Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Fri Jan 14, 2005

Arcesilaus (316/5-241/0 BCE) was a member and later leader (‘scholarch’) of Plato's Academy. He initiated the skeptical phase of the Platonic school (‘Academic skepticism’) and was an influential critic of Stoic epistemology.

The ancient evidence about Arcesilaus' philosophy is difficult to evaluate and, in some respects, inconsistent. As a result, scholars interpret his skepticism in several ways. Some see his philosophical activity as entirely negative or destructive of all philosophical views. Others regard him as endorsing the position that nothing can be known on the basis of philosophical arguments he is committed to. This would make his skepticism similar to Descartes' at the start of the Meditations, where he doubts everything he previously thought he knew. Others take him to have held no positive views on any philosophical topic, including the possibility of knowledge. On this view, his skepticism is very similar to the Pyrrhonian skepticism advocated by Sextus Empiricus: the skeptic is someone who refuses to accept any philosophical theory or proposition as rationally warranted, and insists that further examination is always required.

1. Life and work

After an early education in geometry and astronomy in his native Pitanê (in Aeolis, the northwest Aegean coast of modern Turkey), Arcesilaus escaped to Athens against his guardian's wishes. There he is said to have studied rhetoric in association with Theophrastus (Aristotle's successor) until c. 295-290 BCE, when he abandoned it to study philosophy in Plato's Academy with Crantor (d. 276/5) and its leaders Polemo (d. 270/69) and Crates (d.268/7). He became the scholarch after Crates' death, and led the school for more than 25 years until his own death in 241/0 BCE.

Like Socrates, his philosophical model, and Carneades, who carried forward his skepticism in the 2nd c. BCE, Arcesilaus did not write any philosophical works. His arguments were initially preserved by his students — including Pythodorus, who wrote up some of them, and Lakydes, his successor as scholarch — and in the work of his opponents, most notably, the Stoic Chrysippus, whose reformulation of Stoicism was prompted by Arcesilaus' criticisms of the views of the first generation of Stoics. But Arcesilaus' arguments were later overlaid by Carneadean elaborations and subsumed into the general Academic and anti-Academic traditions; and it is only through those later traditions that we know about them. Our knowledge of his work depends on scraps from the biographical tradition (preserved in Diogenes Laertius and Philodemus) and brief general reports from later skeptical writers — Cicero and Sextus Empiricus and Plutarch — and their opponents — Antiochus and Numenius (preserved in Cicero and Eusebius respectively). And since these offer incompatible interpretations of Arcesilaus' philosophical position reflecting the writers' distinctive views about later developments in the skeptical Academy, the precise nature of his skepticism remains controversial.

2. Skepticism: method or doctrine

The central question presented by the inconsistent evidence for Arcesilaus' skepticism is how to reconcile his dialectical method with the ‘doctrines’ he is reported to have accepted — viz., that nothing can be known (akatalêpsia) and that one should suspend assent universally (universal epochê), i.e., form no beliefs. Our sources agree that Arcesilaus' dialectical method constituted the core of his philosophical activity (see e.g., Diogenes Laertius 4.28). This method presents two basic difficulties for any attempt to reconcile it with these doctrines.

First, the dialectical method meant that rather than arguing in favor of any doctrine or set of doctrines, Arcesilaus restricted himself to arguing against the views proposed by his opponents or interlocutors. At first sight, this method may not look incompatible with affirming akatalêpsia and universal epochê since the repeated result of practicing it was that the views argued against did not stand up to criticism. These repeated failures could suggest that in fact nothing can be known and that one should form no beliefs at all. But our sources confirm that Arcesilaus took his method to entail that he should not reveal his own view on the matter in question in any case, if he had one, including, for instance, the view that the claim argued against is false (see e.g., Cicero De oratore 3.67). It is clear that he went to some lengths not to make positive affirmations of any sort in his own right in his arguments (see Diogenes Laertius 4.36, Philodemus Index Academicorum 20.1-4, cf. 18.40-19.9).

