Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Mon Jan 10, 2005; substantive revision Wed Feb 18, 2009

The philosophy of Epicurus (341–270 B.C.) was a complete and interdependent system, involving a view of the goal of human life (happiness, resulting from absence of physical pain and mental disturbance), an empiricist theory of knowledge (sensations, including the perception of pleasure and pain, are infallible criteria), a description of nature based on atomistic materialism, and a naturalistic account of evolution, from the formation of the world to the emergence of human societies. Epicurus believed that, on the basis of a radical materialism which dispensed with transcendent entities such as the Platonic Ideas or Forms, he could disprove the possibility of the soul's survival after death, and hence the prospect of punishment in the afterlife. He regarded the unacknowledged fear of death and punishment as the primary cause of anxiety among human beings, and anxiety in turn as the source of extreme and irrational desires. The elimination of the fears and corresponding desires would leave people free to pursue the pleasures, both physical and mental, to which they are naturally drawn, and to enjoy the peace of mind that is consequent upon their regularly expected and achieved satisfaction. It remained to explain how irrational fears arose in the first place: hence the importance of an account of social evolution. Epicurus was aware that deeply ingrained habits of thought are not easily corrected, and thus he proposed various exercises to assist the novice. His system included advice on the proper attitude toward politics (avoid it where possible) and the gods (do not imagine that they concern themselves about human beings and their behavior), the role of sex (dubious), marriage (also dubious) and friendship (essential), reflections on the nature of various meteorological and planetary phenomena, about which it was best to keep an open mind in the absence of decisive verification, and explanations of such processes as gravity and magnetism, which posed considerable challenges to the ingenuity of the earlier atomists. Although the overall structure of Epicureanism was designed to hang together and to serve its principal ethical goals, there was room for a great deal of intriguing philosophical argument concerning every aspect of the system, from the speed of atoms in a void to the origin of optical illusions.

1. Sources

The major source for Epicurean doctrine is Diogenes Laertius' third-century A.D. Lives of Eminent Philosophers, a compilation of information on the lives and doctrines of the philosophers of classical Greece (see “Doxography of Ancient Philosophy”). In the tenth and final book, devoted to Epicureanism, Diogenes preserves three of Epicurus' letters to his disciples, in which he presents his basic views in a concise and handy form. The Letter to Herodotus summarizes Epicurus' physical theory, the Letter to Menoeceus offers a précis of Epicurean ethics, and the Letter to Pythocles treats astronomical and meteorological matters. (There is some doubt about whether the last is by Epicurus himself or a follower, but there seems to be sufficient reason to attribute it to the founder himself.) Diogenes also quotes a collection of brief sayings, called the “Principal Beliefs” or “Principal Doctrines” (Kuriai Doxai), excerpted from the writings of Epicurus or, in some cases, of his close associates; another such collection, partially overlapping with the first, survives in an independent manuscript and is conventionally called the Vatican Sayings. The purpose of both sets, like that of the Letters, was to make the core doctrines easy to remember. Diogenes also fills in topics not covered in the Letters, and provides a list of Epicurus' writings and other biographical information.

Short citations of Epicurus' works appear in other writers (e.g., Plutarch, Sextus Empiricus, and the Greek commentators on Aristotle), often taken out of context or presented in a polemical and distorted fashion. (The standard edition of Epicurus' works in Greek is Arrighetti 1973; the fullest collection of fragments and testimonies is still Usener 1887; for translations, see Bibliography: Editions, Translations, Commentaries). In addition, several works of Epicurus, including parts of his major treatise, On Nature (Peri phuseôs) — a series of lectures running to 37 papyrus rolls — have been recovered in damaged condition from the library of a villa in the town of Herculaneum, which was buried in the eruption of Mt. Vesuvius in 79 A.D. The library almost certainly contained the working collection of Philodemus, an Epicurean philosopher from Syria who studied in Athens and moved to Italy in the first century B.C. Many of the rolls consist of Philodemus' own writings, and provide valuable information about later issues in the history of Epicureanism. One must be cautious about ascribing these views to the founder himself, although the school was notoriously conservative and later thinkers were careful not to depart materially from Epicurus' own teachings. New editions and translations are now making these difficult texts available to a wider readership.

More or less contemporary with Philodemus is Lucretius (first century B.C.), who composed in Latin De rerum natura (“On the Nature of Things”; the title, if it is Lucretius' own, is an adaptation of “On Nature”) in six books of hexameter verse, the meter characteristic of epic and didactic poetry. As a dedicated Epicurean, passionate to promulgate the message of the founder, Lucretius reproduced Epicurean doctrine faithfully (Sedley 1998; Clay 1983 allows Lucretius more originality). His poem concentrates principally on the physical and psychological or epistemological aspects of Epicureanism, and to a great extent omits the ethical. From a hostile point of view, Cicero rehearsed and criticized Epicurus' ideas, especially concerning ethics, in several of his philosophical works, including On Moral Ends (De finibus) and the Tusculan Disputations. Still later, in the second century A.D., another Diogenes erected a large inscription, to this day only partially excavated, in the city of Oenoanda (in southwestern Turkey), which contained the basic tenets of Epicureanism (authoritative edition by Smith 1993; see also Gordon 1996).

