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Anomalous Monism

First published Tue Nov 8, 2005

Anomalous Monism is a theory of the relationship between mental and physical events and properties developed by Donald Davidson. It holds that every causally interacting mental event is identical to some physical event — particular mental events (tokens) are the very same events as particular physical events (token-identity, or monism). But it also claims that there can be no strict laws on the basis of which any mental event-type can predict, explain, be predicted or explained – therefore, mental properties cannot be reduced to physical properties (mental anomalism).

While neither of these components of the view, on its own, is novel, their relation is. According to Anomalous Monism, it is precisely because there can be no such strict laws that causally interacting mental events must be identical to some physical event. Previous identity theories of mind had held that claims concerning the identity of particular mental and physical events depended upon the discovery of lawlike relations between mental and physical properties. Empirical evidence for such laws was thus held to be required for particular identity claims. Davidson's position is dramatically different – it requires no empirical evidence and depends on there being no lawlike relations. It in effect justifies the token-identity of mental and physical events through arguing for the impossibility of type-identities between mental and physical properties or kinds.

The appeal of Anomalous Monism is due to these enigmatic features, a fairly straightforward argumentative structure, and its attempt to bring together an intuitively acceptable metaphysics with a sophisticated understanding of the relation between psychological and physical explanatory schemes.

1. The Argument for Anomalous Monism

The basic structure of the argument for Anomalous Monism is as follows. We start with the seemingly plausible assumption that some mental events, such as believing that it is raining, are caused by certain physical events, in this case the rain. Similarly, it is assumed that some physical events, such as one's arm rising, are caused by certain mental events, such as deciding to scratch one's head. Davidson calls this the Principle of Causal Interaction; we shall call it the interaction principle:

The Interaction Principle: Some mental events causally interact with some physical events

Davidson presents this assumption as obvious and not in need of justification, but we shall see that motivations for it can be found in parts of Davidson's writings (2.2). To this interaction principle is added the requirement that all singular causal interactions are covered by strict laws – laws with fully articulated antecedents which guarantee some fully articulated consequence (for caveats and details, see 3.1). Davidson calls this the Principle of the Nomological Character of Causality; we shall call it the cause-law principle:

The Cause-Law Principle: Events related as cause and effect are covered by strict laws

This cause-law principle was also initially assumed without argument by Davidson, though we shall see below (3.3) how he later came to try to justify it. Now, the assumptions so far seem to point directly to the existence of strict psychophysical laws – if some particular mental event m1 is caused by some particular physical event p1, then, given the cause-law principle, it seems to follow that there is a strict law of the form ‘P1 → M1’. That is, whenever events of kind P1 occur, events of kind M1 must follow. However, Davidson then claims that there can be no such laws. He calls this the Principle of the Anomalism of the Mental, and it holds that mental properties are not suitable for inclusion in strict laws of any kind; we shall call it the anomalism principle:

The Anomalism Principle: There are no strict laws on the basis of which mental events can predict, explain, or be predicted or explained by other events

Davidson offered loose ruminations concerning rationality and rationalizing explanations, which purportedly constitute the very nature of mental properties, in support of the anomalism principle (4.2). All of this will be discussed in detail below.

With the interaction principle, the cause-law principle, and the anomalism principle now in place, we can see that there is a tension in need of resolution. From the interaction and cause-law principles it follows that there must be strict laws covering the interaction between mental and physical events. But the anomalism principle entails that there are no strict psychophysical laws. How can all three principles be held simultaneously?

To resolve the tension, Davidson noted that while the cause-law principle requires that there be strict covering laws, it doesn't specify the vocabulary in which those laws must be formulated. If particular physical event p1 causes particular mental event m1, and there must be some strict law covering this interaction, but there is no strict law of the form ‘P1 → M1’, then there must be some other law, ‘?1 →?2’, which covers the causal relation between p1 and m1. That is, m1 and p1 must instantiate properties suitable for inclusion in strict laws; but since we know that M1 is not a property of this kind, m1 must instantiate some other property. Davidson's ingenious deduction at this point was that this property must be physical, since only the physical sciences hold out the promise of a closed system of strict laws (Davidson 1970, 223-24). Therefore, every causally interacting mental event must be token-identical to some physical event – hence, monism (5.1):

Monism: Every causally interacting mental event is token-identical to some physical event

In arguing in this way, Davidson relies upon a certain distinction between explanation and causation. While explanation is, intuitively, an intensional notion – one sensitive to how events are described – causation is extensional, obtaining between pairs of events independently of how they are described. For example, a bridge's collapse is explained by the explosion of a bomb. That explosion, let us suppose, was the most newsworthy event of the day. While the most newsworthy event of the day caused the bridge's collapse, ‘the most newsworthy event of the day’ does not explain that collapse. Telling someone that it was the most newsworthy event of the day that explained the bridge's collapse wouldn't provide an explanation – it wouldn't make the bridge's collapse intelligible to the audience — though it would pick out the actual cause. How the cause is described is relevant to whether an explanation occurs. Causes and effects can be accurately picked out using a variety of expressions, many of which are not explanatory. As we shall see, the distinction between causation and explanation is crucial to Anomalous Monism (6.1-6.5).

Finally, to alleviate certain concerns about the adequacy of the form of physicalism he was endorsing, Davidson endorsed a dependency relation of supervenience of the mental on the physical, and claimed that it was consistent with Anomalous Monism (5.1, 5.3) (Davidson 1970, 214; 1993; 1995, 266):

Supervenience of the Mental on the Physical: if two events share all of their physical properties, they will share all of their mental properties

In what follows (2-5), each step of this argument will be analyzed and discussed separately, but always with an eye to the overall argument. In 6, a central objection to Anomalous Monism – that it appears unable to account for the causal/explanatory power of mental events and properties – will be explained and discussed. Before concluding (8), the penultimate section will look briefly at the relationship between Anomalous Monism and other nonreductive monist positions (7).

2. Premise I: The Interaction Principle

The interaction principle states that some mental events causally interact with some physical events. In this section we will look briefly at a number of issues related to this principle: how mental and physical events are demarcated, the nature of events themselves, the scope of the interaction principle, the relationship between mental events and causation, and the use of the interaction principle in establishing one component of mental anomalism – psychological anomalism, according to which there can be no strict, purely psychological laws. Psychological anomalism is to be distinguished from psychophysical anomalism, which holds that there can be no strict psychophysical laws. This latter thesis will be explored in detail in our discussion of the anomalism principle (4).

2.1 Mental and Physical Events

Davidson essentially restricts the class of mental events with which Anomalous Monism is concerned to that of the propositional attitudes – states and events with psychological verbs such as ‘believes’, ‘desires’, ‘intends’ and others that subtend ‘that’- clauses, which relate subjects to propositional contents such as ‘it is raining outside’. Anomalous Monism thus does not address the status of mental events such as pains, tickles and the like -- ‘conscious’ or sentient mental events. It is concerned exclusively with sapient mental events — thoughts with propositional content that appear to lack any distinctive ‘feel’.

This is of course a controversial way of dividing the domain of the mental. Generally, Davidson expresses some skepticism about the possibility of formulating a clear and general definition of the class of mental phenomena (Davidson 1970, 211). And he is suspicious about the idea of mental states given to, but uninterpreted by, concepts (Davidson 1974a), which is how philosophers have often thought of conscious phenomena. But for current purposes the class of propositional attitudes will suffice as a criterion for the mental. One key reason for so limiting the reach of Anomalous Monism, as we shall see (4.2), is that it is the rational status of the relevant mental events that Davidson usually cites as responsible for mental anomalism. Conscious events have traditionally been thought to occur in non-rational animals, a position with which Davidson shows some sympathy (Davidson 1985a). Such events thus appear to fall outside of the domain of the rational, and thus outside of the purview of Davidson's argument.

Davidson is even less helpful about offering a criterion for the ‘physical’ (Davidson 1970, 211). One half-hearted attempt comes in the statement that ‘[p]hysical theory promises to provide a comprehensive closed system guaranteed to yield a standardized, unique description of every physical event couched in a vocabulary amenable to law” (Davidson 1970, 224). This is at best a promissory note about some future language of ‘physics’ – the ‘true’ physics — and, as we shall see (5.5), it incorporates a requirement of the causal closure of the physical domain that creates problems for certain aspects of Anomalous Monism. It is probably best to take a ‘physical’ description simply to be one that occurs in the language of a future science that is similar to what we call ‘physics’ today but with none of its inadequacies. One important component of such descriptions is their capacity to figure in strict laws of nature (see 3.1). While this is non-negotiable for physical terms, it is an open question for mental terms, and Davidson will be arguing (4) that the answer to this question is “No”.

When Davidson first argued for Anomalous Monism he subscribed to a causal criterion of event-individuation, according to which two events (event-descriptions) are identical (co-refer) if they share all the same causes and effects (Davidson 1969). He much later came to reject that criterion in favor of one according to which events are identical if and only if they occupy the same spatiotemporal region (Davidson 1985b). The difference between these views will not, however, be reflected in our discussion. It does not appear to affect either the derivation or the essential nature of Davidson's monism. For our purposes, Davidson's central claims are that what makes an event mental (or physical) is that it has a mental (or physical) description, and that events are concrete entities that can be described in many different ways (‘the flipping of the light switch’, ‘the illuminating of the room’ and ‘the alerting of the burglar that someone is home’ can all pick out the same one event in different terms).

The interaction principle states that at least some mental events cause and are caused by physical events (Davidson 1970, 208). This leaves open the possibility of mental events that do not causally interact with physical events. However, given Davidson's early views about event-individuation (the causal criterion) it is unclear that this possibility can be realized. His later views on event-individuation appear to leave this possibility open, but his general claims about the causal individuation of mental contents and attitudes (see 4.3 and 6.5 below) also stand in some tension with this possibility. In any case, Davidson goes on to say that he in fact believes that all mental events causally interact with physical events (Davidson 1970, 208), but he restricts his argument only to those that actually do. Given the pressures just noted in favor of the inclusive reading of the interaction principle, we shall assume it in what follows.

The interaction claim itself should be understood as follows: some events that have a mental description or instantiate a mental property cause and are caused by events that have a physical description or instantiate a physical property. Formulating the interaction principle in this way both clears the way for an extensional reading of the causal relation (events are causally related no matter how they are described), and also leaves open the possibility, which Davidson will subsequently argue for, that mental events in particular must have some non-mental description/instantiate some non-mental property. At this stage that possibility is left as an open question, but it is important to notice that for it to be an open question we need to at least allow for a distinction between events and the ways in which they are picked out in language.

2.2 Mental Causation

Though this will be focused on separately below (6), it is also important to recognize that we are beginning with the assumption that mental events cause and are caused by physical events. Many critics of anomalous monism have claimed that it is difficult to see how the position avoids epiphenomenalism – the view that mental events are causally impotent – and that anomalous monism is therefore unacceptable as an account of the place of the mental in the physical world. However, since Anomalous Monism is based upon the interaction principle, Davidson can claim in response that if Anomalous Monism is true, then mental events are already known to have a kind of causal efficacy. As we shall see, this point is not by itself sufficient to ward off all epiphenomenalist concerns about Anomalous Monism. But it does serve to remind us of the full framework within which challenges to Anomalous Monism must be assessed, and in particular brings out the reliance of that framework on specific assumptions about causality (see 4.3, 6, and Yalowitz 1998).

What needs to be noted at this point is that Davidson argued early on for the claim that mental events cause physical events, through noting a problem for non-causal accounts of action explanation (Davidson 1963). Mental events and states explain action by making it intelligible – rational – in light of the agent's beliefs and purposes. The challenge that Davidson raised for non-causal theories of action explanation was to account for the fact that, for any action performed, there may well be a large number of mental events and states true of the agent, and capable of rationalizing the action, but that don't thereby explain that action. The agent acted because of some specific beliefs and purposes, but other beliefs and purposes of his could just as easily rationalize that action, and thus be cited in its explanation. Was the agent moving his hand as he did because he wanted to swat the fly, relieve a cramp, or wave in greeting? He may well have wanted to achieve all three of these aims, but still only in fact performed the action because of one of these reasons. How do we understand ‘because’ so as to rule out the pretenders? Davidson's claim was that it is only if we understand ‘because’ as ‘was caused by’ that we can justifiably pick out the genuine explanans -- thereby imputing causal potency to mental events.

There have been sophisticated attempts, on the behalf of non-causal theories of action explanation, to respond to this challenge (von Wright 1971; Wilson 1985; Ginet 1995; for a good overview, see Stoutland 1976), but the point for now is simply to note that while Davidson assumes mental-physical causal interaction in the argument for Anomalous Monism, he does have this plausible independent rationale for the assumption (again, see 4.3 and 6.5 below for further motivations regarding this assumption) . Whether the ‘because’ rationale, and the point above about Anomalous Monism being defined partly in terms of the Principle of Causal Interaction, can survive the wave of criticism about epiphenomenalism, will be explored further below (6).

2.3 Psychological Anomalism

Davidson uses the interaction principle to establish directly one part of mental anomalism – psychological anomalism, which denies the possibility of strict, purely psychological laws of the form ‘M1 & M2 →M3’ (Davidson 1970, 224; Davidson 1974b, 243). For if physical events causally impact on mental events, then the mental domain is ‘open’, and any laws in which mental predicates figure will have to take this into account (for more on this point, see 5.5 on the causal closure of the physical domain). More generally, physical conditions will always play some role in any plausible psychological generalizations, because physical intervention (e.g. injury) is always a possibility and can prevent the occurrence of the consequent ‘M3’. Thus, the only potentially true and strict laws in which psychological predicates can figure are variants of the psychophysical form ‘P1 & M1 & M2 →M3’. Psychophysical anomalism, the other component of mental anomalism and the one that denies the possibility of such strict laws, is thus the view that Davidson focuses on establishing.