We can see why Arcesilaus' dialectical method may have had these implications by looking at the model he claimed to be following: Socrates' practice in the Socratic dialogues of Plato (see Cicero, Academica 1.44-5, De oratore 3.67, De finibus 2.2, On the Nature of the Gods 1.11). In those dialogues, Socrates challenges the pretensions of his interlocutors to knowledge by showing, through premises they accept, that they are committed to inconsistent beliefs. To achieve this result, it is crucial that the arguments — the premises, the inferences, and the conclusions — depend entirely on the beliefs of the interlocutors. If they do, the result of a successful Socratic encounter will be that the interlocutor is at a loss: the interlocutors now recognize that they have inconsistent beliefs, since they have both their initial reasons for the thesis or knowledge-claim they made and their newly-discerned reasons against it. If they also hold some generally accepted views about knowledge (for example, that one can't know something about which one holds inconsistent beliefs), the interlocutors will be rationally constrained to aver that they don't know whether their thesis is true or false, and hence to suspend assent on the thesis while awaiting further investigation and argument. But no such result holds for Socrates. For, although he represents himself as being in the same aporetic boat — and may in fact be perplexed for exactly the same reasons — his method does not commit him to the premises, inferences or conclusions of the arguments, or even to the regulating ideas about knowledge. His views (if he has any) are not at issue in the argument.

There is good evidence that Arcesilaus followed the Socratic model consistently and refrained from making any positive arguments or even affirmations of any kind. Our most detailed sources actually identify the radical change of position in the Platonic school he introduced — the transition from the Old to the skeptical Academy — in terms of his adoption of this method (see Diogenes Laertius 4.28, Philodemus Index Academicorum 18.7-16 & 21.36-42 and Sextus Outlines of Pyrrhonism 1.220-35, esp. 232). And this explains his reputation as a ‘dialectician’ (or, more negatively, as a ‘sophist’ or ‘eristic’ or ‘magician’), as well as why the skeptical Academy came to be defined primarily by its critical stance towards the doctrines of other schools (and particularly towards the energetic philosophical programs of the new movements initiated by Epicurus and Zeno during his lifetime). But if Arcesilaus followed this model consistently by arguing against every philosophical position that came to his notice and refraining from making any positive arguments or affirmations on any philosophical question, it is hard to see why we should think that he accepted any doctrines, including akatalêpsia and universal epochê.

The second difficulty involved in reconciling Arcesilaus' dialectical method with the doctrines that nothing can be known and that we should suspend assent universally is more straight-forward. These doctrines are conclusions of some of his best known arguments, but these are clearly dialectical anti-Stoic arguments. That is, they are arguments that depend crucially on Stoic premises: they argue that, despite the Stoics' general epistemological commitments, certain premises accepted by the Stoics entail that nothing is known, and that we should suspend assent universally. (See below, sect. 3.) But, given his Socratic method, we would only have reason to ascribe these conclusions to Arcesilaus himself if we had independent evidence that he accepted those premises. And there is good reason to think that Arcesilaus did not accept anything of Stoic epistemology.

The first question about Arcesilaus' skepticism is thus whether it involved any commitment to the doctrines of akatalêpsia and universal epochê at all. A negative answer to this question — based on something like the considerations given above — yields a dialectical interpretation of Arcesilaus (adopted by e.g., Couissin 1929 and Striker 1980). The drawback to this interpretation is that it involves the rejection of a central claim about him in all but one of our major sources: Cicero, Numenius, Sextus, Diogenes and Plutarch ascribe some degree of commitment to at least one of these doctrines, the doctrine of universal epochê. The exception is Philodemus. Rejecting this evidence might be justified by the lateness of these sources and their associations with later Academic developments; but this seems hard to maintain when we learn that Arcesilaus' contemporary opponents, including Chrysippus, also ascribed universal epochê to him (see Plutarch On Stoic Self-Contradictions 1036a with 1037a, and Against Colotes 1122a).

If we accept that the evidence constrains us to look for a positive answer to the first question (at least as regards the recommendation of epochê), the second question is how to reconcile Arcesilaus' method with his commitment to these doctrines. The answer to this question remains open. But the dominant solutions on offer fall roughly into two main groups: first an Academic interpretation, based on the evidence of Cicero and Numenius, which argues that Arcesilaus was led to adopt his method by his prior acceptance of (at least one of) the doctrines (this solution is adopted by e.g., Schofield 1999 and Ioppolo 1986); and, secondly, a Socratic interpretation, based primarily on Sextus, which derives Arcesilaus' attenuated commitment to the doctrines from his application of the Socratic method (this solution is adopted by e.g., Cooper 2004 and Frede 1974 & 1984).

