Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Thu Jul 27, 2006

Normative democratic theory deals with the moral foundations of democracy and democratic institutions. It is distinct from descriptive and explanatory democratic theory. It does not offer in the first instance a scientific study of those societies that are called democratic. It aims to provide an account of when and why democracy is morally desirable as well as moral principles for guiding the design of democratic institutions. Of course, normative democratic theory is inherently interdisciplinary and must call on the results of political science, sociology and economics in order to give this kind of concrete guidance.

This brief outline of normative democratic theory focuses attention on four distinct issues in recent work. First, it outlines some different approaches to the question of why democracy is morally desirable at all. Second, it explores the question of what it is reasonable to expect from citizens in large democratic societies.  This issue is central to the evaluation of normative democratic theories as we will see. A large body of opinion has it that most classical normative democratic theory is incompatible with what we can reasonably expect from citizens. It also discusses blueprints of democratic institutions for dealing with issues that arise from a conception of citizenship. Third, it surveys different accounts of the proper characterization of equality in the processes of representation. These last two parts display the interdisciplinary nature of normative democratic theory. Fourth, it discusses the issue of whether and when democratic institutions have authority and it discusses different conceptions of the limits of democratic authority.

1. Democracy Defined

To fix ideas, the term “democracy,” as I will use it in this article, refers very generally to a method of group decision making characterized by a kind of equality among the participants at an essential stage of the collective decision making.   Four aspects of this definition should be noted. First, democracy concerns collective decision making, by which I mean decisions that are made for groups and that are binding on all the members of the group. Second, this definition means to cover a lot of different kinds of groups that may be called democratic. So there can be democracy in families, voluntary organizations, economic firms, as well as states and transnational and global organizations. Third, the definition is not intended to carry any normative weight to it. It is quite compatible with this definition of democracy that it is not desirable to have democracy in some particular context. So the definition of democracy does not settle any normative questions. Fourth, the equality required by the definition of democracy may be more or less deep. It may be the mere formal equality of one-person one-vote in an election for representatives to an assembly where there is competition among candidates for the position. Or it may be more robust, including equality in the processes of deliberation and coalition building. “Democracy” may refer to any of these political arrangements. It may involve direct participation of the members of a society in deciding on the laws and policies of the society or it may involve the participation of those members in selecting representatives to make the decisions.

The function of normative democratic theory is not to settle questions of definition but to determine which, if any, of the forms democracy may take are morally desirable and when and how.   For instance, Joseph Schumpeter argues (1956, chap. XXI), with some force, that only a highly formal kind of democracy in which citizens vote in an electoral process for the purpose of selecting competing elites is highly desirable while a conception of democracy that draws on a more ambitious conception of equality is dangerous. On the other hand, Jean-Jacques Rousseau (1762, Book II, chap. 1) is apt to argue that the formal variety of democracy is akin to slavery while only robustly egalitarian democracies have political legitimacy. Others have argued that democracy is not desirable at all. To evaluate their arguments we must decide on the merits of the different principles and conceptions of humanity and society from which they proceed.

2. The Justification of Democracy

We can evaluate democracy along at least two different dimensions: consequentially, by reference to the outcomes of using it compared with other methods of political decision making; or intrinsically, by reference to qualities that are inherent in the method, for example, whether there is something inherently fair about making democratic decisions on matters on which people disagree.

2.1 Instrumentalism

2.1.1 Instrumental Arguments in Favor of Democracy

Two kinds of in instrumental benefits are commonly attributed to democracy: relatively good laws and policies and improvements in the characters of the participants. John Stuart Mill argued that a democratic method of making legislation is better than non-democratic methods in three ways: strategically, epistemically and via the improvement of the characters of democratic citizens (Mill, 1861, Chapter 3). Strategically, democracy has an advantage because it forces decision-makers to take into account the interests, rights and opinions of most people in society. Since democracy gives some political power to each, more people are taken into account than under aristocracy or monarchy. The most forceful contemporary statement of this instrumental argument is provided by Amartya Sen, who argues, for example, that “no substantial famine has ever occurred in any independent country with a democratic form of government and a relatively free press” (Sen 1999, 152). The basis of this argument is that politicians in a multiparty democracy with free elections and a free press have incentives to respond to the expressions of needs of the poor.

Epistemologically, democracy is thought to be the best decision-making method on the grounds that it is generally more reliable in helping participants discover the right decisions. Since democracy brings a lot of people into the process of decision making, it can take advantage of many sources of information and critical assessment of laws and policies. Democratic decision-making tends to be more informed than other forms about the interests of citizens and the causal mechanisms necessary to advance those interests. Furthermore, the broad based discussion typical of democracy enhances the critical assessment of the different moral ideas that guide decision-makers.

Many have endorsed democracy on the basis of the proposition that democracy has beneficial effects on character. Many have noted with Mill and Rousseau that democracy tends to make people stand up for themselves more than other forms of rule do because it makes collective decisions depend on them more than monarchy or aristocracy do. Hence, in democratic societies individuals are encouraged to be more autonomous. In addition, democracy tends to get people to think carefully and rationally more than other forms of rule because it makes a difference whether they do or not. Finally, some have argued that democracy tends to enhance the moral qualities of citizens. When they participate in making decisions, they have to listen to others, they are called upon to justify themselves to others and they are forced to think in part in terms of the interests of others. Some have argued that when people find themselves in this kind of circumstance, they come genuinely to think in terms of the common good and justice. Hence, some have argued that democratic processes tend to enhance the autonomy, rationality and morality of participants. Since these beneficial effects are thought to be worthwhile in themselves, they count in favor of democracy and against other forms of rule (Mill 1861, p. 74, Elster 2002, p. 152).

Some argue in addition that the above effects on character tend to enhance the quality of legislation as well. A society of autonomous, rational, and moral decision-makers is more likely to produce good legislation than a society ruled by a self-centered person or small group of persons who rule over slavish and unreflective subjects.

More detailed knowledge of the effects of political institutions can be used to discriminate in favor of particular kinds of democratic institutions or modifications of them. For instance in the United States, James Madison argued in favor of a fairly strong federal government on the grounds that local governments are more likely to be oppressive to minorities (Madison, Hamilton and Jay 1788, n. 10). Of course the soundness of any of the above arguments depends on the truth or validity of the associated substantive views about justice and the common good as well as the causal theories of the consequences of different institutions.

2.1.2 Instrumental Arguments against Democracy

Not all instrumental arguments favor democracy. Plato (Republic, Book VI) argues that democracy is inferior to various forms of monarchy, aristocracy and even oligarchy on the grounds that democracy tends to undermine the expertise necessary to properly governed societies. In a democracy, he argues, those who are expert at winning elections and nothing else will eventually dominate democratic politics. Democracy tends to emphasize this expertise at the expense of the expertise that is necessary to properly governed societies. The reason for this is that most people do not have the kinds of talents that enable them to think well about the difficult issues that politics involves. But in order to win office or get a piece of legislation passed, politicians must appeal to these people's sense of what is right or not right. Hence, the state will be guided by very poorly worked out ideas that experts in manipulation and mass appeal use to help themselves win office.

