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Epistemic Contextualism

First published Fri Sep 7, 2007

Epistemic contextualism (EC) is a recent and hotly debated position. In its dominant form, EC is the view that the proposition expressed by a given knowledge sentence (‘S knows that p’, ‘S doesn't know that p’) depends upon the context in which it is uttered. What makes this view interesting and controversial is that ‘context’ here refers, not to certain features of the putative subject of knowledge (his/her evidence, history, other beliefs, etc.) or his/her objective situation (what is true/false, which alternatives to what is believed are likely to obtain, etc.), but rather to features of the knowledge attributor(s)' psychology and/or conversational-practical situation. (Hence this view's sometimes being referred to as ‘attributor contextualism’.) As a result of such context-dependence, utterances of a given such sentence, made in different contexts, may differ in truth value.

In addition to marking an important departure from traditional epistemological assumptions, EC is claimed to provide a novel resolution to certain puzzles about knowledge — not least, skeptical ones — as well as to best comport with our everyday knowledge-attributing practices. What follows describes the leading forms of EC, so understood, as well as the principal arguments for and major objections to EC. Along the way, EC is situated with respect to certain other views, both kindred and competing.

1. Some Recent History, By Way of Background[1]

EC, in the sense in which it concerns us here, is a relatively recent development. Nevertheless, in the latter half of the 20th century, several at-times overlapping strands emerged which, in one way or another, made ‘contextual’ factors of central importance to certain epistemological questions, thereby setting the stage for EC in its contemporary form.

One such strand was the entertaining of the possibility of some kind of pluralism concerning epistemic standards. In one instance, this took the form of the claim, in response to skepticism, that there are “two senses of ‘know’” — one ‘strong’ or ‘philosophical’, the other ‘weak’ or ‘ordinary’ (see, e.g., Malcolm 1952). So too, some of Wittgenstein's (1953, 1969) claims about the relation between meaning and use and the multiplicity of “language games”, each with its own set of norms, opened the way for a more thoroughgoing kind of semantic pluralism with regard to epistemic concepts and/or terms. Further, in a move which (as we will see) foreshadows contemporary contextualists' methodology, there was the argument for pluralism from cases: Hector-Neri Castañeda's observing that “what counts as knowing” that Columbus discovered America on October 12, 1492 might differ depending on whether we are considering (a) a television quiz show, (b) a high school student's essay, or (c) a defence of the traditional date of Columbus' discovery from some ingenious and famous Harvard historian's claim that it occurred on October 11, 1492. (1980, 217); or Gail Stine's taking it as obvious that “[i]t is an essential characteristic of our concept of knowledge that tighter criteria are appropriate in different contexts. It is one thing in a street encounter, another in a classroom, another in a law court — and who is to say it cannot be another in a philosophical discussion?” (Stine 1976, 254).

Second, and relatedly, there was the emergence of ‘relevant alternatives’ (RA) approaches to understanding knowledge. Although, in the hands of Fred Dretske (1970, 1981) and Alvin Goldman (1976), the RA approach was intended as an alternative to justification-centered accounts of knowledge, it also, like the strategy of multiplying senses of ‘know(s)’, promised a way of giving skepticism its due while at the same time limiting the threat it posed to our ordinary claims to know. The core RA notion is simply that knowing that p is incompatible with any of the relevant not-p alternatives' not having been ruled out. This provides a way of limiting skeptical threats, just because skeptical possibilities (that a certain animal is really just a cleverly disguised mule, that I might now merely be dreaming that I am sitting at my desk, that the seemingly intelligent agents around me are in fact just automatons) might not be relevant, at least not ordinarily. As Austin famously puts it:

[S]pecial cases where doubts arise and require resolving, are contrasted with the normal cases which hold the field unless there is some special suggestion that deceit, etc., is involved, and deceit, moreover, of an intelligible kind in the circumstances, that is, of a kind that can be looked into because motive, etc., is specially suggested. There is no suggestion that I never know what other people's emotions are, nor yet that in particular cases I might be wrong for no special reason or in no special way. (1946, 113; cf. ibid., 88)

Various specific RA theories differ as to just what ‘ruling out’ amounts to and whether it is the agent, his/her evidence, or something else again which does the ruling out. So too, different RA theorists proposed or (more often) appeared to assume different standards of relevance — thus, at one point Dretske suggests that it has to do with “the kind of possibilities that actually exist in the objective situation” (1981b, 63; cf. 1981a, 131); while some remarks of Goldman's (1976, 89; 1989, 147) imply that it is certain facts about the subject's psychological/conversational setting which determine which alternatives are relevant; etc. But, insofar as there is some interesting variation in the set of relevant alternatives to a given proposition, we have the possibility of there being a corresponding variation in what it takes to know that p, and so a kind of pluralism here as well.

Third, among some philosophers there was an increasing emphasis on regarding epistemic subjects, activities, and/or accomplishments, as deeply ‘social’ in ways typically overlooked and unappreciated. (For some discussion, see Goldman 2007.) Included here is Richard Rorty's (1979) espousal of ‘epistemological behaviorism’, as he calls it, as well as perhaps the first explicit statement of a “contextualist” epistemic theory by David Annis. According Annis, while “man is a social animal…when it comes to the justification of beliefs philosophers have tended to ignore this fact” (1978, 215) — more specifically, they have tended to ignore the existence of “contextual parameters essential to justification” (ibid., 213). Thus, as Annis sees it, both foundationalists and coherentists depict justification as a function of certain facts about the subject alone, considered in isolation from his/her social environment (‘context’). According to Annis, however, this picture fails to do justice to what is in fact the social character of justification. For instance:

Suppose we are interested in whether Jones, an ordinary non-medically trained person, has the general information that polio is caused by a virus. If his response to our question is that he remembers the paper reporting that Salk said it was, then this is good enough. He has performed adequately given the issue-context. But suppose the context is an examination for the M. D. degree. Here we expect a lot more. If the candidate simply said what Jones did, we would take him as being very deficient in knowledge. Thus relative to one issue-context a person may be justified in believing h but not justified relative to another context. (Ibid., 215)

Finally, the potential relevance of social factors to epistemological questions also arose in discussion of Gettier cases. In particular, in response to cases involving evidence one does not possess, John Pollock (1986, 190-193) — citing Harman (1968, 1980), who in turn credits Sosa (1964) with the idea — suggested that there are certain things which we are “socially expected” to be aware of and that such expectations bear upon whether one knows. But if that's so, and if there is some kind of variability in such expectations, there will be a similar, socially-based variation in the standards for knowledge.

Each of the views or movements just mentioned makes ‘context’ — of one sort or another — of central importance — in one manner or another — to epistemology, in ways not reflected in more traditional analytic writings on the subject. Still, it is not difficult to discern in them rather different views of the relevance of ‘context’ to epistemology. Thus, among such views there are some — such as Annis', which he intends as an alternative to foundationalism and coherentism — which are obviously concerned with making substantive claims about knowledge or justification itself. On the other hand, some proponents of the various ideas just discussed are at times clearly speaking, not about knowledge/justification per se, but rather about the linguistic items we use in speaking about such things. For instance, among Castañeda's goals in his paper is to elucidate “the contextual semantics of ‘know’” (1980, 209).

So too, there are clear differences among the views just sketched as to just how we are to conceive of context, insofar as it is thought to be of central epistemological importance: sometimes it is conceived of in ‘subject’ terms (facts about the putative subject of knowledge, qua such subject, including features of his/her environment, social or not); sometimes, the concern seems to be more with facts about those who are attributing knowledge (which may include the subject, albeit qua knowledge attributor), rather than the subject of the attribution.[2]

In terms of the views mentioned above, just where to locate a given theory or theorist along both of these dimensions — a substantive versus a semantic orientation of the theory; a subject versus attributor conception of ‘context’ — is at times not at all clear. In current work in epistemology, ‘contextualism’ is used to refer to either of these now more clearly distinguished threads, with the discussion of each going on largely in separation from the other. Thus, on the ‘substantive’ side, we have as perhaps its most prominent exponent Michael Williams (1991, 2001), whose concern is with providing an antidote and alternative to what he calls “epistemological realism”. According to the latter view, the objects of epistemological inquiry (centrally, various exemplars of knowledge and/or justified belief) have some underlying “structural unity” that makes them all instances of a particular kind (1991, 108-109), independently of any “situational, disciplinary and other contextually variable factors” (ibid., 119; 2001, 159ff.). By contrast, as defended by Williams, ‘contextualism’ — which he sees as present in the views of Dewey, Popper, Austin, and Wittgenstein, for example — is the view that it is only in relation to the latter type of factors that a proposition has any epistemic status at all (ibid.), and that there is no need to suppose that the objects of epistemological inquiry have some deep structural unity which binds them all together. Meanwhile, on the semantic side, we have such figures as Stewart Cohen, Keith DeRose, Mark Heller, David Lewis, and Ram Neta, all of whom emphasize moreover the importance of facts about the attributor (rather than the subject) of knowledge — such things as “the purposes, intentions, expectations, presuppositions, etc., of the speakers who utter these sentences” (Cohen, 1999, 187-188; cf. DeRose, 1992, 1995; Heller, 1999b, 117ff.) — in affecting what is expressed by a given utterance of a knowledge-attributing sentence.

