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Philo of Larissa

First published Thu Oct 5, 2006

Philo (159/8–84/3 BC) was the last known head of Plato's Academy during its skeptical phase. Under his leadership, the Academics abandoned the radical skepticism of Arcesilaus and Carneades (who professed to live without rationally warranted beliefs) in favor of a form of mitigated skepticism allowing for provisional beliefs that did not claim certainty. But Philo himself seems to have gone a step further in his controversial ‘Roman Books’, where he rejected the Stoic definition of knowledge on which the Academics' mitigated skepticism relied. The evidence suggests that he proposed instead a weaker, fallibilist theory that allowed for ordinary knowledge but did not support the theoretical dogmatism of the Academics' philosophical rivals. By challenging the accepted epistemological framework of the Hellenistic period, Philo thus inadvertently helped to set the stage for the subsequent revival of Platonism as a dogmatic tradition based on the interpretation of Platonic doctrines. He is most widely known, however, as the teacher of Cicero, through whose work Academic skepticism became known in the Latin-reading world.

1. Life and Work

The external facts of Philo's career are largely undisputed. After eight years of study with Callicles, a student of Carneades, in his native Larissa, Philo moved to Athens in 134/3 BC, where he spent fourteen years with Clitomachus, another of Carneades’ students, and the scholarch (or head) of the Academy from 129/8 (or perhaps 127/6) to his death in 110/9 BC. Philo was elected to replace him in that year, and remained the scholarch until his death in 84/3 BC. His tenure was troubled by two events. First, in the late 90s BC his authority was challenged by the secession of his student Antiochus of Ascalon, who set up a rival anti-skeptic ‘Old Academy’. (A second student, Aenesidemus, also left the Academy to found or revive the radically skeptical Pyrrhonist school, probably in the 90s BC; but the dating of this secession to Philo's tenure as scholarch is insecure.) Secondly, civil unrest in Athens and the threat of the Mithridatic war led to an exodus of Academic philosophers to safer cities. Philo himself moved to Rome in 89/8 BC, where he continued to give lectures and published his ‘Roman Books’. It is unclear whether he ever returned to Athens after its ‘pacification’ by the Romans in 86 BC. The name of his successor as scholarch, who probably oversaw the final demise of the Academy as an institution, is also unclear. (The section of Philodemus’ Catalogue of Academic Philosophers — our main source for his biography — dealing with Philo's death, his students, and his successor, survives in an illegible form.) None of Philo's written works survive, but we possess a summary of a work on ethics, some direct evidence for his Roman Books and earlier epistemological views, and indirect evidence for a work on rhetoric.

2. The Evidence for the Development of Philo's Views

Since the evidence for Philo's various epistemological views is philosophically rich but radically incomplete, their interpretation is unsurprisingly controversial. The primary sources agree that Philo's views evolved between his election as scholarch in 110/9 BC and the publication of the Roman Books in 88 BC; but the precise stages of his epistemological evolution and the arguments that led Philo to change his mind are not explicitly described in the texts we have.

Our evidence indicates (and no scholar disputes this) that Philo began as an adherent of the radical skepticism attributed to Carneades by Clitomachus. The two central questions that the evidence appears to leave open are:

  1. Did Philo hold two, or three, epistemological positions over his Academic career?
  2. Did his Roman Books advocate a form of mitigated skepticism or of fallibilism or of Platonism?

Modern scholarship offers three general kinds of answer to these questions. Scholars who think that Philo held two positions tend to interpret the Roman Books as embracing mitigated skepticism (e.g. Glucker 1978, Sedley 1981, Lévy 1992); while those who think he had three positions interpret the later work as proposing a shift from mitigated skepticism to either Platonism (Tarrant 1985) or fallibilism (e.g. Frede 1987, Barnes 1989, Striker 1997, Brittain 2001).

In order to understand these questions it is important to know something about the context in which Philo's views evolved. Several sources make it clear that when Philo arrived in Athens in the 130s BC, the Academy was sharply divided over the legacy of Carneades. One side, led by Clitomachus, advocated radical skepticism as the authentic Carneadean position, while another, led by Metrodorus of Stratonicea, promoted some form of mitigated skepticism. We know, however, that Philo was elected scholarch in 110/9 BC as a representative of the Clitomachian, i.e. radically skeptical, wing of the Academy (see Numenius fragment 28). We also know that the epistemological views in his Roman Books in 88 BC were regarded as shocking innovations by Academics of all kinds (see Cicero Academica [‘Ac.’] 2.18). The first question is thus whether Philo adopted mitigated skepticism in the Roman Books or had already done so in the interval between 110/9 and 88 BC. On the first alternative, the Roman Books announced his belated adoption of something like Metrodorus’ mitigated skepticism; on the second, they represented a distinct third epistemological position.