To decide between these interpretations of Arcesilaus' skepticism, we need to examine his arguments.

3. Criticism of Stoic epistemology

Arcesilaus' best known arguments, and the only ones that survive in any detail, are his criticisms of Stoic epistemology (Sextus Against the Logicians M. 7.150-9, Cicero Academica 2 passim, esp. 2.66-7 & 2.77).

The Stoic theory of knowledge represented a radical shift in epistemology, since it offered an empirically-based route to the kind of wisdom Socrates had sought (see Frede 1999). Its basis was three novel claims made by Zeno, the founder of the Stoa (see Cicero Academica 1.40-2). First, Zeno proposed a new psychological theory: to form a belief of any kind is to give one's assent to one's ‘impression’ (or appearance: phantasia) about the matter. Secondly, he claimed that some of our perceptual impressions are ‘cognitive’ or self-warranting, so that assenting to them constitutes a cognition or grasp (katalêpsis) of their objects. And, thirdly, he argued that we ought to restrict our assent to just cognitive or kataleptic impressions, since it is contrary to reason to form (true or false) ‘opinions’ by assenting to inadequately warranted, non-cognitive impressions. But, given that there are cognitive impressions, we can attain infallible knowledge or wisdom by restricting our assent to them, since our beliefs will then be constituted entirely by cognitions derived from perception or from concepts warranted by perceptual cognitions.

The focus of Arcesilaus' attack on Zeno's theory was its center-piece, the theory of cognitive impressions. Zeno defined a cognitive impression as one that came from what is stamped and impressed exactly in accordance with it, and was such that it could not be false (Sextus M. 7.248, Cicero Academica 2.77) — i.e., roughly, that an impression is cognitive if [a] it is true, [b] it is caused in the appropriate way for correctly representing its object, and [c] its truth is warranted by the inimitable richness and detail of representation guaranteed by its causal history. Arcesilaus' tactic was to grant that conditions [a] and [b] are often met, as Zeno claimed, but to argue that condition [c] never obtained (M. 7.154, Academica 2.77). Although his detailed arguments for this have not survived, it is fairly clear from later Academic and Stoic arguments that he followed two main lines of attack. One line depended on the existence of indistinguishable — or, at any rate, indiscernibly distinct — objects, such as twins, or pairs of eggs, manufactured items (statues or impressions on wax of the same letter-seal), and grains of sand (Academica 2.54-8 & 2.84-6, M. 7.408-10). Any of these could be mistaken for another no matter how good one's impression of it was. The second depended on abnormal states of mind, such as dreams, illusions, and fits of madness (Academica 2.47-53 & 2.88-90, M. 7.402-8). In either case, Arcesilaus argued that, whether the nature of the objects or of our minds were at fault, it was always possible to have a false impression with exactly the same phenomenal content as a true impression [a] that also met condition [b]. But if so, no impression could be self-warranting in virtue of the way in which its content was represented. So condition [c] never obtains. Hence, on the Stoic view of the requirements for cognition, there is no cognition. And if knowledge is derived entirely from perceptual cognition and concepts warranted by it, as Zeno supposed, it follows that nothing can be known. (Intricate Stoic-Academic debates on these issues lasted for another 150 years; they can best be traced through the arguments of Chrysippus and Carneades, preserved in some detail in Cicero's Academica and Sextus M. book 7.)

The argument is standardly summarized as follows:

  1. Some impressions are true (a Stoic view).
  2. False impressions are non-cognitive (Zeno's condition [a]).
  3. If the content of a true impression is potentially indistinguishable or indiscernible from that of a false impression, it is non-cognitive (Zeno's condition [c]).
  4. The content of all true impressions is potentially indistinguishable or indiscernible from that of false impressions (Arcesilaus' argument).
  5. So, there are no cognitive impressions. (See Academica 2.40 & 2.83.)

And, since for Zeno knowledge itself depends on cognitive impressions, this argument leads to the further conclusion that nothing can be known (akatalêpsia).