Hobbes (1651, chap. XIX) argues that democracy is inferior to monarchy because democracy fosters destabilizing dissension among subjects. But his skepticism is not based in a conception that most people are not intellectually fit for politics. On his view, individual citizens and even politicians are apt not to have a sense of responsibility for the quality of legislation because no one makes a significant difference to the outcomes of decision making. As a consequence, citizens’ concerns are not focused on politics and politicians succeed only by making loud and manipulative appeals to citizens in order to gain more power, but all lack incentives to consider views that are genuinely for the common good. Hence the sense of lack of responsibility for outcomes undermines politicians’ concern for the common good and inclines them to make sectarian and divisive appeals to citizens. For Hobbes, then, democracy has deleterious effects on subjects and politicians and consequently on the quality of the outcomes of collective decision making.

Many public choice theorists in contemporary economic thought expand on these Hobbesian criticisms. They argue that citizens are not informed about politics and that they are often apathetic, which makes room for special interests to control the behavior of politicians and use the state for their own limited purposes all the while spreading the costs to everyone else. Some of them argue for giving over near complete control over society to the market, on the grounds that more extensive democracy tends to produce serious economic inefficiencies. More modest versions of these arguments have been used to justify modification of democratic institutions.

2.1.3 Grounds for Instrumentalism

Instrumentalists argue that these instrumental arguments for and against the democratic process are the only bases on which to evaluate democracy or compare it with other forms of political decision making. There are a number of different kinds of argument for instrumentalism. One kind of argument proceeds from a certain kind of moral theory.   For example classical utilitarianism simply has no room in its fundamental value theory for the ideas of intrinsic fairness, liberty or the intrinsic importance of an egalitarian distribution of political power. Its sole concern with maximizing utility understood as pleasure or desire satisfaction guarantees that it can provide only instrumental arguments for and against democracy.   And there are many moral theories of this sort.

But one need not be a thoroughgoing consequentialist to argue for instrumentalism in democratic theory. There are arguments in favor of instrumentalism that pertain directly to the question of democracy and collective decision making generally. One argument states that political power involves the exercise of power of some over others. And it argues that the exercise of power of one person over another can only be justified by reference to the protection of the interests or rights of the person over whom power is exercised. Thus no distribution of political power could ever be justified except by reference to the quality of outcomes of the decision making process (Arneson 2002, pp. 96-97).

Other arguments question the coherence of the idea of intrinsically fair collective decision making processes. For instance, social choice theory questions the idea that there can be a fair decision making function that transforms a set of individual preferences into a rational collective preference. No general rule satisfying reasonable constraints can be devised that can transform any set of individual preferences into a rational social preference. And this is taken to show that democratic procedures cannot be intrinsically fair (Riker 1980, p. 116). Dworkin argues that the idea of equality, which is for him at the root of social justice, cannot be given a coherent and plausible interpretation when it comes to the distribution of political power among members of the society. The relation of politicians to citizens inevitably gives rise to inequality, so it cannot be intrinsically fair or just (Dworkin 2000, ch. 4 [originally published in 1987]). In later work, Dworkin has pulled back from this originally thoroughgoing instrumentalism (Dworkin 2000, ch. 10 [originally published in 1999]).

2.2 Non-instrumental Values

Few theorists deny that political institutions must be at least in part evaluated in terms of the outcomes of having those institutions. Some argue in addition, that some forms of decision making are morally desirable independent of the consequences of having them. A variety of different approaches have been used to show that democracy has this kind of intrinsic value. The most common of these come broadly under the rubrics of liberty and equality.

2.2.1 Liberty

Some argue that the basic principles of democracy are founded in the idea that each individual has a right to liberty. Democracy, it is said, extends the idea that each ought to be master of his or her life to the domain of collective decision making. First, each person's life is deeply affected by the larger social, legal and cultural environment in which he or she lives. Second, only when each person has an equal voice and vote in the process of collective decision-making will each have control over this larger environment. Thinkers such as Carol Gould (1988, pp.45-85) conclude that only when some kind of democracy is implemented, will individuals have a chance at self-government. Since individuals have a right of self-government, they have a right to democratic participation. This right is established at least partly independently of the worth of the outcomes of democratic decision making. The idea is that the right of self-government gives one a right, within limits, to do wrong. Just as an individual has a right to make some bad decisions for himself or herself, so a group of individuals have a right to make bad or unjust decisions for themselves regarding those activities they share.

Here we can see the makings of an argument against instrumentalism. To the extent that an instrumentalist wishes to diminish a person's power to contribute to the democratic process for the sake of enhancing the quality of decisions, he is committed to thinking that there is no moral loss in the fact that our power has been diminished. But if the liberty argument is correct our right to control our lives is violated by this.

One major difficulty with this line of argument is that it appears to require that the basic rule of decision making be consensus or unanimity. If each person must freely choose the outcomes that bind him or her then those who oppose the decision are not self-governing. They live in an environment imposed on them by others. So only when all agree to a decision are they freely adopting the decision.

The trouble is that there is rarely agreement on major issues in politics. Indeed, it appears that one of the main reasons for having political decision making procedures is that they can settle matters despite disagreement. And so it is hard to see how any political decision making method can respect everyone's liberty.

2.2.2 Democracy as Public Justification

One distant relative of the self-government approach is the account of democracy as a process of public justification defended by, among others, Joshua Cohen (2002, p. 21). The idea behind this approach is that laws and policies are legitimate to the extent that they are publicly justified to the citizens of the community. Public justification is justification to each citizen as a result of free and reasoned debate among equals. Citizens justify laws and policies to each other on the basis of mutually acceptable reasons. Democracy, properly understood, is the context in which individuals freely engage in a process of reasoned discussion and deliberation on an equal footing. The ideas of freedom and equality provide guidelines for structuring democratic institutions.

The aim of democracy as public justification is reasoned consensus among citizens. But a serious problem arises when we ask about what happens when disagreement remains. Two possible replies have been suggested to this kind of worry. It has been urged that forms of consensus weaker than full consensus are sufficient for public justification and that the weaker varieties are achievable in many societies. For instance, there may be consensus on the list of reasons that are acceptable publicly but disagreement on the weight of the different reasons. Or there may be agreement on general reasons abstractly understood but disagreement about particular interpretations of those reasons. What would have to be shown here is that such weak consensus is achievable in many societies and that the disagreements that remain are not incompatible with the ideal of public justification.