The resolution of this question depends primarily on an interpretation of Cicero's Academica, our principal, and only first hand, philosophical source for Academic skepticism. But this text seems to offer very strong support for the second alternative above, since Cicero identifies and distinguishes three positions held by different Academics in Philo's lifetime: a radical skepticism associated with Clitomachus (e.g. in Ac. 2.78, 2.108); a form of mitigated skepticism held by a group of Academics who regarded it as incompatible with the Roman Books (Ac. 2.148, 2.11–12 & 2.18); and the Roman Book view (Ac. 2.18). So it is clear that the Roman Books did represent a third distinct Academic position. But it also seems clear that they represented Philo's third epistemological view, because the interpretation of Carneades that generated the second view is explicitly tied to Philo and Metrodorus (Ac. 2.78, cf. 2.148), while we know that the Roman Books offered a novel interpretation of Arcesilaus and Carneades that was contested by the proponents of the second view (Ac. 2.11–12, 2.18). We can thus safely infer that Philo advocated mitigated skepticism at some point in the 90s BC, prior to the Roman Books of 88 BC and after his election to the scholarchate as a Clitomachian radical skeptic in 110/9 BC. That this is correct is confirmed by the criticisms of mitigated skepticism aimed at Philo by his student Antiochus before the Roman Books (see section 3.4 below), and by the fact that virtually all the generic references to Academic skepticism in later writers assume that it was a form of mitigated skepticism (see e.g. Gellius Attic Nights 11.5.8, Photius Library 212.170a, Plutarch Stoic Contradictions ch. 10, and Sextus Outlines of Skepticism [‘PH’] 1.226–31). Since Metrodorus was regarded as unorthodox, the only plausible candidate for the creation of this received view of Academic skepticism is a work by Philo from the 90s BC.

The second question above is much simpler to dispose of once the first has been resolved. If Philo had previously been a mitigated skeptic and the Roman Books presented an epistemological innovation, his final position was not mitigated skepticism. But we have excellent evidence that it wasn’t a (recognizable) form of Platonism, since Antiochus and Numenius flatly rejected it, despite being avowed revivers of Platonism. (The only evidence in favor of the Platonist hypothesis is an explicitly unsupported fantasy in Augustine, to the effect that Platonist doctrines were secretly taught in the Academy throughout its skeptical phase [Against the Academics 3.37–43].) The fallibilist interpretation of the Roman Books is thus at least prima facie the most plausible candidate offered to date. Whether it is in fact a satisfying candidate will depend on its ability to present a coherent philosophical interpretation of the development of Philo's epistemological views from the evidence we have.

The following sections thus offer an interpretation of Philo's philosophical development on the hypothesis that he held three distinct epistemological views: starting from a position of radical skepticism, he adopted mitigated skepticism before finally embracing fallibilism. It is worth stressing, however, that, given the uncertainties of our evidence, the exegetical and historical arguments above cannot be regarded as conclusive. The case is not closed (see e.g. Glucker 2004).

3. Epistemological views

3.1 Academics vs. Stoics

Philo's distinct epistemological views all share one fundamental feature: all of them deny the possibility of knowledge according to the dominant Stoic conception of it. The essential context for understanding Philo is thus the critique of Stoic epistemology offered by Academic philosophers, and especially by Arcesilaus and Carneades, over the preceding hundred and fifty years (c. 280–130 BC).

The Stoics’ epistemology was designed to accommodate their belief that it must be possible, in principle, to achieve the sort of inerrant wisdom Socrates had desired. The Stoic theory depends on three innovations. (See e.g. Cicero Ac. 1.40–2.) (1) They defined the formation of a belief as a matter of assenting to an occurrent thought or impression that something is, or is not, the case. (2) They isolated a certain kind of perceptual impression as ‘cognitive’ (cataleptic), because it was self-warranting, such that assenting to these impressions constituted a ‘cognition’ (catalepsis — lit. a ‘grasp’) of the state of affairs they represented. And (3) they took secure knowledge of the sort Socrates sought to be the state of an agent whose beliefs are constituted entirely by perceptual cognitions or the non-perceptual cognitions that derive solely from them. As a result, given their ethical doctrine that secure knowledge was necessary and sufficient for happiness, and since, according to (3), such knowledge could be achieved by restricting one's assent to cognitive impressions, the Stoics identified the avoidance of opinion and error — i.e. assent to non-cognitive impressions, whether inadequately warranted (opinion) or false (error) — as the overriding principle of rationality.

