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Medieval Theories of Demonstration

First published Fri Aug 12, 2005

In the Middle Ages, the theory of demonstration, developing the theory found in Aristotle's Posterior Analytics, was considered the culmination of logic, bringing all the other parts of the discipline to bear on the task of developing scientific knowledge. Elaborated largely in commentaries and discussions of the Posterior Analytics itself, but also sometimes in independent opuscula on specific problems, this body of philosophical literature corresponds to modern Philosophy of Science. In particular, the problems how we come to know causal laws, how scientific knowledge differs from other sorts of cognition, how mathematical knowledge differs from other sorts of scientific knowledge, and why mathematical knowledge is more certain, are explored in this literature. Although the discussion followed Aristotle's views closely, each interpreter read his views in a way that would square them with his own metaphysical system, so that the most important Aristotelian writers of the thirteenth century, Albert the Great, Thomas Aquinas, and Giles of Rome, revised the initial, Augustinian, reading of Robert Grosseteste's commentary. Aristotle himself was obscure on a number of points, and so radical Aristotelian authors fell into disputes among themselves over the exact character of the “highest sort of demonstration” (demonstratio potissima), and the nature of the scientific knowledge resulting from it. These disputes were rooted in part in earlier disputes among the Arabic commentators, as reported in Averroes's commentaries. Ockham and his followers developed yet another reading of the science of demonstration to fit their nominalist metaphysics in the fourteenth century, and in the later Middle Ages their views and those of Aquinas dominated the scene. In later Terminist commentaries, such as that of Antony Coronel in 1510, it is assumed that scientific knowledge is a natural form caused in the mind by knowledge of the premisses of a demonstration, and it is treated as a subject of puzzles concerning beginning and ceasing, and the like, typical of the sophismata discussed in that school. In the sixteenth century other controversies moved to the fore, over the application of the “Science of Demonstration” to mathematics, and concerning the manner of discovery of a demonstration through “analysis and synthesis.” In the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries, with the new Platonisms, the anti-Aristotelian bias of the new science, and developing empiricism, the theory of demonstration came to be ignored in mainstream philosophy, although it persists as an element of Thomism.

1. Aristotle's Posterior Analytics

A demonstration in Aristotle is a syllogism that produces scientific knowledge. Scientific knowledge is knowledge not simply that something is the case, but why it is the case, what causes bring it about. Perhaps we would do better to call it a scientific understanding of the fact known. This means that one may have cognition that something is true which is quite certain without having scientific knowledge, and Aristotle's Posterior Analytics is not a treatise on what we might nowadays call general epistemology. To produce and transmit scientific understanding, Aristotle thought we had to duplicate, in the deductive order of the science, the order of causes found in reality. Just as the causes can be traced back to first causes rooted in the nature of the thing known, so the science must arise from first principles associated with the real definition of the thing known expressing that nature.

It is notorious that Aristotle's syllogistic logic cannot capture the logic of relations, and so is inadequate to the task of presenting the deductive structure of mathematics. This difficulty was handled in practice by placing the relational arguments outside the formal structure of syllogistic which formed the framework of a science. The principles of a demonstration, Aristotle thought, always had to be universal, reporting, as they do, necessary connections. Now he was accustomed to showing universal truths through one sort of ‘setting forth’ (ekthesis), working out the thing informally in a particular case and then using universal generalization to establish the universal truth. (Posterior Analytics I 4, 73b33-74a4 clearly sets out the procedure.) The ‘setting forth’ stood outside the formal structure of the syllogistic, and it allowed the establishment of universal premises with complex terms, for instance, a premise to the effect that “every triangle-with-its-base-extended-so-as-to-form-an-external-angle is a triangle-with-its-external-angle-equal-to-the-sum-of-the-two-angles-opposite-it-in-the-triangle.” Aristotle here uses the term “universal” to mean not only that the predicate belonged in every case to the subject, but also that it could not be proved of the subject simply because of its belonging to some wider universal to which that subject also belonged. So it would not do to show by ‘setting forth’ and assume as a first principle that an isosceles triangle has its angles equal to two right angles, for this is because it is a triangle, not because it is an isosceles triangle. A first principle must be not just universally quantified, but commensurately universal, so that the predicate belongs to the subject in every case, and belongs to whatever else it belongs to because it belongs to that subject, and because whatever else it belongs to, essentially or accidentally, falls under that subject.

Aristotle does not lay down tight rules for discovering first principles, though he points out that one needs a good deal of experience of the subject, and that if we possess the first principles they will explain why the subject has the attributes it does. His book proceeds by explaining the logical form into which a science must be put if it is to be transmitted to an ideal student. He takes the mathematics of his time to be the paradigmatic science.

