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Alexander of Aphrodisias

First published Mon Oct 13, 2003; substantive revision Fri May 29, 2009

Alexander was a Peripatetic philosopher and commentator, active in the late second and early third century CE. He continued the tradition of writing close commentaries on Aristotle's work established in the first century BCE by Andronicus of Rhodes, the editor of Aristotle's ‘esoteric’ writings, which were designed for use in his school only. This tradition reflected a gradual revival of interest in Aristotle's philosophy, beginning in the late second century BCE, and helped to reestablish Aristotle as an active presence in philosophical debates in later antiquity. Aristotle's philosophy had fallen into neglect and disarray in the second generation after his death and remained in the shadow of the Stoics, Epicureans, and Academic skeptics throughout the Hellenistic age. Andronicus’ edition of what was to become the Corpus Aristotelicum consolidated this renewed interest in Aristotle's philosophy, albeit in a different form — learned elucidations of the Philosopher's difficult texts. The commentaries themselves served as material for the exposition of Aristotle's work to a restricted circle of advanced students. Hence each generation of teachers produced their own commentaries, often relying heavily on their predecessors’ work. Thus, the ‘scholastic’ treatment of authoritative texts that was to become characteristic of the Middle Ages had already started in the first century BCE. Due to his meticulous and philosophically astute exegesis of a wide range of Aristotle's texts, in logic, physics, psychology, metaphysics and ethical topics, Alexander became known as the exemplary commentator throughout later antiquity and the Middle Ages. He is often referred to simply as ‘the commentator’, later sharing this title with Averroes. Since very little is known about Alexander's life and activities, his extant commentaries and his short treatises on topics related more or less closely to Aristotelian doctrine provide all the information we have about him as a philosopher and a man. As these writings show, his main contemporary opponents were the Stoics, but there is also some evidence of a controversy with Galen. Alexander is not only regarded as the best of the ancient commentators but also as the last strictly Aristotelian one, whose aim was to present and defend Aristotle's philosophy as a coherent whole, well suited to engage contemporary philosophical discussions. The later commentators were members of the Neoplatonist schools and were concerned to document the substantial agreement of Platonic and Aristotelian thought, and to integrate Aristotle's work into their Neoplatonist philosophical system. They continued to consult and discuss Alexander's work, a fact that accounts for its survival.

1. Life and Works

1.1 Date, Family, Teachers, and Influence

Next to nothing is known about Alexander's origin, life circumstances, and career. His native city was (probably) the Aphrodisias in Caria, an inland city of southwestern Asia Minor. His father's name was Hermias. The only direct information about his date and activities is the dedication of his On Fate to the emperors Septimius Severus and Caracalla in gratitude for his appointment to an endowed chair. Their co-reign lasted from 198 to 209 CE; this gives us a rough date for one of his works. Nothing is known about his background or his education, except that he is traditionally taken to have been a student of Aristocles of Messene, though that name may be due to some misunderstanding and his teacher might have been Aristoteles of Mytilene. Alexander is also said to have been a student of Sosigenes and Herminus, the pupil of the commentator Aspasius, the earliest commentator whose work has in part survived. (On the question of his teachers, see Moraux 1984, 335; 361-363; 399-401.) How much Alexander owed to his teachers is hard to guess (he sometimes criticizes Sosigenes and Herminus extensively), but it is clear from the scope and depth of his work that he was a well-trained philosopher with a broad range of knowledge and interests.