3. Premise II: The Cause-Law Principle

The cause-law principle states that events related as cause and effect are covered by strict laws. In the earliest formulations of Anomalous Monism, Davidson assumed but did not argue for this principle. His recent argument in support of it will be considered below (3.3), along with objections to the principle (3.4). But we need to consider the nature of the requirement contained in this claim, and how it relates to the framework out of which Anomalous Monism is deduced. In particular, the relationship between the cause-law principle and the distinction Davidson draws between homonomic and heteronomic generalizations needs to be sorted out.

3.1 Strict Laws

The nature of the strict laws required by the cause-law principle is as follows. For any causal relationship between particular events e1 and e2, there must be a law of the form ‘(C1 & D1) → D2’, where ‘C1’ states a set of standing conditions, and ‘D1’ is a description of e1 that is sufficient, given C1, for the occurrence of an event of the kind ‘D2’, which is a description of e2. Traditionally, a strict law has been thought of as one where the condition and event-types specified in the antecedent are such as to guarantee that the condition or event-types specified in the consequent occur — the latter must occur if the former in fact obtain. But indeterministic or probabilistic versions of strict laws are possible as well (Davidson 1970, 219). The point that distinguishes strict laws is not so much the guaranteeing of the effect by satisfaction of the antecedent as the inclusion, in the antecedent, of all conditions and events that can be stated that could possibly prevent the occurrence of the effect. A strict, indeterministic law would be one that specified everything required in order for some effect to occur. If the effect does not occur when those conditions obtain, there is nothing else that could be cited in explanation of this failure (other than the brute fact of an indeterministic universe). For reasons of simplicity, we will assume determinism in this discussion, though what is said about strict laws could be carried over without remainder to strict indeterministic laws.

The cause-law principle is aimed, in the first instance, at laws of succession, which cover singular causal relationships between events at distinct times. However, as will become clearer below, Davidson's denial of strict laws in which psychological predicates figure takes in bridge laws that would correlate simultaneous instantiations of mental and physical predicates as well – such as ‘P1 → M1’, ‘M1 → P1’, or ‘P1 ↔ M1’. Indeed, mental anomalism rejects the possibility of any strict law in which mental predicates figure (where those predicates figure essentially, and are not redundant) – including (as we have seen (2.3)) laws formulated with purely mental predicates ‘(M1 & M2) → M3’, as well as laws with mental predicates in either the antecedent or consequent, such as ‘(M1 & M2)→ P1’ and ‘(P1 & P2) → M1’ and mixed variants of these (see 4).

The denial of strict laws of these forms is consistent with allowing hedged versions of them which are qualified by a ceteris paribus clause. ‘All things being equal’ or ‘under normal conditions’, such psychological and psychophysical generalizations can, according to Davidson, be justifiably asserted (Davidson 1993, 9). As will be discussed below (4), denying the strict version of these generalizations amounts to denying that the qualifying clause ‘ceteris paribus’ can be fully explicated. That is, ‘ceteris paribus, ((M1 & M2) → P1)’ cannot be transformed into something like ‘(P2 & P3 & M1 & M2 & M3) → P1’ (for a related discussion of this particular issue, see the debate between Schiffer 1991 and Fodor 1991) .

3.2 Homonomic and Heteronomic Generalizations

The transformation process just discussed is related to the distinction Davidson draws between ‘homonomic’ and ‘heteronomic’ generalizations, which he portrays as an exhaustive distinction (Davidson 1970, 219). Davidson organizes his discussion of Anomalous Monism around this distinction, but as we shall see in this section, it is extremely problematic for the wider purposes of establishing Anomalous Monism. Ultimately it is best to set it aside and instead focus simply on the related (but by no means identical) distinction between strict and ceteris paribus laws. With this point in mind, this section can be safely skipped without losing the thread of the overall discussion of Anomalous Monism.

With regard to the distinction, Davidson writes:

[o]n the one hand, there are generalizations whose positive instances give us reason to believe the generalization itself could be improved upon by adding further provisos and conditions stated in the same general vocabulary as the original generalization. Such a generalization points to the form and vocabulary of the finished law: we may say that it is a homonomic generalization. On the other hand, there are generalizations which when instantiated may give us reason to believe there is a precise law at work, but one that can be stated only by shifting to a different vocabulary. We may call such generalizations heteronomic. (Davidson 1970, 219)

Davidson's claim is that generalizations in which mental properties figure can only be heteronomic, not homonomic, and that therefore there can be no strict psychological or psychophysical laws. In the passage above, Davidson maintains that the finished (i.e. strict) laws towards which both homonomic and heteronomic generalizations (both of which are ceteris paribus – see further below) point must be stated in a homogeneous vocabulary. (This reading of the passage is supported by Davidson's subsequent remark (Davidson 1970, 222) explaining the heteronomic character of psychophysical generalizations by appeal to various reasons for mental anomalism. This remark would not make sense if heteronomic statements could be made strict while incorporating both vocabularies.) It is important to see that this is equivalent to ruling out, by sheer definition, the possibility of heterogeneously formulated strict laws. This is extremely problematic, however, because it amounts to defining away the possibility of strict psychophysical laws – strict laws formulated in heterogeneous vocabulary. And that appears to beg one of the central questions that Davidson is investigating.

To see this, notice first that, according to Davidson's actual formulation, neither homonomic nor heteronomic generalizations are strict. Each of these generalizations is a ceteris paribus generalization at the time when its status is under consideration, and each points in the direction of a different sort of strict law relative to the original vocabulary in which it is formulated. The sort of strict law pointed to depends upon whether a change in vocabulary is required in articulating the conditions gestured at in the ceteris paribus clause. Davidson is quite clear on this: the homonomic/heteronomic distinction is made ‘within the category of the rude rule of thumb’ (Davidson 1970, 219; emphasis added). Since homonomic ceteris paribus generalizations are thus possible, the distinctions between homonomic/ heteronomic generalizations, on the one hand, and strict/ ceteris paribus laws, on the other, are not the same; not all ceteris paribus generalizations are heteronomic.

The central question now concerns the status of heterogeneously formulated strict laws. It would seem that Davidson's attack on the possibility of strict psychophysical laws is an attack on the possibility of (one form of) strict laws formulated in a heterogeneous vocabulary. But we have already observed that Davidson's own formulation of the homonomic/heteronomic distinction as exhaustive makes it difficult to see how the possibility of heterogeneously formulated strict laws could even be at issue, since they appear to be ruled out by definition. But there are a number of reasons against proceeding in this way. If we assumed the exhaustive nature of the homonomic/heteronomic distinction, then the interaction principle would guarantee the heteronomicity of generalizations that include psychological predicates, and thus mental anomalism. As a result, no independent argument for mental anomalism would be required; this holds for monism as well.

After all, as we have already seen, the interaction principle tells us that mental events causally interact with physical events, and this means that homonomicity is already ruled out – something other than just psychological vocabulary is needed in explicating psychological generalizations of the form ‘ceteris paribus, M1 & M2 → M3’. With heteronomicity the only remaining option, we could then directly draw the conclusion that the only strict laws that can cover mental event-tokens must be stated in an entirely different vocabulary. This is equivalent to mental anomalism. Furthermore, monism follows as well, since causally interacting mental events must be covered by some strict law (the cause-law principle), and the only candidate laws remaining contain no mental vocabulary -- therefore, mental events must instantiate whatever properties are capable of formulating such laws. Now, as we have seen (2.3), it is quite uncontroversial that there can be no strict, purely psychological laws, and the interaction principle expresses this. However, Davidson's homonomic/ heteronomic framework would allow us to draw directly from this uncontroversial point the far more controversial and interesting doctrines of psychophysical anomalism and monism, with no required route through the anomalism principle. That is too quick, and anyway inconsistent with Davidson's own explicit attempt at independent arguments for this principle. Indeed, on this way of thinking one cannot even formulate the question about the possibility of strict psychophysical laws. The only available formulation that is coherent and somewhat relevant is: ‘are generalizations in which psychological predicates figure homonomic or heteronomic?’ But this does not succeed in raising a question about strict psychophysical laws. It asks only whether there can be strict, purely psychological laws, or (barring that) concludes that there are no strict generalizations in which psychological predicates can figure at all. Clearly something has gone wrong, and the purported exhaustiveness of the homonomic/heteronomic distinction is the culprit.

What this suggests is that an argument is needed to rule out the possibility of heterogeneously formulated strict laws, otherwise the question of the possibility of strict psychophysical laws has simply been begged. And this means that we cannot assume the exhaustiveness of the homonomic/ heteronomic distinction at the start. In what follows, then, we will set aside Davidson's use of this distinction in our discussion of Anomalous Monism, and instead simply focus on the distinction between strict and ceteris paribus laws, which is at the very core of Davidson's discussion.

3.3 Justifying the Cause-Law Principle

Davidson argues for the cause-law principle that singular causal relations require strict covering laws on the basis of a conceptual interconnection between the concepts of physical object, event and law. As he says, “our concept of a physical object is the concept of an object whose changes are governed by laws” (Davidson 1995, 274). The interconnections are established partly in response to C.J. Ducasse's attempt, in reaction to Hume's regularity theory of causation, to define singular causal relations without appeal to covering laws (Ducasse 1926).

Simply put, Ducasse defined some particular event c as the cause of some effect e if and only if c was the only change occurring in the immediate environment of e just prior to e. The striking of the match is the cause of the flaming match just insofar as the striking is the only change occurring in the immediate vicinity of the flaming match just prior to the flaming of the match. Ducasse intended this definition to rebut Hume's claim that singular causal relations between particular events must be analyzed in terms of regularities between types of events (and thus laws). Indeed, Ducasse claimed that Hume was wrong to deny that we have the ability to perceive singular causal relations – this denial being the basis for Hume's subsequent regularity account (see 3.4). For, according to Ducasse, we can perceive that some event is the only change in the immediate environment of some subsequent event just prior to that event's occurrence. (We can, of course, be wrong in thinking that this is what we have in fact perceived. But as Ducasse points out, the same problem plagues Hume's own account – we can be wrong that what we have perceived are instances of types which bear a regular relation to each other. But this does not lead Hume to hold that since we can't infallibly perceive that some succession is an instance of a regularity, we cannot form the concept of causality in terms of regularity. The same thus applies to Ducasse's own account.)

Davidson notes the heavy dependence, in Ducasse's account, on the notion of a ‘change’. And he asks whether we really have a purchase on this concept absent appeal to laws. There are two aspects of this concern. First, the notion of ‘change’ is short for ‘change of predicate’ – a change occurs when a predicate true of some object (or not true of that object) ceases to be true (or comes to be true) of that object. And this leads directly to questions about how predicates are individuated and their relationship to laws (see below). Second, and at a more general level, the notion of ‘change’ has itself changed over time – for instance, Newtonian mechanics defines a change differently than Aristotelian physics, so that continuous motion counts as a change, and thus requires an explanation, according to the latter but not the former. Thus, the very notion of ‘change’ is theory dependent, and therefore (Davidson holds) presupposes the notion of ‘law’, in the sense that something counts as a change, and thus as having a cause, only against a background of theoretical principles.

This second point does not appear to deliver the result Davidson is after – establishing that each causal interaction must be covered by a particular strict law. For it is consistent with the claim that something is a change, and thus has a cause, only if certain theoretical assumptions are in place that these assumptions (for instance, that uniform rectilinear motion does not count as a change) cannot play the explanatory role for specific causal interactions that strict laws are supposed to play. They are simply of too general a nature – they don't enable predictions or explanations of any particular events. And in any case, there appears to be nothing in Davidson's considerations here that forces the requirement that the covering laws be strict as opposed to irreducibly ceteris paribus. (As we have already seen (3.1), Davidson himself has insisted upon the acceptability and ubiquity of such laws in scientific explanation.)

Returning to the first point about predicate-individuation, Davidson claims that “it is just the predicates which are projectible, the predicates that enter into valid inductions, that determine what counts as a change” (Davidson 1995, 272). We know from Nelson Goodman's ‘new riddle of induction’ (Goodman 1983) that we can invent predicates, such as ‘grue’ and ‘bleen’ (where an object is grue if it is green and examined before 2010 or otherwise blue, and an object is bleen if it is blue and examined before 2010 or otherwise green) so that a green object goes from being grue to bleen over the course of time without having changed in any intuitive sense. It will continue to be green, though it will also be true that it ceases to be grue and comes to be bleen. Contrary to much discussion of Goodman's riddle, Davidson holds that such unusual predicates can be projectible, and figure in laws, but only when appropriately paired with other such predicates ( “All emeralds are grue” is not lawlike, but “All emerires are grue” is (where “emerire” is true of emeralds examined before 2010 or otherwise sapphires ). What is crucial for Davidson seems to be that to understand the notion of change, which is so closely tied to the notion of causation, one must understand the notion of a projectible predicate – one appropriate for use in science – and this notion inevitably brings in the notion of law. Changes are described by predicates suitable for inclusion within laws. But how does this relate to the cause-law principle? Once again, it is unclear why Davidson would think that it is the notion of a strict law in particular that this line of argument motivates.