A demonstrative science then, requires for its being understood (1) an understanding of the terms entering into it (later commentators suggest that “nominal definitions” provide this), (2) knowledge of certain axioms applicable to many sciences (for instance, the law of the excluded middle), (3) knowledge of first principles, that is,indemonstrable truths proper to the science under consideration (PA I 1, 71a11-17; 2, 72a14-22; 10), (4) knowledge of real definitions of the subject of the science, and its various species and predicates (PA I 33, 89a18; II 3, 90b24; 13, 96b23; 17, 99b22). The principles of a demonstration must be true, indemonstrable, and such as to provide the reason for the truth of the conclusion, but they must also be necessary and per se (PA I 2). These last two requirements were variously interpreted by medieval thinkers, but we can note that Aristotle allows a statement can be per se in two ways: (1) if its subject term somehow includes its predicate within its definition, so that “A human being is rational” is per se, and (2) if its predicate term includes its subject implicitly in its definition as the proper subject for that sort of accident, so that “A human being is able to laugh” is per se (PA I 4, 73a35-b24. (There are two other senses of “per se” given here, and although it is reasonably supposed they have no bearing on demonstration, we will see below that some medieval commentators tried to make something of them.) The middle term of a demonstration must express the cause why the predicate of the conclusion belongs to its subject. The predicate of the conclusion, the “attribute,” will not be part of the essence of the subject, but will somehow follow on its essence. It was disputed in the Middle Ages whether the middle term in the highest sort of demonstration would be the real definition of the subject, or the real definition of the attribute, but it was generally agreed that it would be a real definition, and that one of the premisses of a demonstration would express a necessary truth not derivable by a simple analysis of either the nominal or the real definition of its subject. (The central text here, and that a very difficult one suggesting a number of different possible lines of analysis, is PA II 8-10.)

Various sorts of demonstration falling short of this ideal model, because they do not give a full explanation of the cause why the fact is true, were allowed in Aristotle's text (PA I 13), and the medieval authors refer to these as demonstration that it is the case (quia) as opposed to demonstration why it is the case (propter quid). Most important here is the sort of demonstration which argues from the cause to the effect rather than effect to cause, for instance, the demonstration that stars, unlike the planets, are far away because they twinkle, and whatever twinkles is far away. Twinkling, of course, does not cause the stars to be far away, but rather the distance causes the twinkling. This sort of demonstration plays a role in discussions of analysis and synthesis in the fifteenth century. Demonstrations concerning particulars, and demonstrations arguing from theorems in the science which are not traced back to first principles, are also demonstrations that it is the case.

Another important case is that in which principles are imported from another science to complete a demonstration. So if one proves that circular wounds heal more slowly because they have a large ratio of area to circumference, and healing proceeds at the edge of a wound, one has borrowed, in medicine, a principle from geometry. The physician (qua physician) need not know this principle (that is, he need not know the reason why it is so, so that he is able to prove it), but may rely on the authority of the geometer (without being open to criticism as a physician). In such a case the demonstration is said to be “subalternate” to another science, and the nature of this subalternation provided a subject for debate between more Augustinian and more Aristotelian commentators on Aristotle.

2. The Medieval Reception of Aristotle before Robert Grosseteste

Although Boethius reports a translation of Themistius's paraphrase of the Posterior Analytics into Latin, and may have done a translation himself, neither of these works survived into the Middle Ages. The Latins first became acquainted with the work through the translation of James of Venice between 1125 and 1150. John of Salisbury benefits from James in his Metalogicon, giving a list of points from the work there (Book IV 6-8). The James translation became the vulgate, and the translation done for Thomas Aquinas by William Moerbeke never received much usage. Translations of Themistius's paraphrase of the work, and a lost work by al-Farabi on demonstration (or perhaps Averroes's critical remarks on that work), were used by Albert the Great, and though they dropped out of circulation soon thereafter, scholars sometimes cribbed from Albert's commentary. The commentary of Alexander of Aphrodisias (or the commentary of Philoponus, which is close to Alexander) was translated by James of Venice. This translation also quickly dropped out of circulation, but much of its content survived in marginal glosses. The Middle Commentary of Averroes was translated by William of Luna around 1300, but was not used before the latter half of the fifteenth century, though Albert the Great seems to have some knowledge of Averroes, and so his doctrines were not without influence.

3. Robert Grosseteste

The Posterior Analytics was little known in the twelfth century, despite James of Venice's translation, then. Though earlier discussions are to be noted, such as that of Richard Rufus (see Rega Wood (1996)), the work first enters into the Western tradition in a serious way in the commentary of Robert Grosseteste (1175-1253), written around 1230. Grosseteste applies the theory in the Posterior Analytics to itself, presenting it as a demonstrative science of demonstration. Thus he suggests that Aristotle first gives a definition of demonstration, a syllogism producing scientific knowledge, and a definition of scientific knowledge, and then, in a series of syllogisms, deduces the properties that a demonstration must have, first considered in itself as a free-standing syllogism, then considered in relation to other demonstrations, and finally considered as it is part of a science. The second book of the work, he claims, discusses the art of definition as the way to discover demonstrations, and how it is that definition occurs as the middle term and the cause of the truth of the conclusion, in a demonstration. He finds thirty-two scientific conclusions in each of the two books, and his list of conclusions forms the standard summary of the work for many later writers. This analysis is most plausible in the beginning of Book I, and the initially structured presentation degenerates to a mere list of points made, often with little evident deductive structure, in the discussion of the latter part of Book I and in Book II. Many portions of the book are treated, plausibly enough, as ancillary to the deductive science, concerned, for instance, with disproving common errors.

