Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Commentators on Aristotle

First published Thu Aug 11, 2005; substantive revision Sun Aug 16, 2009

One important mode of philosophical expression from the end of the Hellenistic period and into Late Antiquity was the philosophical commentary. During this time Plato and Aristotle were regarded as philosophical authorities and their works were subject to intense study. This entry offers a concise account of how the revival of interest in the philosophy of Aristotle that took place towards the end of the Hellenistic period eventually developed into a new literary production: the philosophical commentary. It also follows the commentary tradition into Late Antiquity in order to account for the vitality and richness of this tradition. Special emphasis is given to the ancient study of the Categories because this short but difficult treatise played a central role in the Post-Hellenistic return to Aristotle. The reader should keep in mind that the study of Aristotle in the form of the commentary did not mean the cessation of genuine philosophical thought. Quite the contrary: philosophers customarily used the commentary format not only to expound the works of Aristotle, but also as a vehicle for original philosophical theorizing. One consequence of this approach was that, at least at the beginning, the return to Aristotle did not involve the acceptance of any definite set of doctrines. More directly (and more boldly), there was no definite set of doctrines that a Peripatetic philosopher in the 1st century BCE was expected to accept. At the time Aristotle was considered an authority not because he was above criticism, but because he deserved to be studied carefully.

1. Introduction

The primary purpose of a commentary is to explain a text. Typically the text is divided into lemmata. A lemma is that which is quoted from a text in order to explain and interpret it. Some times the text is quoted in its entirety. Other times only its beginning is quoted. The lemma is always followed by an analysis of the text. Commentaries were not written exclusively on philosophical works. Any poetical or scientific work that came to be regarded as authoritative could be commented upon. For example, the tradition of writing commentaries on the Hippocratic corpus started very early. Although most of this tradition is lost, the commentaries that Galen wrote on the Hippocratic corpus have come down to us. Galen was a doctor who lived and wrote in the second half of the 2nd century CE. Interestingly enough, his exegetical activity was not confined to Hippocrates. Galen wrote on several of Aristotle's works, specifically on the De Interpretatione, the Prior and Posterior Analytics, and the Categories (Galen, On my own Books, xix 47 Kühn). In all probability, these commentaries were not intended for publication but only for the use of a small group of friends and students. Here is what Galen says about his commentary on the Categories:

On Aristotle's work on The Ten Categories I had not previously written any commentary, either for myself or for others; when subsequently somebody asked me for something on the solution posed on that work, <I wrote a commentary> with the firm instruction that he should only show it to students who had already read the book with a teacher, or at least made a start with some other commentaries, such as those of Adrastus and Aspasius (Galen, On My Own Books, xix 42 Kühn, translation after Singer).

The commentator was a teacher, and his readers were students. Moreover, the commentary was a teaching tool addressed to students with specific levels of knowledge. The students who were expected to read Galen on the Categories were not absolute beginners. They were students who either had previously benefited from the study of this treatise with a teacher or had become acquainted with the Categories through some more elementary commentaries. Galen refers to the commentaries written by Adrastus and Aspasius. By so doing, he gives us an idea of the profusion of commentaries that were written on the Categories. These commentaries were written one after the other as part of an already consolidated exegetical practice. Unfortunately, most of these commentaries have not reached us. We no longer have the commentaries that Adrastus and Aspasius wrote on the Categories, nor do we have the commentary that Galen wrote on the same treatise. This frustrating (at least for us) fact is ultimately due to the very nature of this literary production. Each generation of commentators read and interpreted Aristotle in the light of their own theoretical preoccupations and proclivities, only to be replaced by the next generation of commentators. One remarkable exception is Alexander of Aphrodisias, a younger contemporary of Galen. His commentaries survive because they were adopted as exemplary models by later commentators. But not all of them have come down to us. For example, Alexander wrote a commentary on the Categories (Simplicius, In Cat. 1.16). This commentary is not extant. It suffered the same fate as those written by Adrastus, Aspasius, Galen, and others. It survives only in fragmentary form, incorporated in the commentaries that a later generation of commentators wrote on the Categories. (But traces of this commentary may be hidden in what is known as the Archimedes Palimpsest. See the Archimedes Palimpsest Project, and in particular The New Commentary on Aristotle's Categories in the Archimedes Palimpsest.)