The relation between these general sorts of ‘contextualism’ — the substantive and the semantic, as we might label them — is interesting and important. But, as already indicated, the present entry will focus on the semantic view, ‘attributor contextualism’.[3] Henceforth, that will be the view referred to in speaking of (epistemic) contextualism (EC).

2. Further Clarification

So EC, of the sort which will concern us here, is a semantic thesis: it concerns the truth conditions of knowledge sentences, and/or the propositions expressed by utterances thereof.[4] The thesis is that it is only relative to a contextually-determined standard that a knowledge sentence expresses a complete proposition: change the standard, and you change what the sentence expresses; acontextually, however, no such proposition is expressed. In this respect, knowledge utterances are supposed to resemble utterances involving uncontroversially context-sensitive terms. For instance, just what proposition is expressed by an utterance of

  1. ‘It is raining,’
  2. ‘I'm hungry,’ or
  3. ‘That's red,’

depends in certain obvious ways upon such facts as the location (1) or identity (2) of the speaker, and/or the referent of the demonstrative (in 3). Similarly, it is plausible (though by no means universally accepted — see, e.g., Capellen and LePore, 2005a & b) that attributions of tallness or flatness are context-sensitive, insofar as there are varying standards that one might have mind in applying either predicate and which affect just what is said in doing so. Note, though, that insofar as the truth value of such utterances “depends on context”, that is because their truth conditions — or, the proposition expressed thereby — are so dependent. That is, it is not as though (1)-(3) each has fixed truth-evaluable contents, the truth values of which happen to depend on context. Rather, one is not in a position to assess any of these sentences as true/false unless one knows the location of the utterer of (1), the interests/purposes of the ascriber of flatness, and so on. For it is only relative to such facts that tokenings of such sentences have specific contents, and just what contents they do have depends on context. So too for epistemic contextualism: though the thesis is sometimes put in terms of the context-variability of knowledge sentences' truth values (e.g., Rieber 1998, 190, Cohen 1998, 289 and 2005, 57), this is misleading: those truth values shift only because, according to EC, different propositions are expressed in different contexts.

Likewise, just because EC is a thesis about knowledge-sentences' truth conditions — namely, that they are context-variable — it is not a thesis about knowledge itself. (In the same way: recognizing that ‘I’ is token-reflexive has no metaphysical implications about the self, observing that ‘here’ is an indexical has no implications about who's where or what it is to be at some location, and so on.) So it is misleading too when EC of the form under discussion is described, as it sometimes is, as the view that whether one knows depends upon context (Bach 2005, 55, n. 4 provides some examples.) As Richard Feldman says,

…it is not true that contextualism holds that the standards for knowledge change with context. Rather, it holds that the standards for the application of the word ‘knowledge’ change. (Feldman 2004, 24; cf. Cohen 1999, 65; Bach 2005, 54-55)

EC, then, is an epistemological theory because, but only because, it concerns sentences used in attributing (/denying) “knowledge”, as opposed to those employing some non-epistemological term(s); it is not a theory about any such epistemic property/relation itself. (Although, as we will see, when various proponents of EC flesh out their preferred version of the views, the differences among the resulting theories largely recapitulate some of the major lines of division among leading theories of knowledge itself.)

Finally, though there are connections between them (touched on briefly in Section 4.4 below), EC should be distinguished from the general semantical-linguistic approach, or cluster of theses, called “contextualism,” which sees ‘context’ as central in one or another way to certain fundamental semantic issues, most centrally meaning itself. (See, e.g., Recanati (1989, 1994, 2005), Searle (1980).)

3. Support for EC: Apparently Inconsistent Knowledge Claims, Skeptical and Everyday

As its proponents generally admit, EC is something that one needs to be argued into: it takes work to come to think, for example, that there can be situations in which we have two subjects, exactly alike psychologically, possessing the very same history and the same evidence with regard to p, etc., with respect to only one of whom ‘S knows that p’ expresses a truth, since they are being evaluated from within different contexts: we seem, if anything, to be ‘intuitive invariantists’.[5] As one leading contextualist says, many “resist [the contextualist] thesis — some fiercely. Moreover, those who do accept the thesis, generally do so only as a result of being convinced by philosophical reflection (Cohen 1999, 78).

But while, in the abstract, EC strikes many as quite contentious, according to its proponents it has considerable merits. Thus, although EC is not itself a theory of knowledge (or related notions), it has been said to afford a resolution of certain apparent epistemological puzzles, both ordinary and extra-ordinary. More specifically, EC is said to give us a way of responding to certain cases in which we have apparently inconsistent knowledge claims, each of which enjoys some real plausibility. Though these puzzles are not exclusively of the skeptical variety, it is EC's offering a solution to skeptical problems that has figured most prominently in current discussions. So that is the natural place to start.

3.1 A Skeptical Puzzle

Consider one particular form of skeptical argument upon which leading contextualists have focused (e.g., Cohen 1986, 1988, 2005; DeRose 1995; Neta 2003a & b; cf. Unger 1975). We can call it ‘SA’, for ‘skeptical argument’:

P1. I don't know that not-h [h = some skeptical ‘hypothesis’; e.g., that I'm a bodiless brain in a vat, being stimulated to have just those experiences I would be having if I weren't a ‘BIV’].
P2. If I don't know that not-h, then I don't know that p [p = some mundane proposition which we commonly take ourselves to know; e.g., that I have hands].
C. So, I don't know that p

SA constitutes a puzzle just because (a) each of the premises enjoys a fair amount of plausibility. (As to P1, how, after all, could I know that I'm not a bodiless brain in a vat? By waving my arms around? As to P2, it is just an instance of the closure principle for knowledge,[6] which many are inclined to regard as axiomatic.) But (b) given our intuitive anti-skepticism, C seems immensely implausible, even though (c) the argument appears to be formally valid.

On the face of it, then, we are confronted with a paradox — a set of independently very plausible but seemingly mutually inconsistent propositions. Because that is the problem, a complete solution to SA will have to do two things (DeRose 1995): explain which of the assumptions lying behind the generation of the paradox should, in fact, be rejected, and why; and explain too how we got into this mess — or, more formally, why the assumption singled out for rejection struck us as plausible in the first place.

3.2 The General Form of the Contextualist Solution

At first blush, it might seem that there are just three possible responses to SA:

  1. we can simply capitulate to skepticism, accepting SA's conclusion and abandoning our claims to know such things as that we have hands;
  2. we can reject P2 and the closure principle upon which it trades; or
  3. we can reject P1 (for obvious reasons, this is sometimes referred to as the ‘Moorean’ response).

Essential to EC is the idea that these three options do not exhaust the possible responses to SA. — And, according to proponents of EC, that is a good thing, since they generally hold that accepting skepticism is something we should do only if we have to, that the closure principle is extremely plausible, but also that it is hard to see how P1 could be false.[7] But if none of (i)-(iii) make for an attractive response to SA, what is left to deny?

Well, we might conclude (iv) that our concept of knowledge is somehow deeply incoherent, and that epistemological paradoxes such as SA are for this reason irresolvable. This is the view Stephen Schiffer (1996, 2004) recommends. But that strikes many as no more satisfactory than (i) directly embracing skepticism. Like (i), (iv) is a result to be avoided if it is at all possible to do so.

Fortunately, according to the contextualist, there is another way out. The contextualist's recommendation is (v) that we deny that SA's conclusion really does threaten our intuitive anti-skepticism. According to EC, recall, the proposition expressed by a given knowledge utterance crucially depends upon ‘context’. So if, in general, a token of ‘S knows that p’ is true just in case the subject has a true belief and is in a strong epistemic position, there are variable standards governing just how strong the subject's epistemic position must be in order for the tokened sentence to express a truth. 

In its general form, the contextualist's solution to SA involves claiming that there is something about SA, or the possibilities it involves, which effects or reflects a shift in context, such that there is a corresponding dramatic upwards shift in the operative standards. Those standards are not epistemic in the strict sense, of course, since they do not concern knowledge per se; but they do affect what it takes for a given tokening of a sentence of the form ‘S knows that p’ to express a truth.

Thus an utterance of P1, such as occurs in SA, expresses a truth only because, owing to the introduction of a high-standards context, what it expresses is that the subject does not stand in an extraordinarily strong epistemic position with regard to the proposition that he has hands. But that, of course, is compatible with his meeting lower, though still perhaps quite demanding, standards, such as those in play in more ordinary contexts. As DeRose puts it:

…the fact that the skeptic can…install very high standards which we don't live up to has no tendency to show that we don't satisfy the more relaxed standards that are in place in ordinary conversations. Thus…our ordinary claims to know [are] safeguarded from the apparently powerful attacks of the skeptic, while, at the same time, the persuasiveness of the skeptical arguments is explained. (DeRose 1992, 917)

Of course, the latter is explained only if we have, in addition, an explanation as to why we thought that the skeptic's claims threatened our ordinary claims to know. After all, it is only because we thought this that SA posed a problem to which contextualism, or any of (i)-(iii), is intended to be a solution. The contextualist seeks to explain why we might think this — more generally, why we might think that what is said in a given ‘high stakes’ case is in fact compatible with what is said in its ‘low stakes’ counterpart — as follows:

According to the contextualist treatment of the skeptical paradox, competent speakers can fail to be aware of these context-sensitive standards, at least explicitly, and so fail to distinguish between the standards that apply in skeptical contexts, and the standards that apply in everyday contexts. This misleads them into thinking that certain knowledge ascriptions conflict, when they are in fact compatible. Contextualism thus combines a contextualist semantics for knowledge ascriptions with a kind of error theory — a claim that competent speakers are systematically misled by the contextualist semantics.” (Cohen 1999, 77; 2005, 60; DeRose 1995, 40-41; 1999, 194; 2004b, 37).

