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Epistemological Problems of Testimony

First published Thu Feb 2, 2006; substantive revision Fri Nov 3, 2006

The main epistemological problem of testimony is that an enormous number of our beliefs originate in the assertions or testimony of speakers, but our accepting or believing those assertions merely on the word of the speaker does not seem sufficient for those beliefs to be justified, warranted, or knowledge. The problem is diminished but not eliminated if it is assumed, as is standard, that the speaker is justified or warranted in the beliefs that his assertions express, and even if he knows them. Assuming that the answer to this problem is positive, not skeptical, how do we account for this positive answer. Testimony depends upon other fundamental sources of epistemic warrant like perception or memory, but not conversely. A testimonial chain of knowledge must eventuate in a speaker who knows directly by, say, perception. Can the reliability of testimony be justified by appeal to just these other sources along with familiar forms of inference, especially induction? The view that it can be is called reductionism, and it is opposed by anti-reductionists who hold that testimony is a source of warrant in itself, not reducible to warrant derived from these other sources, even if empirically dependent on them. Anti-reductionists typically offer various kinds of a priori justifications for the acceptance of testimony. Anti-reductionists also view reductionists as holding to an individualist epistemology, which grants knowledge only if the putative knower autonomously evaluates and endorses testimony. By contrast, they favor a social epistemology, which holds that the possibility of the vast knowledge we gain from testimony depends essentially on our membership in an epistemic community.

1. Epistemological Problems

Testimony is the assertion of a declarative sentence by a speaker to a hearer or to an audience. (For qualifications, Coady 1992, Fricker 1995, 2004, Graham 1997, Goldberg 2001.) A vast number of our beliefs arise through testimony and inferences drawn from it. Hume tells us that

there is no species of reasoning more common, more useful, and even necessary to human life, than that which is derived from the testimony of men, and the reports of eyewitnesses and spectators. (Hume1977, 74)

The import of this observation is of a Far-reaching Dependence thesis: Our beliefs and knowledge are extensively dependent on testimony (see Price 1969, Sosa 1994, Schmitt 1994, Insole 2000, in the history of science, Shapin 1994). The following hints at how far-reaching is our dependence on testimony for everyday knowledge:

many of us have never seen a baby born, nor have most of us examined the circulation of the blood nor the actual geography of the world nor any fair sample of the laws of the land, nor have we made the observations that lie behind our knowledge that the lights in the sky are heavenly bodies immensely distant… (Coady 1992, 82)

The epistemological problem enters because we seem to have no ground for coming to these beliefs beyond the speaker's word. But that seems a very weak basis. Call this the Vulnerability problem. Both Plato and Locke thought of testimony as an inferior source of belief because one does not check on the accuracy of the reports for oneself, but depends on the reliability and sincerity of others, often strangers or mere acquaintances.

To begin to solve — or dissolve or mitigate — the Vulnerability problem requires articulating either reasons of the hearer's or of the nature of his epistemic position, to accept as true what the speaker says, when the hearer has no specific or special knowledge about the hearer. What reason, if any, is there for a hearer to just take the speaker's word, given that the speaker is capable of lies, deception, error, and poor or misleading expression? For the hearer to trust the speaker's word is for the hearer to ascribe authority to the speaker, a normative ascription (Gibbard 1990, Brandom 1994). Does the hearer have good reason to ascribe that authority?

In order to focus on this fundamental problem, a good deal of abstraction is required to isolate our dependence on the word of the speaker alone. First, speakers' contributions should be limited to brief assertions to avoid internal support due to coherence among the set of assertions. Second, corroboration or convergence of a number of testifiers, who are presumed independent, should be set aside. Third, testimony is to be the sustaining, not just the originating, source of the corresponding belief. My belief that Joan is in Arkansas originates in an acquaintance, Mary, telling me so. But when I receive Joan's postcard from Arkansas that enormously diminishes the epistemic dependence of my belief on its originating source in Mary's testimony. Fourth, we set aside cases of a hearer's attribution of expertise to a speaker on certain topics, as well as a speaker's acting under professional or institutional demands for accurate testimony. The latter is a confound for the problem of the grounds for reliance on the speaker, merely as a participant in the conversational practice. (The topic of expertise in relation to testimony is prominently discussed within the scientific or legal setting. For some treatments relevant to epistemology see Kitcher 1993, Walton 1997, Brewer 1998, Golanski 2001, Jones 2002. For a survey of research on eyewitness testimony in the law, Wells and Olsen 2003 Under this restriction I also set aside testimony whose content is independently problematic for the ascription of authority or expertise e.g., moral assertions, Nickel 2001.) Fifth, and most obvious, the hearer has no special knowledge about the speaker — the speaker is a stranger to the hearer.

When these conditions are met, the setting will be the proper one for investigating the epistemics of testimony, and we will refer to it as the null setting. A familiar example is asking local directions from a stranger. However, even here the hearer is likely to quickly recognize whether the speaker is native to the area, among other relevant matters. It is very difficult to conceive a familiar setting where there is a complete absence of special knowledge, as the null setting restriction posits in order to maintain focus on the Vulnerability problem. Correspondingly, these restrictions and abstractions will often be relaxed so as to allow us to draw insights and data from natural conversational forums.

Still, further assumptions or abstractions are required to bring the problem into sharp focus. The Vulnerability and related problems are assumed not to be essentially altered, if we switch from the speaker-hearer relation to the writer-reader one, even though the latter setting is much less practically constrained to, say, brief contributions. Unless otherwise stated, especially when explicitly discussing deception and lies, I will assume that a speaker is sincere in his assertions (Williams 2002). Also, I restrict discussion to cases in which the speaker's utterance is meant literally, rather than rhetorically, playfully, figuratively, fictionally, or ironically. These assumptions are made for the sake of economy, though the discussion tends toward the substantive claim that literal usage is primary and that informativeness is the basic communicational goal. (Bach and Harnish 1979, McDowell 1980) The primacy of the aim of informativeness explains why the untruths of tact and related forms of social politeness should be set aside, as well. These untruths are not clean instances of lies or deception because norms of truthfulness are relaxed through tacit consent for purposes of sociability and social harmony (Adler 1997).

The cases to focus on are serious, though still ordinary, contexts where the norm of truthfulness holds, and the purpose is primarily to inform. The core cases are those of simple informational exchange over easily known matters, where there is little or no motivation to deceive e.g., the time, the weather, driving directions, the location of notable places, historical facts, sports scores, the whereabouts of acquaintances, explaining your action. In these cases, hearers generally have no special reason to doubt the speaker's word, as they would if the speaker's assertion is blatantly controversial or self-serving. Unless otherwise stated, a restriction to core cases in null settings should be understood throughout, though for emphasis I will at times restate it.

Under these assumptions and restrictions, our conversational practice is that hearers do just accept as true the speaker's assertion in the core cases, except when a hearer has a special reason to question the speaker's assertion. A basic datum for the epistemology of testimony is that our actual conversational practice fits a Uniformity claim: Hearers do regularly, simply accept as true the speaker's assertion in the core cases. In fact, they do so well beyond the core cases e.g., “DNA is a double helix”; “Marcia is depressed because Tom is on the road so much” (Weiner 2003).

Talk here of a ‘practice’ implies norms governing a purposeful activity, in this case conversational or testimonial exchange. The norms are followed by individuals on the expectation that they are typically followed by others in the community. Discovery that a speaker has given false testimony, gives rise to characteristic patterns of disapproval from the hearer that is recognized by the speaker as his responsibility (so that if it is brought to his attention, the speaker ought to feel guilty or apologize or offer an excuse).

Part of the explanation for both the Uniformity claim and the Far-Reaching Dependence thesis will be the Infeasibility of Checking claim: Hearers are unable to seriously check or confirm either the speaker's reliability or his sincerity within the normal constraints of testimonial transmission and exchange. However, the infeasibility of checking does not imply the absence of evidence both of the trustworthiness of the testimonial setting and of the credibility of what is asserted. (See sections 6 and 7.1 below.) The Infeasibility of Checking claim, like the Uniformity claim, characterizes the practice of testimony overall. In many particular exchanges, a hearer can specially check on the speaker's competence and sincerity with various prospects of success.

2. Expressing the Epistemological Problems via a Default Rule

The Vulnerability and related epistemological problems can be clarified and sub-divided by reference to a putative default rule for testimony, as an explicitly normative analogue to the Uniformity claim:

Default Rule (DR):
If the speaker S asserts that p to the hearer H, under normal conditions, then it is proper or correct for H to accept S's assertion, unless H has special reason to object.