2. The Pre-History of the Commentary Tradition: The Fortune of the Categories in the 1st century BCE

The critical engagement with Aristotle that began towards the end of the Hellenistic age and continued throughout the centuries that followed was directed to works such as the Categories, which had been largely ignored in the preceding centuries. This engagement presupposes the availability of Aristotle's writings in a form that suited the interests and needs of the time. Although the information in our possession is slim, it strongly suggests that an intense editorial activity took place in the 1st century BCE. Apellicon of Teos, a bibliophile rather than a philosopher, seems to have produced copies of Aristotle's works in the 90s (Strabo, Geo. xiii I 54); Tyrannion of Amisus, a grammarian and enthusiast of Aristotle (philaristotelês), who had access to Apellicon's books, may have done the same in the 60s (but our sources do not say that he edited the works of Aristotle; they only say that he “put in order the books of Aristotle”; Strabo, Geo. xiii I 54; Plutarch, Sulla 26 468 B-C). These editorial labors were surpassed by that of Andronicus of Rhodes, who is credited with the production of the first reliable edition of Aristotle; an edition that exercised an enormous influence on the Post-Hellenistic return to Aristotle. (More information is available in

Andronicus of Rhodes,

a supplementary document.) In reality, Andronicus could not be entirely responsible for the revival of interest in the philosophy of Aristotle. This revival was, at least in part, independent of his editorial accomplishment. Moreover, a close study of the fortune that the Categories enjoyed in this context suggests that the return to Aristotle took different forms and involved a great variety of exegetical positions not necessarily related to one another. Finally, the return to Aristotle did not necessarily involve either the acceptance of the views stated by Aristotle or codification in the form of the commentary. In short, there was no orthodoxy in the Aristotelian tradition at this early stage (pace Moraux 1973, pages xii-xx, especially xvi-xvii).

We have the names of five ancient interpreters (palaioi exêgêtai) of the Categories whose activity is placed in the 1st century BCE: Andronicus, Boethus, Athenodorus, Ariston, and Eudorus (Simplicius, In Cat. 159.32-33). It is likely that, of these five philosophers, only Boethus of Sidon wrote a commentary on the Categories. Boethus' activity can be dated in the second half of the 1st century BCE. Simplicius contrasts his “word-by-word exegesis” to that of Andronicus, who is said “to have paraphrased the Categories” (Simplicius, In Cat. 29.28-30.5). We cannot exclude that Simplicius projected his own literary conventions onto Andronicus and Boethus, and that by his own standards Boethus and Andronicus were engaged in two different exegetical exercises. On the one hand, there is some clear evidence that Andronicus did rephrase and clarify Aristotle's text in order to extract Aristotle's intentions. On the other hand, there is no reason to think that Andronicus wrote in the style that will later be codified as paraphrase. Themistius was the champion of this particular form of exegesis in antiquity. Interestingly enough, Themistius does not give us names of predecessors. His silence is open to different interpretations: either Themistius did not know of Andronicus' work on the Categories or this work was not written in the style of a paraphrase. Fortunately, it is not essential for us to establish whether or not Andronicus was the first paraphraser of Aristotle. What matters is that his style of exegesis was perceived as different from that of Boethus. Unlike Andronicus, Boethus was engaged in an in-depth examination of whole book of the Categories in the form of a word-by-word commentary. Boethus was highly regarded in antiquity. Simplicius refers to him as “the amazing Boethus” (In Cat. 1.18), “the noble Boethus” (In Cat. 379.32), and prizes “the sharpness of his mind” (In Cat. 1.23 and 434.18). Except for a few testimonies, his commentary has not survived. From these few testimonies, however, it is clear that Boethus concerned himself with the difficulties that the Stoics raised against Aristotle's Categories. The Stoics attacked the Categories on the assumption that this treatise is on language and about linguistic expressions. They argued that as a treatise on language and about linguistic expressions the Categories was incomplete. Boethus resisted this reading of the Categories and anticipated a line of interpretation that was then followed, among others, by Porphyry.

Boethus' defense of the Categories documents that this treatise was intensely read and studied, and not only among philosophers friendly to Aristotle. The Stoic philosopher Athenodorus is credited with a book (Simplicius, In Cat. 86.22) or books (Porphyry, In Cat. 62.25-26) significantly entitled Against Aristotle's Categories. We know very little about Athenodorus. If he is the same person as Athenodorus of Tarsus, who was a friend and adviser of the Emperor Augustus and was appointed by him as governor of Taurus, then Athenodorus was active in the second half of the 1st century BCE. There is no compelling reason to think that his critique of the Categories was written in the form of a commentary. Athenodorus could have been content with offering a series of objections and difficulties, just as the Platonist Lucius and Nicostratus would do more than a hundred years later (Simplicius, In Cat 1.18-20: “Others have chosen simply to present a series of difficulties (aporiai) arising from the text, which is what has been done by Lucius, and after him by Nicostratus, who took over for himself the job of Lucius”).