Another set of worries concerning this approach arises when we ask what reason there is for trying to ensure that political decisions are grounded in principles that everyone can reasonably accept. What is the basis of this need for consensus? To be sure, the consensus that is aimed at is reasonable consensus among reasonable persons. Reasonable consensus does not imply actual consensus. The unreasonable persons in society need not agree with the terms of association arrived at by reasonable persons in order for those terms to be legitimate.

The basic principle seems to be the principle of reasonableness according to which reasonable persons will only offer principles for the regulation of their society that other reasonable persons can reasonably accept. The notion of the reasonable is meant to be fairly weak on this account. One can reasonably reject a doctrine to the extent that it is incompatible with one's own doctrine as long as one's doctrine does not imply imposition on others and it is a doctrine that has survived sustained critical reflection. So this principle is a kind of principle of reciprocity. One only offers principles that others, who restrain themselves in the same way, can accept. Such a principle implies a kind of principle of restraint which requires that reasonable persons not propose laws and policies on the basis of controversial principles for the regulation of society. When individuals offer proposals for the regulation of their society, they ought not to appeal to the whole truth as they see it but only to that part of the whole truth that others can reasonably accept. To put the matter in the way Rawls puts it: political society must be regulated by principles on which there is an overlapping consensus (Rawls, 1996, Lecture IV). This is meant to obviate the need for a complete consensus on the principles that regulate society.

What moral reasons can there be for restraining oneself from offering what one takes to be the best justified proposals for the terms of the society one lives in? One might consider a number of arguments for this principle of reasonableness. One argument is an epistemological one. It is that there is no justification independent of what people or at least reasonable people believe. Hence, if one cannot provide a justification for principles that others can accept given their reasonable beliefs then those principles are not justified for those persons. Another argument is a moral argument. One fails to respect the reason of the other members of society if one imposes terms of association on them that they cannot accept given their reasonable views. This failure of respect for the reason of the other members of society defeats the value of the principles one is proposing for the society. A third argument is a specifically democratic argument. One does not genuinely treat others as equals if one insists on imposing principles on them that they cannot reasonably accept, even if this imposition takes place against the background of egalitarian decision making processes.

Each of these three arguments can be questioned. On the democratic argument, it simply isn’t clear why it is necessary to democratic equality to justify ones views on terms that others can accept. If each person has robust rights to participate in debate and decision making and each person's views are given a reasonable hearing, it is not clear why equality requires more. My rejection of another person's beliefs does not in any way imply that I think that person is inferior to me in capacity or in moral worth or in the rights to have a say in society. The epistemological argument seems to presuppose a far too restrictive conception of justification to be plausible. Many beliefs are justified for me even if they are not compatible with the political beliefs I currently hold as long as those beliefs can be vindicated by the use of procedures and methods of thinking that I use to evaluate beliefs. The conception of respect for reason in the moral argument seems not obviously to favor the principle of reasonableness. It may require that I do as much as I can to make sure that the society I live in conform to what I take to be rationally defensible norms. Of course, I may also believe that such a society must be democratically organized in which case I will attempt to advance these principles through the democratic process.

Moreover, it is hard to see how this approach avoids the need for a complete consensus, which is highly unlikely to occur in any even moderately diverse society. The reason for this is that it is not clear why it is any less of an imposition on me when I propose legislation or policies for the society that I must restrain myself to considerations that other reasonable people accept than it is an imposition on others when I attempt to pass legislation on the basis of reasons they reasonably reject. For if I do restrain myself in this way, then the society I live in will not live up to the standards that I believe are essential to evaluating the society. I must then live in and support a society that does not accord with my conception of how it ought to be organized. It is not clear why this is any less of a loss of control over society than for those who must live in a society that is partly regulated by principles they do not accept.

2.2.3 Equality

Many democratic theorists have argued that democracy is a way of treating persons as equals when there is good reason to impose some kind of organization on their shared lives but they disagree about how best to do it. On one version, defended by Peter Singer (1973, pp. 30-41), when people insist on different ways of arranging matters properly, each person in a sense claims a right to be dictator over their shared lives. But these claims to dictatorship cannot all hold up, the argument goes. Democracy embodies a kind of peaceful and fair compromise among these conflicting claims to rule. Each compromises equally on what he claims as long as the others do, resulting in each having an equal say over decision making. In effect, democratic decision making respects each person's point of view on matters of common concern by giving each an equal say about what to do in cases of disagreement (Singer 1973, Waldron 1999, chap. 5).

One difficulty is that this view relies on agreement much as the liberty views described above. What if people disagree on the democratic method or on the particular form democracy is to take? Are we to decide these latter questions by means of a higher order procedure? And if there is disagreement on the higher order procedure, must we also democratically decide that question? The view seems to lead to an infinite regress.

Another egalitarian defense of democracy asserts that it publicly embodies the equal advancement of the interests of the citizens of a society when there is disagreement about how best to organize their shared life. The idea is that a society ought to be structured to advance equally the interests of the members of the society. And the equality of members ought to be advanced in a way that each can see that they are being treated as equals. So it requires equal advancement of interests in accordance with a public measure of those interests. Hence, justice requires the publicly equal advancement of the interests of the members of society or public equality.

The idea of public equality requires some explanation. If we start with the principle of equal advancement of interests, we will want to know what it implies. Does it imply equality of well being or equality of opportunity for well being or equality of resources?  There are other possibilities but the problem with these accounts is that they cannot be realized in a way that every conscientious and informed person can know them to be in place.  So even if one of these principles is implemented many will think that they are not being treated equally. There are likely to be too many disagreements about what each person's well being consists in and how to compare it to the well being of others. The question for a political society is, is there a kind of equality that genuinely advances equally the interests of the members of the society but that does so in a way that all conscientious and informed people can agree treats them as equals?  And the answer to this question must be informed by background facts of diversity, cognitive bias, fallibility and disagreement. Public equality is the realization of equality of advancement of interests that all can see to be such a realization. And the basic argument for democracy is that it realizes equality of advancement of interests when we take the background facts above into account. 

Now the idea is that public equality is a great value. The importance of publicity itself is grounded in equality. Given the facts of diversity, cognitive bias, fallibility and disagreement, each will have reason to think that if they are ruled in accordance with some specific notion of equality advanced by some particular group that their interests are likely to be set back in some way. Only a conception of equality that can be shared by the members of society can give good reason to think that this will not happen. Within the context set by public equality, people can argue for more specific implementations of equality among citizens in law and policy all the while knowing that there will be substantial and conscientious disagreement on them. As long as the framework within which they make and vote for opposing views is set by public equality, they can know that at base, the society treats them as equals in a way that they can recognize.