Before Grosseteste, Aristotle's text was considered very difficult, both in doctrine and in language, and it seems to have caused some concern because of its apparent disagreement with the dominant Augustinian theory of knowledge. Grosseteste not only explained the book clearly, but also reconciled it with Augustine by treating demonstration as the means by which a fallen humanity must come to knowledge of the world. Augustine's Neoplatonic account of knowledge is reserved for our restored or supernaturally assisted nature in its contemplation of God, or of the natural world in God. No doubt, Grosseteste's position as a well-known and conservative Bishop helped to legitimize the science of demonstration for his more conservative readers.

Grosseteste suggests that if the mind were healthy, and unaffected by the Fall, it would be able to see in God the exemplary forms of all the things he had created. But as it is, such knowledge of exemplary forms is impossible, though the light of God illumines the forms of particular things that we encounter in the world so that we can come to know them. Such forms are in themselves universal and unchanging (indeed, in themselves they are the same as, though not numerically identical with, exemplary forms), and so they can ground necessary truths. But the knowledge of a real definition of a substance, of a simple form, does not impart knowledge of its causal powers. (Ockham, it will be noted, shares this view.) For instance, the knowledge of the causal power of scammony to purge red bile arises only after we observe a number of cases where it does this, and so come to form an aestimatio that it does in this or that particular case. (An aestimatio is produced in the senses, and can be formed by irrational animals. It is a kind of perception of a particular causal conneciton, and is not necessarily correct. The idea seems to have come from Augustine, De Libero Arbitrio II.) Then, spurred on by this aestimatio, reason proposes an experiment, and introduces scammony when every other cause for the purging of red bile is absent, and if it often draws out red bile under these conditions, reason concludes that it is a causal power of scammony to do this. The intellect's ability to frame a universal concept after it becomes familiar with particular individuals through the senses is paralleled by its ability to form universal causal judgments after sensory aestimatio informs it of particular causal events. (Grosseteste (1981) I 14, lines 252-271.)

This knowledge of causal laws is knowledge of what a given agent is suited to do, but it is knowledge of what it will actually do only for the most part. This is not knowledge of what it will do most of the time, or even frequently, but of what it will do of itself as long as nothing is present to prevent it from doing it. It occurs through knowledge of “material definitions” which depend on prior, “formal definitions.” The formal definition of a thing specifies its function, and involves a final cause, while its material definition specifies how it must be constructed so as to perform that function, that is, to be an efficient cause of certain effects. The formal definition tells us what the exemplary form is, while the material definition specifies how that form and its causal activity are actually realized in matter. (The distinction between formal and material definition relies on an interpolation from Alexander/Philoponus's commentary in the text of James's translation of Posterior Analytics II 19. From Aquinas on people were aware of this error in the translation.) Knowledge of mathematical truth occurs without any efficient or final cause in the picture, and we can see triangles, for instance, as they really are in themselves with a direct mental view, rather than attempting to reconstruct them, as we do in the case of thunder, for instance, where we know that some physical arrangement is producing a noise (has that as its function, as it were), but cannot view that physical arrangement directly. Thus mathematical demonstrations are higher (potior) than natural demonstrations, since what they show is always the case, and they are more easily known. (Grosseteste (1981) I 18, lines 119-126.)

Knowledge of what is “for the most part” includes knowledge concerning eclipses, and eclipses, of course, only rarely occur. How can there be knowledge of, and necessary truths about, what, most of the time, does not even exist? For one thing, eclipses are always present in their “causal reasons,” that is, in the motions of the sun and moon, which guarantee that eclipses occur now and again, and, moreover, we can say that it is always true that if a certain situation occurs, in which no impediments are present, an eclipse will occur necessarily due to the nature of the Moon. (Grosseteste (1981) I 18, lines 189-214.)

One science can be subalternate to another, according to Grosseteste, in several ways. In one, a science, say Music, the science of audible proportion, falls under another, in this case the science of proportion, but it is not a part of that science, since audibility is an accident of proportion, not a difference which establishes some species of it. Arithmetical and geometrical proportion, for instance, are species of proportion, and so the science of arithmetical or geometrical proportion would be a part of the science of proportion, not subalternate to it. He says in this case that the one science falls under the other univocally, since both are said to deal with proportion. Now audible proportion may be no more than an accidental unity, but it is still the case, Grosseteste holds, that proportion is a necessary formal part of the real nature of harmony, just as its audibility is. So the subject of music, harmony, is, as it were, proportion realized in a certain matter, just as the actual material constitution of a natural object is the realization of some higher form, say that of an animal, the nature of whose functioning can be understood quite independently of the realization of it in that particular matter. Grosseteste sees subalternation as a phenomenon revealing a deep metaphysical truth, the truth that a natural material object is always the realization in matter of some higher form that is what it is quite independently of that realization. So he does not consider the case of the circular wound as subalternation, for circularity in no way constitutes or realizes the function of a wound. Medicine is not even in part subalternate to mathematics. (Grosseteste (1981) I 12, lines 153-198.) In a second case of true subalternation, Grosseteste holds, the science of the parts of a thing, which realize its functioning, must be brought into play to understand the thing. So the science of harmony is subalternate to the science of numbers, Arithmetic, for numbers are the parts of proportions, and must be known if proportions are to be known, even if proportions are not numbers in the way that audible proportions are proportions. So the one science falls under the other “almost univocally.” Similarly, medicine is subalternate to the science of the elements, even though the elements are not strictly parts of the body (not functional parts), since they still enter into its constitution and so must be understood if the body is to be understood.