In the case of asking for simple directions, the DR is well illustrated: If the stranger tells you to turn right at the next corner in answer to your question of where to find a gasoline station, you accept his assertion without further inquiry. Admittedly, there are numerous other examples which would yield responses by the hearer that do not seem in accord with the DR. You do not so respond if the speaker's driving directions are very complex. You also do not default-accept testimony when a speaker offers an opinionated pronouncement e.g., “Property taxes are regressive”. These and numerous other cases, outside the core ones, are not paradigmatic because the Vulnerability problem appears more difficult if these examples are treated as illustrations. In one case, the complex assertion conflicts with your own judgment of plausibility and in the latter case, the assertion is controversial. Knowledge of it cannot be assumed within a normal speaker's competence.

Nevertheless, these cases do not clearly violate the DR. You do not default accept the testimony, but that is no violation if you have special reason to object, setting aside whether it is polite to present. A special reason to object, one that satisfies the “unless” clause, should be one that speaker and hearer mutually accept as a grounding a legitimate challenge e.g., to the simple driving directions above, the hearer might respond “But I heard that that gas station closed earlier this year.”

I intend “proper or correct” in the DR to accord with norms expressed in whichever epistemic term is pivotal to the analysis of knowledge, with ‘justified’, ‘warranted’, or ‘entitled’ as leading candidates. A corollary claims additionally that the hearer ought to accept the speaker's word, which seems to conform to the practice and to our attitude in testimonial settings. But would such an ought be epistemic and prescriptive, and if so, would it be in conflict with the thesis that believing is non-voluntary? (Williams 1973)

The DR claims as proper or correct that the hearer “accept ” the speaker's assertion, and I assume that the acceptance as true issues in full, all-out, or unqualified belief, as contrasted to some degree of belief. However, sometimes our responses will allow a qualified acceptance to be behaviorally indistinguishable from all-out acceptance, and that indeterminacy is a problem for the Uniformity claim. A hearer may have no special reason to object, yet still not accept testimony in the privacy of his mind, especially when the testimony is to guide pressing demands for action e.g., receiving complex driving directions when one is in a hurry. The Uniformity claim holds only if these cases are the exception, which is plausible enough. For we would all know of this way to dodge the DR, in which case it could no longer sustain mutual expectations between speakers and hearers.

Although, as we note below, there are further explanations for the Uniformity claim that do not favor the DR, there is a path to confirmation from the former to the latter. It is not credible that we would so readily just accept testimonial transmissions in null settings, unless they were by-and-large correct. Hearers' seek information from speakers to guide their actions. If these transmissions were largely untrue, our resulting actions would mostly fail. Presumably, we would be responsive to the failures becoming less willing to readily accept testimony, undermining the Uniformity claim. However, aside from the slightly equivocal nature of the behavioral evidence for Uniformity, just noted, an additional problematic presumption of this path to confirmation is that there are alternatives to simple all-out acceptance. For the vast range of information we gain from testimony, were it to fail significantly more often, we either could do with a lot less of it or we could still secure enough of it as we need with qualified, rather than all-out, acceptance.

The DR is not the weakest principle that might be formulated as governing conversational acceptance. Rather than holding that testimony transmits warrant or justification, a weaker claim is that it yields to the hearer only some (pro tanto) epistemic reason to believe the speaker's assertion (Pritchard, 2004, Graham, 2006). But this weaker version of the DR, or ones like it, would yield only entitlement to qualified, not all-out, acceptance. The result is weaker than the practice reveals as expressed in the Uniformity claim — hearers come to believe the speaker's assertion, without qualification.

The DR is a default rule because it sanctions a procedure to go forward — acceptance or belief — in the absence of a reason to object, rather than requiring a positive reason to so proceed (see Bach 1984; for evidence that acceptance or belief is psychologically prior to evaluation as a hypothesis, see Gilbert 1991, 1993). For example, when you save a document on your computer, and you do not specify a drive to save it on, your computer saves it (by default) to the drive you are working on. A default rule effects great economies because it relieves those it governs of the need to enter a command or to engage in a search for how the procedure should continue. If the DR governs testimony, it relieves hearers of the burden of articulating grounds to accept, or of seeking grounds not to accept, the speaker's assertion.

If testimony does follow the DR, it has parallels with perception and memory. Nonetheless, even if all of these sources of belief are reliable, for an obvious candidate to defend them as defaults, testimony suffers a special vulnerability in our free will (Graham 2004). Testimony, unlike perception, is a product of a communicative-intention that is not lawlike, under the relevant intentional description. Still, our free will is compatible with conformity to regularities and action in accord with rational motives, and so free will is compatible with the reliability of testimony.

To treat acceptance of testimony as a default sharpens the Vulnerability problem: The DR dictates that we, as hearers, just accept the speaker's word without a duty to examine it critically. The DR is only overruled if the hearer has a special ground to object. But hearers are under no duty to search for such grounds. Still, with experience and learning, our application of the DR will be fine-tuned, so that further distinctions are drawn between those who should be default-trusted and those who should not, e.g., the proverbial used car salesmen. We become more sensitive to the kind of testimonial content, like opinions, that should not be default-accepted.

By reference to the DR, let's restate the fundamental epistemological problem of testimony and related ones:

  1. Does the DR express conditions under which the hearer's corresponding speaker-based beliefs are justified, given the hearer's vulnerability to a speaker's deception, error, or misstatement?
  2. Is the DR to be established a priori or a posteriori?
  3. Does the DR express conditions under which a speaker's knowing or justifiably believing what he asserts transfers to the hearer?
  4. Does the DR characterize our conversational practice, and if so, does that lend it support? To what extent is our conformity to the DR real compliance? For, as noted above, hearers can display acceptance and not challenge a speaker, while not truly accepting his word in the privacy of their mind.Does our endorsement of the DR depend on a duty of fair play to respect the norms of the conversational practice, since one voluntarily participates in it for one's benefit?

I'll shorten the remaining questions by assuming that the DR, or something close to it, is correct. If it is not, a number of these questions are void or require evident emendation.

  1. What is the basis for the trust that the DR implies that the hearer should extend to the hearer?
  2. Is the DR's justification one in which the speaker's asserting that p is evidence for p's truth or does the speaker's standing behind his assertion provide a distinctive kind of epistemic support for it? Can it be both?
  3. What is the relevance to the DR of the possibility of speaker insincerity, dishonesty or error? Are these genuine epistemic possibilities that must be ruled out or are they defeasibility conditions that only exclude knowledge if actual or true? If the former, what implications does that have for epistemic closure conditions on knowledge as applied to testimony—specifically, does the hearer's knowing that p via the speaker's assertion of it require that the hearer knows that the speaker is not lying? If so, is that requirement satisfied in the normal conditions of the DR?
  4. Does the DR parallel similar default rules for other basic processes of belief formation like perception or memory? Do those default rules depend for epistemic warrant on the reliability or track records of the respective processes? Whereas perception or memory is a lawlike process, testimony is not. Testimony involves agents with free will, whose assertions are the product of communicative-intentions. Does this difference establish a disanalogy that renders the DR comparatively weaker?
  5. What is the import for justifying either the DR or testimony as a reliable source, that testimonial chains must eventuate in someone who knows that p via a non-testimonial source (e.g., perception), but not conversely? Specifically, is the warrant for testimonial acceptance reducible to the warrant for inferring from the information from these other sources in testimony to the truth or to the likely truth of a particular instance? Does testimonial warrant involve a sui generis warrant?
  6. What is the relation between the speaker's properly asserting that p and both the truth of p and the speaker's knowing or justifiably believing it? How does this relation bear on the epistemic grounding of the DR?
  7. If much of our knowledge arises out of testimony via the DR, is our knowledge socially dependent and fragile because it depends upon trust and truthfulness in others? Is such knowledge no better than second-best, since the beliefs derived from testimony are not checked and endorsed by the one who so comes to believe?
  8. If the DR holds in part because of its value for cognitive economy, as is standardly true for default rules, does that provide for, or detract from, its conferring of epistemic warrant? Does it provide a practical reason to believe, and can such a practical reason serve as an epistemic reason, as well?
  9. Does our extensive epistemic dependence on testimony show that traditional epistemology has ignored, and at times denied, our social and ethical dependencies in inquiry and knowing?
  10. How significant a role does the DR play in the epistemic or cognitive division of labor i.e. that knowers in an epistemic community, paradigmatically, a scientific community, extensively rely on one another for information that they could not readily acquire themselves?

The discussion below accords most prominence to questions 1,2,3,7,8, 9, and 10; less to 4,5,6, and least to 11–14.