The publicly equal advancement of interests requires that individuals’ judgments be taken into account equally when there is disagreement. Here is the argument for the transition from equal concern for interests to equal concern for judgment. Respect for each citizen's judgment is grounded in the principle of public equality combined with a number of basic facts and fundamental interests that attend social life in typical societies. The basic facts are that individuals are very diverse in terms of their interests. People's interests are diverse because of their different natural talents, because they are raised in different sectors of society and because they are raised in societies where there is a diversity of cultural backgrounds. Partly as a consequence of the fact that people are raised in different sectors of society and in distinct cultural milieus they are likely to have deep cognitive biases when they attempt to understand other people's interests and how they are compared to their own interests. Those biases will tend to assimilate other people's interests to their own in some circumstances or downplay them when there is a wide divergence of interests. Hence people have deep cognitive biases towards their own interests. The facts of diversity and of cognitive bias ensure that individuals are highly fallible in their understanding of their own and others’ interests and that there will be considerable disagreement among them. And they are likely to be highly fallible in their efforts to compare the importance of other people's interests to their own. So they are highly fallible in their efforts to realize equal advancement of interests in society. And of course there will be a lot of substantial disagreement about how best to advance each person's interests equally.

Against the background of these facts each person has interests that stand out as especially important in a pluralistic society. They have interests in correcting for the cognitive biases of others when it comes to the creation or revision of common economic, legal and political institutions. And each person has interests in living in a world that makes some sense to them, that accords, within limits, to their sense of how that social world out to be structured. The facts described above, and the principle of equality, suggest that each person ought to have an equal say in determining the common legal, economic and political institutions they live under. In the light of these interests each citizen would have good reason to think that his or her interests were not being given the same weight as others if he or she had less decision making power than the others. And so each person who is deprived of a right to an equal say would have reason to believe that she is being treated publicly as an inferior. Furthermore, since each person has an interest in being recognized as an equal member of the community, and having less than an equal say suggests that they are being treated as inferiors, only equality in decision making power is compatible with the public equal advancement of interests. The principle of equal advancement of interests also implies limits to what can be up for democratic control and so the infinite regress noted above is avoided.

So against the background facts of diversity, cognitive bias, fallibility and disagreement each person has fundamental interests in having an equal say in the processes of collective decision making. And so in order for people to be treated publicly as equals they must have an equal say in collective decision making (Christiano, 2004).

A number of worries attend this kind of view. First, it is generally thought that majority rule is required for treating persons as equals in collective decision making. This is because only majority rule is neutral towards alternatives in decision making. Unanimity tends to favor the status quo as do various forms of supermajority rule. But if this is so, the above view raises the twin dangers of majority tyranny and of persistent minorities i.e. groups of persons who find themselves always losing in majority decisions. Surely these latter phenomena must be incompatible with equality and even with public equality. Second, the kind of view defended above is susceptible to the criticisms leveled against the ideal of equality in decision making processes. Is it a coherent ideal, in particular in the modern state? This last worry will be discussed in more detail in the next sections on democratic citizenship and legislative representation. The first worry will be discussed more in the discussion on the limits to democratic authority.

3. The Problem of Democratic Citizenship

A vexing problem of democratic theory has been to determine whether ordinary citizens are up to the task of governing a large society. There are three distinct problems here. First, Plato (Republic, Book VI) argued that some people are more intelligent and more moral than others and that those persons ought to rule. Second, others have argued that a society must have a division of labor. If everyone were engaged in the complex and difficult task of politics, little time or energy would be left for the other essential tasks of a society. Conversely, if we expect most people to engage in other difficult and complex tasks, how can we expect them to have the time and resources sufficient to devote themselves intelligently to politics?

Third, since individuals have so little impact on the outcomes of political decision making in large societies, they have little sense of responsibility for the outcomes. Some have argued that it is not rational to vote since the chances that a vote will affect the outcome of an election are nearly indistinguishable from zero. Worse still, Anthony Downs has argued (1957, chap. 13) that almost all of those who do vote have little reason to become informed about how best to vote. On the assumption that citizens reason and behave roughly according to the Downsian model, either the society must in fact be run by a relatively small group of people with minimal input from the rest or it will be very poorly run. As we can see these criticisms are echoes of the sorts of criticisms Plato and Hobbes made.

These observations pose challenges for any robustly egalitarian or deliberative conception of democracy. Without the ability to participate intelligently in politics one cannot use one's votes to advance one's aims nor can one be said to participate in a process of reasoned deliberation among equals. So, either equality of political power implies a kind of self-defeating equal participation of citizens in politics or a reasonable division of labor seems to undermine equality of power. And either substantial participation of citizens in public deliberation entails the relative neglect of other tasks or the proper functioning of the other sectors of the society requires that most people do not participate intelligently in public deliberation.

3.1 Some Solutions Offered for the Problem of Democratic Citizenship

3.1.1 Elite Theory of Democracy

Some modern theorists of democracy, called elite theorists, have argued against any robustly egalitarian or deliberative forms of democracy on these grounds. They argue that high levels of citizen participation tend to produce bad legislation designed by demagogues to appeal to poorly informed and overly emotional citizens. They look upon the alleged uninformedness of citizens evidenced in many empirical studies in the 1950s and 1960s as perfectly reasonable and predictable. Indeed they regard the alleged apathy of citizens in modern states as highly desirable social phenomena. The alternative, they believe, is a highly motivated population of persons who know nothing and who are more likely than not to pursue irrational and emotionally appealing aims.

Joseph Schumpeter's assertion that the “democratic method is that institutional arrangement for arriving at political decisions in which individuals acquire the power to decide by means of a competitive struggle for the people's vote” (1956, p. 269), still stands as a concise statement of the elitist view. In this view, the emphasis is placed on responsible political leadership. Political leaders are to avoid divisive and emotionally charged issues and make policy and law with little regard for the fickle and diffuse demands made by ordinary citizens. Citizens participate in the process of competition by voting but since they know very little they are not effectively the ruling part of the society. The process of election is usually just a fairly peaceful way of maintaining or changing those who rule.

On Schumpeter's view, however, citizens do have a role to play in avoiding serious disasters. When politicians act in ways that nearly anyone can see is problematic, the citizens can throw the bums out. So democracy, even on this stripped down version, plays some role in protecting society from the worst politicians.

So the elite theory of democracy does seem compatible with some of the instrumentalist arguments given above but it is strongly opposed to the intrinsic arguments from liberty, public justification and equality. Against the liberty and equality arguments, the elite theory simply rejects the possibility that citizens can participate as equals. The society must be ruled by elites and the role of citizens is merely to ensure smooth and peaceful circulation of elites. Against the public justification view, ordinary citizens cannot be expected to participate in public deliberation and the views of elites ought not to be fundamentally transformed by general public deliberation. To be sure, it is conceivable for all that has been said that there can be an elite deliberative democracy wherein elites deliberate, perhaps even out of sight of the population at large, on how to run the society. Indeed, some deliberative democrats do emphasize deliberation in legislative assemblies though in general deliberative democrats favor a more broadly egalitarian approach to deliberation, which is vulnerable to the kinds of worries raised by Schumpeter and Downs.