Though the dedication to the emperors tells us that Alexander was appointed to a chair in philosophy, there is not sufficient evidence as to whether he obtained one of the four chairs, representing the four traditional schools, established in Athens by Marcus Aurelius in 176 CE. There were similar established chairs in several cities (on Athens see Lynch 1972, 192-207; 213-216). Given the amount and scope of his writing he must have been an active teacher with a flourishing school. It is likely that some of the short essays attributed to Alexander are actually the production of one of his collaborators or disciples. But nothing is known about any of his associates and students (cf. Sharples 1990a). To us his work therefore represents both the heyday and the end of the series of commentators who explained Aristotle exclusively on the basis of Aristotelian texts, without commitment to some other doctrine. Alexander concludes the series of these purely ‘Peripatetic’ commentators (beginning with Andronicus of Rhodes in the first century BCE), who try to explain “Aristotle by Aristotle” (Moraux 1942, xvi). Though later commentators, starting with Porphyry, the disciple and editor of Plotinus, relied heavily on his works, they had a Neo-Platonist approach. Since Porphyry lived considerably later than Alexander (ca. 234-305/10 CE), Alexander's school may have continued to exist until it became outmoded by the ‘Neo-Platonist turn’. Porphyry's report that Plotinus included texts by Alexander ‘and related authors in his discussions (The Life of Plotinus, 14.13) makes this quite likely. After the revival of Aristotelianism in the Middle Ages, commentators such as Thomas Aquinas treated Alexander's work (in Latin translation) as a very important source of information about the true Aristotelian doctrine.

1.2 Works and their history

As the list of his work shows, Alexander was a prolific writer. His writings comprise both commentaries (hupomnemata) on the works of Aristotle and several systematic treatises of his own (including works on “problems,” consisting of series of essays on Aristotelian texts and topics). Of the commentaries, the following are extant: On Prior Analytics I, Topics, Metaphysics, Meteorologica, and On Sense Perception. Of the commentary on the Metaphysics only the first five books are by general consent accepted as genuine; the remaining nine books are attributed to the late commentator Michael of Ephesus (11th-12th century CE.). The commentary on the Sophistical Refutations, ascribed to Alexander in some manuscripts, is considered spurious. References by later commentators show that Alexander's commentaries covered all of Aristotle's theoretical philosophy, including his physical writings (with the exception of the biological works). The list of his lost work is long: there are references to commentaries on the Categories, De interpretatione, Posterior Analytics, Physics, and On the Heavens, as well as On the Soul and On Memory. Alexander did not write commentaries on Aristotle's Ethics or Politics, nor on the Poetics or the Rhetoric. That he had quite some interest in ethical problems, however, is witnessed by the discussions in his own treatises. Among the extant short systematic writings the following are regarded as genuine: Problems and Solutions, Ethical Problems, On Fate, On the Soul and On Mixture and Increase. The rest, Medical Questions, Physical Problems, and On Fevers are considered spurious. Of his lost works some have been preserved in Arabic (see D'Ancona & Serra 2002): On the Principles of the Universe, On Providence, Against Galen on Motion, and On Specific Differences.

Because of Alexander's prestige and authority as an interpreter of Aristotle, many of his works now lost were incorporated in the commentaries of his successors. There are also Arabic and Latin translations, as well as numerous quotations from his lost commentaries. Nothing certain is known about the relative chronology of his writings, but this is not an issue of much importance, since his commentaries may well have incorporated the results of many years of teaching, with later insertions and additions, in a way quite similar to Aristotle's own texts. This would explain the lack of any attempt at elegance and the occurrence of unmitigated inconsistencies or unclear transitions in Alexander.

2. Alexander as commentator

In general, Alexander goes on the assumption that Aristotelian philosophy is a unified whole, providing systematically connected answers to virtually all the questions of philosophy recognized in his own time. Where there is no single, clearly recognizable Aristotelian point of view on some question, he leaves the matter undecided, citing several possibilities consistent with what Aristotle does say. Sometimes he tries to force an interpretation that does not obviously agree with the text, but he avoids stating that Aristotle contradicts himself and, with rare exceptions, that he disagrees with him. Readers will not always be convinced by his suggestions but they will often find them helpful and informative where Aristotle is overly compressed and obscure. As a remark in his commentary on the Topics shows, Alexander was quite aware that his style of philosophic discussion was very different from that of the time of Aristotle (In top. 27,13): “This kind of speech [dialectic refutation] was customary among the older philosophers, who set up most of their classes in this way — not on the basis of books as is now done, since at the time there were not yet any books of this kind.” As this explanation indicates, however, he seems to have regarded the bookishness of his time as an advantage rather than a disadvantage.