A related line of argument that Davidson offers (see 4.3) appears to suggest that dispositional predicates – those defined in terms of the effects they tend to bring about – are not suitable for inclusion in strict laws (generalizations in which they figure are always qualified by a ceteris paribus clause), but there must be strict laws at the bottom, so to speak, of the dispositional vocabulary. Davidson's discussion of this issue refers back to an older debate about the status of dispositional terms – specifically, whether they are ‘place-holders’ for predicates that are non-dispositional (‘intrinsic’ or ‘manifest’) (see Goodman 1983, 41ff). Whatever one's view about that issue, it again does not appear that Davidson has provided adequate argument for establishing that strict laws (as opposed to ceteris paribus laws) are required for our dispositional vocabulary to operate as it does. So Davidson does not appear to have provided the cause-law principle with a plausible rationale (for skepticism about this principle, see Anscombe 1971, Cartwright 1983, McDowell 1985, Hornsby 1985 and 1993, and 4.4 below). This is not to say that it is wrong, or even that it is implausible to assume it in his argument for Anomalous Monism. Many find the principle highly intuitive, and it is worthwhile to explore its relation to the other central claims in Davidson's framework.

3.4 Objections to the Cause-Law Principle

The cause-law principle has come in for a lot of criticism since it received its canonical formulation in Hume's regularity theory of causation, and it is worth briefly reviewing some of the central objections. This will make clear how important it is, for an argument such as Davidson's for Anomalous Monism, that some justification for the thesis be provided.

An initial objection is that Hume's analysis of singular causal statements (‘a caused b’ is true if and only if ‘whenever an A occurs, it is followed by an occurrence of a B’), which articulates his own version of the cause-law principle, is not an accurate rendering of the way in which we typically use the term ‘cause’. We are confident in judgments such as ‘Harry's smoking caused his lung cancer’ while knowing that in fact not all smokers are stricken by lung cancer. This point is entirely general – we make singular causal judgments all the time without believing in (indeed, while knowing the falsity of) the associated universal generalization (see Anscombe 1971). However, Davidson's extensionalism about causality provides a fairly straightforward response to this concern. His view is that while we may not believe in the associated universal generalization, that is consistent with there being some universal generalization, stated in a different vocabulary than the singular causal statement, which ‘covers’ that statement. Davidson indeed rejects Hume's analysis of singular causal statements in terms of universal generalizations — he holds that the requirement of such a covering generalization is necessary but not sufficient for the truth of such a statement (Davidson 1967).

While this response does appear to meet the objection, it raises the following concern, which is behind a related objection to the cause-law principle: no one in fact seems to know any true predictive ‘strict’ laws (in the literal sense of that term). Now, while it is certainly consistent with this point that there are or even must be such laws, it becomes more pressing to know why we should think this if we cannot even offer any examples. It is fine and good for Davidson to point to the possibility of strict covering laws that transcend our current knowledge, but we need to know why we should believe in such things. Science seems to have done well for itself without any apparent use of them.

Another objection to the cause-law principle comes from the state of contemporary physics. According to quantum mechanics, it is not simply difficult or impossible for us to state such laws for quantum phenomena. Rather, quantum theory appears to entail that determinism fails to obtain at the level of microparticles. What the theory and the behavior of such particles tells us is that causation, at least at the level of micro phenomena, is indeterministic. And this indeterminism is claimed to be inconsistent with the requirement of strict laws. This objection to the cause-law principle, then, is that philosophy should never dictate to science on empirical matters. Observation of the world tells us that strict laws are impossible in this domain even while causation is present, in direct contradiction of the cause-law principle.

Now, we have already seen Davidson's own response to this sort of objection (3.1). As traditionally construed, strict laws are supposed to guarantee the consequent condition on the basis of the antecedent condition. But they do not need to provide such a guarantee. What strict laws require is that the antecedent include all conditions and events that could possibly prevent the occurrence of the consequent. If the consequent does not occur when all these conditions have been accounted for, there is nothing else to be cited in explanation of the non-occurrence, other than the sheer brute fact of the indeterministic universe. So indeterministic causation is entirely consistent with the cause-law principle (Davidson 1970, 219). The determinist/indeterminist and strict/nonstrict law distinctions do not map neatly onto each other. An indeterministic law can be universal, exceptionless and true. This point does not appear to be recognized by central proponents of the indeterministic objection to strict laws (see Cartwright 1983).

A final objection to the cause-law principle which is more purely internal to the wider framework of Anomalous Monism has been put forth in McDowell 1985. McDowell claims to see a tension between Davidson's allegiance to the cause-law principle and his rejection of ‘the dualism of scheme and content’ Davidson 1974a – see 4.2.3). Briefly, the dualism Davidson opposes is the idea that, for instance, a perceptual judgment is the rational upshot of an interaction between a concept and an nonconceptualized experiential element – the sensory input. Given Davidson's systematic rejection of this idea, McDowell believes he ought to disavow the cause-law principle. McDowell doesn't think the principle is required for a minimal version of materialism (see 7.3), and without the need to justify materialism McDowell sees the principle as lacking any motivation in Davidson's framework.

How does the dualism between scheme and content figure into the cause-law principle? McDowell's thought here, which is not explained, might well be the following: Hume had argued for the cause-law principle on the basis of the claim that particular perceptual experience cannot account for the difference between particular event sequence pairs that are genuinely causal as opposed to merely temporal. In other words, there is no perceptual difference between merely temporal and ‘genuinely’ causal succession. In order to make that distinction, we are forced to look beyond particular sequences to sequence-types. Merely temporal sequences (a followed by b) don't generalize (Whenever A, B follows); genuinely causal sequences do generalize. Now, this point requires an invariant perceptual content between what purport to be two quite different conceptualizations (causal vs. merely temporal succession) – and for McDowell this manifests the dualism between perceptual given and conceptual scheme. McDowell's point, then, seems to be that Hume's own rationale for his regularity theory of causation — and thus the cause-law principle — depends upon the very distinction that Davidson has argued is a dogma and must be rejected. Therefore, Davidson should disavow the cause-law principle.

It is very unclear whether it is correct to think that Hume's line of argument (and in particular the idea of the invariant perceptual content) relies on the dualism at issue. Hume himself may have bought into that dualism, but it would seem that his argument can go forward while nonetheless rejecting the idea that the perceptual invariant is an unconceptualized sensory ‘given’. But in any case, so long as the rationale that Davidson offers for the cause-law principle steers clear of Hume's strategy for establishing his regularity theory of causation, it is not at all obvious that McDowell is correct in thinking that the cause-law principle is inextricably linked to the dualism of scheme and content. Indeed, it appears that Davidson's justificatory attempt, discussed above (3.3), avoids reliance on Hume's epistemology or theory of perception, whatever else its shortcomings.

4. Premise III: The Anomalism Principle

The anomalism principle states that there are no strict laws on the basis of which mental events can predict, explain, or be predicted or explained by other events. In this section we look at different interpretations of the argument for this principle. Davidson's own formulations, while suggestive, are notoriously vague and often appeal to very different sorts of considerations, including aspects of language and interpretation, questions about psychological explanation, and the nature of causality and dispositions. We shall be looking at specific interpretations as well as the problems they face in providing a compelling rationale for both the anomalism principle and Anomalous Monism.

While differing in important ways, the various formulations of the argument, as well as the objections to them, exhibit a discernible pattern: proponents of mental anomalism highlight some feature of mental properties that is claimed to (1) sharply individuate them from physical properties and (2) create a conceptual tension with physical properties that precludes the possibility of strict lawful relations between these properties. According to the objections, however, the highlighted feature of mental properties either does not serve to distinguish it from physical properties or does not actually stand in a sort of conceptual tension with physical properties that rules out lawlike relations. We will consider each interpretation, and its problems, in turn. In a later section (5.3) we will look at one further objection related to the anomalism principle – that it is inconsistent with Davidson's invocation of the doctrine that mental properties stand in a relation of supervenience to physical properties.

Mental anomalism, as initially formulated by Davidson, holds that there can be no strict laws on the basis of which mental events can be predicted and explained (Davidson 1970, 208). It is thus restricted to ruling out strict laws of succession with mental predicates occurring in the consequent – laws such as ‘P1 → M1’, ‘(M1 & P1) → M2’, or ‘M1 → M2’. More generally, it denies that the occurrence of particular mental events such as coming to believe or intend something, or intentionally acting in some way, can be explained by appeal to strict covering laws. But as becomes clear, Davidson's considered position rejects the possibility of any strict laws in which mental predicates figure – and this includes, in particular, bridge laws of the form ‘P1↔ M1’, which form the basis of type-identity theories of mind, as well as any strict laws with mental antecedents. We have already seen how strict purely psychological laws are ruled out by the interaction principle (2.3). So the focus now is strict psychophysical laws.

It is useful to view Davidson's attack against psychophysical laws in light of an argument, in vogue in the 1950s and 1960s, against the claim that reasons are causes of the actions they explain. This argument was referred to as the “Logical Connection Argument” (see Stoutland 1970). According to this argument, reasons cannot be held to explain actions by causing them because (1) causes and effects must be logically distinct from each other (one of Hume's requirements on causality) but (2) reasons and the actions they explain bear a quasi-logical connection to each other, by virtue of the rationalizing relation between them. That relationship is quasi-logical because not just any reason can explain any action – only those reasons which actually rationalize (make intelligible) an action can explain it. Davidson's own influential response to this argument was to distinguish between causal relations, which obtain between events no matter how they are described, and logical relations, which obtain between particular descriptions of events. The Logical Connection Argument fails to recognize this simple distinction. The distinction allowed Davidson to merge two key ideas in his theory of action – that reasons explain by causing, and that they explain by rationalizing (Davidson 1963, 13-17). As we shall see below, however, Davidson appears to accept a basic distinction at the heart of the Logical Connection Argument – that the rationalizing relationship bears a certain key property (quasi-logical status) that is at odds with the relationship between physically described, causally related events.

4.1 The Holism/Indeterminacy Arguments

Davidson's explicit considerations in favor of mental anomalism appeal to factors about the interpretation of behavior (linguistic as well as non-linguistic) and the ascription of mental states and events to persons. Several distinguishable features are noted – holism with respect to particular ascriptions, indeterminacy with respect to systematic interpretative frameworks, and the responsiveness of mental ascription to an ideal of rationality. According to holism, particular mental states can be cited in explanation of behavior only in the context of other mental states, whose ascription in turn depends upon others. Davidson claims that this dependency and holistic interrelatedness is “without limit” (Davidson 1970, 217). This echoes a related point he makes about the impossibility of definitional reduction of mental states in purely behavioristic terms, because of the ineliminable need for mental caveats (e.g. that the person understands, or notices or cares….) qualifying any attempt to state non-mental conditions for mental states.

Davidson presents these claims about definitional reduction as facts which “provide at best hints of why we should not expect nomological connections between the mental the physical” (Davidson 1970, 217). If definitional reduction of this kind were in fact impossible, it would rule out the possibility of a subclass of psychophysical laws – those relating mental states with non-intentionally described behavior – but the basis for this impossibility would not have been explained. In fact, however, without knowing what that basis is supposed to be, we have no reason to accept Davidson's claim that definitional reduction is indeed impossible. What prevents us from articulating all the required caveats? Without a rationale in hand, nothing prevents a reductionist from simply offering us detailed and sophisticated definitions and challenging us to come up with counterexamples. Something both principled and convincing is clearly needed. Davidson's concerns about definitional reduction are ‘hints’ concerning nomological reduction only in the sense that they draw out our intuitions about something standing in the way of formulating such laws. What that obstacle is needs clear formulation.

At times, Davidson appeared to flirt with the idea that the missing link was provided by the thesis of the indeterminacy of translation, developed by W.V Quine (Quine 1960) and endorsed by Davidson (Davidson 1970, 222; Davidson 1979). This thesis claims that there are empirically adequate but non-equivalent complete frameworks for assigning linguistic meanings and mental states to a person on the basis of his behavior, and that there is no fact of the matter that determines that one but not other such frameworks is correct. In particular, there are no physical facts, inside a person's body or head or outside in the external world, that could settle whether a person's words refer to some determinate range of objects rather than some other range, or whether one rather than another systematically interdependent set of mental states, with distinct distributions of truth values, is true of that person (see Davidson 1979). If the indeterminacy thesis is true, then on the face of it there would be some rationale for rejecting the possibility of psychophysical laws. For if all physical facts are consistent with different psychological/semantic assignments, then it seems that knowing all the physical facts could not tell us whether some mental states were true of some person, or some meaning true of her words – neither could be exceptionlessly predicted or explained, just as mental anomalism maintains.

There are two problems with this, however. First, this would do nothing to rule out certain psychophysical laws, such as those of the form ‘M1 → P1’. And so it couldn't ground the general thesis of mental anomalism. But more importantly, Davidson himself holds that the least controversial versions of indeterminacy, having to do with diverging reference schemes, amount to mere notational variance – as he puts it, meaning is what is invariant between empirically adequate translation schemes (Davidson 1977, 225; Davidson 1999a, 81). And given that such schemes are generated through a mechanical permutation function (Davidson 1979, 229-30) it is a relatively simple technical trick to take these different schemes into account when formulating psychophysical laws. The laws, for instance, could be formulated with disjunctive predicates (‘P1→ (M1 v M2 v M3’). Or, if such predicates are considered problematic, the laws could be of the form ‘P1→M*’, where ‘M*’ picks out the invariant element between the empirically equivalent theories. So it is not at all clear that indeterminacy in and of itself is capable of supporting an across-the-board rejection of strict psychological or psychophysical laws. And Davidson ultimately acknowledges this, in stating that anomalism would hold even if indeterminacy didn't (Davidson 1970, 222).