3. Assertion as a Tool for Epistemology

The speech-act of testimony is a speaker's sincerely saying, uttering, telling, or asserting something to some audience (Searle 1969). For a speaker S to assert that p, where p is a declarative sentence, is for S to present p to a hearer H as true:

The utterance of a sentence serves not only to express a thought, and to refer to a truth-value, but also to assert something, namely that the thought expressed is true, or that the truth-value referred to is truth. (Dummett 1981, 298)

The “normal conditions” clause in the DR leaves open whether the conditions for assertion are sufficient for this purpose or whether further conditions, e.g. the seriousness of the conversational context, are needed. Standard assertion is not epistemically qualified or ‘guarded’ assertion e.g., I am pretty (very) sure that p.(Toulmin 1958, 85) It is the expression of all-out (or full) belief, rather than partial, or degrees of, belief.

Asserting is to be contrasted with asking a question (why is it the case that p?) or entering p as a supposition (“suppose [assume] that p.”). Unlike these speech-acts, in assertion, S's presumed intention is to be informative to H, in part because he is in a better (epistemic) position than H to know whether p. On a communication-intention view (Grice 1989), an assertion is an utterance of a sentence with a certain overt intention of getting the hearer to think “that the speaker has a certain belief” and, for that reason, to come to the corresponding belief himself (Strawson 1971, 181).

In assertion, the speaker extends an invitation to the hearer (to understand him). To use Kant's example: If I start to pack my suitcase in front of you, and I have no plan to leave then I intentionally deceive you by giving you evidence that I plan to leave. But that you take notice of what I am doing is your responsibility, I do not invite you to notice. By contrast, if I said to you either “I am leaving town” (a lie) or “Don't get worried if you do not find me here tomorrow” (an intentional deception), I do invite you to understand me and, as a result, believe me. Thereby, I assume special responsibility for the truth and veracity of my utterance (Thomson 1990).

Since assertion claims the truth of what is asserted and since truth is the aim of central epistemic concepts like knowledge, justification, reliability, or warrant, assertion and testimony offer a methodological resource for epistemology. In this section, I indicate how assertion, as the fundamental speech-act of testimony, provides insights into a number of epistemological issues.

We are all extremely competent and familiar with the practice of assertion, a practice that we depend on, as hearers, for increasing and improving our beliefs. Since belief guides action and assertion issues in the hearer's belief, we will not tolerate lax conditions on assertion. However, since we are in great need for information from others, we will not be so demanding (“Cartesian”) that in order to avoid error, we refuse to take any risks of misinformation to gain informative truths.

Our confidence in the conversational practice is evident from cases in which we come to a testimonial setting holding a contrary belief to a speaker. For the core cases in null settings, hearers' beliefs alter to accord with a speaker's contrary assertions. Even if I believe that the name of the person I am about to meet at a party is ‘Fred’, if he introduces himself as ‘Sam’, I not only cease to believe that his name is ‘Fred’, I acquire the contrary belief that his name is ‘Sam’. Merely my holding a contrary belief does not count as a special reason to object. Despite the banality of such cases, they do present a hurdle for claims that beliefs are self-protective, ‘blinding’ us to contrary information.

In asserting, speakers represent their assertions as relevant and informative to the hearer. For the epistemological problems of testimony these representation are of far less significance than that the assertion is true and believed by the speaker for good reason of its truth, not only because of the centrality of truth. Speakers can, of course, be irrelevant or uninformative. But these will normally be immediately detected by the hearer, unlike deception or errors, since the irrelevance and uninformativeness will be to his assumed or avowed interests and inquiries.

Assertion can play a basic methodological role in epistemology only if its claim to truth is abstracted from some normal conversational expectations or ‘maxims’ (Grice, 1989). But the conversational expectations and implications drawn from it also depend on presumptions that the speaker will be informative, relevant, orderly, polite, and brief. We need to distinguish whether a claim is true from whether it is appropriate to say, where the latter is affected by these conversational presumptions and expectations to the extent that these are not epistemic reasons. So, for an familiar application, the fact that no one would say “I know there is an earth,” in normal contexts, does not imply that it is not known that there is an earth. The former is not asserted because it would be uninformative, not because it is untrue.

What is the presumption that hearers make about the speaker's epistemic relation to what is asserted that is sufficient for acceptance? A major thesis about the epistemics of assertion put forth by Unger (1975) and developed by Williamson (1996, 2000) and others (McDowell 1980, Brandom 1994, Williams 2002) answers question 10. In one version, the thesis is:

Unger-Williamson (U-W): One properly asserts that p only if one knows that p.

If this thesis is correct, it lends support to the view that testimony can transmit knowledge. When a speaker who knows that p asserts it, and the hearer accepts it accordingly, the speaker transmits his knowledge to the hearer, which would explain the great value to us of testimony. It enormously extends our collection of worthwhile truths (Craig 1990, Welbourne 1993, Reynolds 2002).

If the U-W thesis holds, it helps to answer an objection to the DR as our norm. The objection is that were you to ask people directly whether they follow or endorse the DR as stated, many would deny it, treating it as a recipe for credulity. But the U-W thesis does seem right as descriptive of the conditions we presume as hearer in accepting testimony (that the speaker does know what he asserts). Yet, if people are asked straight off whether they endorse the U-W thesis as stated, with the word ‘know’ in it, many will deny it as much too strong.

A crucial argument for the U-W thesis is via a version of Moore's Paradox (Hintikka 1962, Green and Williams 2007). Moore's Paradox is that assertions of the following form are heard as contradictory, although the contained sentences are consistent:

(1) p, but I do not believe that p.

e.g., It's raining, but I do not believe that it's raining. It is controversial how far Moore's Paradoxical sentences reach, whether a paradox arises with other propositional attitudes and how firm is the data of hearing it as contradictory. We do initially hear the following as contradictory, though it is acceptable, often true e.g. I'm joking, but I'm dead serious about it.

As with (1), we hear as contradictory assertion of instances of the following variant of (1):

(2) p, but I do not know that p.

Since the explanation of Moore's Paradox begins with the claim that asserting is the expression of , or implies, belief, then, by parity of reasoning, asserting implies knowledge (of what is asserted).

Now there are a number examples that appear not to fit the U-W thesis e.g.,

(3) You'll lose. [said to someone who just purchased a ticket in a fair lottery].

(4) The Yankees will win this year's pennant race.

These are unremarkable assertions, yet neither of which even appears backed by the speaker's knowledge. Let's set aside the danger of the speaker misleading the hearer to suggest that he has special knowledge of the outcomes, as if they were fixed. Still, even when the speaker's assertion is straightforward and sincere, the threat to the U-W thesis is disarmed if hearers do not really accept them unqualified. Since it is mutual knowledge that fair lotteries are matters of chance, where each ticket has an equal probability of selection, and that honest sports contests cannot be known in advance, it is plausible that conversational participants cooperate to allow speakers to abbreviate their assertions by removing the qualification e.g., “It is almost certain that…” Given that cooperation is based on mutual knowledge and that it yields the clear benefit of economy, the use of the abbreviated forms will not cause misunderstanding. For a supportive illustration, selected because of its direct bearing on the claim that the standard way to express one's belief that p is just to assert that p, observe that if one asserts a sentence of the form

I believe that p (e.g., Jones is in the office)

it is taken to convey that the speaker has less than full or all-out belief that p (e.g., I'm pretty sure that Jones is in the office). The longer, burdensome, form is understood as saying something other than what it strictly reports and other than what we typically convey via the unqualified assertion. (For appeal to examples like (3) and (4) to oppose the U-W thesis on conversational, Gricean, grounds, Weiner 2005.)

If testimony does transmit knowledge, are the conditions for the closure of knowledge satisfied? Knowledge is epistemically closed if whenever S knows both that p and that p implies q, then S knows that q. If H comes to know that p through S's testimony and H knows that if S lied in asserting p, then p is false, must H know that S did not lie? If so, and knowledge is often transmitted, roughly in accord with the Uniformity claim, how does H rule out that S lied, since the assumption is that H knows nothing specific about S? If, instead, H cannot in null settings rule out S's lying and if closure implies that S did not lie, then a non-skeptical view of testimony must deny epistemic closure as a condition on knowledge (Dretske 1970, Nozick 1981). But an epistemic closure condition is a simple and highly credible condition on knowledge, since the implication of knowledge, as the primary factive, is truth and the entailment involved, which is recognized by the agent, guarantees the transmission of truth.

