Wittgenstein's Logical Atomism

First published Mon Nov 22, 2004; substantive revision Thu Mar 28, 2013

Although it has few adherents today, logical atomism was once a leading movement within early twentieth-century analytic philosophy. Different, though related, versions of the view were developed by Bertrand Russell and Ludwig Wittgenstein. Russell's logical atomism is set forth chiefly in his 1918 work “The Philosophy of Logical Atomism” (Russell 1956), Wittgenstein's in his Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus of 1921 (Wittgenstein 1981). The core tenets of Wittgenstein's logical atomism may be stated as follows: (i) Every proposition has a unique final analysis which reveals it to be a truth-function of elementary propositions ((Tractatus 3.25, 4.221, 4.51, 5); (ii) These elementary propositions assert the existence of atomic states of affairs (3.25, 4.21); (iii) Elementary propositions are mutually independent — each one can be true or false independently of the truth or falsity of the others (4.211, 5.134); (iv) Elementary propositions are immediate combinations of semantically simple symbols or “names” (4.221); (v) Names refer to items wholly devoid of complexity, so-called “objects” (2.02 & 3.22); (vi) Atomic states of affairs are combinations of these simple objects (2.01).

Although these doctrines are recognizably atomist in spirit, the term ‘logical atomism’ is not used by Wittgenstein. It was introduced by Russell in his 1911 lecture to the French Philosophical Society, Le Réalisme Analytique (Russell 1911).[1] Russell had advertised “The Philosophy of Logical Atomism” as being “very largely concerned with explaining certain ideas which [he had] learnt from [his] friend and former pupil Ludwig Wittgenstein” (Marsh, 177). No doubt partly as a result of this description, the term ‘logical atomism’ subsequently became associated with Wittgenstein's early philosophy. The term is now standardly used to apply to a vaguely defined set of doctrines centered on theses (i)–(vi). In Russell's opinion, what makes it appropriate to speak of logical atomism is that the atoms in question are to be arrived at by logical rather than physical analysis (Russell 1956, 179). For Wittgenstein too, the ultimate constituents of reality are to be revealed by a process of logical analysis; so, to that extent, the label seems apt. It is not, however, uncontroversial (see Floyd 1998 and 2007).[2]

1. Names and Objects

The “names” spoken of in the Tractatus are not mere signs (i.e., typographically or phonologically identified inscriptions), but rather signs-together-with-their-meanings — or “symbols.” Being symbols, names are identified and individuated only in the context of significant sentences. A name is “semantically simple” in the sense that its meaning does not depend on the meanings of its orthographic parts, even when those parts are, in other contexts, independently meaningful. So, for example, it would not count against the semantic simplicity of the symbol ‘Battle’ as it figures in the sentence “Battle commenced” that it contains the orthographic part, “Bat,” even though this part has a meaning of its own in other sentential contexts. Of course, something else does count against this symbol's semantic simplicity, namely, that it is analyzable away in favour of talk of the actions of people, etc. This point illustrates the difficulty of finding examples of Tractarian names in natural language. It turns out that even apparently simple singular terms such as ‘Obama,’ ‘London,’ etc., will not be counted as “names” by the strict standards of the Tractatus since they will disappear on further analysis (Hereafter, ‘name’ will mean “Tractarian name” unless otherwise indicated).

It is a matter of controversy whether the Tractatus reserves the term ‘name’ for semantically simple symbols referring to particulars, or whether the term comprehends semantically simple symbols of all kinds. Since objects are just the referents of names, this issue goes hand in hand with the question whether objects are one and all particulars or whether they include properties and relations. The former view is defended by Irving Copi (Copi 1958) and Elizabeth Anscombe (Anscombe 1959, 108 ff), among others. It is supported by Tractatus 2.0231: “[Material properties] are first presented by propositions — first formed by the configuration of objects.” This might seem to suggest that simple properties are not objects but rather arise from the combining or configuring of objects. The Copi-Anscombe interpretation has been taken to receive further support from Tractatus 3.1432:

We must not say, “The complex sign ‘aRb’ says ‘a stands in relation R to b;’” but we must say, “Thata’ stands in a certain relation to ‘b’ says that aRb.”

This has suggested to some commentators that relations are not, strictly speaking, nameable, and so not Tractarian objects (see, for example, Ricketts, 1996, Section III). It may, however, be intended instead simply to bring out the point that Tractarian names are not confined to particulars, but include relations between particulars; so this consideration is less compelling.

The opposing view, according to which names include predicates and relational expressions, has been defended by Erik Stenius and Merrill and Jaakko Hintikka, among others (Stenius, 1960, 61–69; Hintikka and Hintikka, 1986, 30–34). It is supported by a Notebooks entry from 1915 in which objects are explicitly said to include properties and relations (NB, 61). It is further buttressed by Wittgenstein's explanation to Desmond Lee (in 1930–1) of Tractatus 2.01: “‘Objects’ also include relations; a proposition is not two things connected by a relation. ‘Thing’ and ‘relation’ are on the same level.” (LK, 120). Finally, it receives indirect support from a remark from the Tractatus: “In an atomic state of affairs objects hang one in another, like the links of a chain.” (2.03). Wittgenstein was later to explain this remark to C. K. Ogden as meaning that: “There isn't anything third that connects the links but the links themselves make the connection with one another.” (LO, 23).

If we take the metaphor of a chain fully seriously, it seems that thing and relation will, as Wittgenstein suggests to Lee, have to be thought of as being, in a certain sense, on the same level. For each link in a chain is linked to by its neighbor (it is, so to speak, pierced by it); but it also thereby links to that neighbor (in being pierced by its neighbor it thereby pierces it). No link, then, plays a special role analogous to that of saturator only or saturatee only. The parallel thought would have to be that each Tractarian object is both capable of saturating another object and capable of being saturated by another object. And, in an existing state of affairs both of these potentialities will have to be thought of as jointly realized. Less metaphorically, we will have to think of each existing state of affairs as being such that each of its constituent objects makes an equal and uniform contribution to securing its unity. Exactly the same idea, moreover, will have to be thought to hold for the propositions corresponding to these elementary states of affairs: Every name in any state of affairs that, when projected onto the world, constitutes an atomic proposition (cf. 3.12, 3.14) will have to be thought of as both “saturated” by another and “saturating” another, so that each one makes an equal and uniform contribution to securing the unity of the proposition in which it occurs.