4.2 The Rationality Arguments

What is responsible for the possibility of indeterminacy, however, is the role of the principle of charity in formulating a theory of another person's behavior (Davidson 1970, 222-23) . And this principle is closely aligned for Davidson with mental anomalism. According to this principle, we must “try for a theory that finds him consistent, a believer of truths, and a lover of the good (all by our own lights, it goes without saying)” (Davidson 1970, 222). In the process of coming to understand another, by ascribing mental states and events to him and meanings to his words, we must, Davidson claims, stand ready to adjust previous assignments of meanings and mental states and events based upon new evidence about the person and how it relates to the overall project of finding him and his behavior intelligible. There are two key points here that for Davidson suggest mental anomalism. First, we never have all possible evidence – we must maintain an openness to better interpretations of previous behavior as new evidence becomes available. And second, ‘better’ interpretations are those made in light of the constitutive ideal of rationality. Consequently, Davidson claims, “there cannot be tight connections between the realms [of the mental and the physical] if each is to retain allegiance to its proper source of evidence” (Davidson 1970, 222).

While Davidson never offers any substantive account of what the proper source of evidence is for the physical, he often invokes the normative notion of rationality as constraining mental ascription, and it is clear that whatever constrains physical ascription is supposed to pull in a different and potentially conflicting direction. One suggestive way of getting at Davidson's idea here is through the traditional distinction between ‘normative’ and ‘descriptive’ concepts. When we look to uncover generalizations in the physically described world, what we find to follow from a certain set of conditions is a brute fact; our world is constituted in certain ways (in its governing laws) that we could imagine to be different. We may come to an empirical investigation with certain theoretical commitments which inevitably lead us to read the data in some ways rather than others; and there may indeed, as Davidson himself suggests, be constitutive a priori principles that govern very basic physical concepts such as ‘object’ and ‘event’ (Davidson 1970, 220; Davidson 1974b, 239; Davidson 1973, 254). However, the constraints are far looser and allow for a much wider variation in terms of empirical content – what can follow from what – than mental ascription. This line of thinking is suggestive, but it is in need of considerable tightening.

4.2.1 Normative vs. Descriptive Principles (Kim)

Jaegwon Kim's account of Davidson's position (Kim 1985) attempts to do just this. Kim argues that if there were strict lawlike relations between mental and physical predicates, the ‘brute factness’ and contingency of the physical would ‘infect’ the mental. For instance, rationality considerations will typically lead us to attribute a belief that q to a person if we attribute a belief that p and also attribute a belief that p entails q. According to Kim's account, beliefs involving very basic logical relations like this hold of necessity – we cannot make sense of possible worlds where beliefs of the first two kinds are attributed but not the third.

Now, this may appear to be too strong a claim, in light of Davidson's rejection of strict, purely psychological laws – mental anomalism rejects the possibility of any strict laws in which mental predicates figure, but Kim here appears to be deploying laws of the form ‘M1 & M2 → M3’. Kim would reply that Davidson is only interested in rejecting strict descriptive (i.e. explanatory, predictive) laws, not strict normative laws (see below). But in any case, it might not affect Kim's basic point to put the claim in terms of the necessity of the principle that, all things being equal, if an individual is attributed the first two beliefs he should be attributed the third. This allows for exceptions under unusual circumstances, but insists that attributions of such exceptions must be well motivated and also not generally the case . But there would nonetheless be a contrast with the merely contingent status of any physical regularities.

This contingency would ‘infect’ the mental, if physical predicates stood in strict lawful relations to mental predicates, in the following sense. Suppose that there were strict bridge laws correlating the instantiation of mental and physical properties, ‘P1 ↔ M1’ and ‘P2 ↔ M2’. Then, Kim argues, rational principles of the form ‘M1 → M2’ would enable the logical derivation of physical laws like ‘P1 → P2’. Indeed, the reverse would be true as well; starting with the physical law ‘P1 → P2’, and assuming the psychophysical bridge laws, one could derive the rational principle ‘M1 → M2’. However, the metaphysical status of the rational principle and the physical law are importantly different – rational principles are necessary, true in all possible worlds, while physical laws, being contingent, are not. In particular, with the bridge laws in place, a contingent physical law could explain (through derivation) the rational principle, undermining its status as necessary. This is how Kim makes sense of Davidson's suggestive claim that mental anomalism is grounded in the fact that mental and physical explanation owe their allegiance to different sources of evidence.

Kim's argument rests upon two central assumptions. First, it assumes that no distinction between strict and ceteris paribus laws need play any role in reconstructions of Davidson's argument. It is, purportedly, not the scope of a psychological law which accounts for an asymmetry with physical laws, but rather the point of each type of law (Kim 1985, 381). Second, it assumes that there is a firm distinction between descriptive laws and relations, on the one hand, and normative laws and relations, on the other, that can bear the weight of mental anomalism (Kim 1985, 383) The first assumption is clearly mistaken; as already noted, Davidson heavily emphasizes the focus on strict laws in his own definition of Anomalous Monism, and explicitly allows for the possibility of hedged laws incorporating mental predicates. And while Davidson does emphasize the normative status of mental predicates, he also recognizes, as we have already noted, a normative component to the physical realm, in constitutive a priori principles. There does not appear to be a significant distinction between descriptive and normative principles in Davidson's writings that can bear the burden of mental anomalism, as required on Kim's interpretation.

4.2.2 Rationality as An Ideal (McDowell)

John McDowell, in a discussion of Anomalous Monism, also emphasizes the normative nature of rationality, but focuses on its function as an ideal that cannot be adequately comprehended through the style of explanation suitable to the physical sciences (McDowell 1985). The attempt to do so would amount to a kind of psychologising of the notion of rationality in terms of how minds in fact work – the sorts of transitions between thoughts to which they generally are prone – that would be powerless to explain why minds must, generally, work that way. The explanation envisaged would be that any alternative lies outside the boundaries of what is intelligible (McDowell 1985, 391-2). The thought seems to be that minds generally work the way they do because they ought to work that way – working that way is working in accordance with how things are. It is not a mere brute fact that rationality marks the limits of intelligibility. Rather, the suggestion seems to be that our grasp of what rationality dictates is generally on target – captures what in fact is the case – though rationality outstrips our own particular grasp at any particular time. Because of this, we must be open to the possible reinterpretation of a person's behavior and psychological states in light of our changing conception of rationality, and how it changes cannot be anticipated in advance so that rationality could be codified into a permanent set of principles from which strict laws could be fashioned.

It is difficult to evaluate McDowell's reading of the basis for mental anomalism. Whether rationality is as he pictures it is controversial, and there certainly is no argument to the effect that rationality must be thought of in this way – as uncodifiable. So while McDowell's reading is suggestive, it doesn't amount to any kind of independent argument for mental anomalism. It does, however, point up a potentially interesting connection between Davidson's concerns about conceptual relativism (Davidson 1974a; see 3.4 above) and mental anomalism.

4.2.3 The Context/Complexity Argument (McDowell and Child)

As we have seen above, Kim thinks that mental anomalism is susceptible of a kind of proof. This seems to be something stronger than Davidson himself claims (Davidson 1970, 215). In light of Davidson's modesty about provability, and lack of explicit argumentation, some commentators (Child 1992; see also McDowell 1979) have suggested that mere reflection on the kinds of generalizations that we draw upon in coming to understand each other supports (but cannot prove) mental anomalism. Such generalizations are rules of thumb that hold only for the most part, and require, for their application to a given case, detailed contextual supplementation that cannot, by its nature, be included in anything like a universal generalization. The suggestion is that the sheer amount of contextual detail that would need to be accounted for in any statement with even a hope of being true is inappropriate for inclusion in strict lawful statements. A related strategy is to point to a lack of fixed, predetermined ends that all humans (or even any particular human over the course of her life) aim for in situations of choice, or values to maximize when deciding what to believe (such as simplicity, scope, and consistency in the case of theory choice) (Child 1992). The thought here is that if there are no such fixed ends or values, then no psychological generalization could be complete – since in particular contexts such ends or values play a crucial explanatory role in determining what to do or believe.

It would seem, however, that reflection on the level of detail required for strict laws in the physical sciences fails to provide for an interesting asymmetry here. If one considers the number of factors that would have to be taken in to account in order to state conditions that guarantee that when a match is struck it will produce a flame, the resulting strict law would be quite complex, and in a way not obviously different from any putative strict laws in which mental predicates figure, with contextual features included. And if there are indeed no fixed ends or values in the realm of choice and a decision, this can be accommodated in the same way – the contextual ends or values could themselves be included in the putative strict laws. This would complicate and expand the set of such laws, but as already noted this is not something that would set mental generalizations apart from physical ones. (For further discussion of rationality and the argument for Anomalous Monism see Yalowitz 1997 and Latham 1999.)

4.3 The Causal Definition Argument

We have been looking at different ways of making sense of and justifying Davidson's claim that mental anomalism stems from the constitutive role of rationality in mental ascription. In Davidson's writings, however, another line of argument often surfaces which focuses less on the rational nature of mental events and more on their causal nature. As we have already seen, in his earliest work on action Davidson argued that reasons explain actions by causing them, and he later came to emphasize that what makes mental states and events what they are is determined in part by their causes and effects. Particular psychological explanations are causal (they invoke causes – Davidson 1963), and are formulated in terms of causally defined concepts (for propositional attitudes, see Davidson 1987b, 41; for mental contents, see Davidson 1987a, 44). In later work he frequently notes the anomic nature of causal concepts and causal explanations, and how mental properties and reasons explanations are anomic because of this – “reason-explanations…are in some sense low-grade; they explain less than the best explanations in the hard sciences because of their heavy dependence on causal propensities” (Davidson 1987b, 42; see also Davidson 1991, 162). If mental concepts are causally defined, and strict laws do not employ causally defined concepts, then mental anomalism appears to follow straight away, without need of any detour through issues concerning the rationality of mental concepts.

Extending this reasoning, Davidson writes that

[m]ental concepts…appeal to causality because they are designed, like the concept of causality itself, to single out from the totality of circumstances which conspire to cause a given event just those factors that satisfy some particular explanatory interest. (Davidson 1991, 163)

This appears to ground the causal definition of anomic properties (whether mental or otherwise) in the fact that they answer to particular explanatory interests. This is contrasted with the case of ‘ultimate physical’ properties: “Explanation in terms of the ultimate physics, though it answers to various interests, is not interest relative” (Davidson 1987b, 45). This seems to collapse the distinction between psychology and all the other special sciences with respect to the question of anomalism. All of the latter answer to particular explanatory interests, and are thus selective with respect to the total sufficient condition for an effect-type (see Davidson 1987b, 45); the causal definition, and thus anomalism, of their vocabularies is owed to this interest-relativity and selectivity. ‘Ultimate physics’, on the other hand, “treats everything without exception as a cause of an event if it lies within physical reach (falls within the light cone leading to the effect)” (Davidson 1987b, 45).

Davidson repeats these sorts of claims about the anomic nature of causally defined properties in a number of places in later writings, but at no point does he clearly bring them into contact with his early remarks concerning the constitutive role of rationality in psychological ascription. And he never provides argument in support of this general thesis concerning causality. It is natural to wonder why, given this general thesis about causally defined concepts, rationality should be thought to underwrite mental anomalism. And it becomes imperative to know why that general thesis is plausible (for discussion of this point, see Yalowitz 1998).

With regard to the first issue, there is some evidence that Davidson is confusing two distinct questions: why mental concepts cannot stand in lawlike relation to physical concepts, and why mental concepts cannot be eliminated in favor of physical concepts in the explanation of human behavior. Given the general thesis, we have an understanding of why mental concepts are anomic. But this leaves open the question whether we ought to continue to traffic in anomic concepts generally, and mental concepts in particular. Why not eliminate them in favor of the nomic physical concepts? Here, the rationality of mental concepts may be thought to provide an answer. If we wish to understand why an agent performed the action that she did, as opposed to having a full sufficient causal explanation of why her body moved as it did, we are interested in a selective explanation – that part of the total sufficient condition that satisfies the particular explanatory interests behind reasons-explanations (Davidson 1991, 163). Those interests highlight the normative nature of reason and action — their responsiveness to the principle of charity and ideal of rationality. Rationality, on this line of thinking, does not account for mental anomalism; but it does speak to the question of mental realism (see further 6.4). (For further discussion of the anomic nature of causally defined concepts and its bearing on Anomalous Monism, see Yalowitz 1998.)

5. Monism

So far we have looked at Davidson's three premises in support of Anomalous Monism – the interaction, cause-law and anomalism principles. In this section, we examine the conclusion that Davidson draws on the basis of these principles – the token-identity theory of mental events, according to which every causally interacting mental event is token-identical to some physical event. We will look at the derivation and nature of this theory, some questions about its adequacy, as well as the additional thesis that mental properties supervene on physical properties. As we shall see, both the token-identity and supervenience claims turn out to be controversial, in their motivation as well as in their consistency with Anomalous Monism.

To begin with, it is worth pointing out that Davidson is concerned with the ontological status of events and not substances. Descartes, for instance, argued for the claim that mind and body are distinct entities. While Descartes' position has implications for accounts of mental events, the issues concerning event and substance identity are distinct (see Latham 2001). Davidson clearly takes himself to be establishing something that is inconsistent with Cartesian dualism, however, and it is useful briefly to look at how Anomalous Monism bears upon substance dualism. According to Descartes, mind and body are distinct substances in part because they do not share essential properties in common. In particular, minds do not occupy a spatial location, while bodies necessarily do. Since mental events thus constitute changes occurring in a nonspatially-located entity, they also do not occupy a spatial region. Bodily events, on the other hand, do occupy spatial locations by virtue of being changes in material substances, which themselves are spatially located. On Descartes' view, then, particular mental and physical events cannot be token-identical, since they fail to share a crucial property in common without which identity is unintelligible. While Anomalous Monism is not officially concerned with the ontological status of substances, it thus appears to have consequences that are inconsistent with Descartes' substance dualism — though it doesn't by itself establish substance monism, it does rule out the Cartesian thought that mental and physical events fail to be identical, and so conflicts with one of the bases for Cartesian substance dualism.