If assertion is proper only if one knows and our intuitive responses to the propriety of assertion reflects this norm, then support for contextualism can be garnered from our conversational practices (Lewis 1983, 1996, Unger 1984, Cohen 1988, DeRose 1995). Contextualism holds that attributions of knowledge of the form “S knows that p” vary according to contextual standards, where these standards are affected by the introduction of uneliminated possibilities of error or altered costs of error. The contextualist draws on the variability of our willingness to assert or to provide testimony: If you ask me whether my son's friend Tom is a good kid, I easily answer “Yes”, based on my casual knowledge of him. But when I am asked this same question, when an issue of illegal drugs sold to teenagers in the neighborhood is involved, I refrain from the same assertion, which the contextualist takes to indicate that the standards for knowledge are raised.

Another central epistemological problem is the infinite regress problem. One premise of the regress problem is that every belief must be justified. The other key premise is that beliefs that confer justification are themselves justified and that they are distinct from the ones upon which they confer justification. These conditions threaten a regress of justifying beliefs in any putative case of justification, for which the skeptic concludes that no belief is ever justified.

Yet, the regress problem does not have a grip on conversation, even though for the hearer to accept the speaker's assertion is for him to take it that the speaker is justified in believing it, and that the reasons that constitute that justification do not, circularly, involve that very belief. Why is there no regress? We are called on to justify a belief only through a legitimate challenge “How do you know that p?” The presupposition of this question as a challenge by the hearer is that the hearer has a ground to question the speaker's assertion or his position to know, since that presupposition itself amounts to an assertion. So challenges themselves carry a burden of legitimation, which blocks this regress route to skepticism. Challenges to an assertion will be limited to when hearers have genuine grounds to doubt. The limit lessens the demands on speakers to present reasons or to engage in justification, in accord with the DR. If this default-challenge structure can be defended as epistemic, not merely practical or pragmatic, it provides a model for answering the regress problem that is committed to none of the standard alternatives: skepticism, foundationalism, coherentism. (Rorty 1978, Williams 1991, Brandom 1994)

One influence on the appeal to conversational or testimonial practice to challenge the regress argument is the views of Wittgenstein particularly in On Certainty (1969). The Wittgensteinian view is that the regress is ended by ‘groundless’ beliefs, which are not themselves justified by other beliefs, but nor are they in need of justification. Wittgenstein is generally taken as rejecting the very attempt to justify the possibility of knowledge altogether as a way to answer the skeptic.

An application of the Wittgensteinian approach to historical knowledge as testimonially based is offered by Anscombe (1981). She argues that our knowledge of history, though it depends on a chain of testimony, does not eventuate in, or only in, the direct testimony of the senses, as proposed by Hume (1978 Book I part III section IV). Rather, there will be certain historical truths like that Caesar was assassinated that serve as Wittgensteinian ‘hinge’ or groundless propositions which are “exempt from doubt” (OC 341), at least within certain historical inquiries. They provide the basis for confirming the historical chain's accuracy, rather than conversely (Coady 1992, Traiger, 1993, Elgin 2002b).

A final application to epistemology of the assertion practice is to the Lottery and Preface Paradoxes, as dependent on a conjunction principle:

If Acc(p1), Acc(p2)…..Acc(pn), then Acc(p1&….&pn).

The analogue of this conjunction principle for probability is unacceptable, since even if the probability of each of a large number of propositions is very high, their conjunction is bound to be much lower. However, if acceptance is detachment from one's evidence and probability assignments, to the all-out affirmation of the proposition as true, the acceptance principle does seem to correspond to a conjunction principle for assertion:

There is no significant contrast between a conjunction of assertions and an assertion of a conjunction. (Dummett 1981, 336)

The basic claim of assertion is to the unqualified truth of the proposition asserted. The conjunction of assertions — the assertion of each — is true just when is their conjunction.

If, though, the conjunction principle is maintained, a simple solution to these paradoxes is surrendered. However, another solution surfaces. According to the epistemics of assertion, you cannot assert with a single ticket for a fair lottery “I will lose with ticket287.” (DeRose 1996, Nelkin 2000, Douven 2003) By parity, for no single ticket is there acceptance that one will lose with it. The worry over conjoining them does not arise. Analogously, one may take it to be overwhelmingly probable that there is an error in one's corpus of belief or one's (non-fiction) book, as in the Preface Paradox, without all-out believing or asserting that there is, which, were it asserted without qualification, would imply a complex form of Moore's Paradox (Adler 2002).

4. Transmitting Knowledge

The backing of assertion by knowledge, in accord with the U-W thesis, suggests a simple model of the sufficiency of knowledge transmission, something like:

If S knows that p and S asserts that p to H, and H accepts p on the basis of S's testimony, then H knows that p. (Hintikka 1962, Welbourne 1979, 1981, 1993, Evans 1982, Ross 1986, Adler 1996, Audi 1997)

If speakers do generally satisfy the antecedent, the model supports the DR, since in accepting the speaker's assertion, the hearer will come to the corresponding knowledge. Testimony as a prime means to transmit or preserve knowledge is similar to memory. The knowledge that either one transmits or preserves is derived from other sources of belief like perception (Dummett, 1994).

A number of examples, deriving from the ‘Gettier literature’, raise problems for this and similar models, specifically, that for a hearer to come to know via testimony, he must know that the speaker is reliable. Consider a variant of a well known example. Jones asks a stranger in Manhattan for directions to the Brooklyn Botanic Gardens, and the stranger answer's “Take the #2 to Eastern Parkway”. Even though the stranger knows this, does Jones, if he picks out the stranger by accident from a group of strangers, most of whom happen not to be reliable? Jones does not know that the speaker is reliable because it is accidental that Jones picked out a reliable speaker. Does Jones's lack of knowledge of the speaker's reliability, undermine Jones's knowing based on the stranger's testimony? A reason to answer ‘No’ is that the question is whether Jones comes to know the directions, not whether the speaker is reliable. Since the speaker does know the directions, why should not Jones come to know from the speaker's testimony? Various ways of handling these and related problems pull defenders of the simple model toward introducing some, if not all, of the complexities of resolutions of “Gettier problems”, including conditions both of stability on the environment and of the hearer, as appropriately credulous and well functioning (Plantinga 1993).

Perhaps, though, the starting assumption of the model that knowledge by the speaker is necessary for transmission of knowledge to the hearer can be abandoned. The proposal is that a speaker's asserting that p can be sufficient to generate knowledge for a hearer, in the absence of defeaters, even if the speaker lacks knowledge (Lackey 1999, 2003, Graham 2000c). In support of this proposal is a case of a student who would, it is held, know that p (e.g. that he lives on Elm St.) except that he suffers certain rarified doubts (e.g. radical skeptical worries as to whether he might be dreaming). The doubts, it is assumed, are incompatible with belief. Since belief is a condition for knowledge, the doubts undermine knowledge. Yet, the student's assertion (or testimony) as to where he lives is sufficient for a hearer, who lacks these doubts, to know.

Examples like this are problematic, however, since if the student lacks knowledge, then, in asserting, he violates the U-W thesis. Another problem is that in asserting that he is in the classroom without mentioning his radical skeptical doubts, the student is either not honest or, more plausibly, he finds something ‘fishy’ about these doubts, which corresponds to our normal dismissal of radical skeptical worries, as not credible. In the former case, the conditions of proper assertion are, again, not met. Of course, the student does engage in a speech-act that appears to be an assertion. But, if the U-W thesis holds, there will be something of a pretense to it, akin to making a promise, when one is in doubt as to whether one can fulfill it. In the latter, and more plausible, (‘fishy’)case, the student does know, so the example does not support knowledge acquisition by testimony when the speaker lacks knowledge. The radical skeptical doubts are not of a type to genuinely undermine belief or knowledge—skeptical worries do not constitute genuine undermining evidence, even if the speaker (momentarily) thinks otherwise. Assertion remains appropriate and knowledge is transmitted to, not generated for, the hearer.

A number of these Gettier-type cases that motivate transmission principles and problems with them, are addressed by an alternative information theoretic version:

If S's assertion that p to H carries the information that p, and H accepts that p on the basis of S's testimony, then H knows that p. (Dretske 1981, Graham 2000a, 2000c)

The carrying of information is a matter of lawlike relations between a signal and a source. The signal cannot carry the information that p, unless p, and thus information meets the factivity implication of knowledge (that if S knows that p then p). Like knowledge as well, whether the signal carries the information that p can depend on what are the relevant alternatives. In Harman's (1973) Newspaper Case, a reliable newspaper reports its knowledge of a certain political event to H, a reader. But other of H's reliable, local newspapers erroneously, but sincerely, report differently. The claim is that these other sources bar the transmission of H's newspaper's knowledge to H, since H could easily have read one of the other ones, and so the information would not be transmitted. (Even if H would not easily have read these other newspapers, he still implicitly claims or presumes their corroboration.)

