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Arabic and Islamic Philosophy of Language and Logic

First published Wed Jul 23, 2008

Arabic logic is a philosophical tradition which has lasted from the mid-eighth century down to today. Traditionally, western study of Arabic logic has tended to concentrate on the early parts of its history, especially on the Greek antecedents of Arabic logic, and on the writings of the foundational philosophers, Alfarabi (d. 950), Avicenna (d. 1037) and Averroes (d. 1198). There have been notable excursions beyond these areas of concentration, especially in the pioneering work of Rescher. This entry is written with a view to furthering the trend initiated by Rescher. [1] With this in mind, I make special efforts to mention the contributions of post-twelfth-century logicians to the philosophical resolution of disputed points.

Whereas there is an Arabic term (mantiq) that equates to “logic”, there is no such term or phrase for “philosophy of language”. As it happens, philosophers tried to solve problems which are now taken to be the concern of a philosophy of language, but this they generally did in the midst of either a logic treatise or a treatise on grammar. I do not attempt to coordinate this material under a section entitled “Philosophy of Language”, but much of what is covered in 2.1 and 2.2.2, and referred to in 3, would be candidates for such a section.

My aim in presenting this overview is, in section 1, to give some historical context for a vast range of philosophical argument, in section 2, to provide a number of texts as samples of those philosophical arguments and, in section 3, to refer to some of the philosophical developments in Islamic disciplines not directly derived from the Greek philosophical tradition. The philosophical assessment of the arguments is a task hardly begun in the secondary literature.

1. Historical Outline

1.1 The Early Translations

The Syriac Christians had adopted a teaching tradition which included a truncated version of the Alexandrian Organon (Porphyry's Eisagoge followed by the Categories, On Interpretation, and the first seven chapters of the Prior Analytics). This teaching tradition continued without disruption through the Arab conquests and under the Umayyad Caliphate (661-750). During this period, however, it evoked little if any interest on the part of the Muslim conquerors.

It was the advent of the Abbasid Caliphate (750-1258) that signalled the beginnings of an interest in philosophy on the part of the ruling elite. This was to usher in a translation movement which in the first place translated the Syriac decoctions of philosophy into Arabic, but which later turned to the Aristotelian texts themselves and the commentaries written on them in late antiquity.[2] An example of an Arabic translation produced before the Aristotelian turn is the translation by Ibn al-Muqaffa‘ (ex. 756) of a logic treatise that probably came to him from the Syriac via the Pahlavi (probably from a late antique introduction to philosophy; see Gutas (1993) 44 fn. 68). The treatise gestures towards the Eisagoge, then turns to the Categories, On Interpretation, and the introductory parts of the Prior Analytics on assertoric syllogisms (Danishpazhuh (1978)). As Pines pointed out long ago, this material corresponds to the Old Logic of the Latin West (Pines (1996)). One must bear in mind, however, that there are important differences between eighth-century Arabic logic and the Old Logic of the Latin tradition. First, there were Syriac translations of other Aristotelian logical texts available throughout this period (e.g. the Posterior Analytics; Hugonnard-Roche and Elamrani-Jamal (1989-2003b)), so there were scholars about who had a good idea of what later texts in the Organon had to offer. Secondly, soon after Ibn al-Muqaffa‘ had produced his treatise, other scholars were translating complete Aristotelian works into Arabic. It is clear, for example, that the Caliph al-Mahdî (reg. 775-785) had commissioned translations of the Topics and the Sophistical Fallacies, presumably for use in interreligious dialogue (Gutas (1993) 43).

The translation movement continued to pick up momentum through the ninth century, and by the 830s a circle of translators were loosely coordinated around Abû Yûsuf Ya‘qûb b. Ishâq al-Kindî (d. c. 870). Kindî produced a short overview of the whole of the Organon (translated in Rescher (1963a)), and members of his circle produced: an epitome of and commentary on the Categories; an epitome of On Interpretation; a version of the Sophistical Fallacies; and probably an early translation of the Rhetoric.[3]

Somewhat later, perhaps from the 850s, the great Syriac Christian translators Hunayn ibn Ishâq (d. 873) and his son Ishâq ibn Hunayn (d. 910) began to produce integral translations of complete works from the Organon, generally by way of Syriac translations, some of which dated back to before the Arab conquests. One or the other (it is uncertain from the sources) translated the Categories, Ishâq translated On Interpretation, Hunayn seems to have collaborated with the otherwise unknown Theodorus to translate the Prior Analytics, father and son both seem to have had a hand in producing a new Syriac translation of the Posterior Analytics, and Ishâq provided revised translations of the Topics and the Rhetoric. Perhaps it was someone in this circle who translated the Poetics into Syriac.[4]

In spite of these achievements, Hunayn's circle is not unequivocally Aristotelian. Hunayn himself was interested above all in Galen, and what we know of Galen's greatest logical work we know from citations in Hunayn's reverential listing (Boudon (1989-2003) 458: On Demonstration).

1.2 Farabian Aristotelianism

Soon after, however, Baghdad philosophy was dominated by self-styled Peripatetics who presented themselves as reestablishing Aristotle's true teachings after a period of rupture. The leading lights of this movement were the Syriac Christian Abû Bishr Mattâ ibn Yûnus (d. 940) and his younger Muslim colleague, Abû Nasr Alfarabi (d. 950). In the early 900s, Abû Bishr added translations from the Syriac of the Poetics and the Posterior Analytics to the growing Arabic Organon. He and his colleagues also contributed to a commentary tradition on each component of the Organon.

Abû Bishr lumbers into every piece that has been written on the history of Arabic logic as the clumsy advocate of the view that speakers of Arabic need to learn Greek logic. In a disputation on the relative merits of grammar and logic convened for the amusement of the Vizier, he confronts a dashing young opponent, Sîrâfî, who confounds him with a series of grammatical subtleties. To these, Abû Bishr responds:

This is grammar, and I have not studied grammar. The logician has no need of grammar, whereas the grammarian does need logic. For logic enquires into the meaning, whereas grammar enquires into the expression. If, therefore, the logician deals with the expression, it is accidental, and it is likewise accidental if the grammarian deals with the meaning. Now, the meaning is more exalted than the expression, and the expression humbler than the meaning.[5]

Whatever the merits of Abû Bishr's view of the relation of logic to language, it weathered Sîrâfî's storm of criticism badly. Assessments differ as to what we should learn from this discussion,[6] but it serves at least to show that some were sceptical of the utility of Aristotelian logic. Other Muslim scholars went further than Sîrâfî and considered the study of logic impious, mainly because of its association with metaphysics. As one fideist scholar put it many years later, “the access to something bad is also bad” (Ibn as-Salâh (d. 1245), quoted in Goldziher (1981) 205-206).

It was Abû Bishr's younger colleague, Alfarabi, who was the outstanding contributor to the Aristotelian project, though not as a translator. On the question of the relation of logic to language, Alfarabi offers a view somewhat more nuanced than Abû Bishr's (see 2.1.1 below). He also claimed that logic was indispensable for analysing the argument-forms used in jurisprudence and theology, a claim that was to be taken up a century later by Abû Hamid al-Ghazâlî (d. 1111), thereby introducing the study of logic into the madrasa (see 1.4.1 below). To support his claim, Alfarabi wrote The Short Treatise on Reasoning in the Way of the Theologians

…in which he interpreted the arguments of the theologians and the analogies (qiyâsât) of the jurists as logical syllogisms in accordance with the doctrines of the ancients.[7]

But Alfarabi's main contribution to the Aristotelian project was a series of commentaries on the books of the Organon—many of them sadly lost—which represent the finest achievement in the study of Aristotelian logic in Arabic. His work in this area aims at the Lesser Harmony, the “project of forging a single, consistent doctrine out of the sometimes incongruent theories found in Aristotle's many treatises;” and this marks him out as clinging to a major hermeneutical commitment of late antiquity (see Wisnovsky (2003) 15, 266). The quality of Alfarabi's arguments is clear from his remaining long commentaries on Aristotle.[8] He is the first truly independent thinker in Arabic logic, a fact commemorated by the honorific bestowed upon him by Avicenna: the Second Teacher (after Aristotle). When Avicenna laid out his own syllogistic, he noted each point on which he differed from Alfarabi (Street (2001)).

The tradition with which Alfarabi was associated, a tradition centred on exegetical problems in the Organon, reached its crowning achievement—a superb and heavily glossed translation of the Organon[9]—at the same time that Avicenna was setting about his work in the East, work which was to make the Organon irrelevant for the vast majority of subsequent Arabic logicians.