The temptation to credit all the ancient interpreters of the Categories with a commentary must be resisted also in the case of Eudorus of Alexandria. It is generally assumed that Eudorus flourished in the middle and third quarter of the first century BCE. Simplicius is not content to enumerate Eudorus among the ancient interpreters of the Categories. He preserves nine testimonies in which Eudorus took issue with Aristotle. But no inference about the form of his literary production is possible. The only safe inference is that the study of the Categories was not confined to the school of Aristotle. In fact, Eudorus was not a Peripatetic philosopher. Simplicius refers to him as the “Academic Eudorus” (In Cat. 187.10).

The last name on list of the ancient interpreters of the Categories is that of Ariston of Alexandria. From Cicero (Luc. §§ 11-12), we learn that Ariston was among the learned men who attended the conversations that took place in Alexandria in 87 BCE between Heraclitus of Tyrus, a former student of Clitomachus and Philo of Larissa, and Antiochus of Ascalon. Cicero depicts Ariston as a pupil of Antiochus. That Ariston was a pupil of Antiochus is confirmed by the Index Academicorum, a history of the Academy written by Philodemus in the 1st century BCE. There, we are told that Antiochus “took over <the Academy>” (xxxiv 34). A list of his students is also given. The list includes the names of Aristus, Antiochus' brother; Ariston and Dio of Alexandria; and Cratippus of Pergamum (xxxv 1-6). What immediately follows is extremely interesting: “Ariston of Alexandria and Cratippus of Pegamum deserted the Academy and turned Peripatetic” (xxxv 10-16). We are not told the reasons for their defection to Peripatetic philosophy. In the case of Ariston it is also difficult to see what this defection really involved. From the information in our possession we can only say that he wrote about the Categories. But there is no evidence that Ariston wrote in the form of a commentary. His case is significantly different from that of Andronicus and Boethus. Andronicus and Boethus made an attempt to organise, clarify, and indeed defend, the philosophy of Aristotle. This does not seem to apply to Ariston. His name is never related to those of Andronicus and Boethus. In addition, there is no evidence that Ariston was aware of the existence of Andronicus and Boethus, or that he was influenced by their works. That the edition of Andronicus played a role in the conversion of Ariston to the philosophy of Aristotle is merely a conjecture.

3. Alexander of Aphrodisias and the Aristotelian Tradition in the 1st and 2nd century CE

The revival of interest in the philosophy of Aristotle outlived the 1st century BCE. The exegetical activity on the works of Aristotle continued to flourish in the 1st and 2nd century CE. New layers of interpretation were added in these two centuries. They greatly contributed to the formation of the exegetical tradition that found its culmination in the commentaries of Alexander of Aphrodisias.

Alexander of Aegae wrote about the Categories (Simplicius, In Cat. 10.20; 13.16) and the De caelo (Simplicius, In DC 430.29-32). Since he is said to have been teacher of the Emperor Nero, his exegetical activity can be dated in the first half of the 1st century CE. Nothing can be said about the form of his literary production. This is also the case of two other interpreters of the Categories: Sotion and Achaius (Simplicius, In Cat. 159.23). Although their exegetical activity is much more difficult to date, there is one line of argument that places it in the 1st century CE. The information at our disposal is frustratingly meagre, but it is hard to escape the conclusion that the Categories continued to be at the centre of the exegetical activity on the philosophy of Aristotle. The situation did not change in the first half of the 2nd century CE. From Galen we learn that Adrastus of Aphrodisias and Aspasius wrote elementary commentaries on the Categories. From the way Galen refers to these commentaries, they must have been easily available and routinely used to introduce students to the Categories. Adrastus and Aspasius established themselves as respected interpreters of Aristotle. We know that their commentaries were still used about one hundred years later by the great Plotinus (Porphyry, Vita Plot. 14.12-14). Aspasius did not confine his exegetical activity to the Categories. He wrote commentaries on the De Interpretatione, the Physics, and the Metaphysics. These commentaries were used and quoted by later generations of commentators. The reputation that Aspasius enjoyed in antiquity explains why his commentary on Aristotle's Ethics has survived. This commentary is the earliest surviving commentary on an Aristotelian text.