Further perplexities for a transmission condition are introduced by an example of Dretske's (1982) of a connoisseur, who can well discern Medoc wines, which he knows to be from Bordeaux. However, he falsely believes that Chiantis are also from Bordeaux, although he can readily distinguish a Medoc from a Chianti. He tells a novice truly that the wine that they are now drinking, which is a Medoc, is a Bordeaux. Dretske claims that whereas the connoisseur knows that the wine is from Bordeaux, the novice does not. The connoisseur passes on his vulnerabilities to the knowledge-seeker, though he, the connoisseur, is himself immunized from them. Dretske concludes

You cannot learn that P from someone who tells you that P if they would say that P whether or not P, and that holds even if the person happens to know that P. (Dretske 1982, 110)

Dretske's argument assumes a subjunctive analysis of knowledge, and that the connoisseur's vulnerabilities undermine only the novice's knowing, not his own (Coady 1992, ch.12). If these assumptions are accepted, the simple model is in trouble, as Dretske concludes, whereas the prospects for the informational one are brighter, since the expert's testimony at best “carries the information that the wine was a Bordeaux or a Chianti” (Graham 2000a; my emphasis).

5. Reductionism and its Critics

If hearers are epistemically entitled to accept the speaker's assertion in core cases and in null settings, as the DR holds, is the right conferred a priori or a posteriori? This question has been the center of discussion, though its presuppositions have been questioned (Kusch 2002 part I).

The view that our ordinary acceptance of testimony is justified only a posteriori has been referred to as the “reductionist thesis” for implying that testimony, unlike perception, is not a fundamental source of warrant. The acceptance of testimony resides in other familiar sources of justification, notably perception, memory, and induction (Hume 1978 Bk I part III section IV). The anti-reductionist admits that testimony depends on other sources like perception, and not conversely. The dependence, he claims, is only psychological—one perceives testimony by hearing. But the epistemic warrant or justification for accepting testimony need not essentially appeal to these other sources. It may refer only to the speaker's knowledge, his word-giving, and other principles that are purely testimonial (see Audi 1997; related claims are made by Coady 1992, for criticisms, Fricker 1995, Graham 2000b).

On an anti-reductionist view, the basic principle is something like the DR. A reductionist, by contrast, endorses basic principles like the following:

If a hearer comes to believe a speaker's testimony in normal ways based on the speaker's so testifying and the hearer's background and current evidence, then the hearer is epistemically entitled to believe it.

The anti-reductionist moves from an antecedent specifying a certain natural position or relation to a normative consequent. The reductionist requires a normative condition in the antecedent (“based on”), although this may take the form of the DR on a normative reading of “normal conditions”. Strictly, the reductionism and anti-reductionism need not be incompatible. The same testimonial transmission can be justified either way, so that justification can be overdetermined, meeting both inferential and non-inferential conditions (Graham, 2006). We will assume that they are incompatible, which is how they are generally presented, with each explicitly denying that at the foundations there is need or room for the other.

Hume is taken as the main proponent of reductionism, due largely to the views he expresses in “Of Miracles”, an essay directed to the warrant for accepting testimony of miracles. (On testimony for the supernatural, see Coady 1994.) Key statements are these:

our assurance in any argument of this kind [from testimony] is derived from no other principle than our observation of the veracity of human testimony, and of the usual conformity of facts to the reports of witnesses. (Hume 1977 74)
The reason, why we place any credit in witnesses and historians, is not derived from any connexion, which we perceive a priori, between testimony and reality, but because we are accustomed to find a conformity between them. (Hume 1977 75)

On the usual readings of these passages, each instance of testimonial transmission is justified only by an implicit record of the agent's ratio of past testimonial success or that of the type of testimony or the type of agent. (For discussion of Hume's views on testimony wary of the usual readings, see Traiger 1993; Faulkner 1998.) If so, a Humean view would be in opposition to the DR, which is the basis for the standard contrast to a “Reidian” view:

Reid's position is that any assertion is creditworthy until shown otherwise; whereas Hume implies that specific evidence for its reliability is needed. (Stevenson 1993, 433, Wolterstorff 2001, Audi 2006)

The Reidian account of testimonial trust is that since God intended us to be ‘social creatures’, he implanted in us “a propensity to speak the truth” (the principle of veracity), as well as, correspondingly “a disposition to confide in the veracity of others, and to believe what they tell us.” (The principle of credulity) (Reid 1983 94–95).

The Reidian-Humean contrast needs tempering, however, if the usual way to obtain specific evidence is by checking on the reliability and sincerity of a speaker. For then testimony would not be feasible as a regular habit or practice, clearly violating the Infeasibility of Checking claim. Testimony would not conform to the Far-reaching Dependence thesis, which Hume endorses. Unless Hume is terribly confused, there must be ways to have evidence favoring the acceptance of testimony that does not involve burdensome checks on the credentials of particular speakers (section 6).

If the transmission of beliefs through testimony is as common and successful as Hume affirms, then, an objection to Humean reductionism is that any attempt to justify testimony through an inductive inference will inevitably be circular, since among the justificatory grounds will almost certainly be grounds obtained through testimony (Coady 1992 ). This criticism assumes that to justify reliance on testimony overall or in a particular case, bars appeal to evidence of past testimonial success. The latter is thought tainted, since itself derived from testimony, even if not the current testimony. But it is not evident that this assumption is correct, or that the restriction would not equally exclude justification of perception (by its ‘track record’) (Alston 1993).

A related objection is that the reductionist view is not empirically feasible:

In our ordinary dealings with others we gather information without this concern for inferring the acceptability of communications from premises about honesty, reliability, probability, etc. of our communicants. I ring up the telephone company on being unable to locate my bill and am told by an anonymous voice that it comes to $165 and is due on 15 June. No thought of determining the veracity and reliability of the witness occurs to me nor…does the balancing of probabilities figure in my acceptance. (Coady 1992 143; for similar concerns, Audi 1997)

This criticism is, though, subject to objections that it conflates the epistemic and the psychological (Burge 1997). Schiffer objects along these lines:

Whether knowing p is based on knowing q, isn't about the actual movement of thought, the considerations one actually ponders; it's about the structure of beliefs that sustain one's conclusion. (Schiffer 2003 303; Fricker 1995)

If the automaticity of our response to testimony is not decisive for whether the epistemic basis is a priori, innate, or empirical, then, similarly, the Uniformity claim, as confirming our conformity to the DR, is not evidence that our trust in speakers is ‘blind’. Hearers may be very sensitive to when speakers are unreliable or insincere. But this sensitivity is only occasionally displayed, since speakers' testimony is by and large correct, at least in core cases.

Another difficulty alleged against the Humean is that his denial of any a priori connection “between testimony and reality” implies that

we might have discovered (though in fact we did not) that there was no conformity at all between testimony and reality. (Coady 1992 85)

If Hume does allow for this discovery, it would be difficult to understand how the practice of testimony persists so robustly, since the failings would undermine trust. But the result also suggests that Hume need not allow for the possibility (Lyons 1997, Schmitt 1994). The demand to empirically justify reliance on testimony does not entail that there are not necessary conditions, like a minimal correspondence between what is asserted and what is the case, that must be satisfied for the practice to be sustained. There is no a priori connection between private swimming pools and wealth. Yet, a high level of wealth may be a major necessary condition for the continued construction of private swimming pools.

Still, if Hume allows for the possibility of a world in which testimony and reality are discovered not to match, a further, related, difficulty is held to arise:

whenever they [the ‘Martians’] construct sentences addressed to each other in the absence (from their vicinity) of the things designated by the names, but when they are, as we should think, in a position to report, then they seem to say what we (more synopticallly placed) can observe to be false. But in such a situation what reason would there be for believing that they even had the practice of reporting? (Coady 1992, 85).

These various objections culminate in an argument that the Humean position lapses into incoherence. Meaning or content, as well as language learning, are claimed to be impossible absent an a priori connection of testimony and truth. For if we are constantly frustrated in checking the truth of our attempts to translate native utterances, we thereby undermine our claim to understand, or even to attribute content, to them (Coady 1992 93–97, Ch.9; for criticisms Graham 2000b).

The argument, broadly understood, is derived from Davidson, who holds that it is a conceptual truth that a language is only possible where most of what is believed is true. Davidson's argument concludes that a principle of charity is necessary in interpreting the assertions of others. The Principle of Charity, which assumes that interpretation is holistic, requires that we attribute rationality to speakers in interpreting them. The Principle of Charity implies that the speaker's beliefs are predominantly like our own, and, more disputably, that they are predominantly true (Davidson 1984).