The Academics attacked every part of this Stoic theory — their practice was to argue against all philosophical positions — but their criticism focused, unsurprisingly, on the central notion of the cognitive impression. The Stoics standardly defined a cognitive impression as one that came from what is, was stamped and impressed exactly in accordance with it, and was, accordingly, such that it couldn’t be false (see e.g. Sextus Against the Logicians [= Adversus Mathematicos books 7–8, ‘M.’] 7.248 or Cicero Ac. 2.77). They took this to mean, roughly, that an impression is cognitive if [a] its content is true [b] it is caused in the appropriate way for correctly representing its object, and [c] its truth is warranted by the inimitable richness and detail of representation guaranteed by its causal history (see Frede 1999). The general Academic tactic against this view was to concede the possibility that an impression might meet conditions [a] and [b], but argue that condition [c] never obtained. They appealed to our experience of twins etc. and in abnormal states such as dreams, illusions and episodes of madness to show that it was always possible to have a false impression with exactly the same richness and detail of representational content as a true one, and thus that meeting condition [b] could never suffice to show that condition [c] obtains, with the result that the warrant claimed in [c] is never available to us. (See e.g. Sextus M. 7.402–10 & Cicero Ac. 2.84–90).

The Academics used these arguments to point out that if our perception is never self-warranting in the way cognitive impressions are supposed to be, and if the Stoic definition of the cognitive impression is correct, there is no cognition. Hence, if all knowledge depends on cognitions, as the Stoics claim, nothing at all can be known. The Academics also offered a corollary to this argument, drawing on the Stoic principle of rationality mentioned above:

  1. if there are no cognitive impressions (as the Academics have argued)
  2. and if the wise person never assents to a non-cognitive impression (as the Stoics think)
  3. then the wise person will never assent to anything, viz. he will suspend his assent universally.

Thus, according to the Stoic theory, once it is shown that there are no cognitive impressions as they define them, if there are any wise people, they will have no beliefs; and, whether there are or not, it is never rational to assent to any impression. (See e.g. Sextus M. 7.150–7 & Cicero Ac. 2.66–8 & 2.77–8).

The Stoics, of course, came up with plenty of sophisticated counter-arguments to the criticisms of the cognitive impression, to which the Academics devised equally subtle responses. But one argument in particular seems to have seriously troubled the Academic students of Carneades: the Stoic ‘inactivity objection’. This was a very simple practical reductio, connected to the corollary argument given above: if the Academics were right it would be impossible to act at all (let alone well), since voluntary action depends on beliefs and thus on assent (see e.g. Cicero Ac. 2.24–5 and 2.34–7). But since action (indeed, good action) is possible, the Academics must be mistaken. The later Academics saw three ways in which they could respond to this counter-argument without giving up their arguments against cognitive impressions. They could:

  1. deny the connection the Stoics discerned between voluntary action and belief or assent; or
  2. reject the Stoic principle of rationality by allowing for rationally defensible assent to non-cognitive impressions, i.e. opinions (thus rejecting premise [ii] above and the conclusion [iii]); or
  3. accept the force of the Stoic position by allowing that knowledge must after all be possible, though on some weaker definition of cognition than the Stoic one.

These three options turn out to define the three Academic positions Philo held: position [1] was the core of Clitomachus’ defense of radical skepticism; position [2] was the basis of Philo's defense of mitigated skepticism; and position [3] was the one Philo defended in the Roman Books.

3.2 Radical Skepticism

The dialectic of Academic and Stoic argument and counter-argument outlined above gives the impression that Carneades, and the earlier Academic skeptics more generally, were committed to the conclusions that they argued for, i.e. that there are no cognitive impressions, that nothing can be known, that the wise person will suspend assent universally, etc. But there are several reasons to doubt that Carneades straightforwardly believed on the basis of these arguments that nothing can be known and that it is irrational to assent to any impression (see Frede 1987). First, such a position is obviously inconsistent: since beliefs are assents on the Stoic view (and Carneades’ arguments rely on Stoic assumptions), the two conclusions cannot be consistently held at one time by a rational agent. Secondly, the arguments only work if one already accepts a basically Stoic epistemological framework, i.e. their theory of impressions, their empiricism, their conception of knowledge, their psychological doctrine etc. But Carneades had no reason to accept any of these highly contestable views rather than e.g. the Platonic or Epicurean alternatives. And, thirdly, we know that the Academic method of argument was dialectical: Carneades made it his practice to argue for and against any and all philosophical views. And, in this case in particular, there is good reason to think that his arguments were designed only to show the inadequacies of the Stoic view and their apparently skeptical consequences for the Stoics themselves. This is more or less directly attested in some sources (Numenius fr. 27, Sextus M. 7.159–64, cf. 7.150), as well as evident from the fact that Carneades was happy to try several incompatible responses to the Stoic reductio argument — viz. options [1] and [2] above — both of which can easily be read as further criticisms of Stoic epistemological views (see Striker 1980 and Allen 1994).