3.3 Some Specific Forms of EC

While the general form of the preceding response to skeptical arguments such as SA is widely accepted among contextualists, different proponents of EC have proposed different specific versions of the view, and so explanations of what is going on in such arguments which differ in their details.

Thus, Robert Nozick (1981) is well-known for proposing that knowledge requires what is come to be known as ‘sensitive belief’, where one's belief that p is sensitive just in case, if p were not the case, one would not believe that p. While he does not endorse sensitivity as a general condition on knowing, and while he is not concerned with giving an analysis of knowledge itself, Keith DeRose offers the following “Rule of Sensitivity”:

When it is asserted that some subject S knows (or does not know) some proposition P, the standards for knowledge (the standards of how good an epistemic position one must be in to count as knowing) tend to be raised, if need be, to such a level as to require S's belief in that particular P to be sensitive for it to count as knowledge. (DeRose 1995, 36)

So, any particular utterance of “S knows that p” will be true only if S believes that p, p, and S's epistemic position is such that his belief that p is sensitive. And for propositions such as, “I'm not a bodiless brain in a vat (a BIV),” the mere uttering of P1 (e.g.) induces very high standards for knowledge, as the belief that I'm not a BIV is manifestly insensitive; and at those very high standards, P1 is true. As for P2, DeRose claims that it is true “regardless of what epistemic standard it is evaluated at, so its plausibility is easily accounted for” (ibid., 39). As it happens, though, in SA P2 is being evaluated at fairly high standards; for those standards are the ones put into play by the mentioning of P1. But this just means that the only reading on which SA's conclusion is true is at the unusually inflated standards induced by SA's first premise.

DeRose's brand of EC is ‘externalist’, in the sense that it focuses on features —‘truth tracking’, as some have called it — which are at center stage in externalist theories of knowledge (/justification). Likewise externalist is Mark Heller's brand of contextualism, which can be understood as both reliabilist in spirit and an instance of the RA approach. On Heller's view (1995), just how reliable a belief-forming process must be for an attribution of knowledge to the subject to be correct depends upon context, in the attributor sense introduced above. And this in turn provides an answer to the question of just which alternatives to what is believed are relevant: they are those such that, if the process in question is reliable to the contextually required degree, the subject will be able to discriminate between them and what is in fact the case.

While sometimes, like Heller's, framed in RA terms,[8] Stewart Cohen's version of EC is ‘internalistic’. According to Cohen (1986, 1987, 1988, 1999, 2005) ‘knowledge’ inherits its “indexical” nature (1988, 97) from that of ‘(is) justified’. Justification, of course, comes in degrees; and what counts as justification simpliciter — i.e., justification to the level required for an attribution of knowledge to express a truth — is governed by a rule of salience, whereby one's evidence/reasons must be good enough to preclude salient possibilities of error. What the skeptic does is make salient certain not-p possibilities (e.g., the BIV hypothesis), with the result that the standard(s) of how good one's reasons must be in order for one to be justified in believing that one has hands, say, goes way up. So, whereas DeRose's Rule of Sensitivity deals with how far out into the space of possible worlds one must be able to ‘track the truth’, insofar as he locates the relevant standards in terms of the strength or goodness of the subject's reasons or evidence, Cohen's is an ‘internalist’ brand of contextualism.

Similar to Cohen's rule of sensitivity is David Lewis' (1996) “rule of attention”, which is the mechanism that he takes to underlie the power of skeptical arguments. According to Lewis:

Subject S knows proposition P iff P holds in every possibility left uneliminated by P's evidence; equivalently, iff S's evidence eliminates every possibility in which not-P. (1996, 551)

What justifies Lewis' “equivalently” here? The (alleged) fact that “every” is restricted to a particular conversational domain (ibid., 553-554). Thus, Lewis thinks, certain not -p possibilities will be “properly ignored” in any given situation — they will not be within the scope of the second “every” in the passage just quoted. As to what determines whether a given possibility is ‘properly ignored’, Lewis suggests a number of rules. “The Rule of Attention,” which Lewis regards as “more a triviality than a rule,” has it that “a possibility that is not ignored is ipso facto not properly ignored” (559). And this is why the skeptic's argument is so irresistible, as Lewis sees it. For skepticism — indeed, epistemology generally — just is the making salient of certain possibilities of error. To ask, for example, whether we know that we are not BIVs, as assessing the first premise of SA requires, is ipso facto not to ignore that possibility. And it is natural to think that one's (putative) evidence that one is not a BIV does not eliminate that possibility. That indeed, is why the possibility that one is a BIV is among the skeptical possibilities singled out by philosophers for attention. So we do in fact have lots of knowledge, according to Lewis, but it is ‘elusive’: “Examine it, and straight-way it vanishes” (ibid., 560).

….S knows that P iff S's evidence eliminates every possibility in which not-P — Psst! — except for those possibilities that we are properly ignoring. That ‘psst’ marks an attempt to do the impossible — to mention that which remains unmentioned. (Ibid., 566)[9]

Still another version of EC takes the shifting standards to directly govern ascriptions of evidence. In Robert Hambourger's version of this form of EC, it is “the amount of evidence needed to know a proposition” which “varies with standards of caution;” further, he claims “that the amount needed to know a proposition under any given standard is just that needed to be epistemically justified in claiming to know it” (1987, 260, emphasis added). According to Ram Neta, it is not so much the quantity of evidence required for a truthful utterance of ‘S knows that p’ that is governed by context-sensitive standards, but rather whether certain mental states of the subject's count as evidence at all. The relevant rule here once again bears certain similarities to those proposed by Cohen and Lewis:

(R) When one raises an hypothesis H that is an uneliminated counterpossibility with respect to S's knowing that p at t, one restricts what counts in one's context of appraisal… as S's body of evidence at t to just those mental states that S has, and would have, at t whether or not H is true.… (2002, 674; 2003a, 23-4)

By exploiting this rule, the skeptic is able to disqualify certain mental states — e.g., those involved in my current experience (as) of seeing my hands — as constituting evidence for my belief that I have hands. Although, once again, when the relevant skeptical possibilities are not raised (as they typically aren't), those experiences qualify (as they typically do) as evidence sufficient for truthful ascriptions of such “knowledge” to me.

Finally, Steven Rieber (1998) has proposed that, in general, S knows that P iff “the fact that P explains why S believes that P” (1998, 194). According to Rieber, however, explanations are always at least implicitly contrastive, and whether one thing explains another will depends upon which contrasts are salient.[10] As just presented, Rieber's theory concerns the knowledge relation itself; so, in the terminology of Section 1, it would qualify as a ‘substantive’ contextualist view. But Rieber's is clearly better construed as a semantic theory, like the other views just sketched. For, as applied to SA, it would have the consequence that what the conclusion of that argument actually says is:

(C′) It is not the case that my having hands rather than my being a handless BIV explains why I believe that I have hands rather than that I'm a handless BIV.[11]

Whereas, that I am a handless BIV is not ordinarily a salient counter-possibility to my having hands — though perhaps my having had my hands amputated and replaced with prostheses after a bad car accident, e.g., is. So the truth of C′ is compatible with my ordinary claim to know, since the latter might strictly express the proposition that My having hands rather than my having had my hands amputated and replaced with prostheses is what explains why I believe that I have hands rather than that I've had my hands amputated and replaced with prostheses. Once again, then, armed with the correct contextualist semantics for the relevant claims, we can see that the conclusion of SA may be true, but that, contrary to appearances, that conclusion is not incompatible with a typical claim to know various mundane matters of fact.

As the discussion of this section reveals, there is plenty of room for variety among proponents of EC — both about, in Jonathan Schaffer's (2005, 115) phrase, “which epistemic gear the wheels of context turn,” and about the exact mechanism or rule which governs such shifts. Once again, however, there is a strong degree of consensus among the theories under discussion that context itself is to be understood in terms of such things as the interests, purposes, expectations, and so forth, of the knowledge attributor. Further, there is of course consensus among these theorists that, understood along those lines, context affects the truth-conditional content of knowledge sentences — and, in fact, that this phenomenon is what underlies and explains the power of skeptical arguments, even though it also reveals why those arguments do not threaten our ordinary claims to know. For on all such views, it is only by effecting shifts in the epistemic standards, and so in what the relevant claims express, that the skeptic is able to truthfully state his view.

Of course, as some proponents of EC point out, contextualists are not forced to any view as to whether and/or under what circumstances, exactly, the skeptic does succeed in raising the standards (Cohen 2001, 92-93; 2005, 58-59; DeRose 2006, Section 6 and 2004a). Still, that EC promises to provide a plausible response to skeptical puzzles has been among its primary ‘selling points’. So, in this sense, the contextualist stands to lose something if it in fact turns out that the skeptic is only very rarely or never able to raise the standards for a knowledge-ascribing sentence to express a truth. For then some other account would be required to explain the apparent power of arguments like SA.