However, even if these Davidsonian claims hold, there is a barrier to transferring them to testimony. The vast, shared collection of beliefs that, in Davidson's words, are “too dull, trite, or familiar to stand notice,” dwarfs by comparison the set of beliefs likely to be expressed in testimony, since the latter are presented only on the presumption of their informativeness to hearers. But if testimony is informative, the assertions are among the riskier constituents of our vast background of ‘dull’ beliefs. Consequently, they are lesser candidates for Davidson's a priori interpretational justification. Among the beliefs a priori guaranteed of truth by the Davidson-type reasoning would be ones like there is an earth, 2+2=4, bacteria do not study physics. Except under unusual circumstances, these are not the kind of beliefs that it would be informative to assert (see Adler 1994, Fricker 1995, Elgin 2002a; for broader doubts about a Davidsonian approach, Ebbs 2002).

Nevertheless, the Davidsonian view can still play a prominent role in a coherence type justification of testimony. The more informative beliefs that are expressed in assertion are required to cohere with our vast background of shared beliefs if they are to achieve the minimal credibility or plausibility requisite for hearers to accept them. If Davidson is right, this coherence requirement sets a high epistemic bar, though such a requirement is not unique to anti-reductionism.

In this section, we have focused mainly on attempts at a priori refutations of reductionism. But we have not yet provided detailed models of reductionism, which we do in the next two sections.

6. Background Conditions on Testimony

One starting point for anti-reductionism is that hearers enter null (testimonial) settings without, by hypothesis, evidence specific to that setting. It does not follow, however, that they lack any evidence or epistemic reasons to accept the speaker's (stranger's) word. As discussed subsequently, the evidence will be background evidence, widely shared and easily known, much of it deriving from the background conditions of our testimonial practice (Adler 1994, 2002, Faulkner 2000, 2002, Siegel 2005). Consequently, the reductionist can urge that these extensive conditions provide sufficient reasons to accept testimony in null settings, and even to comply with the DR.

These conditions include:

  1. The predominance of truthful testimony. Overwhelmingly in core cases (and well beyond) testimony transmits truth (non-accidentally). It is highly reliable.

However, it has been observed that false testimony is frequent and unsurprising (Fricker 1994, McDowell 1994). The observation seems a challenge to the Uniformity claim as supportive of the DR. But its significance is subject to exaggeration due to a reference class illusion, particularly as applied to the core cases. We expect correct testimony, and so it is hardly noticed. We are much more attentive to, and we recall much better, erroneous testimony. The illusion arises if the frequency of erroneous testimony alleged is due to comparisons mainly with cases that one recalls. But the relevant reference class is the actual, and huge, totality of testimony in core cases. By comparison with that class the proportion of cases in which testimony fails is, if the Uniformity claim holds, very small.

If, within the appropriate reference class, error and deceit are relatively rare and unusual, their possibility are not likely to constitute a defeater of knowledge in themselves, where knowledge requires that defeaters be ruled out by specific evidence of their absence. If the frequency of error or deceit by speakers is very low that is a strong indicator that when they do occur it is noise or interference with the testimonial process. The extreme reliability of testimony still allows for normalcy conditions under which speakers assert that p only if p.

  1. Truthfulness as the norm. Truthfulness is a presupposition of the practice of linguistic communication (Lewis 1969, 1983, Schiffer 1972). Truthfulness governs conversational exchange, allowing assertion to serve its function. Defection from it can come only in small doses, since otherwise it would undermine the trust that the defector (‘free rider’) requires. Lying and deceiving (evasion, misleading) are typically much more troublesome and riskier than simple honesty. Ordinary decency is something we reasonably presume in myriad, everyday social interactions.

As discussed further in section 7.4 below, the testimonial practice promises everyone great epistemic benefits, as is obvious to all. Given general conformity to truthfulness and accuracy, the testimonial practice will extend the reach of one's corpus of belief, far beyond one's individual resources. The cooperation that is powerfully motivated by this promise also helps to explain the next two conditions.

  1. Reputation and Sanctions. The demand for truthfulness is sufficiently strong that those who are the victims of false testimony, whether through error or deception, are likely to withdraw trust. The loss of trust will spread, though in large communities the spread from any particular defective exchange is very limited. But in settings where speakers can be so marked, as in institutional structures, this is a forceful constraint. (“Gossip” columnists probably would not keep their jobs, if the readily verified portions of their reports were not accurate in the main.) Even in impersonal settings, substantial defections are likely to spread rapidly, undermining the practice that ‘free riders’ try to exploit.

Although the Vulnerability problem has been most provocatively pressed about science, the constraint of reputation is particularly forceful in it. Professional science is intensely competitive, findings are published and widely disseminated. Discovering errors in others' work is a source of publication; the more notable the claims, the more the glory. Of course, intense competition also motivates defection — cheating, misleading reports, hasty publication. Although the system will expose blunt plagiarism, subtler ways of securing undeserved credit, as with deviousness in assigning lead authors in multiply authored papers, are not at issue, since these do not introduce false or unreliable data. The strength of easily applied restraints like replication, publicity, and peer review is attested to by how rare and limited are major defections. (On peer review, see Shatz 2004.) One overview concludes, “No reliable data exist on the incidence of scientific misconduct, but it is likely that the serious form of it — fabrication and falsification of data — is rare” (Kevles 1996, 109).

  1. The nature of our informants. Our informants (us) depend for their beliefs mainly upon reliable sources such as perception, memory, simple reasoning, and testimony. We share fundamental values, especially honesty and concern for others. In the case of testimony, these values are easily picked up because of the obvious advantage of receiving accurate information.

It is only very occasionally that lying is well motivated. In the absence of that motivation, Burge observes that: "Lying for the fun of it is a form of craziness." (1993: 474) Our overwhelming evidence, as Hume emphasizes, is that persons act from regular and rational motives. Dishonest testimony, well beyond the core cases, is unlikely, since the speaker rarely stands to gain from it.

  1. Prior Plausibility. To be default-accepted, the content of testimony must have a high degree of prior plausibility. Hearers' beliefs, which ground these plausibility assessments, apply automatically, effortlessly filtering out grossly implausible assertions e.g., “Its snowing on Miami Beach.” For an assertion to lack prior plausibility is for the hearer to have a special reason, in accord with the DR, to object (not to accept it).

Were an assertion low in prior plausibility, the hearer is reluctant simply to accept it. Since speakers know this, it will be pointless for them to assert what manifestly lacks plausibility. Consequently, the simple assertions we mainly hear are heavily pre-selected. (Prior plausibility plays a crucial role in the corroboration of testimony—the conditions under which agreement of independent witnesses raises the probability conferred on what each one testifies to individually. A theorem on corroboration is proven by Cohen (1977, 1982); and it is critically discussed by Olsson (2002) and Bovens, (2002). However, as noted earlier, I do not cover this work, given the narrow construal of testimony here. For although corroboration greatly increases the probability that what is testified to is true, it does not do so through the speakers' word alone, but to the antecedent improbability of the convergence.)

Prior-plausibility judgments are at the heart of Hume's argument against acceptance of reports of miracles, as expounded in "Of Miracles.” Hume famously concluded:

The plain consequence is … ‘That no testimony is sufficient to establish a miracle, unless the testimony be of such a kind, that its falsehood would be more miraculous, than the fact, which it endeavors to establish … ’ (Hume 1977: 77)

Specifically, a miracle would imply a violation of a law of nature. But if we know the law, we know in advance that a law of nature is accepted only on the basis of enormous evidence; so the testimony for the miracle begins with extremely low prior plausibility. It is far lower than the “the extraordinary and the marvellous”, which are not merely improbable, like winning a lottery, but in conflict with what else one believes (e.g., to receive testimony that in 1996 a wind on Santa Monica beach blew the sand to form the inscription ‘Happy Birthday Nadine’.)

To review: Condition 1 is that testimony is predominantly successful in fulfilling its claim to truth. Conditions 2–5 explain why that success is unsurprising, and why the conversational or testimonial practice is robustly maintained despite wide variation in circumstances. Conditions 2–5 can serve as reasons because even if they are not available to individuals for articulation, they shape our testimonial practices—our ease of acceptance or not — from within our corpus of beliefs. Our automatic assessment of an assertion for prior plausibility is an assessment by prior beliefs functioning as reasons e.g., I have good reason not to accept a testimonial report of an alien spacecraft landing in Central Park, even if I cannot cite any defect in the observation reported.