This account of subordination was intimately connected with Grosseteste's metaphysics. He thought that the material world arose from light, which propagates itself in a straight line through space, so that matter can only be understood as arising from light in accord with mathematical laws. Thus natural science will be subalternate to mathematics, for even though mathematics is not the science of the higher form, of light, considered in itself, it does govern the way in which light realizes itself in space. The fact that the science of nature depends on mathematics is a clue that the natural world originates from a higher form in accord with mathematics. Similarly, a living being comes about when a higher form lends functions of digestion, reproduction, sensation and the like to matter, these functions being accomplished by the causal operations of matter, so that the biological sciences are subalternate to natural science.

Grosseteste identifies two types of demonstration of the highest sort, natural and mathematical. His analysis of natural demonstrations depends on a distinction between formal and material definition, which was interpolated into the text of Posterior Analytics II 9 and seems to come from the James translation of the commentary of Alexander (= Philoponus?). The interpolated text suggests that a formal definition might serve as the middle term in a demonstration, proving the material definition of the subject. For example, one might demonstrate that anger is the boiling of blood around the heart (its material definition), by using as the middle term the formal definition of anger, the desire to do harm to another. Of course, one would have to know a first principle asserting that whatever fits the formal definition must realize the functioning it expresses in that material form, and one would have to know what anger really is, in its own proper form. Again, drawing on Aristotle's example in Posterior Analytics II 8, thunder is a noise made in a cloud (formal definition), and such a noise, in a cloud, is made (only) when fire is extinguished in it, and so thunder is the extinction of fire in a cloud.

A demonstration of the highest sort in mathematics does not, of course, work out the mechanism by which some function must be accomplished, so in this case the middle term will the formal definition of the subject, stated in terms of its parts (so a definition of a triangle will be in terms of the lines making it up, the definition of a number in terms of the units making it up, and so on). The attribute, rather than a material definition, will simply be the property proved of the subject.

In both these sorts of demonstration, Grosseteste holds, the major premise and conclusion are per se in the second way, that is, the subject is somehow presupposed in their predicates. The minor premise, since it predicates a formal definition of its subject, is per se in the first way (the subject contains the predicate). So in the case of a natural demonstration, the subject is the causal outcome of the predicate (the noise, or thunder, results from the extinction of fire in a cloud), and is presupposed in it inasmuch as the point of the material events is to produce that outcome. It is as if one were to say that the construction of an adding machine presupposes the notion that it adds, because it is in order to do this that it has a structure which causes addition. Final and efficient causation does not figure in mathematical demonstrations, but in any proper demonstration, Grosseteste thinks, the conclusion will not merely assign a predicate that belongs universally to its subject, but one that is commensurately universal with it. That is, one won't have identified the real underlying cause why a figure has a property if it belongs to some larger class of figures that have the property, unless one demonstrates that this larger class has it, and then appends, as it were, a note to the effect that the figure falls within the larger class. That means that a demonstration of the highest sort will always show a property to belong to something which not only has it necessarily, but which is also necessary to produce that property. So the conclusion and the major premise will have to be per se in the second way, for the subject will be the necessarily underlying cause of the property. Nothing else can produce it.

4. The Criticism of Grosseteste by Albert the Great and Thomas Aquinas

The earliest commentary on the Posterior Analytics other than Grosseteste's to gain any general currency in Europe was that of Albert the Great (ca. 1200-1280), written between 1245 and 1260. His commentary takes a different form from Grosseteste's. It is composed of ten Treatises on each of the two books of Aristotle's work, each treatise approaching a topic as a subject of controversy, on which Albert reports every view he can find from Arabic and Ancient commentators, as well as the moderns. It also has different content, for as an Aristotelian, Albert objected to Grosseteste's metaphysical views, and this led him to a different reading of the Posterior Analytics.

The most obvious difference is in Albert's views of the subalternation of one science to another, and the role of mathematics in the natural sciences. Since Albert does not accept a substantial form of a thing that acts as an exemplar to preexisting matter, and does not accept the development of lower forms of individuals from higher forms in the mind of God, he rejects the notion that “natural things are founded on mathematical being, and mathematical being on divine being … so that the principles of natural being are mathematical.” (Albert the Great, Commentary on the Metaphysics, Book I Chapter 1.) For Albert the unity of a particular thing is rooted in its particular substantial form, and does not arise as an expression of a higher, mathematical unity, nor can any knowledge of particular natures in themselves be obtained through reflection on being itself, or other higher forms. Each science must stand on its own, and we cannot even derive the species from its genus, much less from its mathematically expressible accidents.The new account of subalternation worked out by Albert was accepted in general by later Aristotelians (for instance, in Ockham, Summa Logicae III.II 21), and Grosseteste's account was abandoned.

Consider the science of harmony. Grosseteste had said that it was subalternate univocally to the science of proportion, for a harmony is a proportion realized in sounds. Albert objects that in a demonstration within the science of harmony, the real explanation why it is so does not occur in the science of proportion, for the subject of the science is sounds, not proportions, and what is true of proportions cannot be applied to harmonies directly, as though a sound were a mathematical entity. Sounds do have certain mathematically expressible accidents, but the science of proportions does not establish the substance or nature of sounds. It bears only on those accidents. The two sciences are not univocal, that is, they do not have the same subject. Rather, the subject of the higher science is an accident of the subject of the lower science. So the subject of harmony is a certain kind of sound, not a certain kind of proportion. To explain why, we will have to trace the fact, not from the nature of proportionality, striving to introduce itself into a certain kind of material, but from the nature of sound. Nature operates by its own principles, and if it accomplishes the aims of some higher form, this is because God created it so that it would accomplish those aims of itself. God created it from nothing, rather than its evolving from a higher form striving to realize itself in matter.