2. Life

“Epicurus, the son of Neocles and Chaerestrata, was an Athenian from the deme of Gargettus and the lineage of the Philaïdes, as Metrodorus says in his On Noble Families. Heraclides, among others, in his epitome of Sotion, says that he was raised in Samos, since the Athenians were given parcels of land there, but came to Athens when he was eighteen, when Xenocrates was head of the Academy and Aristotle was still in Chalcis” (where he died in 322). So begins the account by Diogenes Laertius (10.1). The dates for Epicurus' birth and first move to Athens are thus 341 B.C. and 323 respectively. Diogenes adds that after the death of Alexander (323), when the Athenians were expelled from Samos, Epicurus left Athens and joined his father in Colophon (in 321), on the coast of what is now Turkey. Here he studied philosophy under the tutelage of Nausiphanes, a Democritean philosopher with skeptical leanings, and author of a work called the Tripod, on which Epicurus reportedly drew for his Canon, his principal work on epistemology; in ethics, Nausiphanes substituted the term akataplêxia (“undauntability”) for Democritus' athambiê, “fearlessness,” as crucial to the good life, which invites comparison with Epicurus' ataraxia or “imperturbability,” though Epicurus is said to have denied having been influenced by him (On Nausiphanes' role in transmitting elements of Democritean doctrine to Epicurus, see Warren 2002: 160–92.)

Ten years later, Epicurus moved to Mytilene on the island of Lesbos, and soon proceeded to Lampsacus on the nearby mainland; in both cities he taught and gathered followers before returning again to Athens in 307/06, where he remained until his death in 270, at the age of seventy or seventy-one. In Athens, he purchased the property that became known as the “Garden” (later used as a name for his school itself) and began to develop his own school in earnest. Diogenes reports a number of slanderous stories that were circulated by Epicurus' opponents, despite which he affirms that Epicurus was of an extraordinarily humane disposition; this was the prevailing view, shared even by hostile witnesses to Epicureanism. Diogenes also records Epicurus' will (10.16–21), in which, among other things, he made provisions for the children of his friends and appointed a successor.

3. Physical Theory

Epicurus held that the elementary constituents of nature are undifferentiated matter, in the form of discrete, solid and indivisible particles (“atoms”) below the threshold of perception, plus empty space. In its broad outline, Epicurus inherited this scheme from the earlier atomists, above all Democritus. But Democritus' version had been the object of critiques by later thinkers, especially Aristotle, in part for incoherencies in the notion of an infinite void, in part for problems attaching to his idea of minima, or entities of the smallest conceivable size (see especially Physics Book 6). First, freestanding entities of minimal size could have no edges, and so no shapes, or rather would be all edge: thus, if two minima touched, they would wholly overlap. (The same argument applies to points in a line, which is why a line contains points but is not composed of them, according to Aristotle.) Further, if atoms really are conceptually indivisible, and not just physically unsplittable, then when two atoms pass by each other it is impossible that they should at any time be only partway past, for this would imply a point partway along the length of the atom, which contradicts the premise that it is a minimum. Although Aristotle does not state the argument precisely in this form, it is apparent that a strict conception of minimal-sized atoms entails that motion too must consist of discontinuous quanta; and if motion, then time. Atoms must, then, Aristotle inferred, move in discrete hops (kinêmata), each one occupying a single temporal minimum — and hence, all atoms must move at a uniform speed. An infinite void, with atoms distributed throughout it, led to problems of its own, for it permits no intrinsic spatial orientation and hence no account of why things fall, as they are observed to do.

The problem for Epicurus was to find a way of explaining the natural phenomena of bodily movement while responding to the challenges posed by Aristotle's criticisms of Democritus' theory. Epicurus rose to the challenge, although one cannot be certain that he was responding directly to Aristotle's critique. (It is unclear whether or how much philosophers of Epicurus' generation who were not members of Aristotle's own school had access to Aristotle's treatises.)