This is a watershed moment: the Farabian tradition continued its work on the Aristotelian texts, though ever more defensively and reactively to challenges posed by Avicenna. The Avicennan tradition by contrast simply ignored the Aristotelian texts. The Farabian tradition shrank away so quickly that even by the late twelfth century, to study Farabian logic meant traveling to north Africa.[10] Spain was its last stronghold, and the work of Averroes (see 1.4.2 below) is best understood as a commentary on Aristotle determined in its focus and direction by the criticisms of Avicenna.

1.3 Avicennan Aristotelianism

At the same time that the Baghdad philosophers were finalizing the translation of the Organon and furnishing it with extensive glosses, Avicenna (d. 1037) was beginning his career far away in the east, in Khurasan. His style of philosophy was to make the Aristotelian texts irrelevant for the dominant tradition of Arabic logic after him. Led by his Intuition, he presented himself as an autodidact able to assess and repair the Aristotelian tradition.[11] In other words, Avicenna's doctrine of Intuition delivered him an Aristotelianism unfettered by the hermeneutic commitments of the Lesser Harmony.

In the modal logic, for example (a subject voluminously contested in the Arabic tradition; see 2.3 below), he cut through the problems in the Aristotelian account by taking them either as tests of the student's acuity, or mistakes by Aristotle in implementing principles. Here is what he says in the Syllogism of the Cure, written about midway through his career:

You should realize that most of what Aristotle's writings have to say about the modal mixes are tests, and are not genuine opinions—this will become clear to you in a number of places… (Avicenna (1964), Qiyâs 204.10-12)

In his later writings, Avicenna is less solicitous in explaining away what he regards as inconsistencies in Aristotle's syllogistic, and writes of problems in the Prior Analytics as arising through negligence. An example of a late text is Twenty Rare Questions, which consists of answers to questions on syllogistic sent by the learned men of Shiraz (a text which incidentally shows how odd Avicenna's system must have seemed to his contemporaries). Why, they ask, has Avicenna produced a syllogistic system that differs so radically from Aristotle's? At one point, we find Avicenna presenting Aristotle's decisions (about mixes with possibility propositions as minor premises) as follows:

It is strange that Aristotle judged… Stranger than this… Even stranger than that are the definitions… Strangest of all…A further matter that confounds Aristotle…(Avicenna (1974) al-Masâ'il al-Gharîba 94.14, 94.20, 94.22, 95.5, 95.11)

Avicenna's Intuition not only set aside important parts of Aristotle's logic, it also differed from Alfarabi's interpretation of that logic. Avicenna has, however, more consistently courteous ways of declining to follow Alfarabi. He refers to Alfarabi as the “eminent later scholar to whom we are most concerned to direct our remarks” as he constructs his different system (see Street (2001)).

Of all his many works,[12] it is Avicenna's Pointers and Reminders that had most impact on subsequent generations of logicians. It became, as Ibn Taymiyya declared, the Koran of the philosophers (Michot (2000) 599). From it we may note a few broad but typical differences from the Prior Analytics in the syllogistic. First, the “absolute” (mutlaqât, often translated “assertoric”) propositions have truth-conditions stipulated somewhat like those stipulated for possibility propositions (so that, for example, the contradictory of an absolute is not an absolute, absolute e-propositions do not convert, second-figure syllogisms with absolute premises are sterile). Secondly, Avicenna begins to explore the logical properties of propositions of the form every J is B while J. Thirdly, Avicenna divides syllogistic into connective (iqtirânî) and repetitive (istithnâ'î) forms, a division which replaces the old one into categorical and hypothetical (Avicenna (19712) al-Ishârât 309, 314, 374). As a rough guide, we may call a logician “Avicennan” if he adopts these doctrines.

1.4 Logic in the Twelfth Century

The twelfth century is one of the most complex periods of transformation in Muslim intellectual history. The century before had seen the advent of the madrasa as the prime institution of learning in the Islamic world (Makdisi (1981) 27-32, especially 31), and Abû Hâmid al-Ghazâlî (d. 1111) had been appointed to the most prestigious of these new institutions. One of the most revered Muslim thinkers of all time, he took up Alfarabi's arguments in support of the utility of logic for theology and law, especially in his last juridical summa, Distillation of the Principles of Jurisprudence, a text which soon became a mainstay of the madrasa. The late twelfth century also saw Averroes produce what was effectively the last of the work in the Farabian tradition of logic, work which was to be translated into Hebrew and Latin but which was neglected by Arabic logicians. Finally, through the course of the twelfth century, the modified Avicennan logic that would be adopted by the logic texts of the madrasa began to emerge.

1.4.1 Ghazâlî and Logic

Before, and especially through, the tenth and eleventh centuries, a deal of effort was expended in defining which sciences constitute the proper focus of a scholar's education and how these sciences relate to each other. A fourteenth-century polymath divided the sciences of civilization into those “natural to man and to which he is guided by his own ability to think, and a traditional kind that he learns from those who invented it.” (Ibn-Khaldûn (1958) Muqaddima 2:385). Earlier scholars had made a parallel distinction between the Foreign Sciences and the Islamic Sciences. Philosophy was the preeminent science of the first kind, and theology and jurisprudence sciences of the second. Although logic was originally part of philosophy, and due to this association despised by many theologians and jurists (noted above in 1.2), a change in attitude came about in the twelfth century:

It should be known that the early Muslims and the early speculative theologians greatly disapproved of the study of this discipline. They vehemently attacked it and warned against it. They forbade the study and teaching of it. Later on, ever since Ghazâlî (d. 1111) and Fakhraddîn ar-Râzî (d. 1210), scholars have been somewhat more lenient in this respect. Since that time, they have gone on studying logic, except for a few who have recourse to the opinion of the ancients concerning it and shun it and vehemently disapprove of it (Ibn-Khaldûn (1858) Muqaddima 113.13-u; cf. Ibn-Khaldûn (1958) 3:143-144).

Ghazâlî had most impact in this regard (see Rudolph (2005)). I deal with Râzî's contribution below (see 1.5.1).

Ghazâlî argued that, properly understood, logic was entirely free of metaphysical presuppositions injurious to the faith. This meant that logic could be used in forensic reasoning:

We shall make known to you that speculation in juristic matters (al-fiqhiyyât) is not distinct from speculation in philosophical matters (al-‘aqliyyât) in terms of its composition, conditions, or measures, but only in terms of where it takes its premises from (Ghazâlî (1961) Mi‘yâr 28.2-4).

Ghazâlî tended to an even stronger position towards the end of his life: more than being merely harmless, logic was necessary for true knowledge. Here is what Ghazâlî has to say at the beginning of his famous Distillation of the Principles of Jurisprudence (referring back to two of his earlier works on logic):

In this introduction we mention… the condition of true definition and true demonstration and their divisions in a program more concise than what we set out in our Touchstone for Speculation and Yardstick of Knowledge [respectively, Ghazâlî (1966) and Ghazâlî (1961)]. This introduction is not part of the sum of the science of [juristic] principles, nor among the preliminaries particular to it; rather it is an introduction to all the sciences, and he who does not comprehend [logic] is not to be trusted at all in his sciences (Ghazâlî (1938) Mustasfâ 10.15-17).

For all his historical importance in the process of introducing logic into the madrasa, the logic that Ghazâlî defended was too dilute to be recognizably Farabian or Avicennan.

1.4.2 Averroes and the End of Textual Aristotelianism

Averroes was one of the last representatives of a dying Farabian Aristotelianism, an Aristotelianism that bent all its efforts to the task of the Lesser Harmony. A student of the Baghdad philosophy that had been transplanted to al-Andalus (Dunlop (1955)), Averroes was trained in the logic of Alfarabi, many specifics of which he later came to discard:

One of the worst things a later scholar can do is to deviate from Aristotle's teaching and follow a path other than Aristotle's—this is what happened to Alfarabi in his logical texts…(Averroes (1983) Maqâlât 175.6-8)

For Averroes, Alfarabi's attempts to make sense of the difficulties in Aristotle's texts were too weak to anticipate and answer Avicenna's criticisms. In one such area, the modal logic, Averroes was to return to the problems four times through his career (see Elamrani-Jamal (1995)), and near the end of his life, having assessed the problems in his colleagues' interpretations, he wrote:

These are all the doubts in this matter. They kept occurring to us even when we used to go along in this matter with our colleagues, in interpretations by virtue of which no solution to these doubts is clear. This has led me now (given my high opinion of Aristotle, and my belief that his theorization is better than that of all other people) to scrutinize this question seriously and with great effort (Averroes (1983) Maqâlât 181.6-10).