5.1 Token Identity

The structure of Davidson's derivation of the token-identity of causally interacting mental events with physical events appears to be straightforward: causally interacting mental events (the interaction principle) must instantiate some strict law property (the cause-law principle) but mental properties are not suitable for inclusion in strict laws (the anomalism principle). So mental events must instantiate some other property, which is suitable for such inclusion. Given Davidson's invocation of the causal closure of the physical domain, according to which every physical event has a physical explanation (see 5.5), he moves rather quickly to the conclusion that this other property must be physical, since closure entails that physical properties have a privileged status, which suggests that they hold out the promise of strict laws. (Davidson also has a tendency simply to identify as ‘physical’ those properties that figure in strict laws (Davidson 1970, 224; Davidson 1995, 266), but this would of course beg the question of mental anomalism.) Consequently, causally interacting mental events must be token-identical with physical events, ruling out Cartesian as well as other forms of dualism.

As we shall soon see (5.5), there are serious problems with the assumption of causal closure of the physical in Davidson's framework. It is difficult, however, to see how Davidson can move from the claim that mental events must instantiate non-mental, strict law properties to the claim that these properties must be physical without assuming closure. Why assume that only ‘physical’ properties are nomic? This raises interesting issues about the nomic status of other special sciences – the relevant ones here being biology and chemistry – but there do not appear to be explicit, conclusive resources in Davidson's own thinking for addressing this. Yalowitz 1998 has, however, provided an interpretation of Anomalous Monism stressing Davidson's views on causality and the nomic status of dispositions (see 4.3) in which causal closure is derived from the cause-law principle, token-identity and the anomalism of causally defined properties. On this interpretation, the strict law properties that mental events must instantiate turn out to be physical because only physical properties are non-causally individuated – all special science properties are causally individuated, and all such properties are anomic.

Davidson's token-identity theory is dramatically different than previous identity theories of mind, in both it's a priori status as well as its stance towards the role of laws in justifying monism. Previous theories had argued that claims concerning the identity of particular mental and physical events depended upon the discovery of lawlike relations between mental and physical properties. These theories thus held that empirical evidence supporting such laws was required for particular identity claims. According to Anomalous Monism, however, it is precisely because there can be no such strict laws that causally interacting mental events must be identical to some physical event. The token-identity thesis thus requires no empirical evidence and depends on there being no lawlike relations. It in effect justifies the token-identity of mental and physical events through arguing for the impossibility of type-identities between mental and physical properties or kinds (Davidson 1970, 209, 212-13; see Johnston 1985).

An important point to recognize in Davidson's version of token-identity is that he is not simply deriving the conclusion that mental events bear some property that we would intuitively acknowledge as ‘physical’ (such as spatial location). As pointed out in 2.1, the relevant ‘physical’ properties would more likely have to resemble the sorts of properties currently invoked in physics, our most mature science and the one closest to issuing in strict laws. This point has generated numerous objections to Davidson's token-identity theory, but it also has been overlooked by some objectors (see below). Davidson's central claim is that what makes a mental event identical to a physical event is that the mental event has a physical description. It has been objected that this is an extremely weak condition, making token-identity too trivial a thesis to merit the label of even the most minimal materialism (Latham 2003). In particular, an event might receive a physical description even though it might, for all we know, include, as a part, the thinking of an immaterial mind. Such an event would count as ‘physical’, according to Davidson, because of the physical description, but it would seem to be counterintuitive to accept this label given the presence and behavior of the immaterial mind. However, if all physical events have physical explanations, as Davidson clearly believes (and putting aside whether he should assume this), then the thinking/existence of this immaterial mind could have no causal consequences. We couldn't, then, ever know of it, or have any reason to think it obtained, and it is not clear that its sheer conceivability should count against Davidson's monism.

As we have seen, what is unusual about Davidson's monism is that it is established in an a priori fashion from the denial of type-identity between mental and physical properties. Davidson, however, also claims that the relation between the classes of properties is not merely haphazard or coincidental. A relationship of supervenience obtains between the two (Davidson 1970, 214; Davidson1973, 253; Davidson 1993; Davidson 1995, 266). A working statement of this relationship is that if two events fail to share a mental property, they will fail to share at least one physical property (Davidson 1995, 266) – or, equivalently, if two events share all of their physical properties, they will share all of their mental properties. It is meant to articulate a kind of dependency of the mental on the physical, and correlatively a kind of explanatory primacy to the physical, but without claiming any kind of reductive relation between the mental and the physical (see 5.4 below). The working statement's truth depends, it seems, on the thought that the distribution of physical properties somehow explains the distribution of mental properties – failure to share a mental property depends upon/is explained by failure to share at least one physical property. Typically, the supervenience relation is understood to issue in generalizations of the following kind: ‘P1 → M1’, ‘P2 → M1’, etc. (where antecedent and consequent occur at the same time). This allows for the empirical possibility that a number of different physical state kinds underlie the same mental state kind (see 7.2 for more on this).

There are many different conceptions of the supervenience relation (see Kim 1993b). In response to critical discussion of his views, Davidson came to identify his version with what is called “weak” supervenience, in contrast to “strong” and “global” supervenience. Briefly, the basic differences between these positions are as follows. Weak supervenience links specific mental and physical properties within but not across possible worlds, while strong supervenience links those properties across worlds. Global supervenience links the class of mental properties as a whole with the class of physical properties as a whole within but not across worlds, but does not constrain relations between specific pairs of mental and physical properties. What weak supervenience comes down to is the view that mental properties depend upon those physical properties they are correlated with within a particular possible world, but those very same physical properties may, in another possible world, correlate with very different (or even no) mental properties. Weak supervenience is thus stronger than global supervenience, in that it posits correlations between particular pairs of mental and physical properties, but weaker than strong supervenience in that it recognizes the possibility that these correlations can fail to obtain in other possible worlds.

5.2 Objections to Token Identity

The token-identity thesis has been the subject of a number of interesting criticisms. Many of them, however, are difficult to bring fully into contact with Davidson's own particular version of the thesis, primarily because Davidson's version is derived a priori from the other premises in his framework. So, for instance, it has been argued that mental events do not bear the burden of the spatiotemporal precision of physical events that they would need to if the former were genuinely identical to the latter (Hornsby 1981; Leder 1985). For example, it would seem arbitrary to identify the deduction of some conclusion from a chain of reasoning with some particular neural event or set of neural events occurring at a specific time and place in the brain – especially given the micro-precision of the neural framework. Further, it has been argued that the only empirical evidence for specific token-identities could be type-identities between other mental and physical properties (Leder 1985).

Such criticisms become difficult to evaluate given Davidson's a priori procedure for establishing the token-identity thesis. He can respond that we already know, a priori, that any particular mental event must instantiate some physical property if it causally interacts with any mental or physical event, given the cause-law and anomalism principles. Questions about how this physical property, whatever it is, relates to properties currently invoked in neuroscience come later and are necessarily secondary to this monistic conclusion. And there is no guarantee (indeed, it is quite unlikely) that neuroscientific properties currently in vogue are candidates for strict-law properties. Further, it would confuse epistemology with metaphysics to insist that, because we can only establish which physical property some mental token event instantiates by leaning on some type-correlations between other mental and physical properties, token-identity claims presuppose type-identity. How we discover the particular physical properties is one thing; whether there can be psychophysical laws is quite another, and not settled by the method of discovery.

We also need to keep in mind that Davidson embraces the possibility of substantive mental-physical correlations (ceteris paribus psychophysical laws), which directly address these epistemological issues. More generally, Davidson's token-identity claim is that the predicates that come to form the vocabulary of the as-yet unknown strict-law science will be capable of being used to describe mental events. While we cannot judge this claim by appealing to features of current neuroscience, it also seems that it should be possible to adjudicate conceivability concerns. And while we are not currently in the business of assigning fine-grained spatiotemporal parameters to mental events, it does not seem obvious that we couldn't come to accept such assignments on the basis of theoretical considerations without thereby committing ourselves to the existence of type-identities. However, Davidson himself ultimately came to reject the requirement that we must be capable of making such assignments in order to assert token-identity – there simply must be true assignments (Davidson 1999b; see further discussion of this issue in 7.3; for a different criticism of token-identity, see 7.4. For a criticism based upon Davidson's own treatment of causal explanation, see Horgan and Tye 1985).

5.3 Is Supervenience Consistent with Mental Anomalism?

The puzzling aspect of Davidson's doctrine of supervenience arises independently of fine points of the disagreement between the competing conceptions of supervenience sketched above (for a more wide-ranging discussion of supervenience and its problems, see Kim 1993b). Whether the dependency is between particular mental and physical properties, or sets of the two, and whether or not the dependency holds only within or also across possible worlds, it appears that it entails that there will exist strict laws on the basis of which mental events can be predicted and explained that were supposed to be ruled out by the anomalism principle. Davidson sometimes claims (Davidson 1995, 266) that supervenience is actually entailed by Anomalous Monism, in which case it would appear to follow that Anomalous Monism itself is an inconsistent theory – entailing both that there cannot be any strict psychophysical laws (the anomalism principle) and that there must be such laws (supervenience). But generally his position appears to be that Anomalous Monism is simply consistent with supervenience (Davidson 1993, 7). If supervenience and Anomalous Monism are indeed inconsistent, and the former is rejected, the question of the plausibility of a materialist position with no discernible relation between mental and physical properties arises (see 5.4).

Why does supervenience appear to generate strict laws? When Davidson first stated the supervenience claim, he articulated it in the following terms: “there cannot be two events alike in all physical respects but differing in some mental respects” (Davidson 1970, 214)). This formulation appears to entail strict psychophysical laws of the form ‘P1 → M1’. Davidson later came to focus on the inversion of this formulation: “if two events fail to share a mental property, they will fail to share at least one physical property” (Davidson 1995, 266). The advantage of this reformulation is that it brings out the fact that the requisite physical differences need not be the same in each case of mental difference (see Davidson 1973, 253-4). As Davidson says, “although supervenience entails that any change in a mental property p of a particular event e will be accompanied by a change in the physical properties of e, it does not entail that a change in p in other events will be accompanied by an identical change in the physical properties of those other events. Only the latter entailment would conflict with [Anomalous Monism]” (Davidson 1993, 7).

There seem to be two problems here, however. First, the inverted reformulation actually entails the original thesis – that if two events share all physical properties they will share all mental properties – and so once again generates strict psychophysical laws. Second, even if the accompanied physical changes can be different, that simply generates more strict psychophysical laws – ‘ P1 → M1’, ‘P2 → M1’, and so on. So it is hard to see why Davidson thinks that the second formulation is consistent with the anomalism principle.

Some defenders of Davidson (Child 1992, 224; see also Davidson 1973, 258) have responded to the apparent tension between supervenience and mental anomalism by emphasizing that the degree of detail that would have to go into the formulation of such laws would make them useless for prediction, since it is unlikely that the relevant initial conditions will repeat. But as we have seen (4.2.3), this seems to be true of any candidate for a strict law – it must take into account all possible interfering conditions, and doing so becomes quite unwieldy for generating predictions. And in any case, such laws would still provide strict explanations of mental events, contrary to Davidson's own formulation of mental anomalism. So the problem that supervenience ‘laws’ seem to pose for the anomalism principle remains.

Other defenders of Davidson (see MacDonalds 1986) have responded to this problem by arguing that the existence of strict supervenience laws is compatible with Anomalous Monism so long as we are not actually able to state any such laws and thus be in a position to use them to predict and explain actual mental events. This suggestion exploits a literal reading of Davidson's official statement of the anomalism principle, which denies the possibility of strict laws on the basis of which mental events can be explained or predicted. But in doing so, it makes Anomalous Monism into a much weaker position, dependent on the cognitive limitations of human beings. It in effects becomes a contingent epistemological position rather than the necessary metaphysical doctrine it purports to be.

Davidson in one place offers a very different suggestion in response to the problem. He claims that the supervenient relations between mental and physical predicates that he envisages are of a ceteris paribus nature. He accepts the requirement that any satisfactory account of the relation between mental and physical properties must permit appeal to local correlations and dependencies between specific mental and physical properties (Davidson 1993, 9). But he blocks any entailment from this requirement to strict psychophysical laws, suggesting that such ‘correlations’ and ‘dependencies’ are of a ceteris paribus form.

Such a ceteris paribus conception of supervenience has not been discussed in the extensive literature on the topic (its possibility is recognized and endorsed by Kim 1995, 136; however, see Kim 1993, 24-25) and it is unclear whether it can deliver a suitably strong notion of dependency to satisfy materialist intuitions. But it does seem to be an attractive way of reconciling supervenience with mental anomalism so that Anomalous Monism remains a consistent theory.