First, he distinguished between the atom, which by its nature cannot be broken apart, and the minimum conceivable expanse of matter: atoms have such minima as parts, but are not minima themselves — there can be no free-standing entity one minimum expanse in size. This resolves the problem of atomic edges, and also that of how atoms can come in different shapes and sizes (though never large enough to be seen): to have the hooks and crevices needed to form compounds, they can scarcely be theoretically partless. Second, Epicurus agreed that time too is discontinuous, as is motion: Simplicius (p. 934.23–30 Diels; translation in Konstan 1989) quotes him as affirming that it is untrue to say that an atom is moving over a minimum interval, but only that it has moved. What is more, as Aristotle had argued must be the case, atoms all move at the same velocity (the principle of isotakheia). This last claim entailed difficulties of its own, such as how atoms ever overtake each other, if they are moving in the same direction. (Lucretius invoked the idea of a random swerve to solve this one; see below.) But it also provided a solution to another problem, that of entropy: for since atoms can never slow down, the universe can never come to a halt (in modern terms, there is no loss of energy). As for gravity, Epicurus may have had a solution to this too, and in a novel form. If an atom just on its own cannot slow down or alter its direction of motion, then an atom that is rising or moving in an oblique direction cannot at some point begin to tilt or fall, unless something blocks its progress and forces it to do so. If, however, after a collision atoms tended to emerge in a statistically favored direction — that is, if the motions of all atoms after collisions did not cancel each other out but on average produced a vector, however small, in a given direction, then that direction would by definition be down. The absence of a global orientation in the universe was thus immaterial. Due to this vector, any given world will, like our own, be similarly oriented in respect to gravitation. (Given the infinite expanse of the universe on Epicurean theory — see below — we must expect there to be a plurality of worlds, some like ours, some — within limits — different.)

Macroscopic objects, of course, do not move at a uniform and very great speed; the atoms within them do, but their motions are restricted and deflected by neighboring atoms, and so they vibrate. In the case of compound objects that are completely at rest, the resultant of internal atomic motions is zero, relative, at least, to the earth, which may have an average motion of its own. If so, and if for some reason the earth's motion is slower in a downward direction than that of objects on or near its surface — because, say, the earth is disk-shaped, as Epicurus held, and hence sinks more slowly in the surrounding atomic medium, like a falling leaf — then Epicurus could explain as well why things like stones tend to fall to the earth's surface when let go.

Epicurus operated with a highly limited number of elementary principles in nature — he did not know the concept of force, for example, or the associated ideas of attraction and repulsion among atoms, not to mention more arcane properties — and for all his efforts to account for all the physical features of the world on the basis of this theory, paradoxes remained. An excellent one is posed by Sextus Empiricus (Against the Physicists = M 10.144–48), which at the same time gives an idea of how Epicurean atoms were understood to behave. Sextus imagined two atoms separated by a distance of nine minima, traveling at the same speed (as atoms must) toward each other; after four temporal minima, the atoms would be one spatial minimum apart. Then what? They cannot meet in the middle of the remaining distance, by the very concept of a minimum. Nor can one cross the interval before the other, without violating the rule of equal velocity. But how, then, can they meet at all? We do not know an Epicurean reply to this conundrum. Perhaps atoms are always an even number of minimal spaces apart from one another. Or else, minima are always bundled in such large quantities that it is meaningless to speak of an odd or even number of minima between atoms; the Stoics, at all events, held that whether the number of stars, for example, is odd or even is absolutely or naturally non-evident (kathapax adela, Sextus Empiricus PH 2.97, M 8.147; physei adela, M 8.317–18). But Epicurus believed that motion at the atomic level obeyed different laws from those that appear to operate at the level of macroscopic objects (that atomic motion is discontinuous is an example). Perhaps, then, he regarded the possibility of a collision under such circumstances as a consequence of this difference. Finally, it possible that he discounted such a puzzle as a purely mathematical paradox, since it is recorded that he had little interest in mathematics as a separate science from physics and believed it to be irrelevant to the proper study of physics.

Fascinating as these questions are in their own right, Epicurus himself does not proceed by creating an abstract model, exploring its internal coherence, and determining its applicability to phenomena, in the ideal manner of modern science. Rather, he begins with the testimony of the senses, which he thinks are always reliable. These provide a basis on which to draw conclusions either with respect to things that still await confirmation or those that are by nature imperceptible (Letter to Herodotus = LH 38). Thus, in beginning his account of the physical world in this Letter, he argues that things cannot arise out of nothing, since otherwise there would be no need of specific seeds for specific plants and animals, and anything whatsoever could be generated out of just any types of material elements. Since this is not seen to happen, but reproduction in things we can observe with our senses is in fact orderly and determinate, spontaneous generation at any level is ruled out. The logic is what Epicurus calls counterwitnessing: a hypothetical premise (here, that things sometimes arise out of nothing) is eliminated because experience tells against its conclusion (here, that the coming into being of visible objects does not require determinate seeds or materials). More simply, if A then B; but not B, hence not A. One might, of course, challenge the implication: something might arise from nothing, even if there are no cases of chickens giving birth to horses. The important point, however, is that Epicurus invokes the data of perception to testify for or against the nature of elementary phenomena; he assumes a certainty uniformity of nature at all levels. So too with his next postulate: things are not destroyed into what is not, since in that case everything would cease to exist (and would have ceased to exist before now, given infinite past time — recall that nothing is created out of nothing); but things do exist, hence the premise is false.