Averroes' project in its full flowering is driven by the demands of this rigorously construed Lesser Harmony and—in spite of everything—by Avicenna's increasingly popular reformulation of Aristotelian doctrine. Both aspects of the Averroist project are in full evidence in his Philosophical Essays, a number of which are on logical matters. So, for example, Averroes defends and refines Alfarabi's account of the conversion of modal propositions against Avicenna's attack, and then uses that account as the basis of a new interpretation of the modal syllogistic (see 2.3.2 below). A second example of the way Averroes works is his reappraisal and vindication of Aristotle's doctrines of the hypothetical syllogistic against Avicenna's alternative division into connective and repetitive syllogisms(see Averroes (1983) Maqâlât essay 9, 187-207). No Arabic logician of note makes any use of Averroes, though his deep concern with the Aristotelian text made his work transportable to both Hebrew and Latin philosophical traditions.

1.4.3 The Avicennan Tradition of the Twelfth Century

But the work on logic which was both technically advanced (and therefore unlike Ghazâlî's) and influential on later Arabic logicians (and therefore unlike Averroes') was done by Avicennan logicians who had begun to repair and reformulate Avicenna's work. Just as Avicenna had declared himself free to rework Aristotle as Intuition dictated, so too Avicenna's school regarded itself free to repair the Avicennan system as need arose, whether from internal inconsistencies, or from intellectual requirements extrinsic to the system. A major early representative of this trend is ‘Umar ibn Sahlân as-Sâwî (d. 1148) who began, in his Logical Insights for Nasîraddîn, to rework Avicenna's modal syllogistic.[13] It was to be his students and their students, however, who would go on to make the final changes to Avicennan logic that characterized the subject that came to be taught in the madrasa.

1.5 The Avicennan Tradition and the Madrasa

Ghazâlî had successfully introduced logic into the madrasa. What happened to it once there was the result of the activities of much more gifted logicians. This period has tentatively been called the Golden Age of Arabic philosophy (Gutas (2002)). It is in this period that the major change in the coverage and structure of Avicennan logic occurred.

1.5.1 Revisionist Avicennan Logic

In the fourteenth century, Ibn Khaldûn (d. 1406) noted the ways that Arabic logic had changed from the late twelfth century on (he mentions a growing restriction of the subject to the syllogistic, and a concentration on its formal aspects; see 2.2.3 below), and names the scholars he thinks are responsible for the change.

Treatment of [the subject as newly conceived] has become lengthy and wide-ranging—the first to do this was Fakhraddîn ar-Râzî (d. 1210) and, after him, Afdaladdîn al-Khûnajî (d. 1249), on whom Eastern scholars rely even now… The books and ways of the ancients have been abandoned, as though they had never been (Ibn-Khaldûn (1858) Muqaddima 113; cf. Ibn-Khaldûn (1958) 3:143).

Let us consider the nature of the work of the first logician named, Fakhraddîn ar-Râzî. Recent scholarly efforts have seen a number of Râzî's important works published, but there has been relatively little analysis of his logic.[14] His teacher in logic was Majdaddîn al-Jîlî, who may have been Sâwî's student. In spite of this pedigree, the polite manner of correcting Avicenna's system that we find in Sâwî's work is missing from Râzî's. In Gist of Pointers, Râzî sets out his own remarkably compact account of the modals, and then says of Avicenna's exposition:

When you have understood what we have mentioned, you will come to realise that [my book], in spite of its brevity, is more explanatory and better verified than what is found in [Pointers], in spite of its length (Râzî (13552 A. H.) Lubâb 22.14-15).

For all his dismissive comments, Râzî's logic is unintelligible without reference to Pointers, nor—I think—does it strike off in new directions other than to offer what Râzî claims are clearer ways to understand the points Avicenna is trying to make. Râzî, like Sâwî, never refers to an Aristotelian text, and refers to Alfarabi in such a fashion as to suggest that he is simply paraphrasing Avicenna's references.

It is the second logician Ibn Khaldûn mentions who, it would seem, made more, and more substantive, changes to Avicennan logic: Afdaladdîn al-Khûnajî (d. 1249). He was apparently one of Râzî's students; Bar Hebraeus writes of a group who were famed as “authors of major works on logic and philosophy… [among them] Khûnajî in Cairo” (translated in Pococke (1663) 485.7-13 (Arabic)). The sense in which he could have been Râzî's student is presumably that he studied under someone who had studied under Râzî. At this stage of scholarly research, only one short text by Khûnajî has been published, and all assessment of his impact has to be by way of references made to him by other Arabic logicians.[15] But there are many such references in later works.

Khûnajî's work inspired or at least prefigured work by other great logicians not mentioned by Ibn Khaldûn, namely, Athîraddîn al-Abharî (d. 1265) and Najmaddîn al-Kâtibî (d. 1276). Bar Hebraeus also claims that Abharî was one of Râzî's students, though again, opportunity for direct contact must have been virtually non-existent. Kâtibî was Abharî's student. The two of them produced the two texts which became the mainstay of the madrasa teaching of logic, studied from the late thirteenth century down to the present day (see Calverley (1933) and Kâtibî (1948)). Kâtibî's text, the Logic for Shamsaddîn, was commented on by Qutbaddîn at-Tahtânî (d. 1365); this is a commentary which records a great many of the technical debates going on between the two major wings of the Avicennan logical tradition. Such was the impressive preparation most Sunni Muslim scholars underwent in logic.

1.5.2 Tûsî and the Neo-Avicennan Response

The great Shî‘î scholar Nasiraddîn at-Tûsî (d. 1274) responded directly to Râzî. He also responded indirectly to the changes Khûnajî introduced by responding to the work of the like-minded Abharî. (As it happens, Tûsî had studied along side Abharî for a time under Kamâladdîn ibn Yûnus (d. 1242).)

Râzî's hostility in characterizing the Avicennan exposition in Pointers is confronted by Tûsî in Solution to the Difficulties of Pointers. The nature of Tûsî's response to Râzî is generally taken to be entirely negative—he relayed a description of Râzî's work as being “a butchery, not a commentary”—but it is really part of a broader project to defend not only Avicenna's logic but also his exposition of that logic. To take one example: Avicenna's account of different kinds of absolute proposition had long raised questions among post-Avicennan logicians. Tûsî explains why Avicenna explores it the way he does:

What spurred him to this was that in the assertoric syllogistic Aristotle and others sometimes used contradictories of absolute propositions on the assumption that they are absolute; and that was why so many decided that absolutes did contradict absolutes. When Avicenna had shown this to be wrong, he wanted to give a way of construing those examples from Aristotle (Tûsî (1971) Sharh al-Ishârât 312.5-7).

It is in his other works that Tûsî takes a more solid stand against substantive changes proposed for Avicennan logic, especially in his Setting the Scale for an Evaluation of “Revealing Thoughts”, an extended assessment of Abharî's Revealing Thoughts (Tûsî (1974b)). Here we find not merely a sympathetic exposition of Avicennan logic as Avicenna would have wanted it to be understood, but a reasoned attack on the thinking behind alternative proposals. Tûsî went on with this project in a series of exchanges with Kâtibî (Tûsî (1974a)).

Finally, Tûsî wrote the Book of Abstraction as a non-polemical exposition of logic. His famous and influential student, al-‘Allâma al-Hillî (d. 1325), wrote a commentary on it, the Facetted Jewel on the Book of Abstraction (Hillî (1410 A.H.)), and the text and commentary are used in Shî‘î seminaries as an introductory text on logic. On the face of it, the text is quite conservatively Aristotelian, its rubrics following the traditional course of topics covered in the Organon, and in the same order; for all that, the substantive doctrine is on the whole pristine Avicennan, precisely the doctrine Tûsî defended against Abharî.

1.5.3 The Madrasa and Beyond

The texts of Abharî and Kâtibî were used in the Sunni madrasa, while Shî‘îs, at least after the sixteenth century, tended to use the texts of Tûsî and Hillî. But the tradition was much more dynamic than the entrenchment of these texts in the syllabus would suggest. First, whatever introductory texts were used in the madrasa, it is clear that students who were attracted to logic studied well beyond these texts with teachers at the madrasa who were often engaged to teach other subjects. Secondly, other places, like hospitals and observatories, provided less formal venues for the advanced study of logic (see Endress (2006)).