So Carneades was not committed to the views that nothing can be known and that it is always irrational to assent on the basis of these anti-Stoic arguments: the latter do not give him reasons to believe their conclusions. Nevertheless, it seems likely that he was committed to them in some sense, since the Stoics and other philosophers kept on arguing against these views as if they were his, or the Academic, position, and some of his students clearly agreed. (Carneades’ actual position remains controversial; see Bett 1989.) Clitomachus, at any rate, advocated an interpretation of Carneades’ skepticism that saw his method of argument on either side of all philosophical questions as motivated by some sort of commitment to the view that it is irrational to assent to anything less than what one knows to be true, and as resulting in a similar kind of commitment to the view that nothing can be known. And it was this interpretation of Carneades that Philo held at the start of his Academic career (Numenius fr. 28).

Clitomachus defended the consistency of a radical skepticism of this sort by denying that assent is necessary for action or belief, as the Stoics had claimed in their inactivity objection to the Academic corollary argument (section 3.1 above). His defense came in two stages, both appealing to arguments Carneades had used in response to the Stoic objection. The first stage identified a way to discriminate between our thoughts without appealing to their objective status as true or as ‘cognitive’ impressions (see Cicero Ac. 2.98–99, cf. 2.32). Here Clitomachus drew on Carneades’ “theory of probable [or, better, ‘persuasive’ (pithanon)] impressions” — i.e. the description of ordinary epistemic procedures that Carneades promoted as an alternative to the Stoic theory of cognitive impressions (see Sextus M. 7. 166–89 and Allen 1994). In ordinary life, Carneades argued, we proceed without assuming that a set of what the Stoics call impressions is ‘cognitive’ or immediately warranted to be true. Rather, some ‘impressions’ leave us with no immediate inclination to accept them, while some strike us as subjectively ‘persuasive’, at least initially, owing to their internal characteristics (e.g. the richness of their representation). We can increase or diminish the initial persuasiveness of our impressions by considering the perceptual conditions under which we experience them (e.g. normal perceptual conditions for perceiving the state of affairs they represent), and their fit with our other impressions (e.g. normal coherence conditions). And we accept and act on impressions when they reach the level of persuasiveness we find appropriate to the situation we are in. But, Clitomachus insisted, none of these procedures is sufficient to establish that an impression is true or ‘cognitive’, since, as the Academics have argued, the representational features of any true impression can always be replicated by a false one. (See Cicero Ac. 2.98–99.) And there is no reason to think that in ordinary life we assume that it is (see Plutarch Common Conceptions ch. 36).

This first stage gives the Academic a procedure that allows for discrimination between impressions while preserving the Academic thesis that nothing can be known. The second stage of Clitomachus’ defense drew on Carneades’ criticisms of the Stoic unitary notion of assent as simply a matter of taking an impression (or its content) to be true. Carneades had argued that this fails to account for the complexity of our cognitive life: many of our actions are not the product of distinct acts of assent, but rather unconscious, or habitual, like animal action; and we sometimes deliberately act without assent, for instance, when we follow unendorsed hypotheses or act in conditions of uncertainty (see Bett 1990). On the basis of considerations of this sort, Clitomachus argued that we should distinguish ‘assenting’ to an impression, in the Stoic sense of taking it to be true, from ‘approving’ an impression, in the sense of acting on it or accepting it as if it were true. (See Cicero Ac. 2.104.)

This second stage gives the Academics a way of accepting impressions and acting on them that preserves the thesis that rationality demands that one should always suspend assent. Thus, by combining both stages, Clitomachus was able to argue that the Academic is free to ‘follow’ or ‘approve’ persuasive impressions without assenting to them: the Academic has a ‘practical criterion’ that allows for action without presupposing the cognitive access to objective truth required for rational assent (Sextus M. 7. 166; cf. Cicero Ac. 2.108).  Clitomachus, however, did not restrict the application of this ‘practical’ criterion to cases of action. He also explicitly claimed that it gave the radical skeptics a means to explain their philosophical activities, i.e. their arguments and views (Cicero Ac. 2.104; cf. 2.32). He was thus in a position to explain the Academics’ apparent commitment to the theses that assent is irrational and knowledge is unattainable. These are views that the radical skeptic finds ‘persuasive’; but they are not ‘beliefs’, at least not in the Stoic sense, because the Academic does not take them to be true.