Like the other commentaries in the ancient tradition, Alexander's derive from his courses of lectures (‘readings’) on Aristotle's works. In commenting, Alexander usually refrains from giving comprehensive surveys. He generally starts with a preface on the work's title, its scope and the nature of the subject matter. He then takes up individual passages in rough succession by citing a line or two (this provides the ‘lemma’ for the ensuing discussion) and explaining what he considers as problematic (in explanatory paraphrases, clarifications of expressions, or refutations of the views of others), often in view of what Aristotle says about the issue elsewhere. This procedure clearly presupposes that the students had their own texts at hand and were sufficiently familiar with Aristotle's philosophy. Alexander does not generally go through the entire text line by line, but chooses to discuss certain issues while omitting others. Paraphrases are interrupted by clarifications of terminology, and sometimes, at crucial points, by notes on divergent readings in different manuscripts and a justification of his own preference as to what to accept as Aristotle's original words. Decisions on such philological problems are based on what makes better sense in conforming with Aristotle's intentions here or elsewhere. As Alexander indicates, such philological explorations were considered as part of the commentator's work (cf. On Aristotle Metaphysics A, 59,1-9): “The first reading, however, is better; this makes it clear that the Forms are cause of the essence for the other things, and the One for the Forms. Aspasius relates that the former is the more ancient reading, but that it was later changed by Eudorus and Euharmostus.”

Though Alexander follows the Aristotelian texts quite conscientiously, he often concentrates on certain points and certain passages while passing over others with brief remarks. Thus in his comments on the first book of Aristotle's Metaphysics he devotes more than half of his exegesis to the two chapters in which Aristotle attacks Plato's theory of Forms (Metaph. A, 6 & 9). Since Aristotle there focuses on Plato's attempt to connect the Forms with numbers, a theory that is not elaborated in the dialogues, Alexander's disquisition turns out to be our most valuable source on the vexed question of Plato's Unwritten Doctrine and also on the impact of this doctrine on the members of the Early Academy. Though on the whole Alexander adopts Aristotle's critical stance towards Plato's separate Forms, he sometimes at least indicates the possibility of dissent. When, for instance, Aristotle claims that Plato recognizes only two of his own four causes, the formal and the material cause, Alexander refers to the demiurge's activities in the Timaeus as an example for an efficient cause acting for the sake of a final cause. But then he adds a justification to explain why Aristotle acknowledges neither of the two causes in his report on Plato (59,28-60,2): “The reason is either because Plato did not mention either of these in what he said about the causes, as Aristotle has shown in his treatise On the Good; or because he did not make them causes of the things involved in generation and destruction, and did not even formulate any complete theory about them.”

There is not room here to discuss each of Alexander's commentaries individually. Some remarks on his treatment of Aristotle's logic in his commentary on Prior Analytics I may serve the purposes of this general survey (cf. the Introduction in Barnes et al. 1991). As his explanations show, Alexander was fully familiar with the development of logic after Aristotle, under Theophrastus and the Stoics. On the whole, he presents the Aristotelian kind of logic as the obviously right one, treating the Stoic approach as wrong-headed. When he confronts problems in Aristotle's syllogistic he sometimes expresses bafflement, and indicates the difficulties or even inconsistencies he sees in the text. But he usually tries to smooth them over or to offer an alleged Aristotelian solution. In any case he avoids, if at all possible, openly criticizing Aristotle or contradicting him. As his analyses show, Alexander was not an original logician with innovative ideas of his own, as was his contemporary, Galen. He does not always get Aristotle right and sometimes blunders in his exegesis. In addition, his style is uninviting. If Aristotle is hard to comprehend on account of his clipped and elliptic style, Alexander is often hard to follow because of his long and tortuous periods. In the past this has made his commentary on the Prior Analytics inaccessible except to the expert. The new English translations try to make up for these deficiencies by cutting up long periods into shorter sentences. This will greatly enhance the usefulness of Alexander's reconstruction and assessment of those aspects of Aristotle's logic that are still a matter of controversy nowadays.