As for body and void as the basic physical principles, the senses, Epicurus affirms, testify to the existence of bodies, and by calculation on the basis of the senses we infer the nature of what is invisible, for example the atoms (LH 39). Here the reasoning is based on analogy: what is evident to our senses must be true on the microscopic level as well, at least in some respects. Void must exist, in turn, if bodies are to be able to move, as they are seen to do. Thus motion is the counterwitness to the non-existence of void — an indirect argument is required since one cannot perceive empty space. What is more, since body, being “full,” offers resistance and void, being empty, offers no resistance, they complement each other and exhaust the possibilities; hence it is impossible to conceive of anything besides these two principles, apart from things that are accidents of them — accidents that arise from unions of elementary bodies in the void. (Inconceivability is another tool in Epicurus' method of demonstration.) These elementary bodies, then, are the atoms, which are indivisible and inalterable, if things are not to dissolve into nothingness. The Letter to Herodotus is an epitome of Epicurean doctrine, and the arguments are crisp and abbreviated, but the reasoning is clear, and is confirmed by the more detailed treatment in Lucretius, which almost certainly follows Epicurus' On Nature. Epicurus appeals to some elementary intuitions concerning bodies and their movement through space in order to establish the structure of imperceptibly small things; he concludes that these must be inalterable if nature is not to dissolve into nothing (creation back out of nothing having already been eliminated by the argument cited above from regularity in generation); and the basic features of the atomic system are then in place. A similar appeal to the senses establishes the infinity of the universe, since what is finite must have an edge, and an edge is conceived in reference to something beyond it. But the universe — in Greek, the “all” — contains everything, and so there is nothing outside it by which to conceive an edge. Hence, it is infinite. And if the all is infinite, so is the void and the number of atoms as well, for otherwise atoms would be too widely dispersed ever to meet (LH 41–42).

Epicurus now has in place the fundamental constituents of his natural world, and he might have stopped here, with atoms and void and the denial, on the grounds of inconceivability, of any other kind of basic physical principle. All secondary properties, such as color and taste, will be explained as epiphenomena of atomic combinations, and perception of things at a distance by the continual emission of infinitesimally thin laminas from objects, which maintain the relevant features of the source (in the case of vision, for example, the laminas will preserve the atomic patterns specific to the color and shape of the object) and directly stimulate the relevant sense organ. This is a tricky thesis, and again posed puzzles: how do the lamina or simulacra, as Lucretius called them, of a mountain enter the eye, for example? In fragments? By somehow shrinking? We do not know the answer to this one. A few more concepts fill in the picture of the natural world: thus, Epicurus denies that there can be infinitely many kinds of atoms, for then all shapes (which define the kinds) at any given magnitude would be exhausted and atoms would have to reach visible proportions, which we know that they do not (this argument depends on the idea of minima, discussed further below); instead, the number of kinds (i.e., shapes of various microscopic sizes) is inconceivably large but “not strictly infinite,” whereas the number of each kind of atom is simply infinite (LH 55–56). This condition is also invoked to explain why there is a limit on possible types of combinations of atoms, and hence on the number of viable species of things in the perceptible world: if there were infinitely many kinds of atoms, Epicurus believed, they could combine to generate absolutely anything — an infinity of different sorts of thing.

But an infinite number of solid and therefore indivisible atoms of finitely many kinds, such as Epicurus' theory provides, are enough to avoid the possibility of the universe crumbling into nothing. Why did Epicurus complicate matters still further with the doctrine that atoms themselves consist of still smaller parts in the form of mathematically minimal expanses, as we saw above that he does? Finite bodies, according to Epicurus, had to be composed of smaller expanses, and if there were no lower limit in size to such expanses, one would have to imagine traversing such a body in an infinite number of moves — but then, however small these infinitesimals might be, the object that contained them, Epicurus reasoned, would have to be infinitely large (LH 56–57). What are such minima like? Epicurus asks us to think of the smallest perceptible thing. It differs from larger visible entities in that it has no sub-parts to be traversed with the eye: if you do attempt to visualize such sub-parts, they simply coincide with the original perceptible minimum. Since such minimal visible entities have no parts, they do not touch edge to edge (edges are parts), and yet they measure out the body that contains them, larger bodies having more such minima. By analogy with the visible, then, we conceive of the smallest part of an atom (LH 58–59). This conception resembles the way points exist in a line, according to Aristotle, since they too do not touch, nor can they exist independently. But Epicurean minima differ from points in that they are physical expanses and so have extension. This looks like a contradictory state of affairs: can we imagine, for example, an atom consisting of just two minima? Or ten? It would be like counting up the least visible bits of a perceptible object. Geometrical problems arise as well if we imagine shapes like cubes containing finite numbers of minima all packed together, since diagonals are incommensurable with edges, but the minima will not fit together in such a way as to allow such incommensurability. On the assumption that Epicurus was aware of and cared about such puzzles, it has been suggested that he thought any atom consists of a not strictly infinite, but inconceivably large — and so “not strictly finite” — number of minima (see Konstan 1989a): thus, the minimum may be imagined as the inverse of the number of kinds of atoms postulated by Epicurus, a quantity that takes on a quasi-technical status as a special order of magnitude. But sufficient evidence for this hypothesis is lacking.