One significant impact on the way the practice of philosophy developed towards the end of the 2nd century CE was the intervention of the imperial power in matters of education. This intervention seems to go as far back as the Emperor Antoninus Pius, who is said to have established public chairs of rhetoric and philosophy in the provinces (Hist. Aug., Ant. Pius 11.3). But it was Marcus Aurelius who first established Imperial chairs of philosophy in Athens in 176 CE. From our ancient sources we are told that those chairs were in Platonic, Stoic, Peripatetic and Epicurean philosophy. In all probability, the first holder of the chair in Aristotelian philosophy was Alexander of Damascus, an older contemporary of Galen described by him as “knowledgeable about the doctrines of Plato but more inclined to those of Aristotle” (Galen, De praenotione xiv 627-628 Kühn). The holder of the Imperial chairs was a public teacher and received an annual salary. His teaching consisted in lecturing on the texts of the founder of the school. Alexander of Aphrodisias was one of these teachers publicly appointed to a chair of Aristotelian philosophy. Alexander refers to himself as a teacher, didaskalos (De fato 164.15). As a teacher of Aristotelian philosophy, Alexander was concerned not only with explicating this philosophy but also with defending it in the context of the debates between philosophical schools. His attitude towards Aristotle is best expressed at the very beginning of his De anima. This treatise is not a commentary on Aristotle's De anima but an investigation of the soul based on the principles established in Aristotle's De anima. The task that here Alexander sets for himself is that of clarifying and promoting the views of Aristotle:

In all philosophical questions, the present writer cherishes a special regard for the authority of Aristotle, in the conviction that his teaching on these matters has greater claim to truth than that of other philosophers. The purpose of this present treatise will therefore be satisfactorily accomplished if the doctrine of the soul which I here set forth is as clear an exposition as possible of what Aristotle has said on this subject; and I shall limit my own contribution to explanations of the specific points that Aristotle himself has so excellently stated. (Alexander, De anima 2. 5-9, translation after Fotinis)

Alexander wrote commentaries on most of Aristotle's treatises. His commentaries on the Prior Analytics (book 1), the Topics, the Meteorology, and On Sense Perception have survived. Of the commentary on the Metaphysics that is transmitted under his name, only the first five books are regarded as genuine. The commentary on the Sophistical Refutations, traditionally attributed to Alexander, is spurious. Although Alexander is best known for his commentaries on Aristotle, his exegetical activity extended to include short discussions on specific points of interpretation within Aristotelian philosophy. These discussions are collected in four books of Problems and Solutions and in a further book traditionally known as Mantissa (literally, “makeweight”). These collections offer an eloquent illustration of the extraordinary variety of exegetical methods deployed in the exposition of Aristotle's philosophy. Up to a point, the deployment of such a variety of exegetical methods can be explained with reference to the pedagogic function of these writings, which were used as teaching tools in the instruction of students with different levels of knowledge of Aristotle's philosophy.

Alexander's exegetical activity ultimately consisted in an effort of systematization combined with an attempt to extract what he regarded as the genuine thought of Aristotle. It was this loyalty to the philosophy of the master coupled with the finesse of his interpretation that gained Alexander the reputation of “the most authentic interpreter of Aristotle” (Simplicius, In Phys. 80.16). His commentaries set standards of interpretations that remained largely unsurpassed in antiquity. But it is important to realize that his extraordinary accomplishment was the culmination of the exegetical tradition that had started in the 1st century BCE. Moreover, Alexander was not the first but rather the last authentic interpreter of Aristotle. Although subsequent generations of commentators were profoundly influenced by Alexander, they were motivated by a very different exegetical ideal. Their primary aim was no longer to recover and preserve Aristotle's thought for its own sake, but for the sake of finding agreement between Aristotle and Plato and presenting them as part of one and the same philosophical outlook. (For further information on Alexander as a commentator and a philosopher, see Sections 2 and 3 of the entry on Alexander of Aphrodisias.)

4. The Commentary Tradition in Late Antiquity: The Place of the Categories in the Reading Curriculum

The study of Aristotle through close textual reading of his works continued, if not increased, in Late Antiquity. So did the supply of commentaries on all his major works. Unlike Alexander of Aphrodisias, however, most of these commentators regarded themselves as Platonists. For them, Plato's philosophy was superior to all the systems of thought that came later. In addition, they believed that all these later systems started out as developments of Plato's philosophy. Aristotle was no exception to the rule. These commentators viewed Aristotle as a true descendant of Plato. This explains why by reverting to Plato they did not mean to reject Aristotle's philosophy. On the contrary, they were convinced that this philosophy could be integrated into a Platonic framework. The Platonism of Late Antiquity was so comprehensive as a system of thought that it could harbor Aristotle's philosophy. In this frame of mind, a major exegetical concern became that of finding substantial agreement between Plato and Aristotle. For most of these commentators, the disagreement on specific issues between Aristotle and Plato did not preclude harmony between the two philosophers on a deeper level.