The idea that discrepancies in Aristotle's texts are due to the development of his philosophy was as alien to Alexander as it was to all other thinkers in antiquity. Instead, he treats Aristotle's philosophy as a unitary whole and tries to systematize it by forging together different trains of thought, and smoothing over difficulties. Thereby he contributed to the emergence of what was to become the canonical ‘Aristotelianism’ that was attacked in early modern times as a severe obstacle to new ideas and scientific development. Though Alexander indicates that he was aware of changes at particular points (he regarded the Categories as Aristotle's earliest work and notes that it does not yet observe the systematic distinction between genus and species), he does not consider the possibility that there were different phases with substantial changes in the Master's work. If such conservatism surprises us in view of the fact that Alexander's own work shows traces of revisions and improvement, we must keep in mind that in the eyes of ‘the commentator’ Aristotle was an authority quite outside the common order. The doctrine of the Master was not the product of an ordinary human mind, subject to trial and error, but a magisterial achievement in a class of its own.

3. Alexander as philosopher

As a philosopher, Alexander presents in his writings an Aristotelian point of view that reflects in many ways the conditions of his own time, on questions that were not or not extensively discussed by Aristotle himself. His Problems and Solutions (Quaestiones), in three books, are collections of short essays, which were apparently grouped together in different books already in antiquity. As their Greek title (phusikai scholikai aporiai kai luseis. lit. ‘School-discussion problems and solutions on nature’, cf. Sharples 1992, 3) indicates, these three books address problems in natural philosophy in the broadest sense. The fourth collection, Problems of Ethics, proceeds in a similar way. As the lists of the essays’ titles at the beginning of each book show, the collections contain a hodgepodge of topics, arranged in a quite loose order. The intellectual level of these discussions is uneven and the titles of the treatises are sometimes misleading. Some of essays do present problems and solutions, but others contain exegeses of problematic passages in Aristotle's texts. There are also mere paraphrases or summaries of certain texts, collections of arguments for a certain position, and sketches of larger projects that were never worked out. It is unclear when and by whom these collections were put together. As mentioned above, some of the essays may be the work of Alexander's associates, or lecture-notes taken by his students. Most interesting from our point of view are those questions that deal with metaphysical issues, like the relation of form and matter, and with the status of universals in general. Of particular interest are also those discussions in book II that are concerned with certain aspects of Aristotle's psychology, because Alexander's commentary on the De anima is lost; they supplement his own treatise On the Soul. Of special interest here is his own work that has been dubbed ‘de Anima libri Mantissa’ (= ‘makeweight’ for his book On the Soul) by its first modern editor, I. Bruns. Of interest are also the essays on the notion of providence (an important topic at Alexander's time, in part due to the influence of the Stoics’ focus on divine providence). They defend the view that while there is no special care for individuals, providence over the objects in the sublunary sphere is exercised by the movement of the heavenly bodies in the sense that they preserve the continuity of the species on earth.

Since Alexander did not write a commentary on Aristotle's ethics, his Ethical Problems, despite their somewhat disorganized state, are of considerable interest (cf. Madigan 1987; Sharples 1990; 2001.2). Apart from Aspasius’ early commentary on parts of the Nicomachean Ethics there are no extant commentaries on Aristotle's ethics before the composite commentary by various hands of the Byzantine age (Michael of Ephesus in the 11th/12th c. and his contemporary Eustratius, together with some material extracted from earlier authors, cf. Sharples 1990, 6-7, 95). This gap may suggest that ethics became a marginal subject in later antiquity. Alexander's Ethical Problems are therefore the only link between Aspasius and the medieval commentaries. Though Alexander's collection of essays displays no recognizable order, it is worth studying because many of the ‘questions’ address central issues in Aristotle's ethics. Some, for instance, are concerned with the notion of pleasure as a good and pain as a bad; with pleasure as a supplement of activity supporting its connection with happiness; with the relation between virtues and vices; with virtue as a mean; and with the concept of the involuntary and the conditions of responsibility. His discussions show not only Alexander's thorough familiarity with Aristotle's ethics, but also reflect the debates of the Peripatetics with the Epicureans and Stoics in Hellenistic times, as shown especially by Alexander's terminology. The Hellenistic background explains the fact that Alexander pays special attention to logical and physical distinctions in connection with ethical problems.