Arcesilaus followed up this argument against the cognitive impression with a briefer argument against Zeno's ideal of wisdom:

  1. there are no cognitive impressions (as Arcesilaus has argued), &
  2. it is irrational to hold ‘opinions’, i.e., to assent to non-cognitive impressions (as the Stoics held); therefore,
  3. it is irrational to assent to any impressions at all. (See M. 7.155-7 & Academica 2.66-7.)

That is, Arcesilaus pointed out to the Stoics that if his argument [1]-[5] against condition [c] of the definition of the cognitive impression is successful, they are also committed to the conclusion that it is rational to suspend assent universally (universal epochê).

4. The original Academic interpretation

These arguments are presented in two very different ways in our two sources. In Sextus' account (followed above), they are presented as explicitly dialectical arguments, relying on clearly marked Stoic views, and leading to the conclusion that the Stoic sage will have no beliefs. In the report of Cicero (who was himself an adherent of Academic philosophy), however, we are informed that Arcesilaus was committed to the conclusions of both arguments: Arcesilaus believed that condition [c] of the Stoic definition of the cognitive impression could never be met, and hence concluded that nothing can be known; and he believed premises [5] and [6] of the second argument, and hence concluded that assent to any impression was irrational (Academica 2.66-7 & 2.77). And this historical version of the Academic interpretation of Arcesilaus' skepticism is supported elsewhere in Cicero with a view of the history of philosophy that has Arcesilaus following Socrates (and Presocratic philosophers such as Democritus, Parmenides and Empedocles) in concluding that nothing can be known by perception or reason, and hence adopting a method of argument that would lead others to refrain from all assent (Academica 1.43-6; but see Cooper 2004).

But this historically Academic interpretation is liable to two serious objections. The first is that the argument against the existence of cognitive impressions only leads to the conclusion that nothing can be known if one subscribes to the Stoic epistemological framework as a whole. For the conclusion doesn't follow unless it is true that there are impressions, that some are true, that there are no other routes to cognition, that the Stoic definition of cognition gives necessary and sufficient conditions for knowledge, etc. But there is no reason to think that Arcesilaus subscribed to these Stoic views, since we have slight, but sufficient evidence that he argued against every aspect of Stoic epistemology and psychology. Plutarch, for instance, mentions an objection to the Stoic theory of the soul's interaction with the body, which implies that Arcesilaus argued against the fundamental mechanism of perception in Zeno's account (On Common Conceptions 1078c). Another fragment from Plutarch suggests that Arcesilaus argued against Zeno's causal theory of perception (Fragment 215a). And Sextus reports that Arcesilaus also objected to Zeno's conception of belief as assent to an impression, on the ground that assent is a matter of reason or thinking, rather than the acceptance of a non-rational ‘impression’ (M. 7.154).

In these cases, as with his argument against the satisfiability of condition [c] of the Stoic definition, it seems possible to trace a definite strategy behind Arcesilaus' arguments: he argued against Zeno's empiricist presuppositions by deploying Platonic objections and theories (see Schofield 1999, von Staden 1978). One might conclude, as some did in antiquity, that Arcesilaus therefore had a hidden objective of undermining Stoic or Epicurean empiricism in favor of Platonic doctrine (see Sextus Outlines of Pyrrhonism 1.234). But Arcesilaus' method implies that he would argue against Platonic doctrines as well, if anyone proposed them. So if he did hold the view that nothing can be known, it seems more plausible to think that, like Socrates (on some accounts), he held it as a tentative consequence of the success of his arguments against all conceptions of knowledge, rather than as the conclusion of an argument relying on a particular epistemological theory.

The second objection to the historical version of the Academic interpretation of Arcesilaus' skepticism is that it is inconsistent. The inconsistency is not in believing that nothing can be known, since, unlike Socrates (on this account), Arcesilaus explicitly disclaimed second-order knowledge of this claim (Cicero Academica 1.45). It lies rather in believing that nothing can be known in conjunction with the belief that it is irrational to hold opinions in the absence of knowledge. If the former is true, the latter rules out believing the premises of the argument that supports both claims.