In reality, the conciliation of Plato and Aristotle attempted by these commentators consisted in an appropriation of Aristotle's works as a pre-requisite for the study of Plato's philosophy. Among these works, the Categories continued to enjoy a very special status. This treatise was considered an elementary introduction to the whole of philosophy and as such it was used to teach beginners with little or no knowledge of philosophy (Porphyry, In Cat. 56. 28-29). For this reason the exegetical activity on this short but difficult treatise never stopped but in fact increased in Late Antiquity. The key figure for the reception of the Categories during this period was undoubtedly Porphyry. Porphyry (c. 234-305 CE) wrote a commentary in seven books addressed to a student named Gedalius. This commentary is lost. All the information we have about its content derives from later commentators who heavily relied on it as a model and sourcebook. Porphyry is reported to have offered a complete interpretation of the Categories, including a resolution of all previous aporiai (Simplicius, In Cat. 2. 6-9). It is likely that he dealt with the traditional criticism of the Categories, including a comprehensive discussion of the objections leveled by the earlier interpreters of the Categories (e.g., the Stoic Athenodorus and Cornutus, and the Platonic Lucius and Nicostratus). His defense of the Categories relied and expanded on the Peripatetic tradition (e.g., Boethus of Sidon, Alexander of Aphrodisias). The influence of the commentary addressed to Gedalius was enormous. Most of the information in our possession about the early exegetical tradition on the Categories ultimately derives from this single commentary. Even if we cannot exclude that the subsequent commentators had direct access to the pre-Porphyrian materials, they extensively used this commentary and closely followed it. Interestingly enough, Porphyry wrote another commentary on the Categories. This second commentary has come down to us. The results achieved in the more comprehensive commentary are here abbreviated, simplified, and made accessible in the form of a dialogue between a teacher and a pupil. The existence of two commentaries written in a different format on the very same treatise by the same author has to be understood in the light of the fact that these commentaries were teaching tools and were used to teach students with different skills and different levels of familiarity with the Categories. Last but not least, Porphyry is the author of the Isagoge (literally, “Introduction”). This short book is an introduction to Aristotle's theory of predication. It is addressed to absolute beginners in philosophy whose reading curriculum then continued with Aristotle's logic, beginning with the Categories.

The commentary addressed to Gedalius became an instant success and an example to imitate. Iamblichus (c. 242-325 CE) is known to have written a commentary on the Categories that closely followed this commentary, abbreviating the argument and making the overall interpretation clearer. He is also known to have amplified the Porphyrian interpretation with the help of the book that the Pythagorean Archytas wrote on the doctrine of the categories (Simplicius, In Cat. 2.9-14). The writing in question is a late forgery intended to claim Aristotle's doctrine of the ten categories for the Pythagorean school. Iamblichus considered this forgery an authentic anticipation of Aristotle's Categories and a vindication of his vision of philosophy as a single tradition of wisdom, starting with Pythagoras and continuing with Plato and Aristotle. Iamblichus is reported to have made use of the considerations of Archytas when it was appropriate in the attempt to demonstrate the overall agreement between Aristotle and the Pythagorean doctrine.

Iamblichus' commentary is lost, but we can form an idea of the contribution that this commentary made to the ancient debate on the Categories thanks to Dexippus. Nothing is known about Dexippus besides the fact that he was a pupil of Iamblichus. His surviving commentary provides a concise and clear presentation of the solutions offered to the aporiai leveled against Aristotle's Categories. Dexippus opted for the question-and-answer format, which better suited his purpose to provide a brief and relatively simple summary of the exegetical results achieved by his predecessors, especially Porphyry and Iamblichus. Dexippus was not an original thinker. According to Simplicius, he added virtually nothing to the considerations of Porphyry and Iamblichus (Simplicius, In Cat. 2. 29-30).