But it was the madrasa that provided the backbone of the tradition, and a number of jurists came time and again to stress that the study of logic was so important to religion as to be a fard kifâya, that is, a religious duty such that it is incumbent on the community to ensure at least some scholars are able to pursue its study.

As for the logic that is not mixed with philosophy, as in … the treatise of Athîraddîn al-Abharî called Îsâghûjî and the works of al-Kâtibî [i.e. ash-Shamsiyya] and al-Khûnajî [Afdaladdîn (d. 1249), i.e. al-Jumal] and Sa‘daddîn [at-Taftâzânî, i.e. Tahdhîb al-Mantiq], there is no disagreement concerning the permissibility of engaging in it, and it is rejected only by he who has no inkling of the rational sciences. Indeed, it is a fard kifâya because the ability to reply to heretical views in rational theology (kalâm), which is a fard kifâya, depends on mastering this science, and that which is necessary for a religious duty is itself a religious duty.[16]

Of course, a fatwâ like this invites us to consider what logic mixed with philosophy might look like; presumably the logic of Tûsî is such a logic. All the logicians named as providing a logic unmixed with philosophy are Revisionist Avicennan. How did all the changes introduced by these logicians affect the overall nature of Avicennan logic such as to make it religiously acceptable? This is an important point for future research.

1.6 The Neglected Half Millenium

Two further periods of logical activity should be noted, though they are as yet so little explored that we can identify them only with temporal boundaries and characterize them only with speculative gestures. The first of these is the long period from the 1350s to the invasions of the metropolitan powers. During these five hundred or so years, thousands and thousands of pages were devoted to logical subjects, a tiny fraction of which has been explored. The first and most dangerous pitfall facing the historian is the assumption that there was a decline in logical studies in the realms under Muslim control that corresponds with the sixteenth century decline of the subject in early modern Europe. It is tempting to make this assumption, seemingly supported by a tradition of scholarship devoted to a luxuriation of layered commentary on a five hundred year old primary text. But genre by no means dictates content, and we often find original work presented in this way. Each period and each region need to be examined in turn.[17]

The coming of the metropolitan powers signals a convenient point at which we may speculate that a new period began in Arabic logic. There is a distinct possibility that interaction between Europeans and Arabs in the capitulated territories in Syria and Lebanon, especially among the Christian communities, resulted in logic texts influenced by the Latin tradition. Because of the curious impact that perceptions of cultural capital may have, and also because of the degraded state of western logic at the time, this is a promising line of research in exploring a possible decline in the Arabic tradition. Again, the relevant texts must be edited and studied.[18]

2. Logical Doctrines under Dispute

Of many possible candidates for discussion, three logical doctrines were disputed in instructively different ways. The first has to do with the subject matter of logic. The doctrine Avicenna settled on came to have decisive impact on Latin logic, though did not become standard in later Arabic texts. The second and related set of doctrines has to do with offering an account of how the various logical disciplines—demonstration, dialectic, rhetoric and poetics—fit together. Inherited expectations of what disciplines a logical treatise should cover came under pressure from new disciplines derived from grammar and law. Finally, modal syllogistic was perhaps the most hotly disputed topic in logic through the twelfth and thirteenth centuries, and I offer an overview of some of the more divisive issues at play.

2.1 The Subject Matter of Logic

It is common doctrine among medieval Latin logicians that logic is a linguistic science. An associated doctrine is that logic makes up, with grammar and rhetoric, the trivium, or the three arts of language. There never was a trivium in the Arabic-speaking philosophical world, and when scholars spoke of the “three arts” (as-sinâ‘ât ath-thalâth), they were referring to demonstration, dialectic and rhetoric. Clashes between scholars working on Greek texts and problems and scholars working on the Arabic language first served to pose the question of how logic related to language, and specifically to the Arabic language. This in turn forced the discussion of what the subject matter of logic is to run up against the issue of how its subject matter differed from that of grammar.

2.1.1 Expressions, Meanings and Intelligibles

The unpromising proposal made by Abû Bishr Mattâ in response to Sîrâfî's attack on logic (see 1.2 above) prompted Alfarabi to make a second attempt at explaining how logic, grammar and language relate to each other.

Text 1. This art [of logic] is similar to the art of grammar, in that the relation of the art of logic to the intellect and the intelligibles is like the relation of the art of grammar to language and expressions (al-alfâz). That is, to every rule for expressions which the science of grammar provides us, there is an analogous [rule] for intelligibles which the science of logic provides us.[19]

This allows Alfarabi to go on to characterize the subject matter of logic as follows:

Text 2. The subject matters (mawdû‘ât) of logic are the things for which [logic] provides the rules, namely, intelligibles in so far as they are signified by expressions, and expressions in so far as they signify intelligibles.

[Logic] shares something with grammar in that it provides rules for expressions, yet it differs in that grammar only provides rules specific to the expressions of a given community, whereas the science of logic provides common rules that are general for the expressions of every community.[20]

This is to say—and here I follow Black's characterization of the doctrine—logic is something of a universal grammar or, more strictly, providing a universal grammar is one of the tasks of logic. Other philosophers of the Baghdad school like Yahyâ ibn ‘Adî (d. 974) by and large adopt Alfarabi's doctrine (see Endress (1977), Endress (1978); cf. Black (1991) 48ff).

2.1.2 Secondary Intelligibles

Aspects of this attempt to identify the subject matter of logic invite clarification. First, is the intelligible corresponding to, say, “horse”, part of the subject matter of logic? If it is, it threatens the formality, or what is now called the topic-neutrality, of logic. Secondly, is reference to expressions essential in a definition of logic, as is suggested by the phrase “intelligibles in so far as they are signified by expressions”?

A more careful statement of what was probably much the same doctrine is provided by Avicenna. Concepts like “horse”, “animal”, “body”, correspond to entities in the real world, entities which can have various properties. In the realm of the mental, concepts too can acquire various properties, properties they acquire simply by virtue of existing and being manipulated by the mind, properties like being a subject, or a predicate, or a genus. These are the subject matter of logic, and it seems it is only mental manipulation that gives rise to these properties.

Text 3. If we wish to investigate things and gain knowledge of them we must bring them into Conception (fî t-tasawwur); thus they necessarily acquire certain states (ahwâl) that come to be in Conception: we must therefore consider those states which belong to them in Conception, especially as we seek by thought to arrive at things unknown from those that are known. Now things can be unknown or known only in relation to a mind; and it is in Conception that they acquire what they do acquire in order that we move from what is known to what is unknown regarding them, without however losing what belongs to them in themselves; we ought, therefore, to have knowledge of these states and of their quantity and quality and of how they may be examined in this new circumstance.[21]

These properties that concepts acquire are secondary intelligibles; here is an exposition of this part of Avicennan doctrine by Râzî:

Text 4. The subject matter of logic is the secondary intelligibles in so far as it is possible to pass by means of them from the known (al-ma‘lûmât) to the unknown (al-majhûlât). The explanation of “secondary intelligibles” is that man Conceives the realities of things (haqâ'iq al-ashyâ’) in the first place, then qualifies some with others either restrictively or predicatively (hukman taqyîdiyyan aw khabariyyan). The quiddity's being qualified in this way is something that only attaches to the quiddity after it has become known in the first place, so it is a second-order [consideration] (fî d-darajati th-thâniya). If these considerations are investigated, not absolutely, but rather with respect to how it is possible to pass correctly by means of them from the known to the unknown, that is logic. So its subject matter is certainly the secondary intelligibles under the consideration mentioned above (Râzî (1381 A. H.) Mulakhkhas 10.1-10.8).

Avicenna in his Metaphysics makes special mention of these secondary intelligibles.

Text 5. The subject matter of logic, as you know, is given by the secondary intelligible meanings, based on the first intelligible meanings, with regard to how it is possible to pass by means of them from the known to the unknown, not in so far as they are intelligible and possess intellectual existence ([an existence] which does not depend on matter at all, or depends on an incorporeal matter).[22]

In identifying the secondary intelligibles, Avicenna is able to place logic within the hierarchy of the sciences, because it has its own distinct stretch of being which is its proper subject matter.

So much for the first problem in Alfarabi's formulation of what the subject matter of logic is; finding it to be secondary intelligibles preserves the topic-neutrality of logic. Avicenna also has a view on the second problem, the question of whether or not expression is essential to a definition of logic and its subject matter.