3.4 Everyday Cases

While proponents of EC have made much of the fact that their view promises a novel and appealing resolution of skeptical puzzles like SA, contextualists have also emphasized what they regard as EC's consonance with our ordinary knowledge-attributing practices. For there too, they say, we find evidence of the very same sort of context-sensitivity which skeptical arguments are actually exploiting. As Hookway puts the general claim: “Whether I can correctly claim knowledge appears to be relative to the purposes underlying the conversations to which I am contributing” (1996, 1).

For a couple of reasons, it is very important not to overlook the appeal to everyday cases — that is, not to restrict ourselves to a consideration of apparently inconsistent knowledge claims where one of these claims arises in a clearly skeptical context. First, as we will see, a number of philosophers have questioned just how effective EC is in its response to skepticism; and if they are right about this, then it matters a great deal that the effectiveness of that response is not EC's sole basis. Second, as Keith DeRose says, “the contextualist's appeal to varying standards for knowledge in his solution to skepticism would rightly seem unmotivated and ad hoc if we didn't have independent reason from non-philosophical talk to think such shifts in the content of knowledge attributions occur” (2002, 169). But in fact, DeRose says, “The best grounds for accepting contextualism concerning knowledge attributions come from how knowledge-attributing (and knowledge-denying) sentences are used in ordinary, non-philosophical talk: What ordinary speakers will count as ‘knowledge’ in some non-philosophical contexts they will deny is such in others” (2005, 172; 2006, 316). Likewise, Cohen claims that examples such as the following “strongly [suggest] that ascriptions of knowledge are context-sensitive” (1999, 59):[12]

Mary and John are at the L.A. airport contemplating taking a certain flight to New York. They want to know whether the flight has a layover in Chicago. They overhear someone ask a passenger Smith if he knows whether the flight stops in Chicago. Smith looks at the flight itinerary he got from the travel agent and respond, ‘Yes I know — it does stop in Chicago.’ It turns out that Mary and John have a very important business contact they have to make at the Chicago airport. Mary says, ‘How reliable is that itinerary? It could contain a misprint. They could have changed the schedule at the last minute.’ Mary and John agree that Smith doesn't really know that the plane will stop in Chicago. They decide to check with the airline agent. (Ibid., 58)

Once again, as with their skeptical counterparts, contextualists claim that regarding the truth conditions of sentences used in attributing/denying knowledge as depending on context makes best sense of the flexibility in our knowledge-attributing behaviour. While, as we have seen, different specific version of EC are possible, contextualists tend to agree that, in everyday cases, such as that just described, the practical importance of the subjects' ‘getting it right’ tends to raise the standards for the truth of a sentence of the form ‘S knows that p’. (Keep in mind, though, a point stressed in Section 2: namely, that just what an utterance of such a sentence expresses changes, in the ‘high stakes’ case, to some more demanding proposition — we do not have a fixed such proposition, with different standards for its truth applying in the more demanding context.) The result is that the knowledge denial (Mary and John's claim) in the high-stakes situation may be true, without affecting the truth of the low stakes claim to know (by Smith himself). What reason is there, though, for adopting this way of resolving the apparent incompatibility between the two knowledge utterances?

Well, it is important that the low-stakes claim be true, since that preserves our intuitive anti-skepticism — the thought that we do know many things: if you cannot know on the basis of ordinary, non-entailing evidence such as what is printed in the flight itinerary (which neither we nor Smith have any reason to think is erroneous), then we will have to deny very many of our ordinary claims to know (Ibid., 59). But, it is argued, the ‘high stakes’ knowledge denial seems right too — that is why the relevant (paired) cases constitute a puzzle and deserve philosophical attention. And contextualism allows us to preserve the sense that in such cases each of the two speakers is speaking ‘properly’, and “the presumption that what is properly said is true” (DeRose 2005, Section 4). Whereas, if we take John and Mary's stricter standard to be too demanding — if their denial of knowledge to Smith is false — then, not only must we reject the feeling that what they are saying is in some sense correct, but it is “hard to see how Mary and John should describe their situation”:

Certainly they are being prudent in refusing to rely on the itinerary. They have a very important meeting in Chicago. Yet if Smith knows on the basis of the itinerary that the flight stops in Chicago, what should they have said? ‘Okay, Smith knows that the flight stops in Chicago, but still, we need to check further.’ To my ear, it is hard to make sense of that claim. (Cohen 1999, 58-9)

But we can bypass having to make sense of such claims, and having to explain why we mistakenly thought that what Mary and John were saying was correct, if we accept EC: in everyday no less than skeptical contexts, the sentences used by someone in a ‘high-stakes’ context (here, John and Mary) and his ‘low stakes’ counterpart (Smith) can both be true, since they are (in some cases anyway[13]) made in different contexts, and the propositions they express are not really conflicting after all.

In short, contextualism promises to deliver up a nice symmetry between the flexibility in our (alleged) judgments as to the truth of a given knowledge claim/denial, on the one hand, and a parallel plasticity in the truth conditions (and hence the truth values) of the knowledge-attributing sentences we are in fact prepared to utter. And on the assumption that speakers realize, however tacitly, that what is expressed by an utterance of “S knows (/doesn't know) that p” is a context-sensitive matter, the contextualist can invoke this to explain the observed tendency to attribute/deny knowledge, depending on such things as “the purposes, intentions, expectations, presuppositions, etc., of the speakers who utter these sentences” (Cohen 1999: 57), even though everything about the subject, his/her worldly situation and history, and so on, remains quite fixed.

3.5 Other Cases, Other Differences — the Lottery, Gettier, Closure

There are some knowledge claims (/denials) which, though they concern everyday matters, rather than unrealistic skeptical ones, can seem to threaten skeptical consequences. As we saw, the perhaps-natural denial of knowledge to Smith, in the preceding example, is like this. A more familiar example is ‘the lottery paradox’. Thus, while the probability of holding the winning ticket in a (fair) lottery may be vanishingly small (assuming there are very many tickets, etc), many balk at crediting any given ticket-holder with knowledge that their ticket is not the winner. But why should that be if, as fallibilism about knowledge has it, one does not need evidence that guarantees the truth of a belief in order to know?

Several contextualists (e.g., Cohen 1988, 1998; Lewis 1996; Neta 2002; Rieber 1998) have suggested that we can resolve the lottery paradox by means of the same device(s) used to explain both skeptical paradoxes and seeming inconsistencies among everyday knowledge attributions:[14] in brief, we are reluctant to attribute knowledge to the subject in the lottery case just because the possibility of error has been made salient; but if we are, instead, focusing on the vast improbability of his ticket's being the winner, that he does know that he'll lose can seem like the right thing to say; and, as above, EC enables us regard both the relevant claims as expressing truths, albeit in different contexts.

Some contextualists again — notably Lewis (1996) — have assayed extending EC to the Gettier problem as well. But this remains a much more controversial move among proponents of EC. (See, e.g., Cohen 1998 and Heller 1999 for criticisms of Lewis on this score.)

Further, there is some disagreement among contextualists as to the status of the closure principle for knowledge, mentioned in Section 3.1 above, in connection with SA. The majority view is that closure should be preserved (Mark Heller is the notable exception; see note #7, below), but also — of course, given EC — that it should be seen as holding only within a given context, on pain of equivocation. As such disagreement illustrates, what one makes of closure and of EC are orthogonal issues — even if one prefers EC in an RA guise. Each of EC, closure, and RA, then, may be endorsed without taking a stand on either of the remaining issues.

Finally, while the differences among particular versions of EC are can be significant, they tend to recede into the background in critical discussions of contextualism. Objections to EC either (a) deny that EC really has the advantages that have been claimed for it, (b) assert that EC has certain problematic features or consequences, and/or (c) allege that EC does not in fact constitute the best response to the data which are supposed to motivate it. And, to a very great extent, such objections to EC are directed towards the central contextualist thesis per se and so are independent of the details of any particular contextualist theory.

4. Critical Reactions, Contextualist Responses

4.1 Some Not-So-Effective Objections

Among the objections to EC which have been made, some are more easily dealt with by the contextualist than others. Thus, for instance, Fred Dretske objects to the contextualist's response to skeptical problems as follows:

Skepticism, as a doctrine about what ordinary people know, cannot be made true by being put in the mouth of a skeptic. Treating knowledge as an indexical…[, however,] seems to have, or to come dangerously close to having, exactly this result. For this reason (among others) I reject it. (Dretske 1991, 192)

To this, however, the contextualist can reply that it is incorrect to say that EC, even where it allows the skeptic to successfully state some truth in uttering ‘You don't know that p’, thereby makes it easy for skepticism to be true. To suppose that requires assuming that knowledge sentences do not have context-sensitive contents — hence that skeptic's denials are true at the expense of the truth of our ordinary claims to know. But, of course, that this is not so is the idea at the heart of the contextualist's treatment of SA. (As we will see presently, there is another way of construing Dretske's objection, whereby it does not misfire in this way.)

For a second objection to EC that is not terribly effective, consider Palle Yourgrau's contention that, if true, EC would license some rather bizarre dialogues, such as the following:

A: Is that a zebra?

B: Yes, it is a zebra.