5. The practical criterion

The original Academic interpretation thus seems inadequate to overturn a dialectical understanding of Arcesilaus' principal anti-Stoic arguments. Modern proponents of this view, however, offer a more complicated explanation for Arcesilaus' adherence to akatalêpsia, or at least, universal epochê (see e.g., Schofield 1999 and Ioppolo 1986). On this version of the Academic interpretation, Arcesilaus' acceptance of these theses is not explained in terms of the straight-forward belief in the premises and conclusions of his arguments, of the sort which would lead a Stoic convinced by Arcesilaus to the inconsistent position examined in sect. 4. It is justified instead by Arcesilaus' ‘practical criterion’ for action, which is supposed to allow him to endorse ‘reasonable’ views without assent, i.e., without believing them. For if Arcesilaus holds that action is possible on the basis of ‘reasonable’ views that don't amount to belief, his acceptance of akatalêpsia or universal epochê can be explained in the same way. So the revised Academic interpretation suggests that these philosophical theses are not beliefs but ‘reasonable’ or tentative hypotheses that guide Arcesilaus' philosophical activity. His acceptance of them as hypotheses does not require assenting to them.

Arcesilaus' argument for a ‘practical criterion’ for action is a defence of the possibility of suspending assent universally given in response to two Stoic objections. The Stoic objections are, first, that life is impossible without assent, since action is caused by assent to an impression of something oikeion, i.e., suited to the agent's nature (Plutarch Against Colotes 1122a-d, cf. Cicero Academica 2.37-8); and, secondly, that a good or successful life is impossible without assent, since a good life requires knowledge and hence assent (Sextus M. 7.158; cf. Cicero Academica 2.39). Arcesilaus' reported replies to these objections are brief, and accordingly difficult to interpret (see Bett 1989). His counter to the first objection is the suggestion that action is possible without assent, since even on the Stoic account animal action is triggered directly by their impressions of something oikeion: the addition of a belief that the object is in fact oikeion is redundant and liable to be a cause of error. In response to the second objection, however, Arcesilaus argued that the person who suspends assent universally will successfully guide his actions by applying his sense of what is ‘reasonable’ as a ‘practical criterion’.

The most promising way to read these brief counter-arguments as a positive theory of Arcesilaus' is something like this. The first response argues that our action isn't always caused by occurrent beliefs — we sometimes act through habit, or by instinct, for instance. By itself, this doesn't go very far, however, since the Stoics will object that, even if this were possible, this account can't describe the voluntary and responsible actions of a rational agent. (The Stoics defined responsible or voluntary action in terms of assent, since this was the mechanism through which our rationality acts on the world.) So Arcesilaus enlarges on his account in the second response: there is space for rationality and responsibility on this view, in the production of the impressions or thoughts motivating us when we act — we can act in accordance with what strikes us as the reasonable thing to do upon reflection, but still refrain from assent, i.e., refrain from forming the belief that this is the right thing to do.

The revised Academic interpretation suggests that this theory of ‘reasonable’ action represents Arcesilaus' own explanation for his actions, given that he doesn't do them on the basis of knowledge or belief. And, although this is not explicit in the texts, it suggests that Arcesilaus' adherence to the thesis that one should suspend assent universally is also to be explained as a second-order case of something that seems reasonable, rather than as the inconsistent belief that one should not hold beliefs.

There are three serious problems with this interpretation. The first is that it is not supported by the evidence to which it appeals. In Sextus, the source for the notion of ‘the reasonable’ as the criterion, this criterion is explicitly marked as one that Arcesilaus did not adhere to, but constructed as “a counterblast to that of the Stoics” (M. 7.150, Bury trans.). (Sextus' later account of Arcesilaus in another work is also incompatible with his holding such a theory in his own right; see Outlines of Pyrrhonism 1.232-3.) And Cicero and Numenius, our other sources for the historically Academic interpretation of Arcesilaus, do not mention his adoption of a ‘practical criterion’ — in fact, both authors suggest that Arcesilaus' position on how one might live without assent was indefensible, and required a significant revision under Carneades' hands (Academica 2.32 & 2.59; Numenius fr. 27.14-32, cf. Eusebius Praeparatio Evangelica 14.7.15 [= ‘Numenius' fr. 26.107-11]).