After having mastered the Categories, the student of philosophy was expected to read the rest of the Aristotelian corpus before turning to Plato's dialogues. Syrianus, the teacher of Proclus (c. 410-485 CE), exposed his students to both Plato and Aristotle, starting with Aristotle. Proclus arrived in Athens around 430, at a time when Plutarch, the previous head of the school, was an old man and Syrianus had already taken over. As a young and gifted student, Proclus read Aristotle's De anima and Plato's Phaedo with Plutarch. But when Plutarch died, Syrianus became responsible for his philosophical education. Under the direction of Syrianus, Proclus mastered in less than two years the entire Aristotelian corpus. He studied the logical, ethical, political, physical works and finished up with theology (Marinus, Life of Proclus, chapters 12 and 13). The sequence logic-ethics-politics-physics-theology reflected not only a certain organization of the teaching but also a particular conception of philosophy. To begin with, the first place assigned to Aristotle's logical writings was not neutral with respect to a certain view of the nature of logic. By this time logic was regarded as a tool for philosophy. This conception of logic and its relation to the rest of philosophy is reflected in the collective title Organon that we still use to refer to Aristotle's logical writings. Moreover, the non-theological writings were preliminary to the study of theology as it is contained in the Metaphysics. This treatise was the last of Aristotle's works to be studied. The conception of God as an intellect and a living being enjoying the state of perfect actuality was designed by Syrianus as the culmination of his course on Aristotle's philosophy. Once Proclus had mastered the Metaphysics and learned about the Aristotelian conception of the divine, Syrianus directed him to Plato, whose dialogues were also read in a definite sequence, culminating with the Timaeus and the Parmenides.

This attitude towards the philosophy of Aristotle and Plato was passed from Syrianus to Proclus, and from Proclus to Ammonius (c. 440-520 CE). The commentaries of Ammonius on the Categories, the De Interpretatione, the Prior Analytics, and Porphyry's Isagoge have come down to us. The last is the earliest extant commentary on the Isagoge. By this time the Isagoge had already established itself as part of the reading curriculum of philosophy, which continued with the Categories, the De Interpretatione and the Prior Analytics. Note, however, that Ammonius did not write his commentaries on the Categories, the Prior Analytics, and perhaps the Isagoge. They were produced by pupils who attended his lectures on Aristotle. (For further information and discussion of his commentaries, see Section 1.2 of the entry on Ammonius.) Other commentaries originated in the lecture room as a transcription of the oral exposition delivered by the teacher. The commentaries on the Categories based on the lectures offered by Olympiodorus (c. 495-565 CE) and his pupil Elias (David) have reached us. Philoponus (c. 490-570 CE) edited his own lectures on the Categories. However, the most influential of these later commentaries was the one that Simplicius wrote after 529 CE. Simplicius was a man of vast learning and extraordinary synthetic powers. He was also acutely aware of writing at the end of a long and venerable exegetical tradition. He consciously tried to assimilate and blend together the various strands of this tradition. By so doing he left us the most comprehensive and informative survey of the reception of the Categories in antiquity. At first sight Simplicius may look like a modern scholar. His commentary shows the great care and precision of a thoughtful and dedicated interpreter who is explicating the Categories through a close reading of the text. Yet there is one important difference that must not be overlooked. Simplicius was a Platonist and his exegetical activity was intended to show that Plato and Aristotle were in substantial agreement. Simplicius is adamantly clear on his own exegetical ideal:

<the worthy interpreter> must, I believe, not convict the philosopher of discordance by looking only at the letter of what <Aristotle> says against Plato; but he must look towards the spirit, and track down the harmony which reigns between them on the majority of points (Simplicius, In Cat. 7. 29-32, translated after Michael Case)

The commentary tradition that found its culmination in Simplicius consisted in a sincere attempt to arrive at a better understanding of the Categories. By reading Simplicius' commentary one still gets a sense of the extraordinary ingenuity that this tradition employed in explicating this short yet elusive treatise. But one also gets the impression that this tradition had no privileged access to this text. Quite the contrary: from the beginning of the revival of interest in the philosophy of Aristotle and into Late Antiquity, the Categories remained a tantalizing puzzle. Not only its title, but also its unity, structure and place in the Aristotelian corpus were intensely discussed. Various titles are attested in the tradition: Introduction to the Topics, On the Genera of Being, On the Ten Genera, The Ten Categories, Categories (Simplicius, In Cat. 15. 26-30). Each of these titles reflected a certain interpretation of what the treatise is about. Andronicus is the first interpreter who is known to have preferred the title Categories. He rejected the title Introduction to the Topics and considered the final chapters of the Categories—the so-called Postpraedicamenta—a later addition contrary to the purpose of the book. He held that the people who added those chapters also inscribed the book with the title Introduction to the Topics (Simplicius, In Cat. 279. 8-10). By contrast, Adrastus of Aphrodisias defended the relationship between the Categories and the Topics in a work entitled Concerning the Order of Aristotle's Treatises (Simplicius, In Cat. 16. 1-4). The dispute was not confined to the organization Aristotle's works, but it clearly extended to the philosophical significance of the treatise. The title Categories eventually prevailed, and along with the title a certain interpretation of the treatise.