A: But can you rule out its being merely a cleverly painted mule?

B: No, I cannot.

A: So, you admit you didn't know it was a zebra?

B: No, I did know then that it was a zebra. But after your question, I no longer know. (1983, 183)

That EC licenses such bizarre dialogues, however, is hardly clear. For, once the skeptical possibility is raised, the relevant knowledge claim no longer expresses something that is true (DeRose 1992). Recall, after all, as was stressed above, that EC is a semantic thesis — it does not concern knowledge at all. Suppose that, prior to the skeptical possibility's having been raised, B had claimed to know that there is or was a zebra before him. Suppose that B, in making this claim, expressed a true proposition; that he did so does not imply that B knows, or knew, full stop. Supposing that it does requires an illicit descent into the object language (DeRose 2000).

According to Keith DeRose (ibid., Section 6), what EC does license, in terms of legitimate ways for B to close out the dialogue, are only metalinguistic claims like:

I was previously such that an utterance of ‘B knows it is a zebra’ would have expressed a true proposition, but the different and more demanding proposition which such an utterance would now express would not be true.

Nikola Kompa (2002, 5) has observed that EC would also seemingly permit B to say,

Had I uttered ‘I know it is a zebra’ earlier, I would thereby have expressed a truth, but I do not know that it is a zebra.

Kompa calls this “an unpleasant consequence” of EC. And one might similarly regard claims in which there is explicit relativization of ‘knows’ to the relevant standards, as in,

I knowS1 that it is a zebra, but I don't knowS2 that it is a zebra.

As Kent Bach (2005, 58-61) says, there seems to be nothing in EC which precludes the legitimacy of claims. After all, they merely involve making explicit what are, according to EC, the propositions expressed by the relevant utterances. But the contextualist may reply that any unpleasantness or feeling of unfamiliarity attending such claims derives from our failing to be fully aware of the context-sensitivity of the expressions in question. (Compare how Cohen (2001, 89) responds to a certain objection of Feldman's (2001, 77).) Whether this sort of error theory is problematic is a separate issue, discussed below.

In any case, the non-skeptical contextualist can further say that it is only because he engages in such an illegitimate descent into the object language — speaking of knowledge, as opposed to the propositions expressed in uttering “knowledge” sentences — that David Lewis is able to say such apparently dramatic and troubling things as that, once certain skeptical possibilities are made salient, ‘knowledge vanishes’ (1996, 560; see Bach 2005, 54-55, and DeRose 2000).

4.2 EC and Skepticism

While reminders that EC is a semantic or meta-linguistic thesis helps both to defuse objections like Dretske's and Yourgrau's and to expose as misleading Lewisian presentations of the view, it sets the stage for a more difficult objection for contextualists to counter: namely, that it does not provide a satisfactory resolution of certain skeptical problems. Various specific versions of this objection have been lodged, with varying degrees of forcefulness (by, e.g., Feldman 1999, 2001, 2004; Klein 2000, 2005; Kornblith 2000; Sosa 2000; Bach 2005), but they have in common the idea that EC, just because it is a semantic or meta-linguistic thesis, fails to successfully engage and respond to skepticism.

On one version of this complaint (e.g., Conee 2005, Feldman 2001), it is said that EC per se does not generate the results essential to the contextualist resolution of SA, for example. That the propositions expressed by utterances of knowledge sentences in ordinary contexts are true, for example, is not secured by EC on its own; some substantive theory is required for that. On another version, the objection is simply that EC does not correctly characterize the skeptic's position at all. As we have seen, EC has it that skeptical claims express truths only relative to extraordinarily high epistemic standards. But surely, the objection runs, what is at issue between skeptics and non-skeptics is whether we satisfy even our ordinary epistemic standards. In Hilary Kornblith's terms, it is the ‘Full-Blooded’, rather than the merely ‘High Standards’, skeptic “who is making an historically important and philosophically interesting claim” (2000, 27). Feldman puts it thus:

The debate about skepticism is…not as a debate in which the quality of our evidence is agreed to and the debate results from differing views about what the standards for knowledge are. Instead, it is a debate about how good our evidence is. Understood that way, it is difficult to see the epistemological significance of decisions about which standards are associated with the word ‘knows’ in any particular context. Contextualism is, from this perspective, skepticism neutral, in that it does not address this part of the issue. (Feldman 2004, 32; cf. Feldman 1999, 2001)

And while he, like Peter Klein (2000, 2005), is prepared to grant the contextualist his/her semantic thesis, Ernest Sosa (2000) likewise takes it to have limited relevance to epistemology generally — though, as he sees it, this is often overlooked, owing to “incautious and faulty formulations of the view” (2000, 9). For, just because it is restricted to certain meta-linguistic claims, EC has only limited significance for skepticism: from the fact that, in non-skeptical contexts, we can use ‘S knows that p’ to express propositions which are true, nothing follows about whether we know anything — a question which we can and do wonder about in philosophical contexts. But in fact, one might suppose that the proponent of EC would disavow the meaningfulness of the latter question, if it is intended to be one which admits of some acontextual answer.

Several proponents of EC have offered replies to the charge that EC does not fairly characterize and/or engage with skepticism. While allowing that the complaint may apply to other forms of EC, Neta claims that, on his version, the skeptic “is not making the uninteresting claim that we do not meet unusually stringent standards of knowledge. Rather, she is claiming that we do not meet ordinary standards for knowledge” (2003b, 2). In reply, however, the objector may press that, as Neta says, and as we saw above, the skeptic is able to do this on his view only because she “disqualif[ies] certain mental states from counting as evidence” (ibid.). And one might think that that constitutes the imposition of unusually high epistemic standards, even if they do not directly govern the proper use of ‘knows’ per se.

Responding to Sosa (2000), Cohen (1999, 79-80) writes that, by his lights, what is troubling about skepticism is the claim that, in saying things of the form, “S knows that p”, we have all along been expressing falsehoods (cf. DeRose 2004b, 37). The point of EC is not to show that we know, or even that our ordinary knowledge claims express true propositions; it is, rather, to reconcile the presumed truth of such claims with the apparent truth of the premises of SA (Cohen 2001, 95-96; DeRose 1995 characterizes the problem posed by SA in very similar terms). And EC shows us how we might do so. But, Sosa counters, insofar as non-skeptics wish to preserve and defend a “Moorean stance”, the latter is not a metalinguistic claim to the effect that folks in ordinary situations who claim to “know” some matter of fact often express truths. Rather, the latter “is a stance, adopted in a philosophical context, about what one then knows and, by extension, what people ordinarily know. At a minimum it is a stance about whether people are right in their ordinary claims to know, which is not quite the same as whether they are right in their ordinary utterances of the form ‘I know that p’.” So once we abandon the metalanguage, as a proper understanding of EC requires, “we abandon thereby the Moorean stance” (Sosa 2004, 281).

This last claim of Sosa's concerning skepticism, considered as a position arising within a philosophical context, leads naturally to a related, though distinct, worry about the contextualist's response thereto. There seems to be a good sense in which, when epistemologists carefully consider and debate about the extent of our knowledge, the cogency (or not) of various skeptical arguments, and so on, they occupy a single, shared context (Conee 2005, 53). Within that context, some (the skeptically inclined) deny that we know very much, while their anti-skeptical counterparts insist that we do. But, the complaint runs, to hold, as EC's proffered handling of SA implies, that in this context it is the skeptic's claims that are true is not licensed by EC itself: the propositions expressed by knowledge sentences may be contextually variable in the way EC alleges, but that does not tell us which specific such sentences are true, and which false. (It is possible to read Dretske's objection to EC, mentioned in the previous Section, as intended to make essentially this point.)

In response, the contextualist may deny that there is, in fact, a single, shared context governing (or constituted by) serious epistemological discussion. (DeRose's 2004a is an extended discussion of just this topic; see too Cohen 2005, 59-60.) So too, she may grant — which, as noted above (Section 3.3), some proponents of EC readily do — that contextualists as such are not forced to any view as to whether and/or under what circumstances the skeptic's claims do express truths, while still insisting that EC provides at least the basis for a resolution of puzzles like SA — a resolution which, overall, is preferable to competing accounts (Cohen 2005, 58-60). Of course, such moves may in turn give rise to further worries — about the first, whether, for example, it would generalize, threatening to dissolve all apparently substantive disagreements among specialists; about the second, whether, in the end, EC itself is even a necessary part of an adequate response to the skeptic (cf. Brady and Pritchard 2005, 165).[15]

Clearly, the effectiveness of EC in addressing and resolving skeptical problems is far from settled. It would appear, however, that one's verdict on this matter — hence, one's view as to whether EC's handling of the skeptical problem constitutes a reason to accept EC — will depend in no small part upon just what one takes the problem posed by skepticism to be, as well as upon facts about particular contextualist views which go beyond an endorsement of EC per se.

4.3 EC's Error Theory

One of the major attractions of EC is said to be that it enables the resolution of certain apparent conflicts among sets of individually plausible claims without forcing us to reject any of the members thereof as false.[16] As Crispin Wright puts it, a good part of the appeal of EC is that it seems to enable a certain “‘no-fault’ view of certain (potentially) intransigent disputes where we have to hand no ready conception of a further fact which would make one party right at the expense of the other” (2005, 240).