This idea might be developed as follows: In the four-constituent elementary proposition “ABCD” we can think of each name as multiply unsaturated — that is to say, as having a triadic “n-adicity.” The model has the merit of exemplifying the Tractarian idea that we cannot conceive of something as a name outside the context of an elementary proposition (cf. 4.23); for it is only in the context of a given elementary proposition that a name's n-adicity is determinate.

Like the Anscombe-Copi reading, the view just outlined treats the forms of elementary propositions as differing radically from anything we may be familiar with from ordinary — or even Fregean — grammar. Both interpretations thus respect Wittgenstein's warning to Waismann in 1929 that “The logical structure of elementary propositions need not have the slightest similarly with the logical structure of [non-elementary] propositions” (WWK, 42).

Going beyond this, Wittgenstein seems once to have held that there can be no resemblance between the apparent or surface forms of non-elementary propositions and the forms of elementary propositions. In “Some Remarks on Logical Form” (1929) he says: “One is often tempted to ask from an a priori standpoint: What, after all, can be the only forms of atomic propositions, and to answer, e.g., subject-predicate and the relational propositions with two or more terms further, perhaps, propositions relating predicates and relations with one another, and so on. But this, I believe, is a mere playing with words” (Klagge and Nordman, 1993, 30). A similar thought already occurs in a more compressed form in the Tractatus itself: “There cannot be a hierarchy of the forms of the elementary propositions. Only that which we ourselves construct can we foresee” (5.556).

It may be, then, that the options we began by considering represent a false dichotomy. Perhaps Wittgenstein simply did not have an antecedent opinion on the question whether Tractarian names will turn out to be names of particulars only, particulars and universals, or whatnot. And it may even be that he believed that the final analysis of language would (or might) reveal the names to defy such classifications altogether. This broader range of interpretive possibilities has only recently begun to receive the attention it deserves (For a beginning, see Johnston 2009).

2. Linguistic Atomism

By “Linguistic atomism” we shall understand the view that the analysis of every proposition terminates in a proposition all of whose genuine components are names. It is a striking fact that the Tractatus contains no explicit argument for linguistic atomism. This fact has led some commentators — e.g., Peter Simons (1992) — to suppose that Wittgenstein's position here is motivated less by argument than by brute intuition. And indeed, Wittgenstein does present some conclusions in this neighborhood as if they required no argument. At 4.221, for example, he says: “It is obvious that in the analysis of propositions we must come to elementary propositions, which consist of names in immediate combination” (emphasis added). Nonetheless, some basic observations about the Tractatus's conception of analysis will enable us to see why Wittgenstein should have thought it obvious that analysis must terminate in this way.

2.1 Wittgenstein's Early Conception of Analysis

A remark from the Philosophical Grammar, written in 1936, throws some light on how Wittgenstein had earlier conceived of the process of analysis:

Formerly, I myself spoke of a ‘complete analysis,’ and I used to believe that philosophy had to give a definitive dissection of propositions so as to set out clearly all their connections and remove all possibilities of misunderstanding. I spoke as if there was a calculus in which such a dissection would be possible. I vaguely had in mind something like the definition that Russell had given for the definite article (PG, 211).

One of the distinctive features of Russell's definition is that it treats the expression “the x such that Fx” as an “incomplete symbol.” Such symbols have no meaning in isolation but are given meaning by contextual definitions that treat of the sentential contexts in which they occur (cf. PM, 66). Incomplete symbols do, of course, have meaning because they make a systematic contribution to the meanings of the sentences in which they occur (cf. Principles, Introduction, x). What is special about them is that they make this contribution without expressing a propositional constituent.

Russell's definition is contained in the following clauses (For the sake of expository transparency, Russell's scope-indicating devices are omitted.).

[1] G(the x: Fx) = ∃x(∀y(Fyy=x) & Gx)    Df.
(cf. Russell 1905b; Russell 1990, 173)

[2] (the x: Fx) exists = ∃xy(Fyy=x)    Df.
(cf. Russell 1990, 174)

The fact that existence is dealt with by a separate definition shows that Russell means to treat the predicate ‘exists’ as itself an incomplete symbol, to be eliminated in favour of the existential quantifier.

One can understand why Wittgenstein discerned an affinity between the theory of descriptions and his own envisioned “calculus,” for one can extract from his remarks in the Tractatus and elsewhere two somewhat parallel proposals for eliminating what he calls terms for “complexes”:

[3] F[aRb] iff Fa & Fb & aRb
[4] [aRb] exists iff aRb

Clauses [1] to [4] share the feature that any sentence involving apparent reference to an individual is treated as false rather than as neither true nor false should that individual be discovered not to exist.

Wittgenstein's first contextual definition — our [3] — occurs in a Notebooks entry from 1914 (NB, 4), but it is also alluded to in the Tractatus:

Every statement about complexes can be analysed into a statement about their constituent parts, and into those propositions which completely describe the complexes (2.0201).

In [3] the statement “about [the complex's] constituent parts” is “Fa & Fb,” while the proposition which “completely describes” the complex is “aRb.” If the propositions obtained by applying [3] and [4] are to be further analysed, a two-stage procedure will be necessary: first, the apparent names generated by the analysis — in the present case ‘a’ and ‘b’ — will need to be replaced[3] with symbols that are overtly terms for complexes, e.g., ‘[cSd]’ and ‘[eFg];’ secondly, the contextual definitions [3] and [4] will need to be applied again to eliminate these terms. If there is going to be a unique final analysis, each apparent name will have to be uniquely paired with a term for a complex. So the program of analysis at which Wittgenstein gestures, in addition to committing him to something analogous to Russell's theory of descriptions, also commits him to the analogue of Russell's “description theory of ordinary names” (cf. Russell 1905a). This is the idea that every apparent name not occurring at the end of analysis is equivalent in meaning to some definite description.