One might plausibly question whether Carneades’ resistance to (straightforward Stoic) assent was the ‘heroic’ defense of rationality against opinion and error Clitomachus took it to be (Cicero Ac. 2.108). It remains very controversial whether there is a coherent distinction to be made between approving a view and assenting to its truth (see the wider discussion in Burnyeat & Frede [ed.] 1997). But there is at least a case to be made that the process of arguing for and against a thesis, in the way Carneades did, can leave one stuck with a view one way or the other, but without being aware of any rational ground for preferring this view. After constant repetition of this process, one can see how the Academics might have come to have the view that their views or ‘beliefs’ are all non-rational in the specific sense that they were not actively formed in accordance with the explicit criteria of rationality advocated by the dogmatic philosophers. And if they remained committed — in the same attenuated or ‘non-rational’ sense — to the Socratic ideal of inerrant knowledge, one can see why they might try to preserve their rationality by not giving their assent to the views they found themselves holding. A case along these lines is made in Brittain 2005. Philo, at any rate, initially agreed with Clitomachus that Carneades’ ability to maintain something like this critical stance towards all beliefs — his own as well as the theories of his philosophical opponents — represented a paradigm of self-conscious rationality (see Numenius fr. 28).

3.3 Mitigated Skepticism

Clitomachus’ interpretation of Carneades’ skepticism was the dominant view in the Academy in the period c. 130–100 BC. But it was always contested, initially by Metrodorus, and later by Philo himself. The basis for the alternative interpretation was a second response Carneades had given to the Stoic inactivity objection (position [2] in section 3.1 above), arguing that it is sometimes rational to assent to non-cognitive impressions (see Cicero Ac. 2.78, cf. 2.53). Clitomachus had taken this as just an ad hominem argument, designed to challenge the Stoic defense of the view that the overriding principle of rationality is avoidance of any possibility of error (see Cicero Ac. 2.67–8). Metrodorus and his followers, however, thought that this was a statement of Carneades’ own view, and adopted it themselves.

There is no direct evidence to explain Philo's shift from radical to mitigated skepticism. But we can learn something about the general motivations he had for adopting his new position from the ways in which some mitigated skeptics understood the Carneadean notion of ‘persuasive impressions’. In the case of perceptual impressions, the difference between their view and the Clitomachian position is clarified by a criticism from Philo's former student Antiochus that some Academics took persuasive impressions to be a ‘criterion of truth’, rather than just of action (see Sextus M. 7.435–8 and Cicero Ac. 2.32–6). This shows that these Academics understood the mechanisms Carneades had outlined for increasing the persuasiveness of impressions to provide a means of confirming or disconfirming — in various degrees, though never ones that warranted them conclusively — whether they were likely to be true or not. These mitigated skeptics thus took the persuasiveness of perceptual impressions under the right perceptual and coherence conditions as defeasible, but rational, evidence for their truth, rather than as merely the ground for their acceptance. We find a similar move in the case of non-perceptual impressions: some mitigated skeptics construed the standard Academic practice of arguing on either side of philosophical questions as a means of rationally evaluating arguments in order to establish which side is more likely to be true. These mitigated skeptics thus changed the status of argument on either side from a critical and, in effect, destructive practice into a positive method for rationally confirming and, indirectly, teaching philosophical conclusions. (See e.g. Cicero Ac. 2.7, 2.60 & On the Nature of the Gods 1.11, Galen On the Best Method of Teaching ch. 1, and Plutarch Stoic Contradictions ch. 10.)

It is not difficult to see how this shift in the understanding of persuasive impressions might lead to a re-evaluation of the conception of rationality shared by Stoics and, at least in part, by the radical skeptics. Clitomachus had agreed with the Stoics that avoiding error is a necessary condition for rationality, and consequently, given the apparent unavailability of knowledge, advocated suspending assent universally. But once Philo had begun to accept that persuasiveness could be used as a rational method for evaluating impressions, the radically skeptical position started to look more like an abdication of rationality than its paradigm. Granted that nothing can be known — a view the mitigated skeptics continued to find extremely persuasive (see Cicero Ac. 2.148) — it still seems that we are rationally obliged to form the best beliefs we can, given the evidence available to us. And while this will involve the possibility of practical error, the refusal to use the evidence we have seems absurd when it is generalized to every case — and immoral in the case of ethics, since without some regulatory beliefs, it is unlikely that our lives could be virtuous or happy (see section 4).

These reasons, then, or something like them, led Philo, along with other mitigated skeptics, to the formal position that, while nothing could be known (as shown by the Academic arguments against the possibility of cognitive impressions), it is nevertheless rational to assent under certain conditions, i.e. to hold beliefs based on reasons (Cicero Ac. 2.78). The mitigated skeptics retained the Stoic characterization of such beliefs as ‘opinions’ to mark the fact that, despite the rational grounds they had for holding them, they were just rational beliefs — i.e. they did not amount to ‘cognitions’ or knowledge (Cicero Ac. 2.148). But they also distinguished rational opinions of this sort from the general Stoic category of opinion as any assent to a non-cognitive impression (and hence as always bad), by qualifying their assent to them as ‘measured’ or ‘virtual’ — that is, as provisional on their avowedly inconclusive evidence, rather than as a straightforward commitment to their truth. (See the anonymous Introduction to Plato chs. 7 & 10 and Gellius Attic Nights 11.5.8. Sextus mis-ascribes this view to Clitomachus in PH 1.226 & 1.229–30.)