From this Albert concludes that the science of the human body might be subalternated to mathematics, after all, and when Aristotle says medicine is not subalternate to geometry, he only means that the whole of medicine is not subalternate to geometry in the way that the whole of optics is, say. Instead, only a few medical demonstrations are subalternate to geometry. They are, however, subalternate to geometry in exactly the same way as the demonstrations in optics are, for optics is the science of light, and geometry bears only on certain accidents of light, not on light itself, and does not explain why light has those accidents.

Thomas Aquinas agrees with Albert on these matters. In his literal commentary on the Posterior Analytics (1269-72) he notes that mathematics bears on matter because of the nature of matter, which leads it to have mathematical accidents, dimensions, that is, accidents which can be abstracted from matter and considered on their own in the mathematical disciplines without relation to matter. It is only in the intellect, through abstraction, that they become separated from matter, and their presence in matter is due to the nature of matter, not to any sort of prior mathematical reality. But there is something here that is not in Albert, for Albert does not allow the possibility that the nature of a thing can cause it to have properties that are not part of its essence. He thinks that every accident in a thing is to be traced to another accident in the thing, or some accident of something outside which brings it about that the accident inheres, but that no accident, not even an attribute, that is, a proper accident necessarily belonging to that sort of thing, is caused in it by its essence. To Albert's mind, this would mean that the nature of a thing, considered in itself and not insofar as it is a particular in particular circumstances, would efficiently cause its attribute to inhere in it, and that smacks of Platonism, of the view that separated universals somehow play a causal role in the world. Thomas argues that a thing's nature efficiently causes its primary attribute, and that it does so necessarily and without exception. This means that the primary attribute is always a propensity or capacity, not an actual inherence of an occurrent quality, since, of course, the actual inherence of an occurrent quality depends on the right conditions being in place for the operation of the capacity to have that quality. Albert allows that such propensities are necessary in their subjects, and he agrees that they are not part of the subject's essence, so that they follow deductively from its nature, but he allows no sort of efficient causation any role in this process. Efficient causation of this sort is referred to in later Thomistic writers as “emanation”—so Cajetan in his commentary on the Summa Theologiae I, questions 54 and 77, and Suarez in his discussion of efficient causation in Metaphysical Disputation 18.3. But such efficient causation is an impossibility for Albert, for Albert takes it that all efficient causation connects actualities (an assumption he perhaps got from Averroes), and seems to take propensities and capacities as nothing more than descriptions how efficient causality works for one or another kind of thing.

Part of the issue rests on the requirement that first principles, which assert primary, indemonstrable attributes of their subjects, be necessary truths. Thomas takes it that they must be strictly necessary, universally true in every case at every time. Albert thinks the necessity involved here is of another sort, a conditional necessity, so that the attribute belongs to its subject necessarily, if nothing prevents it. Thus he can identify an actuality as a primary attribute, allowing that possession of the attribute by the subject only occurs “for the most part,” and still identify the first principle asserting this possession of the attribute as a necessary truth. It seems that Thomas Aquinas was less radically Aristotelian on this point than his master. The metaphysical difference led to a notorious and long-lasting dispute over the nature of the highest sort of demonstration (demonstratio potissima).

5. The Dispute over the Highest Sort of Demonstration

Thomas Aquinas argued that the highest sort of demonstration had as its middle term the real definition of the subject term (Comm. on PA II 1.9, 7, 19). This led him to claim that the fourth way in which something can be per se pertained to demonstration, since it indicates an efficient causal connection, and the minor premise will be true in a demonstration because of the efficient causal connection between the essence of the subject, as expressed in its real definition, and the attribute proven of it, making it per se in the fourth way.

Albert the Great, with his more Aristotelian metaphysics, had argued that a demonstration of the highest sort would have the definition of the attribute as its middle term. This sort of definition is sometimes called a causal definition, and is the rough equivalent of a real definition for an attribute. In actuality, an attribute is an accident, and so has no proper real definition, indicating what it is entirely in itself, since what it is involves its belonging to an appropriate subject, and it actually belongs to such a subject only under favorable conditions. So a “real” definition for the attribute would have to express things extrinsic to the attribute, its subject and that which brings it to actuality in the subject. For this reason, Ockham insists that the definition of an attribute is a nominal definition, not a real one, and Aquinas holds that the conclusion of a demonstration of the highest sort will be per se both in the second way (presupposing the subject) and the fourth (indicating efficient causation) (Aquinas, Commentary on P.A. I 10). Albert's preference for the definition of the attribute follows Averroes's opinion that the highest sort of demonstration should demonstrate not a mere potentiality, but an actual state of affairs. Aquinas and the others who held to his view recognized that a demonstrable attribute in a natural thing would have to be a potentiality, though, of course, an actuality could be demonstrated in a mathematical demonstration, where efficient causation is not at issue, and an occurrent attribute can be shown to inhere in the subject necessarily and at every time.