Wittgenstein's first definition, like Russell's, strictly speaking, stands in need of a device for indicating scope, for otherwise it would be unclear how to apply the analysis when we choose, say, “~G” as our instance of “F.” In such a case the question would arise whether the resulting instance of [3] is [5]: “~G[aRb] = ~Ga & ~Gb & aRb,” which corresponds to giving the term for a complex wide scope with respect to the negation operator, or whether it is: [6] “~G[aRb] = ~[Ga & Gb & aRb],” which corresponds to giving the term for a complex narrow scope. One suspects that Wittgenstein's intention would most likely have been to follow Russell's convention of reading the logical operator as having narrow scope unless the alternative is expressly indicated (cf. PM, 172).

Definition [3] has obvious flaws. While it may work for such predicates as “x is located in England,” it obviously fails for certain others, e.g., “x is greater than three feet long” and “x weighs exactly four pounds.” This problem can hardly have escaped Wittgenstein; so it seems likely that he would have regarded his proposals merely as tentative illustrations, open to supplementation and refinement.

Although Wittgenstein's second contextual definition — our [4] — does not occur in the Tractatus, it is implied by a remark from the Notes on Logic that seems to anticipate 2.0201:

Every proposition which seems to be about a complex can be analysed into a proposition about its constituents and … the proposition which describes the complex perfectly; i.e., that proposition which is equivalent to saying the complex exists (NB, 93; emphasis added)[4]

Since the proposition that “describes the complex,” [aRb], “perfectly” is just the proposition that aRb, Wittgenstein's clarifying addendum amounts to the claim that the proposition “aRb” is equivalent to the proposition “[aRb] exists.” And this equivalence is just our [4].

It turns out, then, that existence is defined only in contexts in which it is predicated of complexes. Wittgenstein proposal thus mirrors Russell's in embodying the idea that it makes no sense to speak of the existence of immediately given (that is, named) simples (cf. PM, 174–5). This is why Wittgenstein was later to refer to his “objects” as “that for which there is neither existence nor non-existence” (PR, 72). His view seems to be that when ‘a’ is a Tractarian name, what we try to say by uttering the nonsense string “a exists” will, strictly speaking, be shown by the fact that the final analysis of some proposition contains ‘a’ (cf. 5.535). But of course, the Tractatus does not always speak strictly. Indeed, what is generally taken to be the ultimate conclusion of the Tractatus's so-called “Argument for Substance” (2.021–2.0211) itself tries to say something that can only be shown, since it asserts the existence of objects. The sharpness of the tension here is only partly disguised by the oblique manner in which the conclusion is formulated. Instead of arguing for the existence of objects, the Tractatus argues for the thesis that the world “has substance.” However, because “objects constitute the substance of the world” (2.021), and because substance is that which exists independently of what is the case (2.024), this is tantamount to saying that objects exist. So it seems that Wittgenstein's argument for substance must be regarded as a part of the ladder we are supposed to throw away (6.54). But having acknowledged this point, we shall set it aside as peripheral to our main concerns.

The most obvious similarity between the two sets of definitions is that each seeks to provide for the elimination of what purport to be semantically complex referring expressions. The most obvious difference consists in the fact that Wittgenstein's definitions are designed to eliminate not definite descriptions, but rather terms for complexes, for example the expression “[aRb],” which, judging by remarks in the Notebooks, is to be read: “a in the relation R to b” (NB, 48). (This gloss seems to derive from Russell's examples of complexes in Principia Mathematica, which include, in addition to “a in the relation R to b,” “a having the quality q” and “a and b and c standing in the relation S” (PM, 44).) One might wonder why there should be this difference at all. Why not treat the peculiar locution “a in the relation R to b” as a definite description — as say, “the complex consisting of a and b, combined so that aRb”? This description could then be eliminated by applying the Tractatus's own version of the theory of descriptions:

The F is G ↔ ∃x(Fx & Gx) & ~∃x,y(Fx & Fy)
(cf. 5.5321)

Here the distinctness of the variables (the fact that they are distinct) replaces the sign of distinctness “≠” (cf. 5.53).

Since Wittgenstein did not adopt this expedient, it seems likely that he would have regarded the predicate “x is a complex consisting of a and b, combined so that aRb” as meaningless in virtue of — among other things — its containing ineliminable occurrences of the pseudo-concepts “complex,” “combination,” and “constitution.” Only the first of these notions figures on his list of pseudo-concepts in the Tractatus (4.1272), but there is no indication that that list is supposed to be exhaustive.

There is a further respect in which Wittgenstein's analytical proposals differ from Russell's. Russell's second definition — our [2] — has the effect of shifting the burden of indicating ontological commitment from the word ‘exists’ to the existential quantifier. In Wittgenstein's definition, by contrast, no single item of vocabulary takes over the role of indicating ontological commitment. That commitment is indicated only after the final application of the definition, by the meaningfulness of the names in the fully analysed proposition — or, more precisely, by the fact that certain symbols are names (cf. 5.535). The somewhat paradoxical consequence is that one can assert a statement of the form “[aRb] exists” without thereby manifesting any ontological commitment to the complex [aRb] (cf. EPB, 121). What this shows is that the two theories relieve the assertor of ontological commitments of quite different kinds. In Russell's case, the analysis — our [2] — removes a commitment to an apparent propositional constituent — a “denoting concept” [5] —expressed by the phrase ‘the F,’ but it does not remove the commitment to the F itself. For Wittgenstein, by contrast, the analysis shows that the assertor never was ontologically committed to the complex [aRb] by an utterance of “[aRb] exists.”