4. Psychology and Ethics

Having established the physical basis of the world, Epicurus proceeds to explain the nature of the soul (this, at least, is the order in which Lucretius sets things out). This too, of course, consists of atoms: first, there is nothing that is not made up of atoms and void (secondary qualities are simply accidents of the arrangement of atoms), and second, an incorporeal entity could neither act on nor be moved by bodies, as the soul is seen to do (e.g., it is conscious of what happens to the body, and it initiates physical movement). Epicurus maintains that soul atoms are particularly fine and are distributed throughout the body (LH 64), and it is by means of them that we have sensations (aisthêseis) and the experience of pain and pleasure, which Epicurus calls pathê (a term used by Aristotle and others to signify emotions instead). Body without soul atoms is unconscious and inert, and when the atoms of the body are disarranged so that it can no longer support conscious life, the soul atoms are scattered and no longer retain the capacities for sensation (LH 65). There is also a part of the human soul that is concentrated in the chest, and is the seat of the higher intellectual functions. The distinction is important, because it is in the rational part that error in judgment enters in. Sensation, including that of pain and pleasure, is incorrigible just because it is a function of the non-rational part, which does not modify a perception — which itself is the passive and pure reception of lamina emitted from macroscopic bodies — by the addition of opinion or belief.

The corporeal nature of the soul has two crucial consequences for Epicureanism. First, it is the basis of Epicurus' demonstration that the soul does not survive the death of the body (other arguments to this effect are presented in Lucretius 3.417–614). The soul's texture is too delicate to exist independently of the body that contains it, and in any case the connection with the body is necessary for sensation to occur. From this it follows that there can be no punishment after death, nor any regrets for the life that has been lost. Second, the soul is responsive to physical impressions, whether those that arrive from without in the form of laminas or simulacra, or those that arise from internal motions of the body. No phenomena are purely mental, in the sense of being disembodied states or objects of pure consciousness conceived as separate from embodiment. The elementary sensations of pleasure and pain, accordingly, rather than abstract moral principles or abstract concepts of goodness or badness, are the fundamental guides to what is good and bad, since all sentient creatures are naturally attracted to the one and repelled by the other. The function of the human mind — that part of the soul located in our chest — is not to seek higher things, but to maximize pleasure and minimize pain. That is its entire objective; the risk (a substantial one) is only that it may miscalculate, since it is subject to false beliefs and errors in cognitive processes.

Unlike other Hellenistic schools, such as those of Aristotle and the Stoics, the Epicureans were not greatly interested in formal logic, but they certainly needed a theory of the formation of beliefs. As far as the ideational content of thinking — that is, the thought of something — is concerned, Epicurus proposed a radically reductive hypothesis: just as sensations occur as a result of thin films emitted by objects that enter the appropriate sense organ, so too some of these simulacra are fine enough to penetrate directly to the mind (located in the chest), and that is how we imagine such objects. This process is invoked to explain not only dream images, but any kind of mental impression, including impressions constituting voluntary thought: the latter occurs when we attend to one or another of the exiguous physical films that are continuously floating through the air. (How we manage to attend voluntarily to whichever of these films we choose is not explained in the surviving sources.) Imagining a thing is thus nothing more than picking out the simulacra that have been emitted by it, and which may endure beyond the life of the thing itself (hence we can imagine the dead). These mental images have no privileged status, such as Plato gave to his noetic Ideas or Forms; they are always true, but in this do not differ from the information provided by the senses. Mistakes occur here too when the wrong beliefs are associated with such impressions, for example, that because we have a mental image of a dead person it follows that he or she still exists in a ghostly form. Epicurean physics proves that this is impossible.

A great barrier to correct thinking is language itself, which, because it has a name for death, may suggest that death (being dead) is something a person can experience and hence deserves to be feared. Words must be understood in their basic sense, Epicurus says, as opposed to what he calls “empty sounds” (LH 37). The culprit in misunderstanding is always an illegitimate inference from sensation (the latter including thoughts produced by film-like images). An example is the belief that centaurs exist. Epicurus does not deny that the thought of a centaur corresponds to some real stimulus in the form of simulacra: his theory of knowledge commits him to the view that it must. But the flimsy laminas as they float through the air can become distorted or interfere with one another, and thus the upper part of a human figure may get loosely attached to the lower part of a horse's. We know that this is unreal because such a combination is physically impossible: horses and human beings mature at different rates, for example, and eat different foods (see Lucretius 5.878–91; cf. Palaephatus On Incredible Tales 20). Beliefs about whether sensations correspond to an actually existing thing must be tested against knowledge of the world, as informed by Epicurean theory.