Text 6. There is no merit in what some say, that the subject matter of logic is speculation concerning the expressions insofar as they signify meanings… And since the subject matter of logic is not in fact distinguished by these things, and there is no way in which they are its subject matter, [such people] are only babbling and showing themselves to be stupid.[23]

One reason for this is that in Avicenna's psychology, language as a set of discrete expressions is not essential for the intellect in its operations. Note, however, that whatever Avicenna's official doctrine is, he recognizes and attempts to deal with the close nexus between language and thought.

Text 7. Were it possible for logic to be learned through pure cogitation, so that meanings alone would be observed in it, then this would suffice. And if it were possible for the disputant to disclose what is in his soul through some other device, then he would dispense entirely with its expression. But since it is necessary to employ expressions, and especially as it is not possible for the reasoning faculty to arrange meanings without imagining the expressions corresponding to them (reasoning being rather a dialogue with oneself by means of imagined expressions), it follows that expressions have various modes (ahwâl) on account of which the modes of the meanings corresponding to them in the soul vary so as to acquire qualifications (ahkâm) which would not have existed without the expressions. It is for this reason that the art of logic must be concerned in part with investigating the modes of expressions… But there is no value in the doctrine of those who say that the subject matter of logic is to investigate expressions in so far as they indicate meanings…but rather the matter should be understood in the way we described.[24]

As Sabra says, Avicenna seems to hold that “the properties constituting the subject matter of logic would be inconceivable without the exercise of a particular function of language” (Sabra (1980) 764).

2.1.3 Conceptions and Assents

Avicenna's doctrine on the subject matter of logic was not adopted by the majority of logicians who followed him (pace Sabra (1980) 757). Quite the contrary, Khûnajî argued in the second quarter of the thirteenth century that the subject matter of logic was Conceptions and Assents, a claim that was energetically resisted by the remaining Avicennan purists like Tûsî. We have scarcely begun to consider the texts that record this dispute, but the issues involved seem to have to do with the criteria for the subordination of one science to another, and perhaps also whether it is sound to postulate the real existence of mysterious entities like secondary intelligibles.

To understand the background to Khûnajî's doctrine, it is necessary first to return to Avicenna's identification of the states of knowledge that logic aims at producing: Conception and Assent.[25]

Text 8. […] A thing is knowable in two ways: one of them is for the thing to be merely Conceived (yutasawwara) so that when the name of the thing is uttered, its meaning becomes present in the mind without there being truth or falsity, as when someone says “man” or “do this!” For when you understand the meaning of what has been said to you, you will have conceived it. The second is for the Conception to be [accompanied] with Assent, so that if someone says to you, for example, “every whiteness is an accident,” you do not only have a Conception of the meaning of this statement, but [also] Assent to it being so. If, however, you doubt whether it is so or not, then you have Conceived what is said, for you cannot doubt what you do not Conceive or understand… but what you have gained through Conception in this [latter] case is that the form of this composition and what it is composed of, such as “whiteness” and “accident,” have been produced in the mind. Assent, however, occurs when there takes place in the mind a relating of this form to the things themselves as being in accordance with them; denial is the opposite of that.[26]

Note that an Assent is not merely the production of a proposition by tying a subject and predicate together; “Assent, however, occurs when there takes place in the mind a relating of this form to the things themselves as being in accordance with them.” All knowledge, according to Avicenna, is either Conception or Assent. Conception is produced by definition, Assent by proof. All Avicennan treatises on logic are structured in accordance with this doctrine: a first section deals with definition, which conduces to Conception, a second with proof, which conduces to Assent.

What the later logicians in the line of Fakhraddîn ar-Râzî did was make Conceptions and Assents the subject matter of logic. We know that Khûnajî was the first to do this thanks to a report in the Qistâs al-Afkâr of Shamsaddîn as-Samarqandî (d. c. 1310). Having laid out softly modified Avicennan doctrine (thereby proving that some later logicians stuck to Avicenna's views on this matter), Samarqandî says this:

Text 9. This is the view adopted by the verifying scholars (al-muhaqqiqûn), but Khûnajî (sâhib al-kashf) and the people who follow him differed from them [9] and said: Logic may investigate the universal and the particular and the essential and the accidental and the subject and the predicate; they are among the questions [of the science]. You [Avicennan logicians] are taking the subject matter of logic as more general than the secondary intelligibles so that the secondary intelligibles and [especially] the secondary intelligibles you have mentioned and what follows after them may come under it as logic. It would be correct for you to say that the subject matter of logic is known Conceptions and Assents (al-ma‘lûmât at-tasawwuriyya wa-t-tasdîqiyya) not in so far as they are [what they are] but in so far as they conduce to what is sought (al-matlûb) …[27]

Two logicians who followed Khûnajî on this were Abharî and Kâtibî. Here is Abharî's statement of the doctrine (though I don't know if it is his full statement of the doctrine):

Text 10. The subject matter of logic, I mean, the thing which the logician investigates in respect of its concomitants in so far as it is what it is, are precisely Conceptions and Assents. [This is] because [the logician] investigates what conduces to Conception and what the means [to Conception] depends upon (for something to be universal and particular, essential and accidental, and such like); and he investigates what conduces to Assent and what the means to Assent depends upon, whether proximately (like something being a proposition or the converse of a proposition or the contradictory of a proposition and such like) or remotely (like something being a predicate or a subject). These are states which inhere in Conceptions and Assents in so far as they are what they are. So certainly its subject matter is Conceptions and Assents (Tûsî (1974b) Ta‘dîl 144.14-20).

Here is part of Tûsî's rejection:

Text 11. If what he means by Conceptions and Assents is everything on which these two nouns fall, it is the sciences in their entirety, because knowledge is divided into these two; whereupon what is understood from [his claim] is that the subject matter of logic is all the sciences. Yet there is no doubt that they are not the subject matter of logic…


The truth is that the subject matter for logic is the secondary intelligibles in so far as reflection on them leads from the known to the unknown (or to something similar, as do reductive arguments or persuasive arguments [146] or imaginative arguments and the like). And if they are characterised by the rider mentioned by the masters of this craft, Conceptions and Assents are among the set of secondary intelligibles in just the same way as definition and syllogism and their parts, like universal and particular and subject and predicate and proposition and premise and conclusion (Tûsî (1974b) Ta‘dîl 144.21-u, 145.pu-146.3).

It is hard to know precisely what is being disputed.[28] What we can note at this stage is that one point at issue has to do with the claim that Avicenna's identification of secondary intelligibles as logic's subject matter is inaccurate, and too narrow to achieve what he hopes it can.

2.2 The Contents of the Treatise on Logic

When the full Organon was finally assembled in Arabic, it included the whole range of texts in the order given them by the Alexandrian philosophers. There was an inherited expectation that this was the full and proper stretch of logical inquiry, an expectation which was to come under pressure in the Muslim world. It had already come under revision in Avicenna's Pointers and Reminders, but more substantial change was to follow.

One factor at work in determining the structure of Avicennan logic treatises was the doctrine of secondary intelligibles, a doctrine which led to the exclusion of parts of the Organon from the realm of the strictly logical, specifically, the Categories. The arguments that excluded the Categories must also have problematized the inclusion of some other parts of the Organon.

Another factor at work was the doctrine of Conceptions and Assents. If, as was commonly accepted, argument is designed to bring about an Assent, then one must ask what kinds of Assent there are, and what variables in an argument lead to different kinds of Assent. This doctrine was to replace the Alexandrian doctrine of the context theory, in which logic is taken to cover different material implementations of syllogistic reasoning, whether in demonstration, dialectic, rhetoric, poetics or sophistry. According to the Alexandrian version of the theory, a stretch of discourse was to be analysed according to the context in which it was found: in poetry, one expected to find false and impossible statements, in demonstration, necessary and true statements. The Arabic logicians were to reject this version and, ultimately, lost interest in the range of disciplines coordinated by the theory.

A final factor, or range of factors, at work on the shape of the logic treatise that emerged in the thirteenth century arose out of discussions in law, especially the tradition of legal dialectic; this tradition was ultimately to crystallize as a new discipline that replaced the discussion of the Topics and Sophistical Fallacies. I examine each of these factors in turn.