3.1.2 Interest Group Pluralism

One approach that is in part motivated by the problem of democratic citizenship but which attempts to preserve some elements of equality against the elitist criticism is the interest group pluralist account of politics. Robert Dahl's early statement of the view is very powerful. “In a rough sense, the essence of all competitive politics is bribery of the electorate by politicians… The farmer… supports a candidate committed to high price supports, the businessman…supports an advocate of low corporation taxes… the consumer…votes for candidates opposed to a sale tax” (Dahl 1959, p. 69). In this conception of the democratic process, each citizen is a member of an interest group with narrowly defined interests that are closely connected to their everyday lives. On these subjects citizens are supposed to be quite well informed and interested in having an influence. Or at least, elites from each of the interest groups that are relatively close in perspective to the ordinary members are the principal agents in the process. On this account, democracy is not rule by the majority but rather rule by coalitions of minorities. Policy and law in a democratic society are decided by means of bargaining among the different groups.

This approach is conceivably compatible with the more egalitarian approach to democracy. This is because it attempts to reconcile equality with collective decision making by limiting the tasks of citizens to ones which they are able to perform reasonably well. And it attempts to do this in a way that gives citizens a key role in decision making. The account ensures that individuals can participate roughly as equals to the extent that it narrowly confines the issues each individual is concerned with. It is not particularly compatible with the deliberative public justification approach because it eschews deliberation about the common good or about justice. And it takes the democratic process to be concerned essentially with bargaining among the different interest groups where the preferences to be advanced by each group is not subject to further debate in the society as a whole. To be sure, there might be some deliberation within interest groups but it will not be society wide.

3.1.3 Neo-Liberalism

A third approach inspired by the problem of citizenship may be called the neo-liberal approach to politics favored by public choice theorists such as James Buchanan & Gordon Tullock (1965). Against elite theories, they contend that elites and their allies will tend to expand the powers of government and bureaucracy for their own interests and that this expansion will occur at the expense of a largely inattentive public. For this reason, they argue for severe restrictions on the powers of elites. They argue against the interest group pluralist theorists that the problem of participation occurs within interest groups more or less as much as among the citizenry at large. As a consequence, interest groups will not form very easily. Only those interest groups that are guided by powerful economic interests are likely to succeed in organizing to influence the government. Hence, only some interest groups will succeed in influencing government and they will do so largely for the benefit of the powerful economic elites that fund and guide them. Furthermore, they argue that such interest groups will tend to produce highly inefficient government because they will attempt to advance their interests in politics while spreading the costs to others. The consequence of this is that policies will be created that tend to be more costly (because imposed on everyone in society) than they are beneficial (because they benefit only the elites in the interest group.)

Neo-liberals argue that any way of organizing a large and powerful democratic state is likely to produce serious inefficiencies. They infer that one ought to transfer many of the current functions of the state to the market and limit the state to the enforcement of basic property rights and liberties. These can be more easily understood and brought under the control of ordinary citizens.

But the neo-liberal account of democracy must answer to two large worries. First, citizens in modern societies have more ambitious conceptions of social justice and the common good than are realizable by the minimal state. The neo-liberal account thus implies a very serious curtailment of democracy of its own. More evidence is needed to support the contention that these aspirations cannot be achieved by the modern state. Second, the neo-liberal approach ignores the problem of large private concentrations of wealth and power that are capable of pushing small states around for their own benefit and imposing their wills on populations without their consent. The assumptions that lead neo-liberals to be skeptical about the large modern state imply equally disturbing problems for the large private concentrations of wealth in a neo-liberal society.

3.2 The Self-Interest Assumption

A considerable amount of the literature in political science and the economic theory of the state are grounded in the assumption that individuals act primarily and perhaps even exclusively in their self-interest narrowly construed. The problem of participation and the accounts of the democratic process described above are in large part dependent on this assumption. While these ideas have generated interesting results and have become ever more sophisticated, there has been a growing chorus of opponents. Against the self-interest axiom, defenders of deliberative democracy and others claim that citizens are capable of being motivated by a concern for the common good and justice. And they claim, with Mill and Rousseau, that such concerns are not merely given prior to politics but that they can evolve and improve through the process of discussion and debate in politics. They assert that much debate and discussion in politics would not be intelligible were it not for the fact that citizens are willing to engage in open minded discussion with those who have distinct morally informed points of view. Empirical evidence suggests that individuals are motivated by moral considerations in politics in addition to their interests. Accordingly, many propose that democratic institutions be designed to support the inclination to engage in moral and open-minded discussion with others (see the essays in Mansbridge 1990).

3.3 The Role of Citizenship as Choosers of Aims

Once we approach the idea of citizenship from a moral point of view and we recognize the importance of a division of labor, the question arises, what is the appropriate role for a citizen in a democracy? If we think that citizens are too often uninformed we should ask two questions. What ought citizens have knowledge about in order to fulfill their role? What standards ought citizens’ beliefs live up to in order to be adequately supported? Some, such as Dahl in the above quote, have proposed that citizens know about their particular sectors of society and not others. We have seen that this view has a number of difficulties. Christiano proposes, along with others, that citizens must think about what ends the society ought to aim at and leave the question of how to achieve those aims to experts (Christiano 1996, chap. 5). This kind of view needs to answer to the problem of how to ensure that politicians, administrators and experts actually do attempt to realize the aims set by citizens. And it must show how institutions can be designed so as to establish the division of labor while preserving equality among citizens. But if citizens genuinely do choose the aims and others faithfully pursue the means to achieving those aims, then citizens are in the driver's seat in society.

It is hard to see how citizens can satisfy any even moderate standards for beliefs about out how best to achieve their political aims. Knowledge of means requires an immense amount of social science and knowledge of particular facts. For citizens to have this kind of knowledge generally would require that we abandon the division of labor in society. On the other hand, citizens do have first hand and daily experience with thinking about the values and aims they pursue. This gives them a chance to satisfy standards of belief regarding what the best aims are.

Still the view is not defensible without a compelling institutional answer to the question of how to ensure that others are genuinely pursuing the means to achieve the aims specified by citizens. On the proposed view, legislative representatives and bureaucrats as well as judges must subordinate their activities to the task of figuring out how to pursue the aims of citizens. There is a huge principal/agent problem here.

Furthermore, we must ask, how must institutions be designed in order to reconcile the demand for equality among citizens with the need for a division of labor? We will discuss one dimension of this issue in the question of legislative representation.

4. Legislative Representation

A number of debates have centered on the question of what kinds of legislative institution are best for a democratic society. What choice we make here will depend heavily on our underlying ethical justification of democracy, our conception of citizenship as well as on our empirical understanding of political institutions and how they function. The most basic types of formal political representation available are single member district representation, proportional representation and group representation. In addition, many societies have opted for multicameral legislative institutions. In some cases, combinations of the above forms have been tried.