However, as we saw above, whether it is a skeptical argument or a pedestrian case that is at issue, contextualists are committed to a certain ‘error theory’. After all, that EC is correct is supposed to be a quite recent discovery. Further, in those cases in which speakers' claims about who does/doesn't know are said by the contextualist not to conflict, among many there persists the sense that they are cannot both be speaking truly. For instance, our ordinary claims to know various things seem to conflict with the skeptic's denial that we know any such things — that is why skepticism has seemed to pose a problem to which contextualism is said to constitute a novel solution. The contextualist seeks to explain why we might think this — more generally, why we might think that what is said in a given ‘high stakes’ case is in fact compatible with what is said in its ‘low stakes’ counterpart — by suggesting that we fail to fully appreciate the contextualist semantics and/or to faithfully track shifts in context (see, e.g.: Cohen 1999, 77; 2005, 60; cf. DeRose 1999, 194; 1995, 40-41; 2004b, 37).

According to another often-voiced objection to EC (in, e.g., Schiffer 1996, Hofweber 1999, Rysiew 2001, Hawthorne 2004, Conee 2005, Williamson 2005a, Egan et al. 2005), its error theory is problematic. As formulated by Stephen Schiffer, the objection is simply that it is implausible that we would get “bamboozled by our own words” (ibid., 329) in the way the contextualist alleges, since “speakers would know what they were saying if knowledge sentences were indexical in the way the Contextualist requires” (ibid.: 328).

Is this a good objection? On the face of it, the complaint may seem not to have any weight. With respect to SA above, for example, the two premises are (suppose) individually quite plausible, the argument appears valid, yet the conclusion seems very implausible. So “something plausible has to go” (DeRose 1995, 2; emphasis added). Thus, that EC is not an entirely ‘no fault’ view might mean that, as Timothy Williamson has argued (2005b, Section II), considerations of charity per se do not favor it; but why think that the contextualist's error theory is particularly problematic?

This is one of the ways in which Cohen has very lately responded to concerns about contextualism's error theory (2005, 70).[17] And in a recent paper (2006) DeRose replies along similar lines: if you present a group of subjects with SA, for instance, and ask them whether the conclusion contradicts an ordinary claim to know such a thing, some will say ‘yes’, and some will say ‘no’. If contextualism turns out to be true, then many are blind to that, and so on. So, whoever turns out to be right, the contextualist or the ‘invariantist’, a substantial portion of ordinary speakers are afflicted by “semantic blindness” (Hawthorne 2004, 107). ‘Bamboozlement’ is something we are stuck with either way.

In assessing this type of response to the objection under consideration, it is useful to separate out two questions: First, whether, considered on its own, the contextualist's error theory is plausible. Second, whether that theory raises any problems internal to the contextualist view.

As to the first question, there are precedents for the type of error that the contextualist says is going on with respect to (at least some of our) knowledge attributions. For example, by implicitly raising the standards — drawing attention to previously disregarded bumps, etc. — you can get a competent speaker to take seriousness ‘flatness skepticism’, the view that nothing's really flat (Cohen 1999, 78-9; 2005, 60, 70; 2004, 193). But this can take place only because,

…although ascriptions of flatness are context-sensitive, competent speakers can fail to realize this. And because they can fail to realize this, they can mistakenly think that their reluctance to ascribe flatness, in a context where the standards are at the extreme, conflicts with their ascriptions of flatness in everyday contexts. (Cohen 2001, 91; 1999, 79)

However, when an apparent incompatibility between certain uttered sentences is actually due to their expressing different propositions in different contexts, once we see that this is so, any appearance that they are incompatible tends to go away. Thus, we might ‘disagree’ over whether Kansas is flat, but once it is made clear that you mean relatively un-mountainous and I mean devoid of any hills at all, we quickly agree that we were both right all along. But for many, this does not happen when they are presented with the proposed contextualist resolution to the problem cases which motivate it (Conee 2005, 55, 66; Feldman 2001, 73, 77-78; Rysiew 2001, 484-485).

Acknowledging this difference in the readiness with which people accept EC, as opposed to a corresponding view about ascriptions of flatness, Cohen notes that we already know that there are “varying degrees to which competent speakers are blind to the context-sensitivity in the language” (2005, 61). The context-sensitivity of indexicals like ‘I’ and ‘now’ are easy to spot, that of ‘flat’ somewhat harder. And for ‘knows’, “it may be very difficult even after some amount of reflection for competent speakers to accept context-sensitivity. It may take subtle philosophical considerations concerning the best way to resolve a paradox in order to ‘see’ the context-sensitivity of ‘knows’” (ibid.).

Bolstering the latter suggestion are cases involving what Thomas Hofweber (1999, 98ff.) calls ‘hidden relativity’. For example, according to Hofweber, our claim that August is a summer month presumes that we are in the Northern hemisphere.[18] A speaker may not be aware of this, though; and even those who are aware of it do not feel compelled to make that parameter explicit whenever they utter the relevant sort of sentence. So, when Schiffer says, “no ordinary person would dream of telling you that what he meant and was implicitly stating was that he knew that p relative to such-and-such standard” (1996, 326ff.), that in itself does not show that no such relativization is, in fact, required or even in place. If you ask someone what they meant in saying “August is a summer month,” they are liable simply to repeat what they've just said!

It is not clear, however, whether such ‘hidden relativities’ really do provide a model for our supposed ignorance of the context-sensitivity of knowledge sentences. For, while many competent speakers of English are unaware of the (supposed) relativity of ‘summer month’, once they are made aware of this relativity, they do not actively resist its being made explicit. Whereas, when the alleged relativizations within knowledge sentences are made explicit — “Smith doesn't knowS that the flight stops in Chicago,” etc. (Bach 2005, Section I) — they are often met with resistance and regarded as highlighting the controversial character of EC.[19]

Further, as Hofweber says (1999: 101-2), with regard to ‘summer month’, say, there is a plausible explanation of why the relativization in question can be ‘hidden’ for many speakers and, even among those who are aware of it, rarely be made explicit — namely, that most of the people with whom we discuss such things are geographically close to us. Whereas, the evidence for contextualism requires that there be some interesting variation among the standards which determine a knowledge sentence's truth-conditions within this or that ‘language community’, and it requires that we be guided in our everyday knowledge-attributing behavior by an awareness of just this fact.

This last point brings out the second question concerning the contextualist's error theory mentioned above — whether that theory raises any problems internal to the contextualist view. For, to the extent that the context-sensitivity of the relevant expression(s) can remain deeply hidden, even after careful reflection, it becomes less clear that in the cases of concern (SA, the airport example, etc.) what is driving our judgments as to whether what speakers say is ‘true and proper’ is, as contextualist says, our awareness of that context-sensitivity. The contextualist must thus strike “a delicate balance” (Conee 2005, 54-55) between crediting us with a grasp of the context-sensitivity of knowledge sentences, while at the same time attributing to us a failure to fully grasp it. 

Finally, as Ram Neta observes, in Hofweber's cases it is some worldly fact about the phenomenon in question of which people are ignorant. Whereas,

…the contextualist does not want to say that our semantic ignorance about our knowledge attributions results from our ignorance of the real nature of knowledge. Rather, it is supposed to result from our ignorance about the way in which the content of those attributions depends upon contextual factors. (2003, 404)

And, as we have seen, far from referring to our worldly situation and the nature of various phenomena therein, ‘context’ is generally said by contextualists to refer to such things as the purposes, intentions, expectations, presuppositions, etc., of the speakers who utter those sentences. (The same sorts of things, plausibly, which are responsible for determining what is expressed by attributions of flatness, say.)

According to some (e.g., Rysiew 2001, 485, 507), this last point of dissimilarity between Hofweber's ‘hidden relativities’ and that which contextualists allege intensifies concerns about the contextualist's error theory. For it seems to imply a quite specific deficit in “our powers of semantic self-knowledge” (Neta 2003, 408): to say that we “conflate contexts” (Cohen 2005, 69) is to say that we are mixed up about what our intentions, purposes, etc., are when we utter knowledge sentences. Now, we do know that that sort of thing sometimes happens. (Neta — ibid., 407-408 — describes one such case.) Still, and whether or not it does constitute a deficit in our “semantic self-knowledge”, it would be good if we had some explanation as to why many have such a hard time coming to terms with the truth of contextualism, when the context-sensitivity of other terms is fairly easily accepted, and when we are said to grasp that truth implicitly. Cohen has tentatively suggested that considerations of value might explain this:

….We value justification and knowledge. But contextualist theories are deflationary. Contextualism about knowledge says that most of our everyday utterances of the form ‘S knows P’ are true, even though the strength of epistemic position in those instances does not meet our highest standards. In the same way, contextualism about flatness says that most of our everyday utterances of sentences of the form ‘X is flat’ are true, even though X's surface may fall short of perfect flatness.

In other words, contextualism is a ‘good news, bad news’ theory. The good news is that we have lots of knowledge and many surfaces are flat; the bad news is that knowledge and flatness are not all they were cracked up to be. We find this much easier to accept in the case of flatness than knowledge, because ascriptions of flatness do not have the normative force that ascriptions of knowledge/justification do. (2005, 61-2; cf. 2004, 193)

Whether one sees this suggested explanation as a step forward, it should by now be clear that we have moved beyond considerations of the contextualist's imputation of error to ordinary speakers per se. While the issue of whether EC's error theory is problematic remains a topic of lively debate, one thing that has emerged from the discussion here is that, in spite of how it is sometimes presented, that debate seems not to concern semantic ‘blindness’ or ‘bamboozlement’ itself. Rather, it has to do with what is, according to some, the unsatisfactory or troubling nature of the contextualist's appeal to such a theory in particular.