There actually seems to be a good deal more support for Albert's view than for Thomas's in the Posterior Analytics. Albert relies in particular on Aristotle's reference to the sort of definition that includes every part of a demonstration, but arranged in a different order (Posterior Analytics II 10), which he takes to be the definition of the passion which is the middle term in a demonstration, and on the examples of demonstration discussed in Posterior Analytics II 8. Aquinas finds little support for his position in the Posterior Analytics, and resorts to De Anima I 1 to prove his point, so that much of his more detailed discussion of demonstration of the highest sort is in fact to be found outside the commentary on the Posterior Analytics.

Albert's position was defended after Aquinas by Giles of Rome, who wrote an extensive literal commentary on the Posterior Analytics in 1285, with many questions embedded in it, as well as an opusculum What is the Middle Term in Demonstration (1276-77). Giles follows Albert closely. Thomas had argued that Albert's candidate for the highest sort of demonstration could not be accepted, because it assumed as its major premise that the definition of the attribute belongs to the subject. This, however, is demonstrable, for the definition of the attribute belongs to the subject only because of the subject's essential nature, if it in fact always belongs to the subject, and if it does not always belong to the subject, then the demonstration needs an additional premise, which is not a necessary truth at all, to the effect that the external conditions needed for the subject to have its attribute are present. So prior to the proposed demonstration is a demonstration that the definition of the attribute belongs to the subject, because it belongs to whatever has the real definition of the subject. Giles's objection to this is that the major premise in such a demonstration is, as it were, tautologous, there being no real distinction between the subject and its essence, and so the purported demonstration begs the question. In order to avoid begging the question, both premisses would have to be such that there is a real distinction between subject and predicate. The argument had been made against Albert's position that the definition of the attribute and the attribute itself were identical, so that Albert's candidate for demonstration of the highest sort begged the question, but Giles (and Ockham after him) points out that the definition of the attribute, being a causal definition of something whose existence depends on other things, refers obliquely to things other than the attribute itself, and so is not in fact really identical with it. The same point cannot be made in defense of the affirmation of the real definition of the subject of the subject, and so Giles turned the tables on his opponents.

This was a powerful objection. The standard reply to it is developed in John of Cornwall's Questions on the Posterior Analytics (1298-1300), and Walter Burleigh's Questions and Commentary on the Posterior Analytics (1300-10). John of Cornwall's work was at one time thought to be Scotus's, and it certainly seems to reflect Scotus's thinking on this point (Opus Oxoniensis I, Distinction 2, Question 2). The defense is to claim that there are two sorts of concepts possible of a substance, quidditative concepts, which are captured in the real definition, and concepts that express the quiddity only confusedly. Someone who does not know what the quiddity of a lion is nonetheless may have a concept of lion if he has encountered lions, but his concept is non-quidditative. To avoid begging the question in a demonstration of the highest sort, one must assert the quidditative concept of the non-quidditative concept of a substance. So, if one says that a lion (as commonly conceived) is in fact an animal with a certain genetic code, say, this is not a mere tautology, for the notion of the genetic code is not included in the everyday, non-quidditative concept of lion. Giles's reply is to the effect that the confused, simple concept of a substance possessed by the ordinary fellow in fact refers to the same reality as the real definition does, so that asserting the real definition of the confused concept simply asserts that the reality is itself, and so is a triviality, after all. This, of course, is not true of the definition of an attribute, since it obliquely refers to things other than the reality that is the attribute, namely its causes. So to discover the real definition of human and assert it of the simple, confused concept of human being is not to convey new information. To see the point of this reply, we must see that the standard way of identifying the real nature of a human being is simply to place it in its genus and identify its specific difference, but it is arguable that doing this in the case of a substance gives us no new information, but only places the thing in the right spot in a scheme of classification. It is a little hard to see how “a human being is a rational animal” does anything more than identify what we want to talk about. Of course, to say that this concrete thing is a rational animal is informative, but does it give us any different information than the assertion that this concrete thing is a human being? On the other hand, the causal definition of an attribute really does add to our information about it, as when we find that the noise-in-the-cloud, i.e. thunder, is a noise-in-the-cloud-produced-by-the-extinction-of-fire. These two notions are really distinct, for the one refers obliquely to fire, and the other does not.

Giles's objection to the view that the definition of the subject is the middle term in the highest sort of demonstration would be particularly difficult for Thomas to meet, since Thomas agreed with Giles on the unicity of substantial form. Ockham and the Franciscan tradition in general, which rejects this doctrine, might hold that the real definition of human being, say, does refer to real parts that need not be referred to in a confused, simple concept of human being. Scotus, of course, has an additional resource available, for he can deploy a formal distinction between the individual and its essence here (which would not be recognized by Ockham or Thomas), even when the individual has but a single substantial form.

6. William of Ockham and the Possibility of Scientific Knowledge

William of Ockham discusses the Posterior Analytics and demonstration in two places, his Summa Logicae III.II, On Demonstrative Syllogism, and his Scriptum in Librum Sententiarum Ordinatio, Prologue, Questions 2 through 6 (before 1324). In the latter, he develops an account of demonstration to discuss the question what, if anything, can be demonstrated of God. In both places he lays out his views systematically, rather than in commentarial form.