Single member district representation returns single representatives of geographically defined areas containing roughly equal populations to the legislature and is present most prominently in the United States and the United Kingdom. The most common form of proportional representation is party list proportional representation. In a simple form of such a scheme, a number of parties compete for election to a legislature that is not divided into geographical districts. Parties acquire seats in the legislature as a proportion of the total number of votes they receive in the voting population as a whole. Group representation occurs when the society is divided into non-geographically defined groups such as ethnic or linguistic groups or even functional groups such as workers, farmers and capitalists and returns representatives to a legislature from each of them.

Many have argued in favor of single member district legislation on the grounds that it has appeared to them to lead to more stable government than other forms of representation. The thought is that proportional representation tends to fragment the citizenry into opposing homogeneous camps that rigidly adhere to their party lines and that are continually vying for control over the government. Since there are many parties and they are unwilling to compromise with each other, governments formed from coalitions of parties tend to fall apart rather quickly. The post war experience of governments in Italy appears to confirm this hypothesis. Single member district representation, in contrast, is said to enhance the stability of governments by virtue of its favoring a two party system of government. Each election cycle then determines which party is to stay in power for some length of time.

Charles Beitz argues (1989, chap. 7) that single member district representation encourages moderation in party programs offered for citizens to consider. This results from the tendency of this kind of representation towards two party systems. In a two party system with majority rule, it is argued, each party must appeal to the median voter in the political spectrum. Hence, they must moderate their programs to appeal to the median voter. Furthermore, they encourage compromise among groups since they must try to appeal to a lot of other groups in order to become part of one of the two leading parties. These tendencies encourage moderation and compromise in citizens to the extent that political parties, and interest groups, hold these qualities up as necessary to functioning well in a democracy.

In criticism, advocates of proportional and group representation have argued that single member district representation tends to muffle the voices and ignore the interests of minority groups in the society. Minority interests and views tend to be articulated in background negotiations and in ways that muffle their distinctiveness. Furthermore, representatives of minority interests and views often have a difficult time getting elected at all in single member district systems so it has been charged that minority views and interests are often systematically underrepresented. Sometimes these problems are dealt with by redrawing the boundaries of districts in a way that ensures greater minority representation. The efforts are invariably quite controversial since there is considerable disagreement about the criteria for apportionment. In proportional representation, by contrast, representatives of different groups are seated in the legislature in proportion to citizens’ choices. Minorities need not make their demands conform to the basic dichotomy of views and interests that characterize single member district systems so their views are more articulated and distinctive as well as better represented.

Another criticism of single member district representation is that it encourages parties to pursue dubious electoral campaign strategies. The need to appeal to a large, diverse and somewhat amorphous sector of the population can very often be best met by using ambiguous, vague and often quite irrelevant appeals to the citizens. Thus instead of encouraging reasonable compromise the scheme tends to support tendencies towards ignorance, superficiality and fatuousness in political campaigns and in the citizenry. It encourages political leaders to take care of the real issues of politics in back rooms while they appeal to citizens by means of smoke and mirrors. Of course, those who agree in the main with the elitist type theories will see nothing wrong in this, indeed they may well champion this effect. Proportional representation requires that parties be relatively clear and up front about their proposals, so those who believe that democracy is ethically grounded in the appeal to equality tend to favor proportional representation (see Christiano 1996, chap. 6).

Advocates of group representation, like Iris Marion Young (1990, chap. 6), have argued that some historically disenfranchised groups may still not do very well under proportional representation. They may not be able to organize and articulate their views as easily as other groups. Also, minority groups can still be systematically defeated in the legislature and their interests may be consistently set back even if they do have some representation. For these groups, some have argued that the only way to protect their interests is legally to ensure that they have adequate and even disproportionate representation.

One worry about group representation is that it tends to frieze some aspects of the agenda that might be better left to the choice of citizens. For instance, consider a population that is divided into linguistic groups for a long time. And suppose that only some citizens continue to think of linguistic conflict as important. In the circumstances a group representation scheme may tend to be biased in an arbitrary way that favors the views or interests of those who do think of linguistic conflict as important.

5. The Authority of Democracy

Since democracy is a collective decision process, the question naturally arises about whether there is any obligation of citizens to obey the democratic decision. In particular, the question arises as to whether a citizen has an obligation to obey the democratic decision when he or she disagrees with it.

There are three main concepts of the legitimate authority of the state. First, a state has legitimate authority to the extent that it is morally justified in imposing its rule on the members. Legitimate authority on this account has no direct implications concerning the obligations or duties that citizens may hold toward that state. It simply says that if the state is morally justified in doing what it does, then it has legitimate authority. Second, a state has legitimate authority to the extent that its directives generate duties in citizens to obey. The duties of the citizens need not be owed to the state but they are real duties to obey. The third is that the state has a right to rule that is correlated with the citizens’ duty to it to obey it. This is the strongest notion of authority and it seems to be the core idea behind the legitimacy of the state. The idea is that when citizens disagree about law and policy it is important to be able to answer the question, who has the right to choose?

With respect to democracy we can imagine three main approaches to the question as to whether democratic decisions have authority. First, we can appeal to perfectly general conceptions of legitimate authority. Some have thought that the question of authority is independent entirely of whether a state is democratic. Consent theories of political authority and instrumentalist conceptions of political authority state general criteria of political authority that can be met by non democratic as well as democratic states. Second, some have thought that there is a conceptual link between democracy and authority such that if a decision is made democratically then it must therefore have authority. Third, some have thought that there are general principles of political authority that are uniquely realized by a democratic state under certain well defined conditions.

Readers who are interested in more general conceptions of political authority may consult the entry for political authority for a discussion of the issues. And the second kind of view has been largely abandoned by democratic theorists. I do wish to discuss the third kind of conception of the political authority of democracy.

5.1 Instrumentalist Conceptions of Democratic Authority

In general, instrumentalist conceptions of authority make no special mention of democracy. The instrumental arguments for democracy give some reason for why one ought to respect the democracy when one disagrees with its decisions. But there may be many other instrumental considerations that play a role in deciding on the question of whether one ought to obey. And these instrumental considerations are pretty much the same whether one is considering obedience to democracy or some other form of rule.

There is one instrumentalist approach which is quite unique to democracy and that seems to ground a strong conception of democratic authority. That is the approach inspired by the Condorcet Jury Theorem (Goodin, 2003, chap. 5; Estlund, 2002, 77-80). According to this theorem, on issues where there are two alternatives and there is a correct answer as to which one is correct, if voters have on average a better than even chance of getting the right answer, the majority is more likely to have the right answer than anyone in the minority. And the likelihood that the majority is right increases as the size of the voting population increases. In very large populations, the chance that the majority is right approaches certainty. The theorem is an instance of the law of large numbers. If each voter has an independently better than 0.5 chance of getting the right answer then the probability that more than 0.5 of the voters get the right answer approaches 1 as the number of voters becomes very large.