The ability to reason or calculate (logismos) cannot be a function of images. It is the faculty that lets us infer by analogy from the visible world to the invisible, and also that with which we may recognize that not all pleasures are to be chosen at all times, since some immediate pleasures may lead to long-term pain or harm (Letter to Menoeceus = LM 129). What is more, one must know something about the nature of pleasure in order to pursue it rationally, and likewise for pain. Epicurus, it appears, uses the terms pleasure and pain (hêdonê, algêdôn) strictly in reference to physical pathê or sensations, that is, those that are experienced via the non-rational soul that is distributed throughout the body. As for the rational part or mind, we have positive and negative experiences through it too. Most prominent among the negative mental states is fear, above all the fear of unreal dangers, such as death. Death, Epicurus insists, is nothing to us, since while we exist, our death is not, and when our death occurs, we do not exist (LM 124–25); but if one is frightened by the empty name of death, the fear will persist since we must all eventually die. This fear is one source of perturbation (tarakhê), and is a worse curse than physical pain itself; the absence of such fear is ataraxy, lack of perturbation, and ataraxy, together with freedom from physical pain, is one way of specifying the goal of life, for Epicurus.

There are also positive states of mind, which Epicurus identifies by the special term khara (joy), as opposed to hêdonê (pleasure, i.e., physical pleasure). These states too depend on belief, whether true or false. But Epicurus does not treat khara as an end, or part of the end for living: rather, he tends to describe the goal by negation, as freedom from bodily pain and mental disturbance (LM 128). However, happiness (eudaimonia), according to Epicurus, is not simply a neutral or privative condition but rather a form of pleasure in its own right — what Epicurus called catastematic or (following Cicero's Latin translation) “static” as opposed to “kinetic” pleasure. Although the precise nature of this distinction is debated, kinetic pleasures involve the return to a stable or healthy state, e.g., the pleasurable elimination of hunger or thirst. As the need is met, however, the pleasure associated with replenishment diminishes: one does not enjoy eating for replenishment when full. To maximize this kind of pleasure, one would have to increase rather than limit one's wants. This was the view adopted by the philosophical school known as the Cyrenaics, who advocated increasing desires and seeking ever new ways of gratifying them, so that the pleasure of replenishment could continue past the point where most people would feel satiated, and be available at every moment.

Epicurus objected that such pleasures are necessarily accompanied by distress, for they depend upon a lack that is painful (Plato had demonstrated the problematic nature of this kind of pleasure; see Gorgias 496C–497A, Philebus 31E–32D, 46A–50C). In addition, augmenting desires tends to intensify rather than reduce the mental agitation (a distressful state of mind) that Epicurean philosophy sought to eliminate. Catastematic pleasure, on the contrary, is (or is taken in) a state rather than a process: it is the pleasure that accompanies well-being as such. The Cyrenaics and others maintained that this condition is not pleasurable but rather neutral — neither pleasurable nor painful. In addition, there was a question concerning the relationship between the two types of pleasure: does catastematic pleasure begin only when kinetic pleasure ends, or does it gradually increase as the need is met, and the pleasure of replenishment diminishes? If the latter, it would appear to involve process as well, as opposed to being a purely stable condition. It is unclear just how the Epicureans responded to these objections.

For Epicurus, there are some fears that are perfectly legitimate (though they would not be agitated and upsetting); so too are some desires. Epicurus offers a classification of desires into three types: some are natural, others are empty; and natural desires are of two sorts, those that are necessary and those that are merely natural (see Cooper 1999). Natural and necessary are those that look to happiness, physical well-being, or life itself (LM 127). Unnecessary but natural desires are for pleasant things like sweet odors and good-tasting food and drink (and for various pleasurable activities of sorts other than simple smelling, touching and tasting). Empty desires are those that have as their objects things designated by empty sounds, such as immortality, which cannot exist for human beings and do not correspond to any genuine need. The same holds for the desire for great wealth or for marks of fame, such as statues: they cannot provide the security that is the genuine object of the desire. Such desires, accordingly, can never be satisfied, any more than the corresponding fears — e.g., the fear of death — can ever be alleviated, since neither has a genuine referent, i.e., death as something harmful (when it is present, we do not exist) or wealth and power as salves for anxiety. Such empty fears and desires, based on what Epicurus calls kenodoxia or empty belief, are themselves the main source of perturbation and pain in civilized life, where more elementary dangers have been brought under control, since they are the reason why people are forever driven to strive for limitless wealth and power, subjecting themselves to the very dangers they imagine they are avoiding.