The best example of his procedure is his construal of an Aristotelian conception of fate in the treatise On Fate. Though its long, and at times inelegant, passages do not make for easy reading, this is no doubt the essay that is most interesting for a general public (cf. Sharples 1983 and 2001, 1). Not only is it the most comprehensive surviving document in the centuries-long debate on fate, determinism, and free will that was carried on between the Stoics, the Epicureans and the Academic Skeptics, it also contains some original suggestions and points of criticism, as a comparison with Cicero's On Fate would show. It is unclear whether there had been a genuinely Peripatetic contribution to this debate before Alexander. If there was not, Alexander clearly filled a significant gap. Though Aristotle himself in a way touches on all important aspects of the problem of determinism — logical, physical, and ethical — in different works, he was not greatly concerned with this issue, nor does he entertain the notion of fate (heimarmene) as a rational cosmic ordering-force (as do the Stoics). In De interpretatione 9, he famously proposed to solve the problem of ‘future truth’ by not assigning truth-values to statements in the future tense about individual contingent events. In his ethics he deals with the question of whether individuals have free choice, once their character is settled. As Aristotle sees it, there is little or no leeway in moral decision, but he holds individuals responsible for their actions because they at least collaborated in the acquisition of their character (EN III, 1-5). In his physical works Aristotle limits strict necessity to the motions of the stars, while allowing for a wide range of events in the sublunary realm that do not happen of necessity but only for the most part or by chance (Phys. II, 4-6). Though he subscribes to the principle that the same causal constellations have the same effects, he also allows for ‘fresh starts’ in a causal series (Metaph. E 3). Given these various limitations, Aristotle had no reason to treat determinism as a central philosophical problem either in his ethics or in his physics. The situation changed, however, once the Stoics had established a rigorously physicalist system ruled by an all-pervasive divine mind. It is this radicalization of the determinist position that sharpened the general consciousness of the problematic, as witnessed by the relentless attacks of the Stoics’ opponents, most of all the Academic skeptics and the Epicureans, which lasted for centuries.

This long-standing debate prompted Alexander to develop an Aristotelian concept of fate by identifying it with the natural constitution of things, including human nature (On Fate, ch. 2-6). Since there is always the possibility that something happens against the natural and normal order of things, there are exceptions to what is ‘fated’ and there is room for chance and the fortuitous. Most of the treatise is occupied not with the defense of this peripatetic position, but rather with attacks on the various aspects of the determinist position. Alexander claims to show why the Stoics’ attempt (though he nowhere names them) to defend a compabilitist position must fail. The determinists, he says, are neither entitled to maintain a coherent concept of luck and the fortuitous, nor of contingency and possibility, nor of deliberation and potency. The bulk of this polemical discussion concentrates on the difficulties for the Stoic position by claiming that their concept of fate makes human deliberation superfluous and therefore imports disastrous consequences for human morality and life in general (chs. 7-21). Alexander also presents, albeit in a dialectical fashion intended to lead to the defeat of the Stoic tenets, the arguments used by the Stoics in their defense of contingency, chance, and human responsibility. As he claims time and again, the Stoics can defend the use of these terms, but only in a purely verbal sense. In addition, their notion of divine foreknowledge and prophecy turns out to be incoherent (chs. 22-35). The stringency and originality of Alexander's critique cannot be discussed here (cf. Sharples 1983; Bobzien 1998). While his presentation is not free from repetition and while the order of the arguments leaves something to be desired, it is an interesting text that displays a lively engagement with the issues and quite a bit of philosophical sophistication. He argues that truly free action requires that at the time one acts, it is open to one both to do and not to do what one does in fact then do. Thus Alexander originates the position later known as ‘libertarianism’ in the theory of free action. Alexander's construction of an Aristotelian account of fate and divine providence that limits them to nature and its overall benign order represents quite a weak conception of fate; but it is clearly the only one that Alexander regarded as compatible with the principles of Aristotelian philosophy of nature and ethics. That the concept of fate greatly intrigued him is confirmed by the fact that he returns to the issue in his addendum (‘Mantissa’) to the treatise On the Soul and in some of his Problems (2.4.5, cf. Sharples 1983, esp. the Introduction).