5. The Exegetical Labor on the De anima

The impression that, from very early on, the interpreters were struggling to understand Aristotle is confirmed by the commentary tradition on the De anima. Consider, for example, De anima 3.5. Here Aristotle famously argues for the existence of an intellect that is separate, unaffected, and unmixed (430 a 17-18). In antiquity commentators traditionally referred to this intellect as the active (or productive) intellect, nous poiêtikos. Discussion on how exactly this intellect is to be understood started very early. There is evidence that already Theophrastus puzzled over it (Themistius, In DA 110.18-28). Among other things, it is not obvious what sort of thing the active intellect is supposed to be. More directly, it is not clear whether it is a human or a divine intellect. What Aristotle says outside of the De anima is equally perplexing. In the Generation of animals Aristotle speaks of an intellect that enters “from without” (GA 736 b 27). But it is not at all clear how the comment that Aristotle makes in this context is to be understood. What exactly is the status of this enigmatic intellect? How does it fit with the discussion offered in the De anima?

Alexander of Aphrodisias developed a line of interpretation that made the active intellect a non-human intellect and identified it with God. His commentary on the De anima is lost. Instead we have the De anima that he wrote following the principles that Aristotle had established in his own De anima. There, Alexander identifies the active intellect with “the first cause, which is the cause and principle of existence to all the other things” (Alexander, DA 89. 9-10). The intellect so understood is not only the cause of human thought; it is also the cause of the existence of everything that there is in the universe. This intellect can also be an object of thought. When this happens, this intellect enters in us from without: “this is the intellect from without which comes to be in us and is imperishable” (Alexander, DA 90.19-20). Alexander makes it abundantly clear that this intellect alone is imperishable and as such it is also divine. A similar but not identical attempt to expand on the elliptical remarks that Aristotle has left on the active intellect can be found in the On Intellect, a short essay attributed to Alexander of Aphrodisias and preserved in the collection of brief exegetical writings known to us as Mantissa. This essay was widely read both in the Arabic and in the Latin world and continued to be studied in the Renaissance. Until very recently, it was almost universally presumed to have been written by Alexander. Now, however, some scholars question its authenticity.

Another text that has important implications for the reception of Aristotle's treatment of the intellect is the paraphrase of the De anima that Themistius wrote around 350 CE. There, Themistius argues that the active intellect is the most accurate specification of the human form (In DA 100.35-36). Put differently, our essence as human beings is the active intellect (In DA 100.36-101.1). Although Themistius does not name names, he is clearly reacting against the reading advanced by Alexander of Aphrodisias. For Themistius the active intellect is not God or the supreme principle upon which everything depends for its existence. For him, the active intellect is an integral part of the human soul: “the active intellect is in the soul and it is like the most honourable part of the human soul” (In DA 103.4-5). Although the active intellect so understood is a human intellect, it is emphatically not conceived of as a personal intellect. Themistius is adamantly clear that there is only one separate, unmixed and unaffected active intellect. Likewise, there is only one separate, unmixed and unaffected potential intellect, nous dunamei. According to Themistius, both the active and the potential intellects are not subject to generation and perishing. What is perishable is only the common or passive intellect, koinon or pathêtikos nous. This third intellect is mixed with the body and its fate is to perish along with the body (In DA 105.28-29; 106.14-15).

6. Boethius and the Latin Tradition

Beginning some time in the fourth century CE, Aristotle's Organon established itself as part of the reading curriculum in the Latin tradition. Like the Greek tradition, the Latin tradition employed a great variety of exegetical tools in the teaching of Aristotle: paraphrases, elementary as well as more advanced commentaries. In addition, the Latin tradition was confronted with the specific problem of providing the students with adequate translations of the relevant texts.

The tradition credits Marius Victorinus (fourth century CE) with a translation of the Categories, the De Interpretatione, and Porphyry's Isagoge (Cassiodorus, Instit. II, 3, 18). The same tradition credits him with a commentary in eight books on the Categories. A few years later Vettius Agorius Praetextatus is known to have translated the Greek paraphrases of the Prior and Posterior Analytics produced by Themistius (Boethius, De Int.2 3.6-4.3). None of these works have reached us, with the exception of excerpts from Victorinus' translation of the Isagoge. An anonymous paraphrase of the Categories falsely attributed to Augustine and traditionally known as Categoriae Decem has survived only because it was widely read and used in the early Middle Ages. Finally, an incomplete parapharase of the Categories is preserved in Martianus Capella's On Dialectic (the forth book of his The Marriage of Philosophy and Mercury, an influential textbook on the seven liberal arts dating from the fifth century CE). Even these few remarks suffice to document a sustained effort to provide the students with a Latin Organon that reflected the teaching needs of the time.