The second problem is that even if the context did not show that Arcesilaus' practical criterion was a dialectical ploy, the argument Arcesilaus used to support it only makes sense if it is construed dialectically. The argument he gives is this:

  1. a good life is guaranteed by practical wisdom;
  2. practical wisdom consists in a disposition causing right or successful actions;
  3. right or successful actions are those that, once done, have a reasonable defense (or justification);
  4. the wise person will be guided by what is reasonable (which is what practical wisdom amounts to, Arcesilaus is arguing, given that there is no knowledge);
  5. hence, the wise person will go right or be successful. (Sextus M. 7.158).

Premises [8] through [10] present two difficulties for a non-dialectical reading. One is that it is hard to see why Arcesilaus should be committed to them, or how such commitment could be consistent with the doctrine of universal suspension of assent they are supposed to justify or at least make compatible with action. For these premises imply that Arcesilaus, like the Stoics, believed that success is entirely a matter of making rational (or rationally defensible) choices. But this view — the claim that virtue is sufficient for happiness — was the most contentious issue in Hellenistic ethics (Stoics maintained it, Peripatetics denied it). And it is also one that Arcesilaus must have argued against, since it is reported that he argued not just against the Stoic theory (see below) but against all ethical views (Philodemus Index Academicorum 18.40-19.9, Diogenes Laertius 7.171, Numenius fr. 25.154-61, cf. fr. 25.41-5).

The second difficulty is that these premises are manifestly variants of the Stoic theory adapted to the Arcesilean context, in which nothing can be known and the wise person does not assent to anything. The Stoics claimed that a good life is the result of performing ‘appropriate actions' — defined as “those that, once done, have a reasonable defense” — from a disposition of wisdom, i.e., knowledge of what is good, bad and neither. But if nothing can be known, as Arcesilaus has already argued ([5]-[7] in sect. 3, above), the wisdom of the sage consists in not having any beliefs. This disposition will still allow the sage to perform the appropriate actions, however, if, as the Stoics claim, they are defined by reasonable defenses or justifications: for wise people will do what they consider reasonable. The connection between performing such actions through a wise disposition and success is, Arcesilaus suggests, something that the Stoics can't deny, because they agree that opinion is the cause of error (this is the justification for premise [6] in sect. 3, above). Hence, the perfect exercise of our rationality — reflection without assent, as Arcesilaus has argued — will lead us to find the action that is naturally appropriate to us as rational animals, i.e., the reasonable thing to do, and this guarantees success.

The third problem is that Arcesilaus' positive doctrine appears to rest on a hugely implausible claim about our rationality, viz., that it is possible to think or reflect, and come up with ‘reasonable’ conclusions, without assenting to anything, i.e., without having any beliefs of any kind or degree (see Frede 1979, Bett 1989). It is not implausible to argue that we sometimes or often act or think on the basis of tentative views, or on the explicit assumption that something is the case (which we don't know or firmly believe). But these actions seem possible only within the context of a large web of back-ground beliefs — or within the framework of Stoic beliefs about human nature, rationality, and happiness that Arcesilaus playfully deploys in the argument he actually gives.

6. The Socratic interpretation

If Arcesilaus did not defend the possibility of living without beliefs by advocating a positive theory of action, we need to find another way to explain his attested commitment to the views that nothing can be known and that one should not form beliefs. The Socratic interpretation suggests that we should understand the first view as a way of expressing the cumulative results of Arcesilaus' method, rather than as the beliefs that motivated it. The suggestion is that, like Socrates, Arcesilaus was engaged in a search for the truth about philosophical questions. But, like Socrates, he found that the arguments in favor of any position were always inadequate, or balanced by equally convincing arguments against it (cf. Diogenes Laertius 4.28, Cicero Academica 1.45). The view that nothing can be known is thus not the conclusion of an argument relying on a theory about knowledge or our cognitive faculties; it is not a theoretical or rationally warranted belief, but just the way things strike him.

If this is on the right lines, we should also look to features of the Socratic method to explain the view that we should not form beliefs. But in this case, it seems that the view does depend — at least in part — on a theoretical belief or, at least, a philosophical commitment. For Socratic investigations are motivated by the thought that it is very important to acquire philosophical knowledge, indeed, so important that we should not permit ourselves to stop inquiring even when we have found a really plausible and well-supported opinion that nonetheless faces unresolved difficulties. Several sources suggest that this was precisely what motivated Arcesilaus: Cicero, for instance, stresses repeatedly that he agreed with Zeno that it is irrational to hold opinions, i.e., inadequately warranted assents — premise [6] in sect. 3, above — (Academica 2.66-7); and Sextus suggests that he thought that individual cases of suspending assent — presumably in the light of inconclusive arguments — were good (Outlines of Pyrrhonism 1.233).