5.4 Supervenience and the Explanatory Primacy of the Physical

Why should the physical be given any explanatory primacy within Anomalous Monism? One reason is that while every mental event is physical, not all physical events are mental. Another is that, with Anomalous Monism already established, the only strict laws are strict physical laws. And given causal closure of the physical (see 5.5), every event that occurs must then have a physical explanation. These points motivate a kind of explanatory primacy to physical properties – they always explain the occurrence of physical events, which is not true of mental properties. However, none of these reasons motivates the sort of explanatory relation between physical and mental properties expressed in the supervenience claim (indeed, Davidson 1970, 214 describes these features of the physical as ‘bland’ and not indicative of any significant ontological bias towards the physical). Typically, supervenience claims are driven by the thought that one can only affect the higher-order (in this case mental) properties of an event or object by affecting its lower-order (physical) properties. One creates a beautiful statue by altering the physical properties of the marble; therefore, aesthetic properties supervene on physical properties. It appears that Davidson has in mind this sort of picture of the relation between physical and mental properties when he maintains that physical properties “determine” mental ones, and that the latter are “strongly dependent” on the former (Davidson1973, 253). But it is difficult to see how this claim is motivated in Davidson's framework. Davidson offers no argument in favor of supervenience, and although he does think that it is required of any acceptable theory of the relation between the mental and the physical (Davidson 1993, 9), he never explains this requirement.

One possible explanation that is close to Davidson's concerns is the following. If an event involving a change in mental properties occurs (e.g. a person comes to believe something), there must be some physical explanation of that event. Davidson's causal extensionalism would lead him to say that what is explained is the event of coming to believe, but under a physical description. ( And, as we shall see below (5.5), causal closure of the physical holds that all physical events have physical explanations.) So the physical explanation is not of that change in mental properties directly. But the physical explanation does concern a physical change that coincides with the change in mental properties. Without some sort of supervenience claim, this coincidence would be merely that – a brute fact that could just as well be otherwise. It would be perfectly possible for that exact same physical change to be accompanied by a completely different mental change or even no mental change at all. In considering the mental change, absolutely no explanatory significance could be accorded to the physical change. But since many mental changes (i.e. actions) involve overt bodily movements for which physical explanations are possible, this would threaten to bifurcate completely the explanations of bodily movements and actions; the former would have nothing to do with the latter, which seems quite counterintuitive and also surprising given Davidson's claim that actions are bodily movements (Davidson 1971, 49).

Continuing this line of thinking, a related reason for the supervenience claim, not mentioned by Davidson, is that it can otherwise appear completely miraculous that the ceteris paribus generalizations in psychology and the strict physical laws can so often converge in their predictions and explanations of events (see Cussins 1992, sect. 3, for discussion). If there are no explanatory relations between mental and physical properties, how is it possible that the psychological generalization that some individual will, given that he has certain reasons, open an umbrella on a certain occasion, predict an event that is also (under a different description) predicted by the physical laws? Such convergences occurs countless times each day, but it can appear to be only a miraculous coincidence unless there are explanatory relations between the mental and physical domains. Supervenience is one way of filling this explanatory void.

5.5 Causal Closure of the Physical in the Argument for Monism

Davidson's argument for monism is supposed to be based upon assumptions — the interaction, cause-law and anomalism principles – each of which, on its own, is consistent with some version of dualism. Otherwise, the question of monism or dualism will have been begged at the outset. And the respective version of dualism must be one the ruling out of which would be a substantive philosophical achievement. Otherwise, the interest of Anomalous Monism will have been compromised. As we shall now see, these two constraints appear to be violated by Davidson's rather innocuous-appearing invocation of a thesis of the causal closure of the physical:

Causal Closure of the Physical: every physical event has a physical explanation

In this section we look at this thesis and its bearing both on the argument for monism and, more broadly, the structure of Anomalous Monism.

Davidson assumes a version of this thesis when he writes “It is a feature of physical reality that physical change can be explained by laws that connect it with other changes and conditions physically described.” (Davidson 1970, 222). Davidson is claiming that it is part of the very nature of the physical realm that every physical event has a purely physical explanation – this is constitutive of the physical domain, a synthetic a priori principle (Davidson 1970, 221) . (Given Davidson's openness to the possibility of strict indeterministic laws (4.1), a more refined formulation of the closure principle would read ‘every physical event that has an explanation has a physical explanation’. For simplicity, we will work with the deterministic version stated above.) With this assumption in place, Davidson's subsequent denial of strict laws incorporating mental predicates amounts to denying that there can be more than one fully adequate and complete (i.e. strict) explanation of any physical event. Only physical explanations can constitute such explanations of physical phenomena. This assumption, however, is quite problematic given Davidson's wider aims of establishing monism.

This can be seen by considering the following dilemma: assuming the interaction principle, to hold that all causally explainable events have a physical causal explanation entails either that those mental events which cause physical events are also physical – token-identity – or else that these physical effects are overdetermined by both physical and mental events. Only these two mutually exclusive options would square the interaction principle with causal closure. Davidson cannot directly embrace the first horn of this dilemma, since this would eliminate the need for independent argument, appealing to mental anomalism, to establish the token-identity of those mental events with physical events. He must, then, acknowledge the ‘overdetermining’ dualism of the second horn as an open question. However, this is the only position available that neither begs the question about monism nor conflicts with the assumptions of closure and the interaction principle. It is therefore the only position that the subsequent argument for monism, appealing to mental anomalism (and assuming causal closure), would actually rule out. There would thus be no argument against other forms of dualism (such as Descartes' classic formulation) which denied causal closure of the physical domain.

Now, perhaps such dualistic conceptions of mind and nature have lost some credibility in the present philosophical and scientific climates (however, are they really any less credible than ‘overdetermining’ dualism, which on this view would be Davidson's central opponent?). However, it would be both self-defeating and wasteful to give up a general argument for monism that would ground their rejection by simply assuming closure, which then rules them out by stipulation. It is also very difficult to believe that Davidson's only opponent is ‘overdetermining’ dualism. It is far more ambitious and interesting to limit oneself to premises that many forms of dualism might share (such as the cause-law, interaction and anomalism principles) and then show that they inexorably lead to monism without reliance on the more controversial assumption of closure. That is true of Davidson's argument for monism shorn of any commitment to causal closure: someone who espouses dualism along with the cause-law, interaction, and anomalism principles but eschews causal closure is nevertheless shown by that argument that dualism is inconsistent with her other commitments.

It would seem, then, that causal closure should not simply be assumed in Davidson's setup. Is it entailed by anything necessary to that setup – the interaction, cause-law or anomalism principles? Davidson's talk of the ‘open’ nature of the mental domain (2.3) – the fact, expressed in the interaction principle, that some mental events have physical causes – may have led him to think that the ‘closed’ nature of the physical domain followed directly, especially given the cause-law principle. But this is false. Notice first that to hold, as Davidson does, that the mental is an ‘open’ system – that mental events causally interact with physical events – does not by itself entail that the physical is ‘closed’ in the sense that every causally explainable physical event has a physical cause. More importantly, even with the cause-law principle in place, the openness of the mental does not entail that the physical domain (or any other domain, for that matter) is closed. Closure also depends partly upon whether mental anomalism is true. The latter's falsity – the existence of strict psychophysical laws of succession – together with the cause-law and interaction principles is compatible with there not being a physical cause for every causally explainable physical event.

Furthermore, even if the interaction, cause-law and anomalism principles are all true, that still does not entail physical causal closure. There are events other than mental ones that are picked out in a non-physical vocabulary (e.g. biological events) and that cause physical events. Mental anomalism and monism do not entail anything about biology's nomic or ontological status, and so it is consistent with Anomalous Monism that not all physical events have physical causes (Crane 1995 fails to see this point). Therefore, neither the interaction nor the cause-law principles (even together with the anomalism principle) entails causal closure. If causal closure is to figure in the arguments for anomalism or monism, it can do so only as a primitive assumption relative to these other premises.

We now need to ask about the motivation for assuming causal closure. What work does it do that might be worth the price of letting go of the more general argument against dualism? Now, the clearest appearance of the causal closure thesis comes when Davidson is offering the official argument for the anomalism principle (Davidson 1970, 222). Rationality is there cited as the constitutive feature of the mental, while closure is cited as the constitutive feature of the physical. And it is then claimed that these disparate commitments ground the anomalism principle (see 4.2). Clearly the structure of this sort of argument requires some characterization of the essence of the physical, in contrast to the mental, and Davidson's strong commitment to causal closure may have led to its invocation here, due to a lack of alternatives. (He nonetheless insists that it does not provide a criterion of the physical (Davidson 1970, 211). But in any case, since an assumption of closure conflicts with the aims of establishing monism, and otherwise would appear question begging, it is probably best left as a conclusion to be derived rather than as playing any supporting role in establishing Anomalous Monism.

Without the assumption, however, the question arises as to how to demarcate the mental and physical vocabularies. Without such a demarcation in hand, it can appear difficult to state what exactly is at issue when it is asked whether there can be strict psychophysical laws in particular. How can we recognize such a purported law without knowing what makes something a physical (or mental) predicate? As noted above (2.1), Davidson despairs of the possibility of an intuitively adequate definition of the mental. However, he allows, for his purposes of establishing monism, a criterion in terms of intentionality – having a propositional content . And this criterion of the mental then allows us to pick out the ‘physical’ by exclusion, without need of a positive criterion like causal closure (Davidson 1970, 211). So the vocabulary-individuation problem does not appear significant enough, even by Davidson's own lights, to motivate the assumption of physical causal closure.

The assumption of causal closure thus conflicts with many of Davidson's aims and procedures in arguing for Anomalous Monism. And, as we have seen, the assumption is not required in order to establish mental anomalism (4). However, we have also seen that causal closure does appear to play a role in Davidson's actual derivation of token-identity – it allows him to identify the further property that causally interacting mental events must instantiate as ‘physical’ (5.1). On some readings of the anomalism principle, however, this role can be eliminated (see 4.3, and Yalowitz 1998). Thus, although there is ample reason for setting the causal closure thesis aside from the general framework within which the argument for Anomalous Monism takes place, its ultimate status is unclear. (For discussion of how causal closure may itself be deduced from Davidson's framework once Anomalous Monism is in place, see Yalowitz 1998, 225.)

6. The Epiphenomenalism Objections

It has been widely held that Anomalous Monism cannot avoid epiphenomenalism – the view that mental events lack causal/explanatory powers entirely (though perhaps they can be causally impacted on by non-mental events). At a first approximation, the concern derives from a tension between mental anomalism and the apparently privileged status assigned to physical properties in Davidson's framework – in particular, that all events are physical, and all physical events have a strict explanation in terms of other physical events. It then becomes an important question what sort of explanatory role mental properties can play.

Some welcome this result, holding that mental events explain actions in a sui generis way not accountable for in the terms of typical scientific explanations (see von Wright 1971; Stoutland 1976; Wilson 1985; Ginet 1995). Many, however, see this charge as devastating to the prospects of Anomalous Monism's attempt to occupy a position between reductionist materialism and dualism. Without a distinctive causal role for mental events to play in the explanation of action, many think that they would lack the sort of robust reality needed to compete with reductionism and dualism. On this way of thinking, only causal powers can justify mental realism. So if Anomalous Monism cannot avoid epiphenomenalism, it appears to open the door to eliminativist materialism, which holds that mental vocabulary and explanations are vacuous and ought to be thrown out and replaced by neuroscience (assuming, which seems extremely doubtful, that neuroscience can itself supply strict laws – if not, then this line of thought would lead to throwing out all but ‘physical’ strict law properties and explanations).

6.1 Are Mental Properties Causally Relevant?

The epiphenomenalist worry arises from two points that are absolutely basic to Anomalous Monism – first, that mental events are at the same time physical events, and, second, that while mental predicates cannot figure into strict causal laws, physical predicates must. An early critic of Anomalous Monism, Ted Honderich (Honderich 1982 – for related literature, see Campbell 2003), articulates the worry by arguing, first, that not all properties of an event are casually relevant to its effect. For instance, the color of a piece of fruit has no effect on its measurement – when the fruit is placed on a scale, the subsequent movement of the weight indicator is not influenced by the fruit's color. According to Honderich, the color is therefore a causally irrelevant property of the event (of placing the green fruit on the scale), while the weight of the fruit is a causally relevant property. Honderich then asks: what accounts for this distinction between causally relevant and irrelevant properties? And he claims that only properties that figure in strict laws – physical properties – are candidates for casual relevance. There is no strict lawlike relation between being green and the resulting measurement, while, according to Honderich, there is such a relation between the weight of the fruit and that measurement.

Honderich thinks that this simple point generalizes and shows that, within the framework of Anomalous Monism, mental properties are not causally relevant because they are not lawlike. His argument can be understood as follows: since Anomalous Monism insists that mental events have physical properties that can be related, by strict law, to the effects of those events, and also insists that such events' mental properties cannot be so related, it is only ‘by virtue’ of its physical (i.e. strict lawlike) properties that a mental event causes what it does. Its mental properties, and thus its being the particular kind of mental event that it is, play no role in its causal powers. Thus, Honderich suggests that the cause-law principle must be articulated slightly differently – as the Principle of the Nomological Character of Causally Relevant Properties. This nomological property principle rules out the causal relevance of anomic mental properties.

Honderich's argument is instructive for a more general consideration of the wave of epiphenomenalist criticisms lobbed at Anomalous Monism. First, Honderich's distinction between causally relevant and irrelevant properties is completely insensitive to the question of what is being explained or caused, which effect is under consideration. Consider the fruit example. While the color of the fruit has no causal relevance to its measurement, that is not the only effect of the event of putting the fruit on the scale. The color catches the eye of a customer, bleeds onto the scale and changes its color, and causes a host of other effects that are not salient when considering only the effect of the measurement. Salience is dependent on explanatory interests, and if we shift those interests, what was an irrelevant property with respect to one effect may be a relevant property with respect to another (more on how this bears on mental causation in 6.4 below).