Although human beings, like everything else, are composed of atoms that move according to their fixed laws, our actions are not wholly predetermined — rather than entertain such a paralyzing doctrine, Epicurus says, it would be better to believe in the old myths, for all their perversities (LM 134). What enables us to wrest liberty from a mechanistic universe is the existence of a certain randomness in the motion of atoms, that takes the form of a minute swerve in their forward course (evidence for this doctrine derives chiefly from later sources, including Lucretius and Cicero). It is not entirely clear how the swerve operates: it may involve a small angle of deviation from the original path, or else a slight shift sideways, perhaps by a single minimum, with no change in direction. The idea of such a minute veering, said to occur at no determinate time or place, is less strange in the modern age of quantum physics than it was in Epicurus' time, and it gave rise to mocking critiques. More problematic today is how the swerve might explain freedom of will — if indeed Epicurus' idea of the will was like our own. It did, at all events, introduce an indeterminacy into the universe, and if soul atoms, thanks to their fineness, were more susceptible to the effects of such deviations than coarser matter, the swerve could at least represent a breach in any strict predestination of human behavior. And this might have been enough for Epicurus' purposes: he may not have invoked the swerve in order to explain voluntary action (claiming that it is action deriving, immediately or ultimately, from a swerve or some swerves of the soul's atoms). He may have wished merely to establish the possibility of action not deriving from the positions of the soul's constituent atoms at any time plus the effects of collisions among them resulting from their given movements at that time. According to Lucretius (2.225–50), the swerve was also put to use to solve a cosmological problem: if at some (as it were) initial moment all atoms were moving uniformly in a single direction (downward) at the same speed, it is impossible to conceive how the process of atomic collisions could have begun, save by some such device. This seems a curious idea: given that time, like space, was infinite according to Epicurus, he need not have imagined a time prior to collisions. Just possibly the tendency of atoms to emerge from collisions in a preferred direction (by definition “down”) might lead over time to local regions of parallel motion, and the swerve could serve to reintroduce contact among them. In any event, Epicurus may have thought of atoms moving in some uniform direction rather than in diverse ones as a default position for physical theory (because of the simplicity of that hypothesis); thus he may have felt the need to explain how the diversity of the atoms' motions could have arisen.

5. Social Theory

Although our main witness for Epicurus' views on the evolution of human society is Lucretius' poem (5.925–1457), there is no doubt that Lucretius was following, in the main, the ideas of the founder himself, as recorded in Epicurus' On Nature and other treatises. In the beginning, human beings were solitary; they reproduced haphazardly, could not communicate verbally, had no social institutions, and survived because they were physically hardier than their modern descendants. With time, the race softened, thanks in part to the discovery of fire, in part too to the emergence of the family and the gentler sentiments toward spouses and offspring to which the family gave rise. At this stage, human beings were in a position to unite in order to fend off natural dangers, such as wild beasts, and they developed various kinds of technical skills, such as agriculture and the building of houses, as well as language. Epicurus explains (LH 75–76) that names at first arose naturally, in the sense that as human beings experienced different affects (pathê) or received various images (phantasmata) they emitted air corresponding to these stimuli; since human physical characteristics vary somewhat from place to place, however, the sounds people produced in response to any given stimulus similarly differed, which explains why there are many tongues. Upon this basis, people later, nation by nation, established certain terms by convention for the purpose of improving clarity and brevity in communication. Finally, certain individual experts further augmented the vocabulary by the introduction of new and specialized words, to explain the results of their theoretical investigations. Once language reached a developed state, people began to establish alliances and friendships, which contributed further to collective security.

This early form of social life had various advantages: among others, the relative scarcity of goods prevented excessive competition (sharing was obligatory for survival) and thereby set limits on those unnatural desires that at a later, richer phase of society would lead to wars and other disturbances. It would appear too that, before language had developed fully, words more or less conformed to their original or primitive objects, and were not yet a source of mental confusion. But thanks to a gradual accumulation of wealth, the struggle over goods came to infect social relations, and there emerged kings or tyrants who ruled over others not by virtue of their physical strength but by dint of gold. These autocrats in turn were overthrown, and after a subsequent period of violent anarchy people finally saw the wisdom of living under the rule of law. This might seem to represent the highest attainment in political organization, but that is not so for the Epicureans. For with law came the generalized fear of punishment that has contaminated the blessings of life (Lucretius 5.1151; cf. [Philodemus] On Choices and Avoidances col. XII). Lucretius at this point gives an acount of the origin of religious superstition and dread of the gods, and although he does not relate this anxiety directly to the fear of punishment under human law, he does state that thunder and lightning are interpreted as signs that the gods are angry at human sins (5.1218–25). While primitive people in the presocial or early communal stages might have been awed by such manifestations of natural power and ascribed them to the action of the gods, they would not necessarily have explained them as chastisement for human crimes before the concept of punishment became familiar under the regime of law. People at an early time knew that gods exist thanks to the simulacra that they give off, although the precise nature of the gods according to Epicurus remains obscure; but the gods, for him, do not interest themselves in human affairs, since this would compromise their beatitude (see Obbink 1996: 321–23).