7. Other A Posteriori (Reductionist) Approaches

Appeal to the background conditions of the testimonial practice lends itself to the development of a number of approaches to the a posteriori justification of testimony with varying implications for reductionism. The simple, enumerative, inductive account attributed to Hume's in ‘On Miracles’ is only one kind of a posteriori position (Lyons 1997, Rysiew 2000). Specifically, some a posteriori or reductive approaches are opposed to the DR and others are neutral or supportive of it. The latter is far more effective dialectically, since one of the anti-reductionist's chief claims is that the DR does rightly govern our practice and that it cannot be justified on reductionist grounds. Unless otherwise stated, there is no assumption that these approaches are exclusive of one another, and in obvious ways a number of them are, in fact, complimentary.

7.1 Background Beliefs as Evidence

The prior plausibility constraint is one of coherence with our beliefs. In the core cases, an evident presumption is that fellow speakers are competent and that they have no reason to deceive. More generally, the background conditions, enumerated above, as incorporated into our corpus of belief, constitute a vast background of evidence for us as to the reliability of testimony. For this reason, it is difficult to secure a realistic grip for an internalist-externalist gap between whether the epistemic relevance of a reliable source of belief is available to the agent or not. Conditions 1–5 are apparent to us and the very success of the practice depends upon our appreciation of that success, as motivating our own cooperation (though see Pritchard 2004).

From our earliest years, we acquire knowledge of the trustworthiness of testimony in the core cases and beyond, as well as knowledge of domains in which the word of others is not to be default-accepted (e.g., opinions on controversial topics). Recent empirical work shows that young children do trust testimony. However, the trust is selective enough to raise doubts about Reidian views of children as highly credulous (Harris 2002). Inculcation into the practice involves an inheritance of knowledge of the successful workings of the practice, as well as in the fine tuning of its contours. Specifically, we learn whom not to trust. Much of the information in core cases we are easily able to verify through engaging in the corresponding actions or through the corroborative or dissenting testimony of others. Since these verifications will obtain in diverse settings — different informants under different conditions — there is confirmation of the reliability of testimony and of the trustworthiness of informants overall. As noted earlier, testimonial practice works very largely under conditions that risk detection of error or falsification. If testimony often transmitted falsehoods, it would be noticed and communicated, even if, under this supposition, less assuredly. Our reliance would be less uniform.

Even though the knowledge that subtly guides our patterns of acceptance of testimony is obtained prior to the testimonial setting, it is clearly not knowledge a priori— knowledge not dependent on experience. The background conditions are conditions that we learn of, as we are inculcated in the practice. The appeal to background beliefs to justify our testimonial practice or the DR is at variance with the accusation that an empirical or a posteriori approach demands that “we should remain neutral or skeptical of information unless we have empirical grounds for thinking it trustworthy…” (Burge 1993 473)

The appeal to our background beliefs as evidence can serve to justify the acceptance of testimony or conformity to the DR. The charge that an empirical view fails the Infeasibility of Checking claim is nullified if the evidence to accept a speaker's word is already with us as competent hearers, calling upon no special checking. Along these lines are resources to object to those who have used the Far- reaching Dependence claim to press the Vulnerability problem. The charge is that our knowledge rests on a fragile, ethical, basis e.g.,

the trustworthiness of members of epistemic communities is the ultimate foundation for much of our knowledge. (Hardwig 1991: 694, Webb 1993, Govier 1993, Baier 1994, Holton 1994, Shapin 1994)

In opposition to this fragility claim, we enter testimonial settings with background beliefs that amount to powerful evidence to trust the word of the speaker, though it need not be evidence specific to that setting, prominently, that this particular speaker is trustworthy.(Adler 1994, 2002)

7.2 A Minimal Reductionist Position

Elizabeth Fricker (1987, 1994, 1995, 2004, 2006) argues for a reductionist and internalist justification for particular (local) testimonial exchanges, in which testimony is taken as inferential or indirect, by contrast to perception which she takes as providing a direct justification for corresponding beliefs. She is skeptical of a global reductionist thesis to establish the general reliability of testimony. With qualifications, Fricker denies that we are entitled to default-accept the reliability of testimony, although she does think a default applies to judging the sincerity of the speaker. She regards any rule like the DR as “an epistemic charter for the gullible and undiscriminating.”(1994 126) Fricker claims that hearers can obtain independent evidence to confirm the belief that a speaker is trustworthy. She stresses that “insincerity and honest error are both perfectly possible”:

a hearer should always engage in some assessment of the speaker for trustworthiness. To believe what is asserted without doing so is to believe blindly, uncritically. This is gullibility. (145)

Later, explicitly contrasting her view with an analogue of the DR [the PR thesis], she writes that

My account requires a hearer always to take a critical stance to the speaker, to assess her for trustworthiness;…on my account, but not on the PR thesis, the hearer must always be monitoring the speaker critically. (1994 154, 1995)

However, if the critical monitoring required is only the ‘counterfactual sensitivity’ that “if there were any signs of untrustworthiness, she would pick them up” (154, 1995, Weiner 2003), so that no special efforts are required of hearers, her differences with those who uphold the DR or a minimal anti-reductionist thesis seems to vanish. If, instead, special efforts are required by the hearer, and if our actual practice is in accord with the DR and the Uniformity claim, it is doubtful whether her proposal meets the Infeasibility of Checking claim. (A difficulty that applies as well to contextualist approaches like that of Jones 1999 or Kusch 2002.)

7.3 Inferential Structure 1: A Bayesian Analysis

The role of prior plausibility or probability at the heart of a Humean view of testimony can be turned into a Bayesian justification of testimony. Based on Friedman's (1987) analysis for legal settings, Goldman (1999 4.2–4.4) presents the following model: Given that a witness testifies to a fact X, what is the probability of X? The answer, given by Bayes' Theorem, is that it is a function of the likelihood that the witness would so testify, if the fact X held, and the prior probability of that fact. If the likelihood of the testimony is greater given X than not, then testimony raises the probability of X compared to its original or prior probability. As is typical of Bayesian analyses, a key question is how individuals are to estimate the various likelihoods and to secure the prior probabilities. (Friedman 1987, Goldman 1999)

Also along Bayesian lines, Goldman (1999) applies a related theorem of his and Shaked (1991) to testimony. The theorem establishes that under certain conditions (e.g., that there is an objective likelihood that the witness will testify that p, if p) one's posterior degree of belief will reflect an objectively greater nearness to truth than one's prior degree of belief.

7.4 Inferential Structure 2: Inference to the Best Explanation

If testimony is based on enumerative induction, it requires verification of the assertions that hearers' accept. These verifications will themselves appeal to testimony for corroboration. Even if this kind of circularity is acceptable, the correlations alone do not seem strong enough to justify our conformity to the DR and to the Uniformity claim. But instead of relying just on extrapolation from the correlations, inductive inference can take the form of inferring to the best explanation of why testimonial transmission works as well as it does.

Inference to the best explanation (IBE) is particularly powerful in science as justifying inferences from observational surprises or puzzles to the existence of theoretical entities to explain them e.g., to explain why ice floats on water by appeal to atomic bonding. The role of IBE in testimony is straightforward. Normally, if a stranger responds to your inquiry as to how to get to New York University by uttering “Take the downtown A or E train to West 4th”, the best explanation of why he said that is that he believed it and that he cared to inform you of it. The inference is mutually supportive of the counterfactual we assume as hearers:

S wouldn't have asserted that p to us unless she believed she knew p and she wouldn't have that belief if p weren't the case. (Harman 1965, Fricker, 1995, Lipton 1998, Schiffer 2003)

If IBE provides sufficient reason to accept the speaker's testimony, it may be argued to obviate the need for the DR. The hearer treats the stranger's uttering what he did as evidence of what he believes or what he believes that he knows. The inference involves no explicitly normative notion, yet it yields the same pattern of virtually automatic acceptance of testimony in normal settings. I will refer to the appeal to IBE as providing a non-normative a posteriori justification for testimony as the “IBE view”.

Is the IBE view sufficient to meet the Uniformity claim—that hearers overwhelmingly accept testimony? If we rely on IBE alone, then natural individual differences, particularly in willingness to trust speakers in various settings, should result in much more diversity in our response to testimony than accords with the Uniformity claim. A plausible reply: The variation is absent because IBE goes so smoothly, at least in the core cases, that all individual and circumstantial variations are swamped by the solidity of the inference.

Yet, underlying this ‘best explanation’ are deeper ones for why hearers readily apply IBE. The best explanation of why instances of testimonial transmission lend themselves to the above IBE is that the conversational practice is governed by the background conditions and constraints discussed above section 6, which do affirm, and depend upon, various normative relations.