Russell's conception of analysis at the time of the theory of descriptions — c.a. 1905 — is relatively clear: Analysis involves pairing up one sentence with another that expresses, more perspicuously, the very same Russellian proposition. The analysans counts as more perspicuous than the analysandum because the former is free of some of the latter's merely apparent ontological commitments. By the time of Principia Mathematica, however, this relatively transparent conception of analysis is no longer available. Having purged his ontology of propositions in 1910, Russell can no longer appeal to the idea that analysans and analysandum express one and the same proposition. He now adopts “the multiple relation theory of judgment,” according to which the judgment (say) that Othello loves Desdemona instead of being, as Russell had formerly supposed, a dyadic relation between the judging mind and the proposition Othello loves Desdemona, is now taken to be a non-dyadic, or, in Russell's terminology, “multiple,” relation whose terms are the judging mind and those items that were formerly regarded as constituents of the proposition Othello loves Desdemona (Russell 1994, 155). After 1910 Russell can say that a speaker who sincerely assertively uttered the analysans (in a given context) would be guaranteed to make the same judgment as one who sincerely assertively uttered the analysandum (in the same context), but he can no longer explain this accomplishment by saying that the two sentences express the same proposition.

A further departure from the earlier, relatively transparent conception of analysis is occasioned by Russell's resolution of the set-theoretic version of his paradox. His solution involves giving an analysis of a sentence whose utterance could not be taken to express any judgment. One argues that the sentence “{x: φx} ε {x: φx}” is nonsense because the contextual definitions providing for the elimination of class terms yield for this case a sentence that is itself nonsense by the lights of the theory of types (PM, 76). It's (apparent) negation is, accordingly, also nonsense. In Principia, then, there is no very clear model of what is preserved in analysis. The best we can say is that Russell's contextual definitions have the feature that a (sincere, assertive) utterance of the analysans is guaranteed to express the same judgment as the analysandum, if the latter expresses a judgment at all.

Some of the unclarity in the conception of analysis introduced by Russell's rejection of propositions is inherited by Wittgenstein, who similarly rejects any ontology of shadowy entities expressed by sentences. In the Tractatus a “proposition” (Satz) is a “propositional sign in its projective relation to the world” (3.12). This makes it seem as though any difference between propositional signs should suffice for a difference between propositions, in which case analysans and analysandum could at best be distinct propositions with the same truth conditions.

Enough has now been said to make possible a consideration of Wittgenstein's reasons for describing the position I have been calling “linguistic atomism” as “obvious.” Since the model for Tractarian analysis is the replacement of apparent names with (apparently) co-referring “terms for complexes,” together with eliminative paraphrase of the latter, it follows trivially that the endpoint of analysis, if there is one, will contain neither “terms for complexes” nor expressions that can be replaced by terms for complexes.

Wittgenstein, moreover, thinks it obvious that the analysis of every proposition does terminate. The reason he supposes analysis cannot go on forever is that he conceives an unanalyzed proposition as deriving its sense from its analysis. As Tractatus 3.261 puts it: “Every defined sign signifies via those signs by which it is defined” (Cf. NB, 46; PT 3.20102). It follows that no proposition can have an infinite analysis, on pain of never acquiring a sense. So analysis must terminate in propositions devoid of incomplete symbols.

That much, at least, is plausibly obvious, but unfortunately it does not follow that the final analysis of language will be wholly devoid of complex symbols. The trouble is that for all we have said so far, a fully analysed proposition might yet contain one or more complex symbols that have meaning in their own right. Clearly, then, Wittgenstein was assuming that all genuine referring expressions must be semantically simple. But why should that be so? The seeds of one answer are contained in Tractatus 3.3, the proposition in which Wittgenstein enunciates his own version of Frege's context principle: “Only the proposition has sense; only in the context of a proposition has a name meaning” (3.3). The juxtaposition of these two claims suggests that the context principle is invoked as the ground for rejecting senses for sub-sentential expressions. But just how it provides such a ground is far from clear. Another, more concrete, possibility is that Wittgenstein simply accepted the arguments Russell had given in “On Denoting” for rejecting senses for sub-sentential expressions.

3. Metaphysical Atomism

By “Metaphysical atomism” we shall understand the view that the semantically simple symbols occurring in a proposition's final analysis refer to simples. The Tractatus does not contain a distinct argument for this thesis, but, as we shall see, one uncovers the needed argument in the course of scrutinizing the famous “Argument for Substance” of 2.0211–2:

2.0211 If the world had no substance, then whether a proposition had sense would depend on whether another proposition was true.
2.0212 It would then be impossible to draw up a picture of the world (true or false).

To see what precisely is being contended for in this argument one needs to appreciate the historical resonances of Wittgenstein's invocation of the notion of “substance.”

3.1 Objects as the Substance of the World

The Tractatus's notion of substance is the modal analogue of Kant's temporal notion. Whereas for Kant, substance is that which “persists,” (i.e., exists at all times), for Wittgenstein it is that which, figuratively speaking, “persists” through a “space” of possible worlds. Less metaphorically, Tractarian substance is that which exists with respect to every possible world. For Kant, to say that there is substance is to say that there is some stuff such that every existence change (i.e., origination or annihilation) is an alteration or reconfiguration of it. For Wittgenstein, analogously, to say that there is substance is to say that there are some things such that all “existence changes” in the metaphorical passage from world to world are reconfigurations of them. What undergo “existence changes” are atomic states of affairs (configurations of objects): a state of affairs exists with respect to one world but fails to exist with respect to another. What remain in existence through these existence changes — and are reconfigured in the process — are Tractarian objects. It follows that the objects that “constitute the substance of the world” (2.021) are necessary existents. The Tractatus compresses this whole metaphorical analogy into one remark: “The object is the fixed, the existing [das Bestehende]; the configuration is the changing [das Wechselnde].” (2.0271). “Wechsel,” it should be noted, is the word that Kant explicitly reserves for the notion of existence change as opposed to alteration (Critique, A 187/B230). (Wittgenstein may not have read the Critique in time for this to influence his phrasing in the Tractatus, but there is some reason to think that he may have read the Prolegomena, in which the world “Wechsel” is also expressly reserved for existence change. For details see Proops 2004.)