Such a result makes sense of Rousseau's famous passage: “Each citizen, in giving his suffrage, states his mind on that question [concerning what the general will is]; and the general will is found by counting the votes. When, therefore, the motion which I opposed carries, it only proves to me that I was mistaken and that what I believed to be the general will was not so” (Rousseau 1762, 95-96). On this account, we have a conception of the authority of democracy. The members of the minority have a powerful reason for shifting their allegiance to the majority position, since each has very good reason to think that the majority is right.

There are a number of difficulties with the application of the Condorcet Jury Theorem to the case of voting in elections and referenda. First, many have remarked that voters’ opinions are not independent of each other. Indeed, the democratic process seems to emphasize persuasion and coalition building. And the theorem only works on independent trials. Second, the theorem does not seem to apply to cases in which the information that voters have access to, and on the basis of which they make their judgments, is segmented in various ways so that some sectors of the society do not have the relevant information while others do have it. And modern societies and politics seem to instantiate this kind of segmentation in terms of class, race, ethnic groupings, religion, occupational position, geographical place and so on. One can always have good reason to think that the majority is not properly placed to make a reasonable decision on a certain issue when one is in the minority. Finally, all voters approach issues they have to make decisions on with strong ideological biases thus undermining the sense that each voter is bringing a kind of independent observation on the nature of the common good to the vote.

One further worry about the Condorcet Theorem's application seems to be that it would prove too much anyway for it undermines the common practice of the loyal opposition in democracies. Indeed, even in scientific communities the fact that a majority of scientists favor a particular view does not make the minority scientists think that they are wrong, though it does perhaps give them pause (Goodin 2003, chap. 7).

5.2 Democratic Consent Theories of Authority

Some consent theorists have thought that there is a special relation between democracy and legitimate authority at least under certain conditions. John Locke argues (1690, sec. 96) that when a person consents to the creation of a political society, he necessarily consents to the use of majority rule in deciding how the political society is to be organized. Locke thinks that majority rule is the natural decision rule when there are no other ones. He argues that once a society is formed it must move in the direction of the greater force. One way to understand this argument is as follows. If we think of each member of society as an equal and if we think that there is likely to be disagreement beyond the question of whether to join society or not, then we must accept majority rule as the appropriate decision rule. This interpretation of the greater force argument assumes that the expression “greater force” is to be understood in terms of the equal worth of each person's interests and rights, so the society must go in the direction in which the greater number of persons wants it to go.

To be sure, Locke thinks that a people, which is formed by individuals in consenting to be members, could choose a monarchy by means of majority rule and so this argument by itself does not give us an argument for democracy. But Locke refers back to this argument when he defends the requirement of representative institutions for deciding when property may be regulated and when taxes may be levied. He argues that a person must consent to the regulation or taxation of his property by the state. But he says that this requirement of consent is satisfied when a majority of the representatives of property holders consent to the regulation and taxation of property (Locke, 1690, sec. 140). This does seem to be moving towards a genuinely democratic conception of legitimate authority. How democratic this conception is depends on how we understand property in Locke's discussion. If it includes the rights of citizens generally, then we have an argument for democratic decision making. But if the idea of property only includes holders of private property then we have an argument for, at best, a highly attenuated form of democratic decision making.

Another consent-based argument for the claim that democracy is necessary for legitimate authority asserts that when people participate in the democratic process, by their act of participation they consent to the outcome, even if it goes against them. Their participation thereby lends legitimacy to the outcome and perhaps even to the democratic assembly that is elected by citizens. On this account, the acts of voting, for example, are also acts of consent to the outcome of the voting. So participants are thereby obligated to comply with the decision made by the majority.

The problem with all these variations on consent theory is that they face a worrisome dilemma. On the one hand, they seem to involve highly suspect interpretations of behaviors that may or may not imply the kinds of consent that these theorists have in mind. Hume's worries about consent theorists’ interpreting residence in a territory as consent to its government have close analogs in this kind of context (Hume, 1748, p. 263). Why suppose that a person's vote is understood by that person to be consent to the outcome of the vote. Why not suppose that the person is merely trying to have an impact on the outcome? Or why suppose that a person's membership in society—the “consent” signaled by remaining in the society—really commits him to agreeing that decisions must be made by majority rule?

On the other hand, if we eschew the interpretative route the only way to think of the person's vote as constituting consent is if we think that the person ought to consent to the outcome or ought to know that he is consenting to the outcome. The fact that they ought to consent to the outcome because they have participated is sufficient, on some views, to produce an obligation. And the thesis that they ought to know that they consent is usually grounded in the idea that it they ought to be consenting when they vote. But this kind of view seems to get far away from the basic idea of consent theorists, which is that whether persons consent or not should be up to them and should not be determined by the correct moral view. Consent theory is grounded in the need a way to think of government has legitimacy when people disagree about whether it is just or right.

5.2.1 Liberty and Authority

The liberty approaches to the justification of democracy provide alternative approaches to the idea of the authority of democracy. The idea here is that democracy has authority to the extent that people freely bring about the democratic decision. The reason for this is that democracy merely extends their activity of self-determination to the political realm. To the extent that self-determination is an preeminent value and democracy extends it to the political realm, allegiance to democratic decisions is necessary to self-determination and therefore is required by virtue of the pre eminent importance of self-determination.

But here is a worry about this kind of approach. It seems either to presuppose that decisions will have unanimous support or it requires a number of substantive conditions on self-determination, which conditions do a lot of the work of generating obligations to democracy. For instance, if a decision must be made by majority rule, one strategy for reconciling this with self-determination is to say that a self-determining person must accept the legitimacy of majority rule when there is disagreement. This may be because the self-determining person must accept the fundamental importance of equality and majority rule is essential to equality under circumstances of disagreement. So if one argues that one cannot be self-determining unless one accepts equality then one might be able to argue that the self-determining person must accept the results of majority rule. But this argument seems to make the authority of democracy depend primarily on the importance of equality. And one must wonder about the importance of the idea of self-determination to the account.

5.2.2 Equality and Authority

Another approach to the question of the authority of democracy asserts that failing to obey the decisions of a democratic assembly amounts to treating one's fellow citizens as inferiors (Christiano 2004, 284-287). And this approach establishes the authority of democracy by claiming that the inequality involved in failing to obey the democratic assembly is the most important form of inequality. It is more important to treat persons as equals in political decision making on this account than it is to treat them as equals in the economic sphere. The idea is that citizens will disagree on how to treat each other as equals in the areas of substantive law and policy. It is the purpose of democracy to make decisions when these disagreements arise. Democracy realizes a kind of equality among persons that all can share allegiance to even when they disagree about many matters relating to substantive law and policy. Since democracy realizes equality in a highly public manner and publicity is a great and egalitarian value, the equality realized by democracy trumps other kinds of equality.