The key figure for the reception of Aristotle in the Latin world was Boethius. Best known for his Consolation of Philosophy, Boethius (c. 475-526) was the transmitter of the Aristotelian logical tradition to the early Middle Ages. His attitude to the text of Aristotle and Plato was not different from that of the other commentators of Late Antiquity. He regarded Plato and Aristotle as philosophical authorities and was persuaded that the best way to do philosophy was to read and comment on their works. Like the Platonists of Late Antiquity, he was convinced that Plato and Aristotle were in basic agreement, and that Aristotle's thought was to be understood as a genuine development of Plato's. In this frame of mind, Boethius planned to translate all the works of Aristotle that he could find along with all the dialogues of Plato, and to comment on all of them in order to show that Plato and Aristotle agreed on the most significant philosophical points (Boethius De Int.2 79. 9-80.9).

Boethius was able to execute this plan only in part. He managed to translate the Categories, the De Interpretatione, the Prior Analytics, the Topics and the Sophistical Refutations. In addition, he translated Porphyry's Isagoge. Boethius produced two commentaries on the Isagoge. Along with these commentaries, he wrote two commentaries on the De Interpretatione.

The practice of writing double commentaries is to be understood in the light of the concern for pedagogy that motivates the entire commentary tradition. Here is how Boethius explains why he wrote two commentaries (or rather two versions of the same commentary) on the De Interpretatione:

It has been my plan to disclose Aristotle's subtlest doctrines in a commentary organized in two versions; for what the first version contains prepares, to some extent, an easier path for those who are entering into these more profound and subtle matters. But because the second version develops in connection with the expositor's subtler doctrines, it is presented to be read and studied by those who are advanced in this inquiry and study (Boethius, In De Int.2 186. 2-9 after Kretzmann).

Boethius also wrote a commentary on the Categories. This commentary was intended to be an elementary exposition of the treatise. Boethius planned to write a second exposition, addressed to more advanced students (Boethius In Cat. 160 A-B). It is just unclear whether he was able to produce this more advanced commentary. (For further information on Boethius as a commentator, see Section 2 of the entry on Anicius Manlius Severinus Boethius.)

The exegetical labor on the Isagoge, the Categories and the De Intepretatione continued after Boethius. This labor took often the form of glosses, that is, annotations written in margin of copies of the Isagoge, the Categories and the De Interpretatione. A survey of the exegetical results reached in the early Latin Medieval tradition goes beyond the scope of this entry. I refer the reader to the Bibliography for further reading on the commentary tradition in the early Middle Ages.

7. Conclusion

There is no philosophy of the commentators in the sense of a definite set of doctrines that all the ancient commentators on Aristotle shared. What they shared was the practice of reading and commenting on the texts of Aristotle on the crucial assumption that Aristotle was a philosophical authority and his works deserved to be studied with great care.

Due to the almost complete loss of the relevant literature, we know very little about the first generation of interpreters of Aristotle. No picture of unity emerges from the little that has reached us. The notion that all these interpreters wrote commentaries is not supported by the information in our possession. The commentary eventually became the standard form of exegesis. But even within the commentary tradition there was room for a plurality of exegetical positions. Different commentators developed different lines of interpretations in the light of the different concerns that motivated their exegesis. The exegetical tradition that finds its culmination in Alexander of Aphrodisias was primarily (but not exclusively) motivated by an attempt to defend the philosophy of Aristotle in the context of the ancient debate between philosophical schools. Alexander of Aphrodisias viewed Aristotle as his master and devoted his exegetical works to explicate and extract Aristotle's distinctive philosophical position. While the Platonists of Late Antiquity put themselves in continuity with this tradition, their exegesis was largely an attempt to develop a philosophy that insisted on the continuity between Plato and Aristotle. They wrote their commentaries on the assumption that Aristotle and Plato were in substantial agreement.


The surviving ancient Greek commentaries on Aristotle are published in the series Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca, H. Diels (ed.), Berlin: Reimer 1882-1909. These commentaries are being translated in the Ancient Commentators on Aristotle Project. The General Editor is Richard Sorabji. For an update on the volumes published or in press see the website: Ancient Commentators on Aristotle Project.

Richard Sorabji has recently produced a sourcebook in three volumes:

A. Primary Sources in Translation

B. Secondary Sources

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Alexander of Aphrodisias | Ammonius | Aristotelianism: in the Renaissance | Aristotle | Boethius, Anicius Manlius Severinus | David | Elias | Neoplatonism | Olympiodorus | Philoponus | Plato | Plotinus | Porphyry | Simplicius


Thanks to Christopher Shields for commenting on a draft of this entry.