Ockham agreed with Scotus and Aquinas that the definition of the subject is the middle term in a demonstration of the highest sort, but he is no more comfortable with the notion that the subject somehow efficiently causes an attribute in itself through its essence than is Albert. Indeed, he insists that nothing of interest follows for a demonstration from the real definition of a subject giving its genus and difference. This is because what follows demonstratively follows on some real structure of really distinct parts within the subject. This means, first of all, that a genus-difference definition of a thing, which does not identify really distinct parts in it, cannot serve as a middle term in demonstration. Moreover, since God has no real parts, but is perfectly simple, no demonstration concerning God can be constructed at all. But some definitions of a subject do identify real parts within it. One case occurs in mathematics, in which the real definition of a subject obliquely conveys parts of the subject, for instance, as in the definition of a triangle, which is not said directly to be identical to its parts, the lines making it up, say, but is said obliquely to be something composed from those lines. This, for Ockham, is the only possibility for the highest sort of demonstration (Summa Logicae III.II 40). It alone meets Thomas's criterion for such a demonstration, i.e. it shows the attribute to belong actually to the subject necessarily and in every case, Albert's criterion, that the attribute be occurrent and not merely a capacity, and Giles's requirement that the attribute be really distinct from the subject, so that it can reasonably be said that the conclusion is not an immediate proposition. In another case, one can demonstrate an implicitly negative attribute of something from the fact that it is composed of real parts, arguing, for instance, that “Whatever has separable parts is destructible, every material thing has separable parts, therefore every material thing is destructible.” This, however, since it shows an attribute which conveys the parts of the subject negatively, is not a demonstration of the highest sort.

In another type of demonstration, the middle term may be a definition of a concrete subject obliquely referring to its parts without any determination, namely in demonstrations concerning animals and human beings, in which the reality contains a plurality of forms. Thus a particular human being is able to learn, say, in virtue of the form which is its rational soul. If, as Thomas held, there is no plurality of forms here, but every natural substantial form, including biological forms, is simple, and its rational soul just is the form of the body, then no demonstration is possible at all, for the ability to learn is immediately in a human being through itself, so that to say that a human being is rational is to express a first principle. If there is a plurality of forms, this sort of demonstration nonetheless falls short of the highest sort, for it concerns only the concretum, the concrete instance that has several forms, not the substance considered in itself (simply as possessor of the form). (Note that here forms are the parts expressed in the definition obliquely, so the case differs from mathematical demonstrations.) Moreover, since the concretum receives the attribute, the attribute is either learning itself, which is clearly not demonstrable of every concrete instance of a human being, since some human beings may fail to realize their capacity to learn, or merely the ability to learn, which is not an actual occurrent constituting part of a real fact about the world as it is, but, as Albert insisted, merely a kind of possibility of an occurent thing. The notion that a kind of efficient causation produces the capacity for learning, which is to be taken as something really present in a human being even when the human being is not learning, is rejected by Ockham, of course, for he takes it that talk about the capacity is only oblique talk about real events, using modal propositions. All natural demonstration concerning efficient causes is reduced to this sort of thing by Ockham, and he never allows that, for instance, it can be shown that fire is capable of heating, unless it is taken that we are talking about concrete instances of fire, in which case the whole essence of a particular fire can be expressed in the middle term, thus: “Every hot thing is capable of heating, every concrete instance of fire is (essentially) a hot thing, therefore every concrete instance of fire is capable of heating.” This is as close as Ockham gets to Thomas's notion of the highest sort of demonstration.

For Ockham, a demonstration arising from natural efficient causes takes the following pattern: “When there is no opaque medium between the moon and the sun, the moon will be illuminated by the sun, when the moon is in such a place, there will be no opaque medium between the moon and the sun; therefore the moon is then illuminated.” Here, the attribute “illuminable,” an attribute predicated of its subject without further determination, is indemonstrable, but the attribute “illuminated when in such a place” is predicated of its subject with a further determination, and so can be demonstrated. This form of demonstration agrees closely with the highest form of demonstration in Albert and Giles of Rome, but Ockham does not regard it as demonstration of the highest sort, since its conclusion is hypothetical rather than categorical.

Ockham did not allow any demonstration from final causes on the pattern of Grosseteste's demonstration of a material from a formal definition of an attribute, because he did not think that final causes have any genuine productive power. When a final cause is identified, the causal power involved is always the efficient causal power of some agent with a purpose in mind. This raised a problem with the account of the science of demonstration Ockham inherited from Grosseteste. Grosseteste expected the science of demonstration to argue from the function of demonstration to the material structure required to realize that function. The procedure seems inadmissible to Ockham, since it does not follow the path of actual (efficient) causation. Thus the demonstrations making up the science of demonstration seem to be illegitimate. Ockham responds to this problem by holding on to the formal structure that Grosseteste had identified for the science of demonstration, but making demonstration follow the natural (and reliably functional) efficient causal path from knowledge of its premisses to knowledge of its conclusion. Thus the conclusion that a demonstration has necessary premisses cannot be drawn concerning demonstration defined in terms of its purpose, but only for demonstration defined in such a way that that sort of thing actually produces knowledge. So the definition will be “a syllogism with necessary premisses etc,” which, as it happens, supposits for the same things as “syllogism intended by the artisan, the logician, to produce knowledge.” It is as though we were to define an axe by describing those aspects of its structure responsible for its functionality (a handle of a certain shape, a head made of iron with a sharp edge, etc.), and then deducing from this structure that it will actually serve that function (actually cut wood) under the right conditions, and then applying this piece of natural science to the practical issue by giving the advice to use an axe so defined in the appropriate way when one wants to cut wood.