Tractarian objects are what any “imagined”—or, more accurately, conceivable—world has in common with the real world (2.022). Accordingly, they constitute the world's “fixed form” (2.022–3): the character of any possible world is constrained by the objects because all possible atomic states of affairs are configurations of them (On Wittgenstein's conception of possibility, the notion of an “alien” Tractarian object — one which is merely possible — is not even intelligible). The various existing atomic states of affairs constitute the world's “content.”; but objects are also the content of atomic states of affairs, whose “form” is the way in which their constituent objects are combined. Thus substance — the totality of objects — is “both form and content” (2.024–5). It is at once both the form of the world and the content of states of affairs (Further details of this interpretation of substance are provided in Proops 2004).

3.2 The Argument for Substance

As we have seen, the immediate goal of the argument for substance is to establish that there are things that exist necessarily. In the context of the Tractarian assumption that anything complex could fail to exist through decomposition, this conclusion entails that there are simples (2.021). While the argument is presented as a two-stage modus tollens, it is conveniently reconstructed as a reductio ad absurdum (The following interpretation of the argument is a compressed version of that provided in Proops 2004):

Suppose, for reductio, that
  [1] There is no substance (that is, nothing exists in every possible world).
Then
  [2] Everything exists contingently.
But then
  [3] Whether a proposition has sense depends on whether another proposition is true.
So
  [4] We cannot draw up pictures of the world (true or false).
But
  [5] We can draw up such pictures.

Contradiction

So
  [6] There is substance (that is, some things exist in every possible world).

Our [5] is the main suppressed premise. It means, simply, that we can frame senseful propositions. Let us now consider how we might try to defend the inference from [2] to [3] on Wittgensteinian principles. As a preliminary, note that, given Wittgenstein's equation in the Notes on Logic of having sense with having truth-poles (NB, 99), it seems reasonable to suppose that for a sentence to “have sense” with respect to a given world may be for it to have a truth value with respect to that world. Let us assume that this is so. Now suppose that everything exists contingently. Then, in particular, the referents of the semantically simple symbols occurring in a fully analysed sentence will exist contingently. But then any such sentence will contain a semantically simple symbol that fails to refer with respect to some possible world. Suppose, as a background assumption, that there are no contingent simples. (It will be argued below that this assumption plausibly follows from certain Tractarian commitments.) Then, if we assume that a sentence containing a semantically simple term is neither true nor false evaluated with respect to a world in which its purported referent fails to exist — and, for now, we do — then, for any such fully analysed sentence, there will be some world such that the sentence depends for its truth valuedness with respect to that world on the truth with respect to that world of some other sentence, viz., the sentence stating that the constituents of the relevant complex are configured in a manner necessary and sufficient for its existence. It follows that if everything exists contingently, then whether a sentence is senseful with respect to a world will depend on whether another sentence is true with respect to that world.

The step from [3] to [4] runs as follows. Suppose that whether any sentence “has sense” (i.e., on our reading, has a truth-value) depends (in the way just explained) on whether another is true. Then every sentence will have an “indeterminate sense” in the sense that it will lack a truth value with respect to at least one possible world. But an indeterminate sense is no sense at all, for a proposition by its very nature “reaches through the whole logical space” (3.42) (i.e., it is truth-valued with respect to every possible world).[6] So if every sentence depended for its “sense” (i.e., truth-valuedness) on the truth of another, no sentence would have a determinate sense, and so no sentence would have a sense. In which case we would be unable to frame senseful propositions (i.e., to “draw up pictures of the world true or false”).

One apparent difficulty for this reconstruction arises from its appearing to contradict Tractatus 3.24, which clearly suggests that if the complex entity A were not to exist, the proposition “F[A]” would be false, rather than, as the argument requires, without truth value. But the difficulty is only apparent. It only goes to show that 3.24 belongs to a theory that assumes that the world does have substance. On this assumption Wittgenstein can say that whenever an apparent name occurs that appears to mention a complex this is only because it is not, after all, a genuine name — and this is what he does say. But on the assumption that the world has no substance, so that everything is complex, Wittgenstein can no longer say this. For now he must allow that the semantically simple symbols occurring in a proposition's final analysis do refer to complexes. So in the context of the assumption that every proposition has a final analysis, the reductio assumption of the argument for substance entails the falsity of 3.24. But since 3.24 is assumed to be false only in the context of a reductio, it is something that Wittgenstein can consistently endorse (This solution to the apparent difficulty for the present reconstruction is owed, in its essentials, to David Pears (see Pears 1987, 78).

To complete the argument it only remains to show that Tractarian commitments extrinsic to the argument for substance rule out contingent simples.[7] Suppose a is a contingent simple. Then “a exists” must be a contingent proposition. But it cannot be an elementary proposition because it will be entailed by any elementary proposition containing ‘a,’ and elementary propositions are logically independent (4.211). So “a exists” must be non-elementary, and so further analyzable. And yet there would seem to be no satisfactory analysis of this proposition on the assumption that ‘a’ names a contingent simple — no analysis, that is to say, that is both intrinsically plausible and compatible with Tractarian principles. Wittgenstein cannot analyse “a exists” as the proposition “∃x(x = a)” for two reasons. First, he would reject this analysis on the grounds that it makes an ineliminable use of the identity sign (5.534). Second, given his analysis of existential quantifications as disjunctions, the proposition “∃x(x = a)” would be further analysed as the non-contingent proposition “a = aa = ba = c…”. Nor can he analyse “a exists” as “~[ ~Fa & ~Ga & ~Ha…]” — that is, as the negation of the conjunction of the negations of every elementary proposition involving “a.” To suppose that it could, is to suppose that the proposition “~Fa & ~Ga & ~Ha…” means “a does not exist,” and yet by the lights of the Tractatus this proposition would show a's existence — or, more correctly, it would show something that one tries to put into words by saying “a exists” (cf. 5.535, Corr, 126)). So, pending an unforeseen satisfactory analysis of “a exists,” this proposition will have to be analysed as a complex of propositions not involving a. In other words, ‘a’ will have to be treated as an incomplete symbol and the fact of a's existence will have to be taken to consist in the fact that objects other than a stand configured thus and so. But that would seem to entail that a is not simple.