2.2.1 Logic as a Formal Science

Avicenna's doctrine of secondary intelligibles awards logic a subject matter whose properties the logician studies; this makes logic a science in the Aristotelian sense of the term. But—according to the strictures applying to an Aristotelian science—no science can probe the existence of its subject matter, but rather must take it as given from a higher science (in this case, metaphysics). Yet the Categories investigates things that fall directly under terms like “substance” and “accident” like “horse” and “grey”, that is, it shuttles between secondary intelligibles and the primary intelligibles which are the pre-condition for the existence of the secondary intelligibles.

Avicenna himself adverted to the problem of whether or not Categories was a properly logical book, and decided that it was not, though he treated it in the Cure out of deference to Peripatetic custom. His arguments for deeming it not to be properly logical have been gathered together in the past (see esp. Gutas (1988) 265-267), but the line of argument is put most neatly by later logicians. Here is Hillî dealing with why Tûsî moves from the five predicables (or “five categories”) to the ten categories:

Text 12. When Tûsî finished investigating the five categories which inhere in the ten categories, he began the investigation of [the ten], even though [such investigation] is not part of logic. [This is] because the subject matter of logic is the secondary intelligibles which inhere in the primary intelligibles. How can the primary intelligibles be investigated even though [such investigation] is a [presupposed] part of the science [of logic]? This would be circular. But rather, [the ten categories] are investigated in logic to aid in properly realizing the genera and specific differences. [Such investigation], then, will be a help in discovering (istinbât) what is defined and inferred, even though it is not part of logic (Hillî (1410 A.H.) Jawhar 23.4-8).

A study of the categories will, in short, be helpful in giving concrete examples of the logical doctrines presented. The same arguments in removing the Categories from logic should apply to texts which investigate commonplace reasoning, though I have not seen such an argument made by an Arabic logician.

2.2.2 Assent and the Context Theory

Arguments aim to bring about Assent; more precisely (see Text 8 above), when Conceptions have been gained that produce in the mind both the meaning of the terms in a given proposition, and the form of composition of these terms, Assent “occurs when there takes place in the mind a relating of this form to the things themselves as being in accordance with them…” In fact, different kinds of discourse can bring about one or other kind of Assent, or something enough like Assent to be included in a general theory of discourse. I give Tûsî's statement of the Avicennan version of the context theory; it is the neatest statement I know of the criteria that divide kinds of discourse and the Assents for which each aims (though unfortunately somewhat dense).

A few preliminary words by way of introduction to this dense passage. Arabic logicians, like most Aristotelian logicians, speak of form and matter in propositions and proofs, and they have quite specific distinctions in mind when they do so. The matter in a proposition is what underwrites as true or false the modality the proposition has. When the dummy variables in a proposition are filled in with concrete terms, the resulting claim may be semantically determinate (as in “every man is an animal” and “no man is a stone”), and this will make the proposition's matter either necessary or remote and, if necessary, make the proposition true as a necessity proposition. Alternatively, the resulting claim may be semantically indeterminate (as in “every man is writing”), and this will make the proposition's matter contingent, and the proposition true as a contingency proposition. The matter in an argument, by contrast, is the epistemic status or persuasive force each of the premises has which, given a formally appropriate proof, will confer a similar or lesser epistemic status or persuasive force on the conclusion. (Note that jâzim is rendered by Black as “apophantic” (Black (1990) 53), which I give here as “truth-apt”.)

Text 13. Since Avicenna had finished explaining the formal and quasi-formal aspects of syllogistic, he turned to its material aspects. With respect to these, syllogistic divides into five kinds, because it either conveys an Assent, or an Influence (ta‘aththur) of another kind (I mean an Imagining or Wonder). What leads to Assent leads either to an Assent which is Truth-apt (jâzim) or to one which is not. And what is Truth-apt is either taken [in the argument] as True (haqq), or is not so taken. And what is taken as True either is true, or isn't.

That which leads to true truth-apt Assent is [1] Demonstration; untrue truth-apt Assent is [2] Sophistry. That which leads to truth-apt Assent not taken as true or false but rather as [a matter of] Common Consent (‘umûm al-i‘tirâf) is—if it's like this—[3] Dialectic (jadal), otherwise it's Eristic (shaghab) which is, along with Sophistry (safsata), under one kind of Fallacy Production (mughâlata). [And what leads] to Overwhelming though not Truth-apt Assent is [4] Rhetoric; and to Imagining rather than Assent, [5] Poetry (Tûsî (1971) Sharh al-Ishârât 460.1-461.12).

Tûsî immediately goes on to lay out grounds for Assent to propositions, for example, because they are primary, or because they are agreed for the purposes of discussion. Propositions to be used as premises for Demonstration make the most irresistible demands for our Assent; premises for lower kinds of discourse make weaker demands.

The vast majority of Arabic logicians do no more than nod towards the context theory in a paragraph towards the end of their treatises. A logician should only be interested—in so far as he is interested in material implementation of formal reasoning at all—in demonstration because it leads him to what is true and certain, and in sophistry, because it may confuse him in the search for demonstrative truth.

Philosophically, the context theory is an attempt to account for the cognitive and communicative impact of every kind of discourse. It examines in extraordinary detail the Aristotelian claim that the syllogism lies at the heart of all human reasoning and, in an attempt to make good the claim, presents an account of syllogistic forms attenuated in accordance with the epistemic matter of their premises. It also recognizes that communication depends on more than merely objective truth and formal validity, and offers an account of what motivates the assent of the human knower to any given stretch of discourse. As a theory, its global reach may be more impressive than its analytical grasp, but it is a marked advance on a theory only partly developed in the Alexandrian school.[29]

2.2.3 An Alternative Organon?

The doctrine of dividing knowledge into Conception and Assent determined the structure of Avicennan logic treatises, and the doctrine of secondary intelligibles cut down the number of subjects treated within the logic treatises, or at least, treated as strictly logical subjects. Formal interests of post-Avicennan logicians further limited interest in demonstration; syllogistic, whether usable in demonstration or not, became the central focus of research from the thirteenth century on. Further changes were introduced for clarity of exposition.

Text 14. The later scholars came and changed the technical terms of logic; and they appended to the investigation of the five universals its fruit, which is to say the discussion of definitions and descriptions which they moved from the Posterior Analytics; and they dropped the Categories because a logician is only accidentally and not essentially interested in that book; and they appended to On Interpretation the treatment of conversion (even if it had been in the Topics in the texts of the ancients, it is none the less in some respects among the things which follow on from the treatment of propositions). Moreover, they treated the syllogistic with respect to its productivity generally, not with respect to its matter. They dropped the investigation of [the syllogistic] with respect to matter, which is to say, these five books: Posterior Analytics, Topics, Rhetoric, Poetics, and Sophistical Fallacies (though sometimes some of them give a brief outline of them). They have ignored [these five books] as though they had never been, even though they are important and relied upon in the discipline (Ibn-Khaldûn (1858) Muqaddima 112-113; cf. Ibn-Khaldûn (1958) 3, 142-143).

It is clear that whether the structure of the Organon was appropriate for Arabic logic treatises was contested at least to the end of the thirteenth century. At the same time Hillî was setting out his logic according to the Avicennan outline of the Organon, Shamsaddîn as-Samarqandî (d. c. 1310) was writing a book laid out after the fashion described by Ibn Khaldûn in the text above, with one major difference. Samarqandî concluded his Qistâs al-Afkâr with a long section covering what he called “the etiquette of debate” and fallacies. He consciously adopted the etiquette of debate from treatises on legal reasoning, and he tells his readers that he intends it to replace study of the Topics and the Sophistical Fallacies.

Text 15. It has been the custom of our predecessors to place a chapter on dialectics (jadal) in their logical works. But since the science of juristic dialectic (khilâf) of our times does not need it, I have brought in its stead a canon for the art of disputation and its order, the proper formulation of speech [in disputation] and its rectification. This [art] is, with respect to establishing a thesis and explaining it, just like logic with respect to deliberation and thought; for, through it we are kept on the desired path and are saved from the recalcitrance of speech. I have set it out in two sections, the first, on the ordering and etiquette of debate, the second, on error and its causes.[30]

Samarqandî was entirely successful in supplanting the Topics and Sophistical Fallacies, and his works (especially Etiquette of Debate) gained a place in the madrasa system along side Kâtibî's Shamsiyya (and certain other works mentioned in 3 below).

2.3 The Modal Syllogistic

There were a number of modal systems developed and debated among the Arabic logicians. Those of Avicenna, Averroes and Kâtibî represent the nature and to some extent the range of the systems that were considered. We have to leave that of Alfarabi to one side not because it was not important, but because the relevant section of his long commentary on the Prior Analytics has not yet been recovered.