The significant difference between this position and radical skepticism is clear from the principal example of a mitgatedly skeptical ‘opinion’ that we have: the thesis that nothing can be known (see e.g. Cicero Ac. 2.148, Gellius Attic Nights 11.5.8, Galen On the Best Method for Teaching ch. 1). The mitigated skeptics evidently believed this thesis directly on the basis of the Academic arguments considered in section 3.1 above. But this means that, despite their rejection of the existence of cognitive impressions and their new principle of rationality, their skepticism was heavily parasitic on Stoic epistemology: they accepted a dogmatic epistemological framework, including the Stoic theory of impressions, Stoic empiricism, the Stoic conception of knowledge, and so on. One does not need to see this as a weakness to notice that the ties between mitigated skepticism and its dogmatic framework render it liable to redundancy, in a way radical skepticism is not, if the philosophical conception of knowledge itself changes. (Early modern skepticism has perhaps suffered this fate as the Cartesian framework it was parasitic on fades.)

3.4 Fallibilism

Philo's motivation for his final shift away from skepticism in the Roman Books can be seen, at least in part, from the criticisms directed at him by his ex-student Antiochus before their publication in 88/7 BC. These criticisms point to a kind of instability inherent in mitigated skepticism: it seems to waver unhealthily between a dogmatic position allowing for something approaching certainty about some questions and a radical skepticism about our ability to make any epistemic progress. More specifically, it suggests that we can take persuasive impressions as evidence for the truth that is firm enough to warrant assent — thus allowing for a life guided by reasoned belief, and even ethical teaching — while simultaneously maintaining that even the most perfect rational consideration of the evidence is compatible with wholesale error. (See the argument in Cicero Ac. 2.111, addressed explicitly to Philo prior to his Roman view, and its elaboration in Ac. 2.34–6 & 2.43–44. These Antiochian criticisms are echoed almost verbatim by Aenesidemus in Photius Library 212 170a 14–38.)

The outlines of Philo's response to this problem in the Roman Books are fairly clear from the direct evidence we have for their epistemological innovations (Cicero Ac. 2.18 and Sextus PH 1.235). He argued, first, that the Stoic definition of the cognitive impression ruled out the possibility of anything being known — i.e. he restated the standard Academic arguments to this effect — and, secondly, that this definition was therefore misconceived, since at least some things could be known. His elucidation of the second claim is unfortunately not explicit in the surviving evidence. But its criticism by Antiochus (the context for Cicero's report) very strongly suggests that Philo offered an alternative and weaker definition of knowledge of single propositions. For Antiochus both characterizes Philo's innovations as an attempt to redefine ‘cognition’ (Ac. 2.17 & 2.18 fin.) and attempts to refute them by arguing that an impression that does not meet the condition given in the third clause of the Stoic definition (see section 3.1 above) cannot be ‘cognitive’. Philo's new definition thus amounted to something like the Stoic definition minus its third clause (the clause the Academics had always disputed). If so, Philo claimed that an impression is cognitive if it is both [a] true and [b] caused in the appropriate way for correctly representing its object — without adding the disputed Stoic rider [c], that its truth is warranted by the inimitable richness and detail of representation guaranteed by its causal history.

This bare outline of Philo's final position is sufficient to show its novelty, and thus explain its poor reception by Antiochus and the Academics alike (see Ac. 2.11–12, 2.18). His new conception of knowledge was a radical innovation in three respects. First, given his acceptance of the standard Academic arguments against self-warranting cognitive impressions, it offered a fallibilist theory, which allows for unqualified assent to knowledge claims on the basis of impressions that might nonetheless be false. Antiochus’ criticism suggests that he defended this view by pointing out that the theoretical or counterfactual possibility of error was epistemically irrelevant in cases where the impression is in fact true and our positive evidence for it is, in practice, conclusive (see Barnes 1989). But however he justified it, Philo's new conception of knowledge challenged the fundamental epistemological principle of the Hellenistic period that knowledge must be certain. Secondly, Philo's new theory implied that there is in fact a good deal of knowledge. It thus constituted an apparently radical rejection of the basic thesis that all the skeptical Academics had shared, that nothing can be known. And, thirdly, Philo's theory implied a revised principle of rationality. The mitigated skeptics had responded to the Stoic inactivity objection by identifying rationality with forming defeasible beliefs on the basis of the available evidence. But, by qualifying the assent of the rational agent as ‘measured’ or provisional, they insulated rationality itself from practical error: whether or not the belief is false, an agent who forms it on the appropriate grounds is never mistaken in holding it provisionally. On Philo's new position, however, rationality is compatible with outright error because it is rational to give straightforward, unqualified assent to impressions that might nonetheless be false. The Roman Books thus marked Philo's final rejection of the joint Stoic and Academic thesis that the avoidance of error is an overriding principle of rationality.