The argument for substance may be criticized on several grounds. First, the step leading from [2] to [3] relies on the assumption that a name fails to refer with respect to a possible world at which its actual-world referent does not exist. This amounts to the controversial assumption that names do not function as what Nathan Salmon has called “obstinately rigid designators” (Salmon 1981, 34). Secondly, the step leading from [3] to [4] relies on the assumption that a sentence that is neither true nor false with respect to some possible world fails to express a sense. As Wittgenstein was later to realize, the case of intuitively senseful, yet vague sentences plausibly constitutes a counterexample (cf. PI Section 99). Lastly, one may question the assumption that it makes sense to speak of a final analysis, given that the procedure for analysing a sentence of ordinary language has not been made clear (See PI, Sections 60, 63–4, and Section 91).

4. The Epistemology of Logical Atomism

How could we possibly know that something is a Tractarian object? Wittgenstein has little to say on this topic in the Tractatus, and yet it is clear from his retrospective remarks that during the composition of the Tractatus he did think it possible in principle to discover the Tractarian objects (See AM, 11 and EPB, 121). So it seems worth asking by what means he thought such a discovery could be made.

At times, it can seem as though Wittgenstein just expected to find the simples by reflecting from the armchair on those items that struck him as most plausibly lacking in proper parts. This impression is most strongly suggested in the Notebooks, and in particular in a passage from June 1915 in which Wittgenstein seems to express confidence that certain objects already within his ken either count as Tractarian objects or will turn out to do so. He says: “It seems to me perfectly possible that patches in our visual field are simple objects, in that we do not perceive any single point of a patch separately; the visual appearances of stars even seem certainly to be so” (NB, 64). By “patches in our visual field” in this context Wittgenstein means parts of the visual field with no noticeable parts. In other words, points in visual space (cf. KL, 120). Clearly, then, Wittgenstein at one stage believed he could specify some Tractarian objects. However, the balance of the evidence suggests that this idea was short-lived. For he was later to say that he and Russell had pushed the question of examples of simples to one side as a matter to be settled on a future occasion (AM, 11). And when Norman Malcolm pressed Wittgenstein to say whether when he wrote the Tractatus he had decided on anything as an example of a “simple object,” he had replied — according to Malcolm's report — that “at the time his thought had been that he was a logician; and that it was not his business as a logician, to try to decide whether this thing or that was a simple thing or a complex thing, that being a purely empirical matter” (Malcolm 1989, 70).

Wittgenstein was not suggesting that the correct way to establish that something is a Tractarian object is to gather evidence that its decomposition is physically impossible. That reading would only have a chance of being correct if Wittgenstein had taken metaphysical possibility to coincide with physical possibility, and that is evidently not so.[8] His meaning seems rather to be just that the objects must be discovered rather than postulated or otherwise specified in advance of investigation (cf. AM, 11). But since Wittgenstein was later to accuse his Tractarian self of having entertained the concept of a distinctive kind of philosophical discovery (see WVC 182, quoted below), we must not rush — as Malcolm appears to have done, to the conclusion that he conceived of the discovery in question as “empirical” in anything like the contemporary sense of the word.

We know that Wittgenstein denied categorically that we could specify the possible forms of elementary propositions and the simples a priori (4.221, 5.553–5.5541, 5.5571), but he did not deny that these forms would be revealed as the result of logical analysis. In fact, he maintained precisely this view. This idea is not explicit in the Tractatus, but it is spelled out in a later self-critical remark from G. E. Moore's notes of Wittgenstein's 1933 lectures at Cambridge:

I say in [the] Tractatus that you can't say anything about [the] structure of atomic prop[osition]s: my idea being the wrong one, that logical analysis would reveal what it would reveal (Moore Archive, ADD 8875, 10/7/7, 88; entry for 6 February, 1933)

Speaking of Tractarian objects in another retrospective remark, this time from a German version of the Brown Book, Wittgenstein says: “What these [fundamental constituents] of reality are it seemed difficult to say. I thought it was the job of further logical analysis to discover them” (EPB 121). These remarks should be taken at face value: it is logical analysis — the analysis of propositions — that is supposed to enable us to discover the forms of elementary propositions and the objects. The hope is that when propositions have been put into their final, fully analysed forms by applying the “calculus” spoken of in the Philosophical Grammar we will finally come to know the names and thereby the objects. Presumably, we will know the latter by acquaintance in the act of grasping propositions in their final analysed forms.

Admittedly, Wittgenstein's denial that we can know the objects a priori looks strange given the fact that the analytical procedure described in Section 2 above seems to presuppose that we have a priori knowledge both of the correct analyses of ordinary names and of the contextual definitions by means of which terms for complexes are eliminated. But some tension in Wittgenstein's position on this point is just what we should expect in view of his later rather jaundiced assessment of his earlier reliance on the idea of philosophical discovery:

I [used to believe that] the elementary propositions could be specified at a later date. Only in recent years have I broken away from that mistake. At the time I wrote in a manuscript of my book, “The answers to philosophical questions must never be surprising. In philosophy you cannot discover anything.” I myself, however, had not clearly enough understood this and offended against it. (WVC, 182, emphasis added)

The remark that Wittgenstein quotes here from “a manuscript of the Tractatus” did not survive into the final version, but its sentiment is clearly echoed in the related remark that there can: “never be surprises in logic” (6.1251). Wittgenstein is clear that, in spite of his better judgment, he had in the Tractatus unwittingly proceeded as though there could be such a thing as a philosophical surprise or discovery. His idea that the true objects would be discovered through analysis, but are nonetheless not known a priori, is plausibly one instance of this mistake.