Avicenna, Averroes and Kâtibî wanted to use modal propositions to record metaphysical claims along the lines every man is necessarily rational and every man is contingently a writer. Each of them wanted to stipulate truth-conditions for the modal propositions that would precisely accommodate the metaphysical claims they believed they were entitled to make.

Averroes wanted further to make sure the truth-conditions he ended up with for his modals produced a syllogistic system that would have all and only the inferences that Aristotle had claimed for his system in the Prior Analytics. This made Averroes' task much more difficult than Avicenna's and Kâtibî's; both Avicenna and Kâtibî were content to have their propositions generate systems quite different from Aristotle's.

I dwell longest in what follows on Avicenna, because his was the system from which all other important systems had to distinguish themselves. For simplicity's sake, I concentrate on the truth-conditions stipulated for the propositions rather than the inferences traced in the proofs.

2.3.1 Avicenna

In a famous and much-quoted passage, Avicenna lays out six conditions under which a proposition may be said to have a given modalization (all his examples are of necessity propositions, but the same conditions apply to propositions under all modalizations); the first two conditions are the most important:

Text 16. Necessity may be absolute (‘alâ l-itlâq), as in God exists; [265] or it may be connected (mu‘allaqa) to a condition (shart). The condition is either [1] perpetual [relative] to the existence of the substance [of the subject] (dhât), as in man is necessarily a rational body; by which we do not mean to say that man is and always will be a rational body, because this is false taken for each human individual. Rather we mean that while he exists as a substance (mâ dâma mawjûda dh-dhât) as a human, he is a rational body. Likewise for every negative which resembles this affirmative statement.

Or [the condition may be] [2] the duration (dawâm) of the subject's being described with what is set down with it, as in all mobile things are changing; this is not to be taken to mean [this is so] absolutely, nor while the subject exists as a substance, but rather while the substance of the moving thing is moving. [266]

Distinguish between this condition and the first condition, because the first condition has set down [as the condition] the principle of the substance, man, whereas here the substance is set down with a description which attaches to the substance, moving thing; the moving thing has a substance and an essence (jawhar) to which movement and non-movement attach; but man and black are not like that (Avicenna (19712) Ishârât 264-266).

Avicenna takes a proposition under condition [1]—later termed, for obvious reasons, the dhâtî—to be the right proposition to use while laying out the system Aristotle should have laid out in the Prior Analytics, and for laying out the central claims of his own metaphysics. This is extremely important, especially for distinguishing the Avicennan system from the Averroist. Avicennan takes the dhâtî necessity proposition to be, strictly speaking, the necessity proposition used in the modal syllogistic. It depends on how things are and not on how things are described; that is, on what underlies J, and not on what kind of term J is. As he says in his response to the Shirazi scholars:

Text 17. The real necessary is the first, which has the sense that every thing described as J and every subject of J, whether J is inseparable for it or not, is described as A always at every time as long as that which is described as J exists (Avicenna (1974) al-Masâ'il al-Gharîba 90).

This is the point on which Avicenna differs most from Averroes; now we come to the point at which he will differ from Kâtibî (who accepts the conditions for the dhâtî/ wasfî propositions in much the same terms as Avicenna sets them out). On the subject term (and it is the same across all his propositions, whether explicitly modalized or not), Avicenna says this:

Text 18. Know that when we say every J is B, we do not mean the totality (kulliyya) of J is the totality of B. Rather, we mean that every single thing described as J, be it in mental supposition or extramental existence, be it described as J always, or sometimes, or whatever; that thing is described as B without further adding that it is so described at such and such a time (waqt), or in such and such circumstances (hâl), or perpetually. All of these [modalizations would make for a proposition] more special than one being described as absolute (mutlaq). So this is what is understood from every J is B, with no addition of modal operators attached. On this understanding it is called a general absolute… (Avicenna (19712) Ishârât 280 & 282).

(It's the phrase “be it in mental supposition” that will drive the wedge between Kâtibî and Avicenna.) As Paul Thom has pointed out, Avicenna's characterization of the subject term leaves open two ways of representing the proposition: either as de re predications with ampliated subjects, or as wholly embedded within the scope of a necessity operator.[31] The examples Avicenna uses, like “man is an animal”, tend to support the second reading. Further, the only successful model of Avicenna's system adopts the second way of representing the subject (see Thom (2008b)).

What this means is that when Avicenna expands on the truth-conditions of the necessity proposition, every J is necessarily B, he comes to something like: necessarily, whatever is described as J is necessarily B. For every J is possibly B, he has necessarily, whatever is described as J is possibly B. And—for reasons I won't delve into here—for the absolute every J is B, he has necessarily, whatever is described as J is at least once B.

With these truth-conditions, Avicenna ends up with some syllogisms with stronger conclusions than the corresponding syllogisms in the Prior Analytics, most notably Barbara NPN:[32] every J is possibly B, every B is necessarily A, therefore every J is necessarily A (Aristotle holds this to conclude: every J is possibly A (Pr.A. 35b37-36a2)). Avicenna also has to weaken some inferences: whereas Aristotle claims every J is necessarily B converts to some B is necessarily J (Pr.A. 25a31-33), Avicenna holds the true converse is only some B is possibly J (Avicenna (19712) Ishârât 334-335).

2.3.2 Averroes

In his fourth attempt to interpret Aristotle's modal system (see 1.4.2 above), Averroes differs from Avicenna first and foremost by insisting on a consideration Avicenna has been at pains to remove from his syllogistic: is the subject picked out by a term essential to it?

Averroes' final system comprises two distinct aspects. The first aspect—not original to Averroes nor apparently to the Arabic tradition—is seeing the modality of a proposition as a function of the modality of its terms, which in turn is a function of how each term picks out what it refers to. The second aspect is that different classes of modal syllogism are differentiated by the types of terms occurring in them. Rather than looking on the modality of the proposition as something which belongs irreducibly to the proposition, Averroes classifies modals in the following way:

Text 19. You should know that assertoric propositions have assertoric terms, necessary propositions necessary terms. [1] By “necessary term” I mean that the term is one per se, and these propositions are composed of a subject and an essential predicate (mahmûl jawharî) of that subject, or a subject and an inseparable accident (‘arad lâzim) belonging to that subject. [2] Those propositions with assertoric terms are those which are composed of denominative terms [162] which are sometimes present in the denominated thing and sometimes absent (sifât tûjad lil-mahmûl târatan wa-tufqad târatan). But when one of these denominative terms is present in the subject, there must be present another denominative term that follows on it necessarily which is the predicate, as in: everything walking is moving. For when walking is actually present the thing must be moving; and when walking is withdrawn from it (irtafa‘ minhu), so too is movement. These are the simple assertoric premises (al-muqaddamât al-wujûdiyya al-basîta) which are atemporal (fî ghayri zamân), and they are what Aristotle intends firstly to talk about in this book. Their subject and predicate alike are one per accidens (wal-mawdû‘ fîhâ wâhid bil-‘arad wa-ka-dhâlika l-mahmûl). [3] And there exists another kind of proposition that is partly assertoric and partly necessary (min jiha wujûdî wa-min jiha darûrî)—that is, the subject is composed of a substance and a changeable denomination (jawhar wa-sifa mutabaddila), from which follows a predicate composed of the substance of the denomination and [its] intrinsic essential attribute (sifa jawhariyya gharîziyya). The subject here is one per accidens and the predicate is one per se, for example, when we say that everything walking is an animal. And this is assertoric on account of the denomination of the denominated subject, and necessary on account of the predicate of the denomination. For walking, when it occurs, signifies an animal by discontinuous signification (fal-mashy idhâ wujida dalla ‘alâ l-hayawân dalâlatan ghayra dâ'ima), but for the times at which walking is present in it. The subject of walking implies being an animal always (wa-mawdû‘u l-mashy yalzamuhu wujûdu l-hayawân dâ'iman), because the subject of walking and what is denoted by that is necessarily an animal. And this proposition is in one respect necessary and in another assertoric (darûrîya min jiha wa-wujûdîya min jiha)—necessary per accidens and assertoric per se (darûrîya bil-‘arad wa-wujûdîya bidh-dhât). [4] A proposition that conversely has a necessary subject and a predicate of assertoric matter (mâdda) is just assertoric, and is not necessary per accidens. [163] This is a temporal assertoric, I say, where the subject implies the predicate for a specified time, and necessity is not found in it, only a connexion of the predicate and subject merely for that time. The characteristic of this [proposition] is that the predicate is not connected to the subject for all times at which the subject exists, but only for a certain specified time. And so, as Aristotle says, syllogisms in the sciences are not constructed from this type of assertoric.[33]

Averroes has, unlike Avicenna, made the way something is picked out by the term crucial in determining what kind of modal proposition is produced. So with a per se necessity proposition described in [1] above, he has truth-conditions which will allow him to make sense of Aristotle's claim that every J is necessarily B converts to some B is necessarily J.[34] And given that a possibility proposition will be the contradictory of a necessity proposition of the opposite quantity and quality, he will have good reasons to agree with Aristotle's claims about Barbara NPP (see Thom (2003) 86-87). In fact, Averroes is able to replicate Aristotle's results with necessity and possibility premises (Thom (2003) 199). He does so, however, at the cost of having to slide between calling a proposition of type 3 a necessity proposition or an assertoric according to the dictates of the exegetical moment.