The conception of democracy as grounded in public equality provides some reason to think that democratic equality must have some pre-eminence over other kinds of equality. The idea is that public equality is the most important form of equality and that democracy, as well as some other principles such as liberal rights, are unique realizations of public equality. The other forms of equality in play in substantive disputes about law and policy are ones about which people can have reasonable disagreements (within limits specified by the principle of public equality). So the principle of public equality requires that one treat others publicly as equals and democracy is necessary to doing this. Since public equality has precedence over other forms of equality, citizens have obligations to abide by the democratic process even if their favored conceptions of equality are passed by in the decision making process.

Of course, there will be limits on what citizens must accept from a democratic assembly. And these limits, on the egalitarian account, must be understood as deriving from the fundamental value of equality. So, one might think that public equality also requires protection of liberal rights and perhaps even the provision of an economic minimum.

5.3 Limits to the Authority of Democracy

If democracy does have authority, what are the limits to that authority? A limit to democratic authority is a principle violation of which defeats democratic authority. When the principle is violated by the democratic assembly, the assembly loses its authority in that instance or the moral weight of the authority is overridden. A number of different views have been offered on this issue. First, it is worthwhile to distinguish between different kinds of moral limit to authority. We might distinguish between internal and external limits to democratic authority. An internal limit to democratic authority is a limit that arises from the requirements of democratic process or a limit that arises from the principles that underpin democracy. An external limit on the authority of democracy is a limit that arises from principles that are independent of the values or requirements of democracy. Furthermore, some limits to democratic authority are rebutting limits, which are principles that weigh in the balance against the principles that support democratic decision making. Some considerations may simply outweigh in importance the considerations that support democratic authority. So in a particular case, an individual may see that there are reasons to obey the assembly and some reasons against obeying the assembly and in the case at hand the reasons against obedience outweigh the reasons in favor of obedience.

On the other hand some limits to democratic authority are undercutting limits. These limits function not by weighing against the considerations in favor of authority, they undercut the considerations in favor of authority altogether; they simply short circuit the authority. When an undercutting limit is in play, it is not as if the principles which ground the limit outweigh the reasons for obeying the democratic assembly, it is rather that the reasons for obeying the democratic assembly are undermined altogether; they cease to exist or at least they are severely weakened.

5.3.1 Internal Limits to Democratic Authority

Some have argued that the democratic process ought to be limited to decisions that are not incompatible with the proper functioning of the democratic process. So they argue that the democratic process may not legitimately take away the political rights of its citizens in good standing. It may not take away rights that are necessary to the democratic process such as freedom of association or freedom of speech. But these limits do not extend beyond the requirements for proper democratic functioning. They do not protect non political artistic speech or freedom of association in the case of non political activities (Ely 1980, chap. 4).

Another kind of internal limit is a limit that arises from the principles that underpin democracy. And the presence of this limit would seem to be necessary to making sense of the first limit because in order for the first limit to be morally important we need to know why a democracy ought to protect the democratic process.

Locke (1690, chap. XI) gives an account of the internal limits of democracy in his idea that there are certain things to which a citizen may not consent. She may not consent to arbitrary rule or the violation of fundamental rights including democratic and liberal rights. To the extent that consent is the basis of democratic authority for Locke, this suggests that there are limits to what a democratic assembly may do that derive from the very principles that ground the authority. And these limits simply undermine the right of the assembly to rule in these cases since they are not things to which citizens can consent. This account provides an explanation of the idea behind the first internal limit, that democracy may not be suspended by democratic means but it goes beyond that limit to suggest that rights that are not essentially connected with the exercise of the franchise may also not be violated because one may not consent to their violation.

The conception of democratic authority that grounds it in public equality also provides an account of the limits of that authority. Since democracy is founded in public equality, it may not violate public equality in any of its decisions. The basic idea is that overt violation of public equality by a democratic assembly undermines the claim that the democratic assembly embodies public equality. Democracy's embodiment of public equality is conditional on its protecting public equality. To the extent that liberal rights are grounded in public equality and the provision of an economic minimum is also so grounded, this suggests that democratic rights and liberal rights and rights to an economic minimum create a limit to democratic authority. This account also provides a deep grounding for the kinds of limits to democratic authority defended in the first internal limit and it goes beyond these to the extent that protection of rights that are not connected with the exercise of the franchise is also necessary to public equality.

5.3.2 Persistent Minorities

This account of the authority of democracy also provides some help with a vexing problem of democratic theory. This problem is the difficulty of persistent minorities. There is a persistent minority in a democratic society when that minority always loses in the voting. This is always a possibility in democracies because of the use of majority rule. If the society is divided into two or more highly unified voting blocks in which the members of each group votes in the same ways as all the other members of that group, then the group in the minority will find itself always on the losing end of the votes. This problem has plagued some societies, particularly those with indigenous peoples who live within developed societies. Though this problem is often connected with majority tyranny it is distinct from the problem of majority tyranny because it may be the case that the majority attempts to treat the minority well, in accordance with its conception of good treatment. It is just that the minority never agrees with the majority on what constitutes proper treatment. Being a persistent minority can be highly oppressive even if the majority does not try to act oppressively. This can be understood with the help of the very ideas that underpin democracy. Persons have interests in being able to correct for the cognitive biases of others and to be able to make the world in such a way that it makes sense to them. These interests are set back for a persistent minority since they never get their way.

The conception of democracy as grounded in public equality can shed light on this problem. It can say that the existence of a persistent minority violates public equality. In effect, a society in which there is a persistent minority is one in which that minority is being treated publicly as an inferior because it is clear that its fundamental interests are being set back. Hence to the extent that violations of public equality undercut the authority of a democratic assembly, the existence of a persistent minority undermines the authority of the democracy at least with respect to the minority. This suggests that certain institutions ought to be constructed so that the minority is not persistent.

5.3.3 External Limits to Democratic Authority

One natural kind of limit to democratic authority is the external rebutting kind of limit. Here the idea is that there are certain considerations that favor democratic decision making and there are certain values that are independent of democracy that may be at issue in democratic decisions. Some views may assert that there are only external limits to democratic authority. But it is possible to think that there are both internal and external limits. Such an issue may arise in decisions to go to war, for example. In such decisions, one may have a duty to obey the decision of the democratic assembly on the grounds that this is how one treats one's fellow citizens as equals but one may also have a duty to oppose the war on the grounds that the war is an unjust aggression against other people. To the extent that this consideration is sufficiently serious it may outweigh the considerations of equality that underpin democratic authority. Thus one may have an overall duty not to obey in this context. Issues of foreign policy in general seem to give rise to possible external rebutting limits to democracy.


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authority | citizenship | constitutionalism | egalitarianism | equality | Hobbes, Thomas | justice | justification, political: public | legitimacy | liberty | Locke, John | Mill, John Stuart | Plato | pluralism | political obligation | publicity | Rawls, John | representation, political | rights | Rousseau, Jean Jacques | rule of law and procedural fairness