Second, Honderich arrives at the view that an event's physical properties are the only causally relevant ones through reflecting on Anomalous Monism's insistence on the cause-law principle in light of the anomalism principle. If mental events must instantiate physical properties – strict-law properties – and all causal relations must be covered by strict causal laws, then an event's having such properties is a necessary condition for standing in causal relations. Davidson can agree with all of this. However, Honderich concludes from this that it is only ‘by virtue’ of its physical properties that an event stands in causal relations. This ‘by virtue’ claim then allows Honderich to move directly to the conclusion that only physical properties are casually relevant. What enables (i.e. is necessary for) causation is thus held to be responsible for causation. But this is disputable. Not all necessary conditions of some phenomenon are explanatory conditions – conditions ‘responsible for’ that phenomenon. For example, a person can talk only if she was born – having been born is thus a necessary condition of her talking. However, her ability to talk is not explained by her having been born. It is not ‘by virtue’ of being born that she can talk, though the former is a necessary condition of the latter. Davidson himself expresses skepticism about the intelligibility of his critics' use of the ‘by virtue’ locution in discussing Anomalous Monism (Davidson 1993, 6, 13) (see further 6.2).

6.2 Causation vs. Explanation

The point that causal explanation is interest-relative, and must be sensitive to what one wishes to explain, is not novel. But it is a point that often gets lost in epiphenomenalist criticisms of Anomalous Monism. However, it is also a point that invites important questions about the relations and differences between causation and explanation. As we have seen (1), Davidson insists on a firm distinction between causation, which is a metaphysical relation between particular events independently of how they are described, and explanation, which concerns events only as they are described in particular ways. Thus, he is inclined to dismiss the epiphenomenalist concerns about Anomalous Monism, and the locution of ‘causally relevant and irrelevant properties’ as based upon a confusion and certainly a different metaphysical framework than that assumed by Anomalous Monism. Events themselves – rather than any particular aspect or property of them – cause other events. Our descriptions of these events (what we speak of as their aspects or properties) explain why effects described in certain ways occur. Mental descriptions explain actions by rationalizing them – making them intelligible in light of the agent's beliefs and purposes. The mental event that explains an action by rationalizing it is a cause of that action – otherwise, as discussed above (2.2), there would be no way of answering the question concerning which of the many mental events that rationalize some action are the ones that actually explain its occurrence (see also 6.5). That mental event is also a physical event (as is the action it explains), according to Anomalous Monism, because it stands in causal relations (the interaction principle), and thus (given the cause-law and anomalism principles) must instantiate physical (strict-law) properties. But properties themselves don't cause anything, only instances of properties – and these are the events that bear or instantiate them.

Is this point really responsive to Honderich's concern? It is instructive to observe how some proponents of Anomalous Monism (Macdonalds1986) have attempted to defended Davidson from epiphenomenalist concerns by exploiting the point in the following way. Honderich has insisted that the only causally relevant properties of events are strict-law properties. But properties don't cause anything; only their instances do. And particular, causally interacting mental events are instances of strict-law properties, according to the monistic component of Anomalous Monism. So Honderich's nomological property principle must itself be amended to the Principle of the Nomological Character of Causally Relevant Instances of Properties. Mental properties are causally relevant, according to this principle, because their instantiations are also instances of nomic properties, and nomic properties are paradigm examples of causally relevant properties.

However, it can reasonably be wondered how this line of thinking is responsive to the point that appears to be underlying Honderich's nomological property principle. After all, the issue under consideration has been whether mental properties are relevant to explanation (recall the discussion of the color of the fruit). The Macdonalds' insistence that they are turns on the point that only instances of properties cause anything. But instances are neither relevant nor irrelevant. At best, they either have or lack causal efficacy-- they are or are not responsible for bringing about some effect or other. The Macdonalds have perhaps established that because physical events are paradigm examples of causally efficacious events, then since, according the Anomalous Monism, mental events are physical events, mental events inherit any causal efficacy had by physical events. But that is quite different than establishing that mental properties are explanatorily relevant — that an event's being a mental kind of event matters to the occurrence of any effects in the world.

6.3 Are Mental Properties Explanatorily Relevant?

Jaegwon Kim, a persistent critic of Anomalous Monism's ability adequately to account for mental causation, has pressed this line of thought — that mental properties are not explanatorily relevant -- against Davidson's extensionalist line of defense. Kim in effect grants Davidson the point (6.2) that Anomalous Monism can account for the causal efficacy of mental events in the sense just discussed (Kim 1993a, 20), but he does not see this as responsive to the real issue of concern. The question “What is it about events c and e that makes it the case that c is a cause of e?” is a good one, and requires an answer of the form “Because c is an event of kind F and e is an event of kind G, and there exists a law of the appropriate kind connecting F-events with G-events” (Kim 1993a, 22). Kim's point can be put either in terms of how, given mental anomalism, mental properties can be causally efficacious or have a causal role (as Kim himself tends to put things), or in terms of how mental properties can be explanatory – i.e. how mental properties can explain the obtaining of causal relations between particular events so long as one acknowledges that such causal relations obtain because these events are of certain kinds, or have certain properties.

Now, as we have seen (6.1), Davidson's invocation of the cause-law principle does not by itself commit him to acknowledging this point that mental properties themselves need to be causally efficacious/ play an explanatory role – necessary conditions for causation are not explanatory conditions. However, Davidson does indeed seem to make this acknowledgement, in two different ways. First, he reminds us that while Anomalous Monism rejects the possibility of strict laws in which mental predicates can figure, it allows for ceteris paribus psychological and psychophysical laws (see also 5.3). So if backing by some law is sufficient for causal efficacy, as is suggested in Kim's objection, then mental properties are causally efficacious. Second, as Kim himself notes, Davidson appeals to the supervenience of mental properties on physical properties in order to ground the explanatory role of mental properties. Davidson says that “properties are causally efficacious if they make a difference to what individual events cause, and supervenience ensures that mental properties do make a difference to what mental events cause” (Davidson 1993, 15). Each of these moves makes sense only if Davidson accepts Kim's point that causal relations between particular events obtain because the events instantiate specific properties.

The first point does not get developed by Davidson in any systematic way, though it has been explored by others interested in defending nonreductive monism from epiphenomenalist concerns. Some have focused on exploiting ceteris paribus covering laws for psychophysical casual relations, claiming that this allows mental properties to be sufficient for their effects, thus providing the needed type of explanatory role (McLaughlin 1989, Fodor 1989 and 1991). Others have attempted to sidestep the issue of covering laws entirely by appealing directly to the truth of psychological and psychophysical counterfactuals in grounding the explanatory role of mental properties (LePore and Loewer 1987 and 1989, Horgan 1989). Davidson himself instead focused on supervenience (although as we are about to see, the possibility of ceteris paribus laws enters into his account).

Supervenience implies that “if two events differ in their psychological properties, they differ in their physical properties (which we assume to be casually efficacious). If supervenience holds, psychological properties make a difference to the causal relations of an event, for they matter to the physical properties, and the physical properties matter to causal relations” (Davidson 1993, 14). The point here is not simply that mental properties inherit or piggyback on the causal powers of the physical properties on which they supervene. Rather, Davidson appears to be claiming that mental properties influence the causal powers of their subvenient physical properties.

One problem with Davidson's response here is its reversal of the dependency relationship between mental and physical properties typically claimed in supervenience relationships. As we have seen (5.4), a central rationale for positing supervenience is to mark a kind of explanatory primacy to the subvenient properties. And this is reflected in the first part of Davidson's formulation above – surely a difference in psychological properties entails (requires) a difference in physical properties because the difference in physical properties is needed in order to explain the difference in psychological properties. So the sense in which psychological properties ‘matter’ to physical properties is that changing the former amounts to a change in the latter because a change in the latter explains a change in the former. This does not appear to be helpful in establishing the casual efficacy of mental properties. Another problem, discussed above (5.3), is that it is difficult to see how a supervenience relation of sufficient power to make mental properties explanatory of an event's physical properties in the way Davidson seems to suggest does not issue in strict laws. So it is unclear how supervenience is consistent with the anomalism principle, and thus how it can help block epiphenomenalist concerns, although we did previously note one potentially worthwhile but unexplored possibility – a ceteris paribus supervenience relation – which Davidson endorses.

6.4 The Explanatory Exclusion Objection

Kim has explored a related but different route from Anomalous Monism to mental epiphenomenalism – the problem of explanatory exclusion (Kim 1989, 44). A causal explanation of an event cites a sufficient condition for that event's occurrence. This seems to exclude the possibility of other independent causes or explanations of that event. So if, as Anomalous Monism entails, physics can provide a sufficient explanation of any particular event, there appears to be no room for an independent and irreducible mental explanation of an event (Davidson 1993, 15). It is because the cause instantiated some particular physical property that the effect (which happens to instantiate a mental property) came about. Any mental properties that the cause instantiates seem superfluous in explaining why the effect occurred – unless those properties are identical or related in some strict lawlike way to the physical properties, something ruled out by the anomalism principle.

Davidson responds to this problem by articulating what a ‘sufficient’ explanation involves: ‘the’ cause must take in to account all possible interfering conditions, everything in the history of the universe that has causal bearing on the effect. Otherwise, the cited ‘cause’ would not, strictly speaking, be sufficient for the occurrence of the effect – something not cited could interfere with the occurrence of the effect. But given supervenience, ‘the’ cause, understood in this way, will necessarily include reference to its mental components, if any. For if they were different, then the physical components of the cause would also differ, and thus the resultant effect would be different from what it actually it is. Davidson concludes that any sufficient explanation of the actual, particular effect (as opposed to a similar but numerically distinct event) will need to include reference to any mental properties present in the cause, since they depend upon the physical properties of that cause and thus cannot vary without this affecting both the cause and the effect.

This response does not appear to meet the explanatory exclusion objection, however, since once we have cited all the required physical properties, it does not seem that we need to cite any other properties in order to explain fully the effect. Davidson is aware of this and so claims further that citing only the physical properties of the cause to provide a sufficient explanation of the effect does not address the particular interests that psychological explanations of actions serve – providing the reasons of the agent in light of which she performed the action that she did. Serving these explanatory interests compensates for the fact that such explanations cannot be sharpened into strict laws or folded neatly into physical laws (Davidson 1991, 163). We understand why the agent waved her hand – why the effect is of the mental kind ‘waving one's hand’ (as opposed to merely ‘one's hand going up and down’) — by citing mental properties of the causing event, such as her wanting to greet her friend. The citation of physical properties of the causing event and the associated mere bodily movement will not (given mental anomalism) bring about such understanding.

Here we see the interest-relativity of explanation and its bearing on causal relevance (6.1) playing an important role for Davidson. Mental properties must be cited if we want a rational explanation of mental effects. Davidson's response to epiphenomenalist concerns can thus be described as a kind of ‘dual explananda’ theory of the explanatory role of mental properties. According to this theory, for every (causally interacting) mental event there are two distinct occurrences in need of explanation: an event of a certain physical type and an event of a certain mental type. Mental properties are accorded an ineliminable and (given Anomalous Monism) irreducible explanatory role by virtue of their singular capacity to make intelligible the occurrence of other mental properties through the sui generis relation of rationalization.

It should be pointed out, however, that this does not entail that only mental properties can explain the occurrence of other mental properties. That would lead to an “outlet” problem, with mental properties being explanatorily insulated from physical properties – something inconsistent with the way in which we typically think of mental-physical interaction. A blow to the head can, for instance, explain the occurrence of a thought. And a thought can explain the movement of an object, as when my decision to quench my thirst leads to the movement of a glass of water to my lips. However, the blow cannot rationalize the thought, and the decision cannot rationalize the movement of the glass (though it can rationalize the action of moving the glass). So long as there are occurrences of mental properties in need of the distinctive kind of explanation provided by rationalization, mental properties occupy an ineliminable explanatory role. And given Anomalous Monism, that role is irreducible. It is worth noting that this dual explananda strategy is consistent with the causal closure of the physical (Crane 1995 seems to miss this possibility) — every physical event can have a physical explanation, even if the mental component of some physical events can be rationally explained only through appeal to mental components of the causing event. Therefore, however causal closure ultimately enters into Anomalous Monism (see 5.5), it does not appear to create any further problems for Anomalous Monism's ability to account for the ineliminable, irreducible explanatory role of mental properties.

The interest-relativity of causal explanation previously discussed (6.1) is thus crucial for grounding the ineliminable explanatory role of mental properties within the framework of Anomalous Monism. If, as Anomalous Monism contends, mental event-types such as actions are not reducible to physical-event types, then the only way to explain actions (as opposed to mere bodily movements) so as to make them intelligible is by appeal to the mental properties of the cause – reasons.

6.5 The Causal Constitution of Reasons

A final point to consider in evaluating the epiphenomenalist objections to Anomalous Monism is the way in which causality enters into the constitution of reasons and reasons-explanations according to Davidson. Before we have established the anomalism principle, or go on to derive monism, we already know that reasons explain action by causing them (the ‘because’ problem discussed in 2.2). And, as we have seen (4.3), we know that propositional attitudes and mental contents are individuated, and thus defined, partially in terms of what they are caused by and cause (for attitudes, see Davidson 1987b, 41; for contents, see Davidson 1987a, 444). But if something cannot even be recognized as a reason unless it is a cause, then the charge that mental properties are causally impotent appears to have difficulty getting any traction. And since these claims are prior to the argument for monism, they are neutral about whatever else reasons must be in order to be causes. So reasons must be recognized as causes prior to any discovery that they are also physical events. This appears to secure the causal potency of reasons in a way entirely independent of the claim of token-identity (6.2). Within Davidson's framework, reasons can only play the rationalizing and explanatory role that they do by virtue of their causal nature.