The attempt to ‘naturalize’ crucial concepts in Aristotle's philosophy is typical of Alexander's philosophical stance in general. He regards universals as inseparable from particulars and as secondary to them, and stresses the unity of matter and form. Similarly, he treats the human soul as the perishable form imposed upon the bodily elements to constitute a living human being, and argues that the intellect develops from an embodied intellect focused upon the material world to a state that eventually contains forms no longer embodied. He rules out personal immortality by identifying the active intellect at the same time with pure form and with God, the Unmoved Mover (see On the Soul). In his emphasis on a naturalist point of view he appears remarkably free from the increasingly spiritualistic and mystical tendencies of his own time. In the treatise On Mixture and Increase Alexander expands on problems that Aristotle touched upon only briefly in On Generation and Corruption, but his main concern is — as it is in his On Fate — to prove that the Stoic position of a ‘thorough’ mixture of two substances cannot be maintained. These treatises suggest that at the beginning of the third century philosophical discussions between the traditional schools were still lively. We have, of course, no other evidence on that issue. But there would be little point in proving the superiority of the peripatetic doctrine, as he does in On Fate, to the emperors if the issue was by general consent regarded as obsolescent. It is unlikely, therefore, that Alexander's polemics are only a kind of shadow-boxing against long-gone adversaries.

4. Importance and Influence

We know little or nothing about the impact of Alexander's teaching in his lifetime. Since there are indications of critical attacks on his contemporary Galen (129-?216 CE), he may have engaged in controversy with other contemporaries as well. Whether his polemics against contemporary versions of Stoic doctrine were part of a personal exchange or rather a bookish exercise is unclear. If he held the chair of Peripatetic philosophy at Athens it is quite possible that he was in direct contact with the incumbents of the other philosophical chairs there. He was, of course, not the first commentator on Aristotle. But posterior exegetes certainly treated as exemplary his method and his standards for explaining problems and obscurities in Aristotle's texts. This is indicated both by explicit references in later commentators and by the unacknowledged exploitation of his work in some extant later commentaries on the same texts that he commented on. As the translations of his work first into Arabic and then into Latin show, he continued to be treated as a leading authority and his work influenced the Aristotelian tradition immensely throughout late antiquity and the Middle Ages. Scholars nowadays continue to make use of his commentaries, not only for historical reasons but also because his suggestions are often worth considering even if complete agreement may be rare. The present accessibility of most of his writings in English translations will show that Alexander's work is not only relevant for specialists in the history of philosophy, but opens up an interesting age of transition in the history of philosophical and scientific ideas.


A. Primary Sources

1. Commentaries

2. Treatises considered genuine

3. Spuria

B. Translations

1. Latin translations

2. Commentaries (with notes):

Richard Sorabji (gen. ed.), London: Duckworth, and Ithaca: Cornell University Press

3. Major Treatises

4. Minor works

5. Works extant in Arabic

C. Overviews

D. Studies on Particular Topics

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Related Entries

Aristotelianism: in the Renaissance | Aristotle | Aristotle, commentators on | Elias | Plato | Platonism: in metaphysics | Plotinus | Porphyry | Stoicism