4.4 Linguistic Issues

According to EC, ‘know(s)’ is a context-sensitive term. Among proponents of EC, however, there has been relatively little discussion, and little agreement, about just what linguistic model best captures this fact. Thus, Cohen (1988, 97) speaks of ‘knowledge’ as “an indexical”,[20] Hambourger (1987, 262) likens it to “large”, Heller (1999a, 206; 1999b, 121) says that it is a vague term, and DeRose, while at one point (1992, 920-921) using an analogy with the demonstrative “this” to illuminate the lack of contradiction between certain utterances of knowledge sentences, tends to be noncommittal as to the appropriate model for ‘know(s)’.

It has been objected, however, that regardless of exactly which model is adopted, the linguistic data surrounding ‘know(s)’ is not what one would expect were it a genuinely context-sensitive term. For example, Jason Stanley (2004) argues that, unlike terms like ‘flat’ and ‘tall’, ‘knows’ is not clearly gradable. (It makes sense to describe someone as “very tall”, but while I might say that someone knows something “very well,” ‘very’ does not appear here to be functioning as a degree modifier.) And while ‘(is) justified’ is obviously gradable, even if gradability were sufficient for context-sensitivity, from the fact that knowledge requires justification it would not follow that ‘knows’ is context-sensitive as well (pace Cohen 1999, 60). Nor, Stanley argues, does ‘know(s)’ behave like indexicals (‘I’, ‘here’) or relational terms (such as ‘enemy’).

In a related argument — one that recalls some of the discussion of the preceding Section — John Hawthorne points out that with uncontroversially context-dependent terms, we find it very natural to employ what he calls “the clarification technique”. — An example from the previous section illustrates the point: I balk at your claim that Kansas is flat, pointing out that there is a small rise just ahead of us. Rather than admitting to a mistake (‘concession’) or simply repeating your claim (‘sticking to one's guns’), you clarify: “Well, what I meant was that there are very few mountains.” Hawthorne's point is that there we have very few techniques of clarification in the case of  ‘know(s)’; whereas, it “is through the clarification technique that sensitivity to context-dependence is manifested” (2004, 104-106).

Finally, Herman Capellen and Ernie Lepore (2003) argue that, according to certain tests for the genuine context-sensitivity of a term, ‘know(s)’ just does not pass muster. (In their discussion, examples like the one illustrating the “unpleasant consequence” of EC mentioned in 4.1, above, loom large.)

Responses on behalf of EC to such arguments vary. Commenting on Stanley, Barbara Partee (2004) agrees that ‘know(s)’ is indeed unlike expressions such as ‘tall’, but that perhaps better models are available. Nikola Kompa (2002) suggests that the context-sensitivity of ‘know(s)’ is best understood as deriving from a sui generis sort of “unspecificity”. And Rob Stainton (forthcoming), while quite sympathetic to the claim that ‘know(s)’ is not itself a context-sensitive term, nevertheless believes that the “spirit” of EC can be saved: if there are pragmatic determinants of what is stated/asserted/claimed, then what is stated (/etc.) in different uses of “knowledge” sentences can vary in truth conditions, even if ‘know(s)’ is not context-sensitive. (Here, we see a connection between EC and its philosophy-of-language namesake, which was mentioned in Section 2, above; and a similar connection is evident in Charles Travis' 2005 paper.)

Ceding less ground, Peter Ludlow argues that questions about gradability are too crude a standard by which to judge whether ‘know(s)’ is context-sensitive. Ludlow disagrees with Hawthorne about the prevalence of clarificatory devices for ‘know(s)’ and argues that there is good reason to think its semantics includes some placeholder(s) for the variable standards of knowledge which EC posits. Like DeRose (2005), Ludlow casts EC a piece of ‘ordinary language’ philosophy, and in that spirit he presents the results of Google searches in which clauses like, “…by objective standards”, “…by academic standards”, “…with some certainty”, “…doggone well…”, and so on, accompany uses of ‘know(s)’. The latter are more data to be mulled over in considering possible linguistic bases for EC. In general, from the fact that different standards are employed, even explicitly adverted to, in making some evaluative judgments (whether x is/isn't F, whether S does/doesn't A) in different domains, it does not immediately follow that a contextualistic semantics for the relevant terms (‘F-ness’, ‘(to) A’) is correct (Conee 2005, 50-51). Just as they were at the center of debates about the merits of ordinary language philosophy decades ago, methodological questions about the proper philosophical handling of such data as Ludlow cites — whether to view them as semantically revealing or grammatically misleading; whether, in the present case, the relevant utterances involve the making-explicit of context-variable standards for “knowledge”, or the conveying of information over and above that encoded in ‘know(s)’ itself, etc. — arise as much here as with the considerations initially used to motivate EC.

4.5 Further Issues — Epistemic Modals, Thought, Preservation and Transfer of Information, Practical Reasoning, Attitude Reports

Questions have been raised about EC's ability to account for certain other data. Andy Egan et al. (2005) argue that ‘relativism’, rather than EC, gets the semantics of epistemic modals right. Bach (2005, 66) and Feldman (2004, 27) question whether the contextualist model might apply to one's thoughts about whether various knowledge sentences express truths. Timothy Williamson (2005a, 100-101) and John Hawthorne (2004, 109-110) raise related concerns about the preservation of information in memory and testimony. In addition, Williamson (ibid., 102ff.) argues that EC, because it privileges attributor over subject factors, does not respect the autonomy of the agent (subject), qua agent, in settling the contents of questions involved in practical decision making. And Hawthorne (ibid., 98ff.) contends that EC has implausible consequences for reports of propositional attitudes.

Whether any of these criticisms are effective against EC is controversial. (See DeRose 1995, 6-7 and Rieber 1998, 197, e.g., on the extension of EC to one's thoughts; DeRose 2006, Section 4 and Cohen 2005b, 201-206 reply to Hawthorne's arguments concerning belief reports.) However, whatever we make of these further issues, not to mention the ones earlier raised, they could give us reason to reject EC only if there were some viable alternative explanation of the relevant data — in particular, of the apparently inconsistent knowledge claims described in Section 3. On the other hand, if we could explain those data without introducing a novel view about the semantics of ‘know(s)’, that would considerably weaken the case for EC.

4.6 Some Proposed (‘Classical’, ‘Insensitive’) Invariantist Treatments of the Data

Among critics of EC, at least three such purported explanations have emerged.[21] Since each is intended to preserve the thought that we do ordinarily know many things, the granting of knowledge in the relevant ‘low standards’ case is taken to express a truth. What needs explaining, then, is why denying knowledge of the same subject can seem correct once the standards are raised, even though nothing in the subject's situation changes. Though they are not obviously competing, each attempt to explain this in non-contextualist terms focuses on different factors. Framed in terms of the airport example described in Section 3.4 above, and in broad outline only, these sample non-contextualist proposals are as follows:

4.6.1 Pragmatic Factors

According to some (e.g., Blaauw 2003, Black, 2005, Brown 2006, Prades 2000, Pritchard forthcoming, Rysiew 2001, 2005, forthcoming),[22] pragmatic factors explain the relevant knowledge-attributing behavior. In the airport case, it is mutually obvious to John and Mary that they want to ensure that their epistemic position with respect to the flight plan is very strong — strong enough to rule out the possibility of a misprint, e.g. Being in an epistemic position of such strength may or may not be required for knowing. Hence, whether Smith does know — whether the proposition literally expressed by “Smith knows…” is true — may or may not be relevant to John and Mary's concerns. Either way, ‘S knows that p’ entails that S is in a good epistemic position — this is why granting someone knowledge involves representing them as entitled to their belief. But it would be odd of Mary and John to grant Smith such an entitlement (by saying ‘he knows’) and represent him as being in a good epistemic position if they thought that his evidence wasn't so good as to put their concerns to rest. Whereas, by denying knowledge to Smith, they are able to express the thought seems not just relevant but true, that his epistemic position is not so good that they do not need to check further. And if they (we) read what is conveyed by the relevant utterance onto the sentence uttered, the knowledge denial will strike them (us) as expressing a truth.

4.6.2 Psychological Presuppositions of Attributing Knowledge

Mary does not say ‘Smith knows that the plane will stop in Chicago’ and goes so far as to assert its negation because of her own doxastic situation. Because she is not sure Smith's itinerary is reliable, she herself is not confident enough to believe that the plane will stop in Chicago. So she cannot coherently attribute knowledge of it to Smith, not if knowledge implies truth. In general, you cannot coherently assert that someone knows that p if you are not confident that p and think that it still needs to be verified. That is why Mary cannot very well assert that Smith knows that the plane will stop in Chicago. Not only that, she has to deny that she knows it, since she thinks that it is not yet established. And, since Smith has no evidence that she doesn't have, she must deny that he knows it [too]. (Bach 2005, 76-77)

In a similar spirit, Adler 2006b suggests that such cases are best explained in terms of the subject's diminished confidence as to p, where the latter does not imply a lack of belief.