7. Knowledge of First Principles

It is no doubt clear at this point that a large part of the question how we gain natural knowledge has not yet been treated, for we have not yet discussed how it is one acquires knowledge of the first principles that enter into demonstration. Grosseteste allowed two forms of knowledge. In first principles per se in the first way (so that the predicate is contained in the subject) he suggested that through sensory experience of particulars of a natural kind, one's intellect is aroused, and comes to a vision of the real nature of the thing which is expressed in the real definition of the subject. (Aquinas has a similar view concerning the first principles of a demonstration of the highest sort. With acquaintance with the real definition of a substantial nature, one can simply see, intellectually, what its immediate powers are.) Since the predicate is contained in the subject, once we have a real definition of the subject in hand, we simply see that the first principle is true. Roughly speaking, we will simply see what functions a natural thing has once we understand what it is formally, though we will not yet see how it manages to execute those functions.

How it executes those functions is expressed in principles per se in the second way, so that the subject is somehow implicated in the predicate. It is in these first principles that natural causes are expressed. Grosseteste supposes that we have a faculty, aestimatio, parallel to the senses, which enables us to simply see a particular causal connection. This faculty is no more infallible than are the senses, but after a number of such experiences of a causal relation the intellect will be aroused, and will begin to seek actively whether the apparent causal connection is real or not. To do this, it will attempt to produce experiences in which the apparent cause is present, but nothing else that might be a cause is. If the effect is produced in such situations, it will then conclude the first principle, which will assert the material definition of the attribute to its formal definition. For instance, through experience we might note that thunder is caused by the extinction of fire, and express this in the principle that thunder, considered formally (as a noise in a cloud, perhaps with a certain function of frightening those in Hades), is in fact the same as noise in a cloud produced by the extinction of fire (the material realization of this function of frightening by a loud noise). Or we might note that anger (as the desire to harm someone) is in fact, in this world, the same thing as the boiling of blood around the heart (the material conditions for its realization). Thus he takes causal principles to describe how a form is realized (made actual) given certain material resources. To see what material resources in fact realize the form, sensory experience, aided by reason, is needed.

Aquinas, it is to be noted, holds that we know all the principles of a demonstration of the highest sort through an intellectual vision of the substantial nature of the subject, for this tells us the real definition, and so reveals the minor premise, per se in the first way, and it also enables us to see, through the intellect, what primary attribute arises through emanatio from such a thing. Like Grosseteste, Aquinas thinks that the causal capacities of things (their functions) must be understood to know what they are, but he sees no problem in working out how these forms do what they do within the actual world. In the case of the highest form of demonstration, they simply do it. It is as though we were to say that an adding machine adds, without concerning ourselves how it must be designed to do so. Of course, real natural substances are simple, and artificial things like adding machines are not. An adding machine adds because of the way it is put together, but it is absurd to say that heat heats or a person knows, because of the way it is put together, for it is not put together. There must be something for which simply to exist is to exercise its function, or else we have an infinite regress, and must explain every functioning as though it were the functioning of a complex machine, without ever settling on simple parts for the machine which simply function as they do because of what they are. It is Aquinas who lies behind Descartes's view that first principles in the sciences are clearly and distinctly perceived by reason.

Duns Scotus seems to have retained Grosseteste's empiricist bent. Some causal principles are known per se, for instance, that an opaque thing placed between something illuminated and its light source will block the light and leave that thing in the dark. Here, anyone who knows the definitions of the terms (in the example, of ‘opaque’) can work out the principle from there. But, like Grosseteste, he also thought some principles can only be discovered through experience. So he advances the notion that &ldquot;Whatever occurs in many instances by a cause that is not free is the natural effect of that cause.” He seems to assume that a sufficient number of observations will lead to cases in which the cause fails, if it ever does. In any case, this seems to continue Grosseteste's empiricist tendencies, for he apparently assumes that a simple substance must be observed to function before one can conclude through reason that it functions as it does. Aquinas would no doubt say that such observation of the immediate functioning of a simple substance is necessary in order to acquire a concept of its substantial nature, and so its real definition. A real definition of a substance will specify its natural effect, and we do not infer its functioning from experience, but rather use experience to abstract its real definition.

Ockham thought that the causal power of a most specific natural kind (infima species) can be known through the observation of a single instance. So the curative power of an herb, or the ability of heat to produce heat in something adjacent to it, can be concluded by reason from a single instance. The principle at work here states that everything in a given most specific natural kind which acts produces effects of the same kind. He thus seems to refer to a version of the uniformity of nature. He is perfectly clear that the real definition of a simple substance, since it does not signify anything outside the substance, cannot tell us what its effects are. Here we find the roots of Early Modern Empiricism.


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Albert the Great [= Albertus magnus] | Aquinas, Saint Thomas | Aristotle, General Topics: logic | Boethius, Anicius Manlius Severinus | Burley [Burleigh], Walter | Duns Scotus, John | Giles of Rome | Grosseteste, Robert | medieval philosophy | Ockham [Occam], William | syllogism: medieval theories of