On the conception of the Tractatus, objects are to be discovered by grasping fully analysed propositions, presumably with the awareness that they are fully analysed. But since that is so, we shall not have fully explained how we are supposed to be able to discover the simples unless we explain how, in practice, we can know we have arrived at the final analysis of a proposition. But on this point, unfortunately, Wittgenstein has little to say. In fact, the only hint he offers is the rather dark one contained in Tractatus 3.24:

That a propositional element signifies [bezeichnet] a complex can be seen from an indeterminateness in the propositions in which it occurs. We know that everything is not yet determined by this proposition. (The notation for generality contains a prototype). (3.24)

An indeterminateness in propositions — whatever it might amount to — is supposed to alert us to the need for further analysis. We therefore possess a positive test for analyzability. It by no means follows, however, that the absence of indeterminacy can be used as a negative test. At the very least, further arguments would need to be given before we could accept this claim. But even then there would be further problems, for it is quite unclear what Wittgenstein means by an “indeterminateness” in a proposition. The indeterminateness in question is plainly not the one considered in section 3: what is in question now is the indeterminateness of propositions, not of senses. But what does that amount to?

According to one line of interpretation, due originally to W. D. Hart (Hart 1971), a proposition is indeterminate when there is more than one way it can be true. Thus if I say “Barack Obama is in the United States,” I leave open where in particular he might be. The source of the indeterminacy is the implied generality of this statement, which is tantamount to: “Obama is somewhere in the United States.” This line of interpretation has the merit of promising to make sense of the closing parenthetical remark of 3.24. But it cannot be correct. The kind of indeterminacy that Wittgenstein has in mind at 3.24 is supposed to serve as a sign of further analysability. But Hart's notion cannot play this role, since any disjunctive proposition would be indeterminate in his sense, even a fully analysed proposition consisting of a disjunction of elementary propositions.

According to a second line of interpretation, a proposition is indeterminate in the relevant sense if the result of embedding it in some context is structurally ambiguous. Consider, for example, the result of embedding “F [A]” in the context “it is not true that,” where ‘A’ is temporarily treated as a semantically simple term designating a complex (Keep in place the assumption that a sentence containing a non-referring semantically simple term is neither true nor false). In this case the question would arise whether the result of this embedding is neither true nor false evaluated with respect to a world in which A does not exist, or simply true. The first option corresponds to giving the apparent name wide scope with respect to the logical operator, the second to giving it narrow scope. Such a scope ambiguity could not exist if ‘A’ were a genuine Tractarian name, so its presence could reasonably be taken to signal the need for further analysis.

So far, so good, but where does the business about the generality notation “containing a prototype” come in? Nothing in the present explanation has yet done justice to this thought. Nor does the present explanation really pinpoint what it is that signals the need for further analysis. That, at bottom, is the fact that we can imagine circumstances in which the supposed referent of ‘A’ fails to exist. So, again, there is reason to be dissatisfied with this gloss on indeterminacy.

It must be concluded that Wittgenstein never supplied an adequate way of recognizing when a proposition is fully analysed, and consequently that he failed to specify a means for recognizing something as a Tractarian object.

5. The Dismantling of Logical Atomism

Wittgenstein's turn away from logical atomism may be divided into two main phases. During the first phase (1928–9), documented in his 1929 article “Some Remarks on Logical Form” (Klagge and Nordmann, 1993, 29–35), Wittgenstein exhibits a growing dissatisfaction with certain central details of the Tractatus's logical atomism, and notably with the thesis of the independence of elementary propositions. During this phase, however, he is still working within the broad conception of analysis presupposed, if not fully developed, in the Tractatus. The second phase (1931–2) involves a revolutionary break with that very conception.

5.1 First phase: The colour-exclusion problem

The so-called “colour-exclusion problem” is a difficulty that arises for the Tractatus's view that it is metaphysically possible for each elementary proposition to be true or false regardless of the truth or falsity of the others (4.211). In view of its generality, the problem might more accurately be termed “the problem of the manifest incompatibility of apparently unanalysable statements.” The problem may be stated as follows: Suppose that a is a point in the visual field. Consider the propositions P: “a is blue at t” and Q: “a is red at t” (supposing “red” and “blue” to refer to determinate shades). It is clear that P and Q cannot both be true; and yet, on the face of it, it seems that this incompatibility (or “exclusion” in Wittgenstein's parlance) is not a logical impossibility. In the Tractatus Wittgenstein's response was to treat the problem as merely apparent. He supposed that in such cases further analysis would succeed in revealing the incompatibility to be logical in nature:

For two colours, e.g., to be at one place in the visual field is impossible, and indeed logically impossible, for it is excluded by the logical structure of colour. Let us consider how this contradiction presents itself in physics. Somewhat as follows: That a particle cannot at the same time have two velocities, that is, that at the same time it cannot be in two places, that is, that particles in different places at the same time cannot be identical (6.3751)

As F. P. Ramsey observes in his review of the Tractatus (Ramsey, 1923), the analysis described here actually fails to reveal a logical incompatibility between the two statements in question; for, even granting the correctness of the envisaged reduction of the phenomenology of colour perception to facts about the velocities of particles, the fact that one and the same particle cannot be (wholly) in two places at the same time still looks very much like a synthetic a priori truth. It turns out, however, that Wittgenstein was well aware of this point. He knew that he had not taken the analysis far enough to bring out a logical contradiction, but he was confident that he had taken a step in the right direction. In a Notebooks entry from August 1916 he remarks that: “The fact that a particle cannot be in two places at the same time does look more like a logical impossibility [than the fact that a point cannot be red and green at the same time]. If we ask why, for example, then straight away comes the thought: Well, we should call particles that were in two places [at the same time] different, and this in its turn all seems to follow from the structure of space and particles” (NB, 81; emphasis added). Here Wittgenstein is conjecturing that it will turn out to be a conceptual (hence, for him logical) truth about particles and space (and presumably also time) that particles in two distinct places (at the same time) are distinct. He does not yet possess the requisite analyses to demonstrate this conjecture, but he is optimistic that they will be found.