If one does not fear the gods, what motive is there for living justly? Where law obtains, Epicurus indicates, it is preferable not to commit crimes, even secret ones, since there will always be anxiety over the possibility of detection, and this will disrupt the tranquillity or ataraxy that is the chief basis of happiness in life (see Principal Beliefs = KD 34–35). Justice, for Epicurus, depends on the capacity to make compacts neither to harm others nor be harmed by them, and consists in such compacts; justice is nothing in itself, independent of such arrangements (KD 31–33). According to Epicurus (LM 132, KD 5), someone who is incapable of living prudently, honorably, and justly cannot live pleasurably, and vice versa. Moreover, prudence or wisdom (phronêsis) is the chief of the virtues: on it depend all the rest. This again sounds calculating, as though justice were purely a pragmatic and selfish matter of remaining unperturbed. Epicurus does not entertain the thought experiment proposed by Plato in the Republic (359C–360D), in which Plato asks whether a person who is absolutely secure from punishment would have reason to be just. Did Epicurus have an answer to such a challenge? He may simply have denied that anyone can be perfectly confident in this way. Perhaps, however, he did have a reply, but it was derived from the domain of psychology rather than of ethics. A person who understands what is desirable and what is to be feared would not be motivated to acquire inordinate wealth or power, but would lead a peaceful life to the extent possible, avoiding politics and the general fray. An Epicurean sage, accordingly, would have no motive to violate the rights of others. Whether the sage would be virtuous is perhaps moot; what Epicurus says is that he would live virtuously, that is prudently, honorably, and justly (the adverbial construction may be significant). He would do so not because of an acquired disposition or hexis, as Aristotle had it, but because he knows how to reason correctly about his needs. Hence his desires would be limited to those that are natural (not empty), and so easily satisfied, or at least not a source of disturbance if sometimes unsatisfied.

6. The Epicurean Life

Epicurus placed an extremely high value on friendship (or love: philia). A saying with rather a more poetic flair than is Epicurus' custom runs: “Friendship goes dancing round the world, announcing to all of us to wake up to happiness” (Vatican Saying = VS 52). Epicurus held that a wise man would feel the torture of a friend no less than his own, and would die for a friend rather than betray him, for otherwise his own life would be confounded (VS 56–57). These are powerfully altruistic sentiments for a philosopher who posits as the unique goal in life happiness based on freedom from physical pain and mental anxiety. Epicurus could justify such an attitude by the same prudential calculus that he uses to argue in favor of living justly: only by living in such a way that loyalty to friends is perceived to be a consummate value will one be able to feel secure in one's friends, and thus maximize one's felicity. Yet this does not seem quite what Epicurus means when he says that “friendship [or love] had its beginning as a result of utility, but is to be chosen [or is a virtue, if we follow the manuscript reading] for its own sake” (VS 23). The question is further complicated by the report in Cicero's On Moral Ends (1.66–70) that there was a difference of opinion concerning friendship among later Epicureans. Since human beings were originally asocial and only later learned to form alliances and compacts, it is possible that Epicurus means to say that this capacity for friendship arose out of need, but that once the capacity for such feelings was acquired, feeling them came to be valued in itself. The argument would be similar to the modern idea that altruism could have developed as a result of natural selection. But the evidence does not permit a firm conclusion on this matter.

When Epicurus spoke of friendship, he may have had at least partly in mind specifically the relationship among his followers, who seem to have thought of themselves as friends. Epicureans were encouraged to form communities and to observe certain rituals, although most of these practices, such as the celebration each month of the day (the 20th) on which Epicurus was born or wearing rings bearing an image of Epicurus, may have originated after the founder's death. The Epicureans paid attention to problems of pedagogy as well, laying out the best way to correct the ideas of people new to the school and its community without cajoling or discouraging them. It must be remembered that Epicurus understood the task of philosophy first and foremost as a form of therapy for life, since philosophy that does not heal the soul is no better than medicine that cannot cure the body (Usener 1887, frag. 221). A life free of mental anxiety and open to the enjoyment of other pleasures was deemed equal to that of the gods. Indeed, it is from the gods themselves, via the simulacra that reach us from their abode, that we derive our image of blessed happiness, and prayer for the Epicureans consisted not in petitioning favors but rather in a receptivity to this vision. (Epicurus encouraged the practice of the conventional cults.) Although they held the gods to be immortal and indestructible (how this might work in a materialist universe remains unclear), human pleasure might nevertheless equal divine, since pleasure, Epicurus maintained (KD 19), is not augmented by duration (compare the idea of perfect health, which is not more perfect for lasting longer); the catastematic pleasure experienced by a human being completely free of mental distress and with no bodily pain to disturb him is at the absolute top of the scale. Nor is such pleasure difficult to achieve: it is a mark precisely of those desires that are neither natural nor necessary that they are hard to satisfy. Epicurus was famously content with little, since on such a diet a small delicacy is as good as a feast, in addition to which it is easier then to achieve self-sufficiency, and “the greatest benefit of self-sufficiency is freedom” (VS 77).


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Aristotle | atomism: ancient | continuity and infinitesimals | contractarianism | Cyrenaics | Democritus | friendship | hedonism | Lucretius | physicalism