2.3.3 Revisionist Avicennan Logicians

By and large, the Revisionists adopt most of Avicenna's distinctions and stipulations. But—on their preferred reading of the proposition—they reject, among other inferences, Barbara NPN. At this point I construct what I hope is an argument Kâtibî would be happy with: If every J is possibly B, and every B is necessarily A, it doesn't follow that every J actually becomes B such that it is necessarily A. Kâtibî does not ampliate the subject term to the possible (so that it would be understood as every possible B is necessarily A), nor does he read each proposition as being embedded in a necessity operator. Rather, he understands the possibility proposition as follows: there are Js, and whatever is at one time J is possibly B. This means that Kâtibî and the other Revisionists have a modal syllogistic that differs significantly from Avicenna's. The way the Revisionists put this difference is as follows:

Text 20. Our statement every J is B is used occasionally according to the essence (hasab al-haqîqa), and its meaning is that everything which, were it to exist, would be a J among possible individuals would be, in so far as it were to exist, a B; that is, everything that is an implicand of J is an implicand of B. And occasionally [it is used] according to actual existence (hasab al-khârij), and its meaning is that every J actually (fî l-khârij), whether at the time of the judgment or before it or after it, is B actually (fî l-khârij).


The distinction between the two considerations is clear. Were there no squares actually (fî l-khârij) it would be true to say a square is a figure under the first consideration and not the second; and were there no figures actually other than squares, it would be correct to say every figure is a square under the second consideration but not the first (Kâtibî (1948) Shamsiyya 91.1-4, 96.12-14).

Following Thom (Thom (2008b)), we may refer to the first reading as the essentialist and the second as the actualist.

I hope that by the italicized shriek at the beginning of the last paragraph (“on their preferred reading”) I made it clear that this is not the only reading of a proposition that the Revisionists are prepared to acknowledge. In fact, the Revisionists are prepared to accept the Avicennan inferences given an essentialist reading of the propositions, but this is a half-hearted concession never pursued in their treatises. The question is why, and I conclude this section by speculating as to the answer.

Both groups, the Avicennan and the Revisionists, want to be able not only to trace valid inferences, they want also to use the system they produce for extra-logical purposes. They want arguments that are not only valid, but also sound, that is, arguments that are not only formally perfect, but that have true premises. To use the essentialist reading to say every cow is necessarily four-stomached, as an Avicennan would, is to claim necessarily, every cow is necessarily four-stomached; this is much stronger in one important respect than the Revisionist claim that there are actually cows, and everything that's actually a cow is necessarily four-stomached. I think—and much more research is needed here—the Revisionists are backing away from the optimistic insights into reality the Avicennans claim to have.

3. Language in the Islamic Sciences

As has been noted, there is an Arabic term, mantiq, that translates “logic”, but none that translates “philosophy of language”. The study of mantiq was initially part of the foreign sciences, and only in the twelfth century was it accepted as an essential preliminary to a Muslim education. The other essential elements were the Islamic sciences, sciences which prepared a scholar to read the Koran and Traditions, and to extract from them theological and legal doctrines. One such science was the etiquette of debate, mentioned in 2.2.3 above, in which pragmatic arrangements stipulated for a debate about legal principles were extended to serve as rules for any kind of debate at all; it was to replace dialectic by the fourteenth century. Certain other Islamic sciences deal with questions covered in a philosophy of language.

Since the Koran is Arabic—a translation of the Koran is no longer the Koran—and since its rhetorical perfection functions as the miracle probative of Muhammad's prophetic status, reflection on language forms a major part of the Islamic sciences. There was a theological dispute about whether the Koran was eternal or created in time, and, since the Koran was in Arabic, the dispute entrained certain further disputes about the origin of language. Because the dispute had arisen out of concerns peculiar to Muslims, the ensuing dispute did not merely recapitulate discussions of antiquity. Bahshamî Mu‘tazilites held language to be a result of social convention (istilâh), a cooperative process in which expressions were assigned to, or Posited for, meanings in an arbitrary fashion. Their theological opponents, the first generation of Ash‘arites, held language to have been revealed by God to man and, in so far as there was a “process” of Positing, it was carried out by God. After the tenth century the debate moved on in a series of refinements on these two extreme positions, and the question retained an important place in theological and legal treatises (Weiss (1974)).

Of the cluster of disciplines that make up the grammatical sciences, especially ‘ilm al-wad‘ (roughly, semantics) and ‘ilm al-balâgha (roughly, rhetoric) overlap with the concerns of philosophy of language. Like the logic textbooks, the textbooks for both ‘ilm al-wad‘ and ‘ilm al-balâgha that were incorporated into a typical madrasa education were achieved fairly late.

‘Ilm al-wad‘ was named and consecrated as a separate discipline by the work of the great Ash‘arite theologian, ‘Adudaddin al-Îjî (d. 1355). In his Epistle on Positing, Îjî drew together the views of his predecessors on the way language came about. All agreed that language was the result of a conscious assignation—Positing—of units of vocal sound (or expressions, alfâz) to units of thought (or meanings, ma‘ânî). It made no difference what position one adopted on the origin of language, because either God or the community could function as the Positor of language. Note that the units of thought are at least logically prior to language, so language is not considered a pre-condition of thought. Language is the totality of expressions together with the totality of their meanings. Once expressions have been assigned their meanings by the Positor, this is irrevocable.

Having stated these common assumptions about language, Îjî turned to set out a typology of Positing. Îjî noted that—in what he took to be unproblematic cases—the meaning in the mind of the Positor in positing the expression is identical to the meaning it has in actual speech situations. But what about the pronoun, “he”, which will have a different meaning in different speech situations? This is the problem on which Îjî dwells in his epistle. Its solution turned out to be, as Tashköprüzade was later to say, only a drop in the ocean of problems in ‘ilm al-wad‘; once one took the notion of Positing seriously, implementing it as a general explanation for the relation between expression and meaning turned out to be an immense project which carried on into the twentieth century (Weiss (1987), especially 341-345).

‘Ilm al-balâgha was standardly presented in a textbook by Khatîb Dimashq al-Qazwînî (d. 1325), The Abridgement of the Key. ‘Ilm al-balâgha was a doctrine deriving from work by the great eleventh-century grammarian and Ash‘arite theologian, ‘Abdalqâhir al-Jurjânî (d. 1078), who—spurred by debate about how to judge the inimitability of the Koran—had tried to develop a method for evaluating rhetorical excellence. Later scholars continued his work. Whereas literal usage depends on a fixed relationship between expression and meaning (and is therefore not open to evaluation beyond being right or wrong), figurative usage has no such fixed relationship, but rather has the expression refer to a mediate meaning which then refers to the intended meaning: “I have a gaunt young camel” refers to a camel deprived of food, which in turn brings to mind a generous man who prefers feeding his guests to looking after his camel.[35] Thus the basis for the further investigation of metaphor and simile was complementary in certain respects with the discussion of Positing.

It is a sad fact of modern scholarship that those who study the Greek-derived traditions of philosophy of logic in Arabic are unlikely to have the competence to deal with parallel traditions within the Islamic sciences, and vice versa. That may in turn make modern scholarship overemphasize the gap between the two traditions. I therefore end by referring to the work of Abû l-Hasan Hâzim al-Qartâjannî (d. 1285) who, in his Program for Rhetoricians, exemplifies how easily and profitably at least some in the pre-modern Muslim world could slide between the two traditions (Qartâjannî (1966) Minhâj esp. 66 et seq.). Would that modern scholarship could emulate this facility.


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