This sketch of their implications explains why Philo's innovations were decisive enough to startle his contemporaries and, eventually, to lead to the doxographical classification of his version of Academicism as a distinct ‘Fourth Academy’ (see e.g. Sextus PH 1.220 & 1.235). But two facts imply that his further elucidation in the Roman Books included some significant limitations on the range of knowledge Philo came to accept, and hence the sense in which he rejected the skepticism of his Academic predecessors. The first is just that his contemporaries (and later historians) continued to regard him, even at the end of his career, as an Academic, i.e. in some way a follower of Arcesilaus and Carneades, rather than a defector like Antiochus or Aenesidemus. The second is that Philo asserted ‘the unity of the Academy’ in the Roman Books (see Cicero Ac. 1.13), i.e. claimed that his new view was in fact the underlying view of all the Academics from Socrates and Plato to himself. Exactly what he meant by this claim is controversial, but the tenuous and complex evidence does not suggest that it involved either accepting an anti-skeptical reading of Plato or denying that the skeptical Academics were skeptical about the possibility of achieving theoretical knowledge in philosophy (see Brittain 2001 chs. 4–5).

By combining these external constraints for our understanding of the epistemological innovations of the Roman Books with their philosophical context — Philo's prior position of mitigated skepticism and the criticisms it faced — we can see, at least roughly, how Philo may have given flesh to the basic outline above. Taken together, these considerations suggest three constraints on the range of the knowledge that Philo accepted. They suggest, first, that Philo supplemented the externalist bones of his new definition of cognition with the internalist constraints on assent that the mitigated skeptics had already identified: assent to a Philonian cognitive impression would only be warranted when the representational ‘richness’ guaranteed by its causal history (condition [b] above) was confirmed by meeting the additional perceptual and coherence conditions Carneades had identified for persuasive impressions. Secondly, that Philo took Philonian cognition to apply primarily to experiential knowledge, i.e. the kind that we ascribe to ourselves in virtue of perception and to experts with practical skills, or something like ‘ordinary knowledge’. And thirdly, that Philo accordingly did not assume that the results of philosophical inquiry would often, or even usually, or perhaps ever, amount to knowledge when subjected to rational criticism through argument on either side. (The evidence that might support these three claims is collected in Brittain 2001 ch. 3.)

The hypothesis that Philo's fleshed out final theory of knowledge was roughly along these lines makes sense of both the context and the reception of his innovations. It also allows us to offer a more philosophically satisfying explanation of his eventual acceptance of the possibility of knowledge than Antiochus’ suggestion that he was unable to endure the criticisms he and other Academics had dealt with for thirty years (Cicero Ac. 2.18). By allowing for the existence of ordinary, fallible, knowledge, Philo challenged the epistemological framework of his era; but by limiting knowledge so that it did not include most of the results of philosophical inquiry, and by ascribing its acceptance to the Academic tradition, he sought to redefine the skeptical Academy in terms of its original Socratic function as the non-dogmatic critic of philosophical pretensions to theoretical knowledge. On this view, Academic philosophy is not defined by an epistemological position (as even Clitomachus’ radical skepticism appears to have been), but by the critical method of argument on either side.

4. Ethics and Rhetoric

Our knowledge of Philo's work in ethics comes almost entirely from an extended summary of an introductory book or lecture preserved without any context in an anthology (Stobaeus Anthology 2.7). The summary is puzzling because it presents a picture of Philonian ethics that seems too dogmatic, and too ordinary, for an Academic, even at the time of the Roman Books. The work presents a method for teaching ethics in terms of an analogy between philosophy and medicine. This yields a division of ethical teaching into three parts: a protreptic stage (showing the need for philosophical guidance), a therapeutic stage (adjusting the student's evaluative concepts), and a preservative stage (outlining the life-styles and political arrangements that promote or maintain happiness by reinforcing these adjusted concepts). This is intriguing as an example of the way in which late Hellenistic philosophers approached the teaching of practical ethics (see Annas 1996). But it does not look innovative. The analogy itself is a standard one in Plato and in Hellenistic ethics. The focus on practical rules and the application of technical divisions and sub-division is derived from the Stoic tradition. And its theoretical claims — for instance, that wisdom or knowledge is necessary for virtue, and that virtue promotes the goal of happiness — do not identify it as an exception to the mainstream tradition of weaker or stronger ‘intellectualist’ and ‘eudaemonist’ virtue ethics. In these respects, the summary suggests the Philo's ethics was largely unaffected by the wide-ranging and penetrating criticisms of Hellenistic ethics by his Academic predecessors, and especially by Carneades (examined in Algra 1997).