4.6.3 Salience, Conflicting Arguments, and Focusing Effects

When we find people seeming to disagree about some matter, that is often because there is a genuine conflict of evidence — arguments and considerations on either side of the issue, none of which can be easily dismissed. And which of these one focuses on can affect one's view as to the truth of the proposition in question. So, for instance, if Mary and John focus on the various ways in which Smith might be mistaken (e.g., because of a misprint in the itinerary), this can get them thinking that he does not know what he claims to know, especially if focusing on a possibility tends to make one over-rate its probability. (See especially Feldman 2001, 74-78. For similar ideas, see Williamson 2005a, 112; 2005b, 226; Conee 2005, 63-66; and Rysiew 2001, 502-505.)

Unsurprisingly, even among opponents of EC, each of these proposals is contentious. And proponents of EC have raised specific doubts about their viability. For instance, according to Cohen (1999, 80-82; 2001, 94) merely citing the existence conflicting arguments does not really explain what needs explaining. And DeRose (1999, 2002; cf. Cohen 1999, 60) argues that the prospects for explaining the relevant data via any kind of pragmatic ‘warranted assertability manœuver’ are very dim (arguments that both Brown and Rysiew, op cit., e.g., attempt to defuse).

5. Further Arguments for EC, with some Non-Contextualist Responses

5.1 Fallibilism and Concessive Knowledge Attributions

It is plausible to suppose that, if knowing requires believing on the basis of evidence that entails what is believed, we have hardly any knowledge at all. Hence the near-universal acceptance of fallibilism in epistemology: denying that one can know on the basis of non-entailing evidence is, it seems, not an option if we are to preserve the very strong appearance that we do know many things (Cohen 1988, 91). Hence the significance of ‘concessive knowledge attributions’ (CKAs) (Rysiew 2001) — i.e., sentences of the form ‘S knows that p, but it is possible that q’ (where q entails not-p). To many, utterances of such sentences sound very odd indeed:

If you claim that S knows that P, and yet you grant that S cannot eliminate a certain possibility in which not-P, it certainly seems as if you have granted that S does not after all know that P. To speak of fallible knowledge, of knowledge despite uneliminated possibilities of error, just sounds contradictory…. If you are a contented fallibilist, I implore you to be honest, be näive, hear it afresh. ‘He knows, yet he has not eliminated all possibilities of error.’ Even if you've numbed your ears, doesn't this overt, explicit fallibilism still sound wrong? (1996, 549, 550)

If Lewis is correct though in supposing that the relevant utterances are merely “overt, explicit” statements of fallibilism (ibid., 550), their seeming incoherence suggests that, contrary to our everyday epistemic pretensions, “knowledge must be by definition infallible” after all (ibid., 549).

Lewis' own attempt “to thread a course between the rock of fallibilism and the whirlpool of skepticism” (Lewis 1996, 566) involves embracing epistemic contextualism: We may say with the infallibilist that S knows that p iff S's evidence eliminates “every” possibility in which not-p (ibid., 551). But since ‘every’ is (Lewis claims) restricted to a particular conversational domain (ibid., 553-554), and since certain not-p possibilities will be “properly ignored” in a given situation, we preserve our intuitive non-skepticism. 

Jason Stanley (2005a) attempts to block Lewis' move to EC and defends fallibilism against the worry that overtly fallibilistic speech is incoherent. According to Stanley, CKAs are not just odd-sounding: in most cases, they are simply false. But this does not impugn fallibilism. Insofar as the odd-sounding utterances Lewis cites state the fallibilist idea, the latter portion thereof (‘S cannot eliminate a certain possibility in which not-p’, e.g.) expresses the idea that the subject's evidence does not entail what is (allegedly) known (hence, the negation of any contrary propositions).[23] According to Stanley, however, this is not the best reading of the possibility clauses CKAs contain. On the correct account of such statements of epistemic possibility, ‘It is possible [for A] that p’ is true if and only if what A knows does not, in a manner that is obvious to A, entail not-p. (Cf. DeRose 1991, 1999; and Hawthorne 2004, 24-28.) So, while the sentences Lewis cites are self-contradictory, they do not capture the fallibilist idea after all.

Dougherty and Rysiew (forthcoming) offer a different strategy for accounting for CKAs' oddity while both protecting fallibilism and avoiding EC. While they grant that the latter portion of CKAs express epistemic possibility, they recommend thinking of what is epistemically possible for a subject in terms of those things which his evidence, rather than what he knows, does not rule out. On this view, CKAs express, as Lewis assumes, precisely the fallibilist idea. According to Dougherty and Rysiew, however, their oddity poses no problem for fallibilism, and so does not motivate the adoption of contextualism, as that oddity can be explained pragmatically, in the same way that Moore-type sentences (‘p, but I don't believe it’) are generally held to be.

Which (if either) of these responses to the problem Lewis sets is correct is a matter of dispute. But there are at least these two ways in which a non-contextualist could counter Lewis' argument.

5.2 Knowledge and Assertion

A number of philosophers[24] have found very plausible the idea that, in asserting that p, one represents oneself as knowing that p. Here, very quickly, is one route to this idea: If our talk is governed by ‘the Cooperative Principle’ (CP), then ‘saying’ itself presumes one's striving to fulfill certain credal-epistemic conditions: chief among the Gricean maxims is that of Quality, ‘Try to make your contribution one that is true,’ along with its two more specific sub-maxims:

  1. ‘Do not say what you believe to be false;’ and
  2. ‘Do not say that for which you lack adequate evidence.’ (Grice 1989, 27)

Now notice that the properties addressed by Quality and its sub-maxims closely approximate what are generally taken to be the central conditions on knowing (so long, at least, as we are open-minded as to how to read ii — such that, e.g., ‘justification’ could be substituted for ‘evidence’). So it seems that, if one is striving to conform to CP, one shouldn't ‘say’ something if one takes oneself not to know it — hence, that if one does say that p, one commits oneself to this condition's not being unfulfilled; i.e., to one's actually being in the knowing relation to p.

According to some, this same idea can be expressed by saying that knowledge is “the norm of assertion”. Thus, Timothy Williamson (2000, Chapter 11) defends at length what is come to be known as ‘the knowledge account of assertion,’ whereby our linguistic practices are governed by the rule: “One must: assert p only if one knows p” (2000, 243)

Keith DeRose, taking the two ideas just expressed to be “just two sides of the same coin” (2002, 180), argues that, if the knowledge account of assertion is correct, it furnishes a different sort of argument for EC, which is summarized as follows:

If the standards for when one is in a position to warrantedly assert that P are the same as those that constitute a truth condition for ‘I know that P,’ then if the former vary with context, so do the latter. In short: The knowledge account of assertion together with the context sensitivity of assertability… yields contextualism about knowledge. (Ibid.,187)

Several objections to this argument have been made. First, it is worth considering whether one couldn't accept the idea, for reasons such as those outlined above, that in asserting that p one represents oneself as knowing that p, while taking the rule governing assertion to be, say, ‘Do not assert what you take yourself not to know,’ or some such. According to Matt Weiner (2005), for instance, the knowledge rule is too strong, and the cases which motivate it can be handled assuming the rule that proper assertions be true, along with conversational norms governing all speech acts. Second, Adam Leite (2007) argues that the direct argument for contextualism from the knowledge account of assertion rests on an equivocation on the notion of ‘warranted assertability’. (See too Bach 2005, 73-4, who also suggests that DeRose's argument rests too heavily on first-person knowledge claims). And Thomas Blackson (2004) argues, as Williamson (2005a, 111, n. 20) suggests, that DeRose's argument does not favor EC over another recent view, “subject-sensitive invariantism”, as it is sometimes called (see next Section). Quite independently of its relation to EC, the relation between knowledge and assertion has been the focus of much recent attention.

6. Other Views

Besides forcing non-contextualist epistemologists to give more attention to such matters as the pragmatics of knowledge attributions, and certain features of our actual knowledge-attributing practices, EC has been instrumental in the development of other competing theories. Prompted in part by a dissatisfaction with EC, several other views have recently been proposed. They are said by their proponents to do a better job of accommodating the sort of data, both ordinary and extraordinary, which inspire EC. These views are:

According to the first of these views, as Schaffer discusses it, while EC holds that ‘knows’ expresses different two-term relations (between subjects and propositions) in different contexts, according to contrastivism, ‘knows’ denotes a three-place relation, with a contrast variable being included among the relata. The latter may be ‘shifty’, when it is not explicitly provided. (Some claim that contrastivism in a species of EC; for Schaffer on the differences between contrastivism and canonical versions of EC, see his 2004.)

According to the second view, whether a subject knows — though not what is expressed by the relevant knowledge sentences themselves — depends upon certain facts about his/her practical interests (or, depending on the view, what the subject believes about such).

According to the third, the truth values of knowledge sentences depend upon certain features of the contexts in which they are assessed, as opposed to of those in which they are uttered.

The various strengths and weakness of each of these views — considered both on their own, and as compared with each other, with EC, and with traditional (insensitive) invariantism — is the subject of much recent discussion. Unsurprisingly, no clear consensus has emerged.


[Pagination of in-text citations follows that of the reprint, where given.]

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