The problem with this solution, however, is that it still leaves Arcesilaus with an inconsistent position. The difficulty now is not that Arcesilaus appears over-committed to Stoic epistemology, as he seemed to be on the Academic interpretation, since the present assumption is that he shared only premise [6], not their theories of perception, belief, cognition, action, virtue and happiness, etc. It is rather that even the view that it is irrational to hold (mere) opinions presupposes a set of epistemological beliefs (i.e., opinions, assuming that knowledge is inaccessible, or has so far proven to be). If Arcesilaus is not committed to any set of assumptions about the nature and requirements of rationality or about belief and knowledge — which he ought not to be, given that he had argued against the various views on offer, and hence, ex hypothesi, suspended assent about them — it doesn't look like he can consistently believe that it is irrational to hold opinions.

But perhaps we can salvage the Socratic interpretation by applying the notion of a non-theoretical — or rationally unwarranted — belief to this view as well. On this version, Arcesilaus begins by being motivated by the same pre-theoretical beliefs as Socrates, i.e., that philosophical knowledge is important and mere opinion inadequate. But one result of his repeated and extensive Socratic investigations is the realization that even these regulating assumptions of his philosophical practice have failed to be warranted, and may be incorrect. He has kept on looking for the truth, on the assumption that obtaining it is of crucial importance for his life. But he has never obtained it, and it begins to strike him that perhaps he never will. Perhaps, it was not, after all, so important for his life to have it: maybe mere opinion is all we need. It doesn't follow that he should give up (as false) his belief that it is irrational to hold opinions, since it would only be correct to give it up if it actually is rational to hold opinions — but this is something that his arguments don't warrant, any more than they warrant the opposite conclusion.

The suggestion, then, is that Arcesilaus' beliefs in the importance of knowledge and the inadequacy of mere opinion are explicitly non-rational, in the sense that he is not persuaded that they are warranted by a rational argument or theory, or even by the extensive argument he has devoted his life to. He believes that he hasn't found knowledge and that it is irrational to assent to anything without knowledge, but realizes, as a result of the unrestricted application of his Socratic method, that there are strong reasons against these beliefs. He is thus not in a position to give his rational assent to the belief that it is irrational to hold opinions — he just finds that that is how things strike him, i.e., that's what he believes. The Academic skeptic, on this view, is someone whose sustained but pre-theoretical commitment to rational investigation undermines their confidence in rationality. The result is not a negative theory — e.g., the theory that we can't acquire knowledge owing to the limitations of our cognitive or rational capacities — but a pervasive lack of theory sustained by a dialectical method.

If this is correct, the basic philosophical puzzle about Arcesilaus' skepticism is not whether it is possible to live without beliefs, but whether it is possible to be committed to rationality and yet sufficiently detached from it to recognise that, whatever it is, it may not work.

7. Conclusion

It is clear that any interpretation of Arcesilaus must take into account both his reputation as a master dialectician who deployed Socrates' method ruthlessly against his philosophical contemporaries, and his notorious advocacy of akatalêpsia and epochê. Given the contradictory nature and scarcity of the evidence, it is perhaps not surprising that modern critics do not agree about the success of the ‘dialectical’, ‘Academic’ and ‘Socratic’ interpretations of Arcesilaus or about the consistency of the very different kinds of skepticism they propose. But further progress is not ruled out, since it is open to us to offer more sophisticated philosophical elaborations of those forms of skepticism and to test their historical plausibility by appealing to the diverse, but better attested traditions in the later Academy.




Diogenes Laertius:







Arcesilaus' Life and Philosophical Activity

Arcesilaus' Skeptical Position

Arcesilaus' Relation to Other Philosophers

Other Internet Resources

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Related Entries

Academy, Plato's | belief | Carneades | Cicero | Dialectical School | Philo of Larissa | Pyrrho | Sextus Empiricus | skepticism: ancient | Socrates | Socratic Dialogues | Stoicism | Zeno of Citium


The author thanks John Cooper and Tad Brennan for their help with this entry.