The article “Some Remarks on Logical Form” (1929) marks the end of this optimism. Wittgenstein now arrives at the view that some incompatibilities cannot, after all, be reduced to logical impossibilities. His change of heart appears to have been occasioned by a consideration of incompatibilities involving the attribution of qualities that admit of gradation — e.g., the pitch of a tone, the brightness of a shade of colour, etc. Consider, for example, the statements: “A has exactly one degree of brightness” and “A has exactly two degrees of brightness.” The challenge is to provide analyses of these statements that bring out the logical impossibility of their being true together. What Wittgenstein takes to be the most plausible suggestion — or at least a sympathetic reconstruction of it — adapts the standard definitions of the numerically definite quantifiers to the system described in the Tractatus, analysing these claims as respectively: “∃x(Bx & A has x) & ~∃x,y(Bx & By & A has x and A has y)” (“Bx” means “x is a degree of brightness”) and “∃x,y(Bx & By & A has x and A has y) & ~∃x,y,z(Bx & By & Bz & A has x & A has y & A has z).” But the suggestion will not do. The trouble is that the analysis — absurdly — makes it seem as though when something has just one degree of brightness there could be a substantive question which (if any) of the three mentioned in the analysis — x or y or z — it was, as though a degree of brightness were some kind of corpuscle whose association with a thing made it bright (cf. Klagge and Nordmann, 33). Wittgenstein concludes that the independence of elementary propositions must be abandoned and that terms for real numbers must enter into atomic propositions, so that the impossibility of something's having both exactly one and exactly two degrees of brightness emerges as an irreducibly mathematical impossibility. This, in turn, contradicts the Tractatus's idea that all necessity is logical necessity (6.37).

5.2 Second phase: Generality and Analysis

Wittgenstein differs from Frege and Russell in denying that the symbols for generality have meaning in isolation. Instead, the Tractatus treats them as incomplete symbols to be analysed away according to the following schemata:

x. Φx ↔ Φa & Φb & Φc
x. ΦxΦaΦbΦc

Universal (existential) quantification is treated as equivalent to a possibly infinite conjunction (disjunction) of propositions. Wittgenstein's dissatisfaction with this view is expressed most clearly in the still unpublished parts of G. E. Moore's notes of Wittgenstein's lectures from Michaelmas term 1932.

Now there is a temptation to which I yielded in [the] Tractatus, to say that
(x).fx = logical product[9] (of all propositions of the form fx), fa . fb . fc

(∃x).fx = [logical] sum, fafbfc

This is wrong, but not as absurd as it looks. (Moore Archive, 8875, 10/7/7, 34, entry for 25 November, 1932)[10].

Explaining why the Tractatus's analysis of generality is not palpably absurd, Wittgenstein says:

Suppose we say that: Everybody in this room has a hat = Ursell has a hat, Richards has a hat etc. This obviously has to be false, because you have to add “& a, b, c,… are the only people in the room.” This I knew and said in [the] Tractatus. But now, suppose we talk of “individuals” in R[ussell]'s sense, e.g., atoms or colours; and give them names, then there would be no prop[osition] analogous to “And a, b, c are the only people in the room.” (ibid., 35, entry for 25 November, 1932)

Clearly, in the Tractatus Wittgenstein was not making the simple-minded mistake of forgetting that “Every F is G” cannot be analysed as “Ga & Gb & Gc…” even when a, b, c, etc. are in fact the only Fs. (Unfortunately, his claim that he registered this fact in the Tractatus is not borne out by the text). His idea was rather that the Tractatus's analysis of generality is offered only for the special case in which a, b, c, etc, are “individuals” in Russell's sense. Wittgenstein had supposed that in this case there is no proposition to express the supplementary clause that is needed in the other cases. Unfortunately, Wittgenstein does not explain why there should be no such proposition, but the answer seems likely to be the following: What we are assumed to be analysing is actually “Everything is G.” In this case any allegedly necessary competing clause — for example, “a, b, c etc., are the only things” (that is, Tractarian objects) — would just be a nonsense-string produced in the misfired attempt to put into words something that is shown by the fact that when analysis bottoms out it yields as names only such as figure in the conjunction “Ga & Gb & Gc…” (cf. Tractatus 4.1272).

What led Wittgenstein to abandon the Tractatus's analysis of generality was his realization that he had failed adequately to think through the infinite case. He had proceeded as though the finite case could be used as a way of thinking about the infinite case, the details of which could be sorted out at a later date. By 1932 he had come to regard this attitude as mistaken:

There is a most important mistake in [the] Tract[atus]…I pretended that [a] proposition was a logical product; but it isn't, because “…” don't give you a logical product. It is [the] fallacy of thinking 1 + 1 + 1 ... is a sum. It is muddling up a sum with the limit of a sum (ibid., 37, entry for November 25)

Wittgenstein came to see his earlier hopeful attitude as, in effect, resting on the mistake of confusing “dots of infinitude” with “dots of laziness.” But beyond this: “There was a deeper mistake — confusing logical analysis with chemical analysis. I thought ‘(∃x).fxis a definite logical sum, only I can't at the moment tell you which” (November 25, 1932, ibid.: 39; cf. PG, 210). Wittgenstein had supposed that there was a fact of the matter — unknown, but in principle knowable — about which logical sum “(∃x).fx” is equivalent to. But because he had failed to specify the analytical procedure in full detail, and because he had not adequately explained what analysis is supposed to preserve, this idea was unwarranted. Indeed, it exemplified an attitude he was later to characterize as amounting to a kind of unacceptable “dogmatism” (WWK, 182).

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Suggestions for further reading

  • Carruthers, P., 1990, The Metaphysics of the Tractatus, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Griffin, J., 1964., Wittgenstein's Logical Atomism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Livingston, P.M., 2001, “Russellian and Wittgensteinian Atomism,” Philosophical Investigations, 24 (1): 30–54.
  • Moss, S., 2012, “Solving the Color Incompatibility Problem,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 41(5): 841–51.
  • Rogers, B. and Wehmeier, Kai F., 2012, “Tractarian First-Order Logic: Identity and the N–Operator,” The Review of Symbolic Logic, 5(4): 538–573.
  • Sullivan, P.M.S., 2003, “Simplicity and Analysis in early Wittgenstein,” European Journal of Philosophy, 11: 72–88.
  • Tejedor, C., 2003, “Sense and Simplicity: Wittgenstein's Argument for Simple Objects,” Ratio, 16(3): 272–89.

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