But there is reason to think that the summary — which was probably written five hundred years after Philo's work — gives a misleading picture of Philonian ethics by not informing us directly of the methods it used to enable and secure the possession of happiness. It is perhaps natural to assume that his methods were the standard dogmatic ones. Two aspects of the wider context omitted by the excerptor, however, suggest that Philo's ethics were in fact based on the Academic method of argument on either side. First, we know that the mitigated skeptics had already come to see their method of arguing for and against ethical theses as a way of teaching ethics that allowed students to evaluate which views were more persuasive, i.e. had better rational grounds. This is clearest in the case of Philo's colleague Charmadas in Cicero On the Orator 1.83–93. It is confirmed by the criticisms of mitigated skepticism from Aenesidemus in Photius Library 212 170a and Sextus PH 1.226. Secondly, we know that Philo had developed a way to popularize the Academic method by incorporating it into a technical system of rhetoric (see Cicero On the Orator 3.110–118 and Tusculan Disputations 2.9). But since the function of this system was to provide students with forensic techniques for arguing about moral issues, and given that teaching rhetoric in any form was a significant departure for an Academic philosopher, this development must have had some connexion to Philo's ethical views (see Reinhardt 2000 and Brittain 2001).

When the summary is read with this wider context in mind, three apparently minor points stand out. First, the therapeutic stage, dealing with the students’ fundamental conceptions of value, is described as the effort to replace “falsely acquired beliefs” with ones “in a healthy state,” rather than just false with true beliefs (Stobaeus Anthology 2.7 p. 40.18–20). Secondly, the preservative stage, concerned with the lifestyles that promote or secure happiness, is framed as an “investigation” of a set of questions that correspond precisely with the questions dealt with by argument on either side in Philo's rhetoric (ibid. p. 41.7–14). And, thirdly, that kind of general ‘investigation’ is explicitly distinguished from the provision of straightforwardly prescriptive advice about how to behave, which is regarded as a temporary fix for busy people (ibid. p. 41.16–25). These points can be explained in various ways. But given the wider context, they suggest that the summary has obscured the central point about Philo's ethics: its method of teaching was not dogmatic, but the Academic one of argument on either side.

If this is right, the summary's apparent ordinariness and dogmatic structure reflect only Philo's systematic approach to ethical topics, not its methods or results: Philo did not propose a dogmatic ethics, but rather a systematic way of structuring its students’ moral values into a coherent way of life through their rational evaluation of arguments on either side. A philosophical approach to ethics of this kind allows students to use their ethical intuitions — the knowledge provided by their own experience — to revise and structure their conceptions of value, and, on that basis, critically evaluate their general social and political roles, and select the appropriate actions in a particular situation. An approach of this sort perhaps no longer seems striking or innovative, but if Philo adopted it in the early 80s BC, it presented no less a challenge to Hellenistic ethics than his Roman Books did to epistemology. Two reasons to think that Philo did adopt this approach are, first, that it yields a conception of ethical knowledge that fits the epistemology of the Roman Books — a Philonian rational agent will have the sort of wisdom and happiness that is available to ordinary people, i.e. something quite unlike the illusory promise of inerrant knowledge and moral perfection promised by the Stoics. And, secondly, Philo's student Cicero adopted something like a mitigatedly skeptical version of this approach both in his personal life (see Griffin 1989) and in his philosophical works on ethics (see Schofield 2002).

5. Conclusion

Philo eventually abandoned both radical and mitigated skepticism, on this reconstruction of his work, for a form of open-ended critical inquiry that he described as the basis of the Academic tradition. His novel conception of Academic philosophy had some impact on the work of Cicero, Plutarch, Favorinus and Augustine, but his radical innovations in epistemology and ethics sank almost without trace. The skeptical tradition survived in the form of Pyrrhonism, but the Academy did not. Like any interpretation of Philo's philosophical development, this reconstruction is speculative in some respects. But much of it can be confirmed or disconfirmed by further work on Cicero's philosophical treatises, which remain an open field for research.



Collections of Philo's fragments










Sextus Empiricus


Philo's life and philosophical activity

Philo's epistemological positions

Philo's relation to other philosophers

Philo's ethics

Philo's rhetoric

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Related Entries

Antiochus of Ascalon | Arcesilaus | Carneades | Cicero | skepticism