Many of Anomalous Monism's epiphenomenalist critics do not address this rich causal background. As we have seen, the background is not sufficient by itself to silence all epiphenomenalist concerns. But it does significantly affect how those concerns can be addressed. Anomalous Monism is clearly deeply committed, at a number of levels, to the causal efficacy and relevance of the mental, and so charity suggests that we try to understood it in a way such that these commitments are respected. The dual explananda strategy discussed above (6.4) provides one promising framework for doing this, while at the same time displaying sensitivity to the sorts of concerns driving the epiphenomenalist objections.

7. Related Views

There are a number of philosophers and traditions that share the two key features of Anomalous Monism: its rejection of any reductive relationship between mental and physical events and properties, and its assertion of monism. In this section, we look briefly at one classic precursor to Anomalous Monism as well as several more recently developed positions that share these features. The comparisons help to shed further light on Anomalous Monism.

At the most general level, one distinctive component of Anomalous Monism is its a priori status. It is deduced logically from what are plausibly claimed to be a bland set of assumptions themselves not clearly empirical in nature. (Certainly the anomalism principle is not empirical. While the cause-law principle has been claimed to be an empirical, and false, assumption (Cartwright 1983 – see 3.4), we have seen (3.3) that Davidson himself views it as a priori. The interaction principle does not appear to be based upon empirical assumptions.) This a priori status sets Anomalous Monism apart from other forms of nonreductive monism that have been developed since Anomalous Monism was formulated. However, Anomalous Monism's clearest philosophical ancestor, Spinoza (Spinoza 1985), shared this a priori perspective., and Davidson explicitly acknowledges Spinoza's anticipation of Anomalous Monism (Davidson 1999c). We begin with him.

7.1 Spinoza's Parallelism

Spinoza held that the world was composed of only one kind of substance or stuff (monism) which exhibits distinct realms of physical and mental properties. On the standard reading of Spinoza's metaphysics, these two realms are causally insulated from each other – while mental events can cause and result from other mental events, and physical events can cause and result from other physical events, there are no causal relations between mental and physical events. There are thus no strict psychophysical laws. But there are both strict physical and strict psychological laws. The causal insulation of the two realms, and the existence of strict psychological laws, appear to distinguish Spinoza's position from that of Anomalous Monism.

Davidson, however, disputes this traditional reading of Spinoza's metaphysics , emphasizing two key points. First, while Spinoza does indeed deny that there can be explanatory relations between the mental and the physical, his notion of explanation is quite demanding. ‘Explanation’ means ‘adequate explanation’, which in turn requires a demonstration of logical entailment between explanans and explanandum. Davidson happily concedes that no such relation exists between mental and physical properties and events. But he denies that one need impose such a strong requirement on causation and causal explanation. In any case, it is consistent with Spinoza's position that mental events cause and are caused by physical events so long as one does not equate ‘cause’ with ‘logically entails’.

Second, and related to this, Davidson insists that while explanation is, intuitively, an intensional notion – one sensitive to how events are described – causation is extensional, obtaining between pairs of events independently of how they are described. As we have seen (1, 6.2), this distinction between causation and explanation is central to Anomalous Monism. Some interpreters of Spinoza, explicitly considering the question of his relation to Anomalous Monism, have denied that Spinoza would or should accept such an extensional account of causation (see Della Rocca 1991 and Jarrett 1991). Davidson replies that one needs to distinguish an opaque and a transparent concept of ‘cause’ (where the former involves sentences which do not allow the substitution salva veritate of co-referring expressions, and latter does allow such substitutions). Davidson accepts that Spinoza himself probably had in mind the opaque concept, in keeping with historical tradition, but that nothing stands in the way of his accepting a needed transparent concept as well. Davidson sees this as the only way to get Spinoza out of being saddled with the logical absurdity that would result from holding that, for instance, the physical event of a bell ringing cannot cause a mental awareness of the ringing even though that mental awareness is identical (as Spinoza's monism requires) with a physical event in the brain caused by the ringing.

According to Davidson, what Spinoza is really committed to is denying the possibility of a fully adequate (complete) explanation of the occurrence of the awareness by appeal to the laws of nature and the cause described in physical terms. This does not preclude holding that the ringing of the bell may cause us to be aware of the ringing. Davidson goes on to reject Spinoza's infamous doctrine of parallelism, the view that the temporal order of physical events corresponds to the order and connection of ideas. Since the physical domain is governed by strict laws, this would entail the possibility (indeed, necessity) of strict, purely psychological laws. Just as events described physically would have a fully adequate explanation in terms of strict physical laws and initial conditions, so too would events described mentally need to have a fully adequate explanation in terms of strict mental laws and initial (mental) conditions. Davidson rejects this picture (as indeed Anomalous Monism must) because too many causes and effects of mental events are not themselves events with mental descriptions – the mental domain is thus ‘open’ in a way that the physical domain is not (2.3). Every physical event has a fully adequate (strict) physical explanation, but no mental event can have a fully adequate (strict) mental explanation.

In these ways, then, Davidson finds points of significant contact between Anomalous Monism and Spinoza's position, and attempts to soften or correct those points of apparent divergence. Davidson's view appears to be that if Spinoza had available to him the intensional-extensional distinction as well as a concept of causation that was not identical to logical entailment, his position would essentially be that of Anomalous Monism.

7.2 Functionalism

Functionalist accounts of mental phenomena (for a good overview, see Block 1980) were the most prominent of the nonreductionist monist positions developed at around the same time as Anomalous Monism. According to functionalism, an adequate analysis of the meaning and individuation of propositional attitudes such as belief, desire, intention and other psychological states is in terms of the explanatory/causal role that they play in the etiology of behavior. Beliefs differ from desires, for instance, in the role that each plays in mediating the relations between perceptual inputs, behavioral outputs and other intervening psychological states. To believe something is just to be in a state that exhibits such a distinctive causal pattern. It is not relevant what realizes such a functional state, however, just so long as it is the sort of realizing media that can support such a pattern.

Associated with functionalism was the doctrine of multiple realizability: mental properties can, in practice as well as principle, be realized by a variety of media which do not share anything in common physically other than a capacity to support the distinctive pattern (Fodor 1974). Other species, with different internal wiring, can realize mental properties, and in principle so could non-terrestrial beings. Mental properties therefore cannot be reduced to physical properties because of this heterogeneous nature of the realizing physical media. However (at least according to most proponents of functionalism – see Lewis 1966), some physical media must play the realizing role – hence, monism.

Functionalism therefore differs from Anomalous Monism in appealing to multiple realizability rather than rationality as the ground for irreducibility. There are other important differences as well. For one thing, it is unclear what exactly grounds the monism of functionalism – in Anomalous Monism, the monism is derived in an a priori fashion from Davidson's three principles, but it often seems to be simply an assumption within the functionalist framework (Fodor 1974, but again, see Lewis 1966). Indeed, some functionalists explicitly observe that their account is consistent with dualism (see Block, 1980). Another key difference is that traditional functionalism has built into it a kind of reductionism, though not of the type-type variety. This comes out in the fact that the inputs and outputs between which the functional states are supposed to play their mediating role are typically required to be characterized in non-intentional terms. For instance, intending to stay dry would be (partially) defined not in terms of perceiving that it is raining and subsequently opening an umbrella, but instead in terms of something like sensory stimulations and mere bodily movements. Indeed, many functionalists claim to provide an analysis of mental properties in other, non-mental terms. Brian Loar (Loar 1981, 20-25) sees his functionalist account as a direct refutation of Anomalous Monism, by purporting to account for the rational nature of mental states and events within a reductionist framework. But whether or not all functionalists view their accounts in these terms, it nonetheless appears that the nonreductionism of functionalism is of a vertical but not horizontal nature, so to speak. Mental properties cannot be reduced to their realizing physical properties (because of multiple realizability), but there will be strict lawlike generalizations (the distinctive patterns) that purport to define mental properties in non-mental terms — causal relations to non-mentally characterized inputs, outputs and other functional states.

Another point on which functionalism diverges from Anomalous Monism is in its attempt to account not only for the propositional attitudes – belief, desire, intention, etc. – but also for sentient states and events like pains and tickles – conscious phenomena that there is something it is like to experience (Nagel 1974). These wider aspirations have, however, proven to be especially problematic for functionalism. A standard objection has been that while the propositional attitudes may be given a plausible analysis in terms of casual patterns, the felt quality of sentient states and events cannot be analyzed in purely causal terms without losing touch with what is distinctive about such phenomena (Nagel 1974; Chalmers 1996; see 7.4 below).

Many of the same questions that arose in our examination of Anomalous Monism – in particular, concerning supervenience and mental causation – arise also in discussions of functionalism. Indeed, these questions arise for any property dualist monism – any theory on which mental and physical properties are thought of as distinct and irreducible but instantiated by the same set of states, events or substances.

7.3 Bare Materialism

Another version of nonreductive monism, put forward in different ways by Hornsby (Hornsby 1981, 1985, 1993), Leder (Leder 1985) and McDowell (McDowell 1985), rejects the token-identity of Anomalous Monism and replaces it with a blander, bare materialist doctrine of substance monism. As we have already seen (5.2), this is motivated, in the first instance, by the concern that it is simply too demanding to require that every mental event bear a uniquely identifying description in the language of physics — the fine-grained spatiotemporal specificity of the language of physics appears ill-suited to mental events. Davidson's view, recall, is that there must be such a fine-grained physical description for every causally interacting mental event, though he made no attempt to provide examples. McDowell (1985) sees this requirement as an overreaction to the threat of Cartesian dualism. He puts the point as follows: “…since it is not events but substances that are composed of stuff, one can refuse to accept that all the events there are can be described in ‘physical’ terms, without thereby committing oneself to a non-‘physical’ stuff or compromising the thesis that persons are composed of nothing but matter.” (McDowell 1985, 397). This view is essentially shared by Hornsby and Leder, each of whom questions both the intelligibility of attaching precise spatiotemporal parameters to mental events, and the purported necessity of doing so, in order to maintain a materialist position. McDowell and Hornsby subsequently come to question the cause-law principle, which, when appended to the interaction and anomalism principles (both of which are accepted by McDowell and Hornsby) leads to the token-identity thesis they question. Each sees the cause-law principle as unmotivated and, as we have seen, McDowell claims it to be inconsistent with another of Davidson's basic commitments – his rejection of scheme-content dualism (see 3.4 above).

It is not entirely clear, however, what the rationale is then going to be for asserting materialism, even one of this minimalist variety, which focuses on substance (the person or perhaps the body) rather than events undergone by substance. One virtue of Anomalous Monism is that it provides a justification for its form of materialism. It is also not clear how mental events, when thought of as not describable in the language of physics, can be thought to interact with events describable in physical language. Here concerns with a lineage going back to the earliest critics of Descartes, such as Pierre Gassendi and Princess Elisabeth of Bohemia, again rear their heads: if physical but not mental events (which supposedly interact) have precise spatiotemporal locations, how can events of such different kinds causally interact, and where is the locus of interaction? These questions are just as pressing for proponents of minimal materialism who reject token-identities of mental and physical events.

As discussed in 5.2, the spatiotemporal objection to Anomalous Monism is difficult to evaluate, depending as it does on our own current intuitions about the intelligibility of recognizing precise spatiotemporal dimensions for mental events and states. Davidson's point, based upon his a priori argument, is simply that there must be such dimensions, and in some of his last thoughts on this subject (Davidson 1999b), he seems to be at pains to acknowledge that we may never be able actually to make such identifications.

7.4 Other Positions

Various other nonreductive monist positions have been developed that are motivated by concerns very different than those of Anomalous Monism. These positions raise issues that go beyond what can be addressed here, but some are worth noting. As observed above, one motivation derives from concerns with sentient phenomena — whether, given distinctive properties attaching to conscious states and events, they can be explained in terms of underlying physical states and events. Proponents of these views deny that such an explanation is possible, and subsequently assert various forms of property dualism together with a substance monism (see Chalmers 1996). Another nonreductive monist position has been motivated by appeal to a semantic thesis concerning how mental contents of propositional attitudes are determined. This externalist thesis holds that mental contents are determined in part by environmental and or social factors external to individual agents' bodies. Some proponents of this view conclude that the attitudes in which these contents figure cannot be held to be token-identical to underlying physical states of those agents, even though all states and events may indeed be physical in some other sense (Burge 1979, 1993). Davidson himself endorses the semantic thesis (Davidson 1987a) but denies that it is inconsistent with token-identity.

8. Conclusion

Despite the initial appearance of simplicity in its assumptions, structure and argumentation, we have turned up several important problems and lacunae that stand in the way of any overall final assessment of the plausibility of Anomalous Monism. While the central objections it has faced have derived from epiphenomenalist concerns, the force of these objections is not clear. Arguably, the most serious difficulties for Anomalous Monism are not with its adequacy but with its justification. We still stand in need of a clear argument for how rationality leads to the anomalism principle; there are the substantial problems surrounding the status of the causal closure of the physical and its bearing on monism; and the cause-law principle's strictness requirement is still in need of a compelling rationale. Even with these problems, Anomalous Monism continues to provide an extremely useful framework for exploring fundamental issues and problems in the philosophy of mind, and has earned a central place on the rather short list of important positions on the relation between mental and physical events and properties.


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