Typically, when we infer abductively to a hypothesis as most plausible to explain some observations, we are not then in a position to accept that hypothesis as true, rather than as only worth further testing. Only with subsequent confirmation from those tests are we positioned to accept it. If testimony diminished in reliability—if there were more lies and errors, though still far from a dominant-–it may still be that the best explanation of why a speaker said what he did remains as above: that he believed it because it is true. If a stranger gives me directions to take the A or E train downtown, and I recall hearing that there was smoke reported on a subway line in the area, then, even if my memory is vague, I still have a specific reason to object, and so I am entitled to challenge the stranger. Nevertheless, I do not thereby doubt that the best explanation of why he said what he did goes according to the above IBE, I, as hearer, require not just that claim as the best explanation, but that it is the actual one. (See Lipton 2004 on the difference between inference to the loveliest and inference to the likeliest hypothesis.)

8. A Priori Defenses of the DR and Other Oppositions to Reductionism

Coady's critique of reductionism and his Davidsonian a priori defense of it is only one of a number of forceful anti-reductionist approaches to explaining the warrant for testimony.

8.1 A Priori Entitlement

In a foundational article on the subject, Burge (1993; 1997) offers an a priori defense of a variant of the DR. His “Acceptance Principle” is a fallible, easily defeasible norm which only describes our epistemic condition. Its pivotal epistemic term is entitlement, which he contrasts to justification,

A person is entitled to accept as true something that is presented as true and that is intelligible to him unless there are stronger reasons not to do so. (1993, 467)

The “Acceptance Principle” is comparable to Davidson's (1984) “Principle of Charity” and Grice's (1989) “Cooperative Principle” in endorsing the hearer's starting point for comprehension as favorable to the speaker's assertions, or corresponding beliefs, as correct. The hearer does not begin in the neutral position of treating the speaker's assertion, and his asserting it, as requiring evaluative certification as a condition on its acceptance. The entitlement is conferred on the hearer by the nature of the testimonial setting, it applies independent of whether the hearer has either any epistemic reasons to trust the speaker or sensitivity to the trustworthiness and reliability of the speaker.

The argument disassociates the Acceptance Principle from essential, epistemic, dependence on perception or memory. These only serve as sources to preserve content (Burge 1997, 28; responding to criticisms of Christensen and Kornblith 1997; for other criticisms, Audi 2004). Burge summarizes his argument as follows:

We are apriori entitled to accept something that is prima facie intelligible and presented as true. For prima facie intelligible propositional contents prima facie presented as true bear an apriori prima facie conceptual relation to a rational source of true presentations-as-true: Intelligible propositional expressions presuppose rational abilities and entitlement; so intelligible presentations-as-true come prima facie backed by a rational source or resource of reason; and both the content of intelligible propositional presentations-as-true and the prima facie rationality of their source indicate a prima facie source of truth. Intelligible affirmation is the face of reason; reason is a guide to truth. We are apriori prima facie entitled to take intelligible affirmation at face value. (Burge 1993: 472–473)

Burge's reasoning applies beyond testimony, as becomes clear in responding to an objection to his argument. The objection is that if the intelligibility of the speaker's affirmation depends upon the structure of the communication mechanism, and if that mechanism is inferential, then an empirical, non-purely preservative mechanism, would be required for understanding, contrary to Burge's claim of an a priori entitlement (Bezuidenhout 1998). However, since even if the hearer directly or non-inferentially grasps the speaker's meaning, the epistemological question — of what entitles or justifies belief — remains open, the actual nature of intentional-communicative understanding can be abstracted from for epistemological purposes. If, as a matter of fact or idealization, the intelligibility of the speaker's contribution is not dependent on the specifics of the comprehension process — if the a priori entitlement resides in the speaker's reason — Burge's argument should reach beyond testimony to beliefs generally, since it is beliefs themselves which are affirmed and which purport to respond to reason.

Even if, though, the scope of Burge's argument is as far-reaching as just proposed, the entitlement it confers is extremely modest. The entitlement conferred by Burge's Acceptance Principle requires "empirical supplementation" to meet the usual run of specific counter-considerations. (Burge 1997, 23) Without empirical supplementation, normally highly implausible possibilities of error become undermining reasons. A stranger gives me directions. Assume that the salient reference class to which he belongs is of informants with a distinctive trait, who gave me bad directions previously (e.g., those who spoke with a New York accent). If I cannot isolate that failing and show its irrelevance to the present case, then my belief that the stranger is a member of that reference class is enough to override, or to defeat, my entitlement. Against the background of our common, however, empirical knowledge, which Burge's entitlement cannot draw upon, this possibility is not a serious one.

Burge's argument begins with a contrast between justification and entitlement. Justification calls for the articulation of one's reasons. These reasons must be accessible to conscious understanding. This demanding notion of justification explains why Burge thinks that the positive-bias or default proposal can be defended only on a priori grounds. Presumably, Burge takes us not to have access to background knowledge of empirical reliability, since we can not uniformly articulate that knowledge in defense. But must the reductionist or the epistemic internalist endorse the articulation and accessibility requirement, which assumes that nothing can be a reason for an agent that is not available to his present conscious self ?

8.2 Self-Trust

Our cognitive or epistemic activities have (Reidian) presuppositions not only of trust in perception or memory, but of oneself (Lehrer 1997). From this presupposition of self-trust a parity or consistency argument can be developed to trust the word of others (Gibbard 1990 Ch.9, Foley 1994, 2001 part 2). For if we trust our own beliefs, as we do, we ought to trust the beliefs of others, since we rely on others for our own opinions and

it is reasonable for me to think that my intellectual faculties and my intellectual environment are broadly similar to theirs. (Foley 1994, 63)

As stated, this argument contains a posteriori inputs, specifically in the “similarity” claim. It also assumes that our dependence on the testimony of others for our own opinions is extensive. However, as we noted earlier, although our reliance on others is extensive in the origination of our beliefs, the reliance greatly decreases for the sustaining of those beliefs, since over time those beliefs are subject to confirmation from other sources.

The parity argument from self-trust also requires the assumption that our trust in ourselves and others is similarly grounded. However, when I trust my own beliefs and their sources, my trust is first-personally compelled. I cannot think “p, but maybe I should not trust myself or my sources in believing that p.” But there is no such compulsion from my point of view to regard the beliefs of someone else as rightly based. I can believe that you believe p, while I do not. If so, the parity argument must show that the conditions that verify that I do correctly trust myself are just conditions on my cognitive mechanisms. The argument would now invoke the similarity of those mechanisms across the human community to reach its conclusion. (For critical examination of the parity argument, Schmitt 2002; for further issues of self-trust in relation to testimony, Jones 2002.)

8.3 Moral Groundings for the Epistemics of Testimony: The Assurance View.

The “Assurance View” (Ross 1986; Moran 2005) claims that a speaker's assertion is not evidence for what he believes or the truth of what he asserts, as the IBE and other reductive, and even some non-reductive, views hold. (See further Sosa's 1994 distinction between accepting a report and making use of it.) The hearer's entitlement to belief resides in the speaker's standing behind his word, giving his assurance, in accord with the speaker's communicative-intention for the hearer to come to the belief via recognizing the speaker's intention. Testimony as evidential gets to the truth of the assertion by way of what the speaker believes and an assumption of his reliability in acquiring and maintaining that belief. But if the hearer could get directly to that belief, there is no further epistemic force to testimony. On the Assurance View, there is: The speaker freely takes responsibility for the truth of his assertion. What is distinctive of testimony on the Assurance View is that

when the hearer believes the speaker, he not only believes what is said but does so on the basis of taking the speaker's word for it. (Moran 2005, 2)

This normal situation is epistemically different from one in which the hearer does acquire the intended belief, however

the hearer might not believe the speaker at all, taking him to be a con man, but yet believe that what he has said is in fact true. (Moran 2005, 2)

Some hold that the requisite assurance is sufficiently binding that the speaker's assertion to a hearer, under standard conditions, amounts to the speaker's giving his word to the hearer. If the content of the assertion is about a speaker's future action, it amounts to a promise (see Thomson 1990, Elgin 2001; for a critical comparison of promising and asserting, see Watson 2004). To trust a speaker is to confer authority on him and it implies that, within limits, counter-evidence to what he asserts is dismissed, not weighed in (Welbourne 1979, 1981, 1993). If I believe that the #4 train stops at Eastern Parkway, and I trust a stranger, who tells me that it does not, then I accept his assertion, dismissing my prior, contrary belief.

The Assurance View draws on Grice's (1989) distinction between natural and non-natural meaning in his article “Meaning”. A photograph of a man and a woman together is evidence for their meeting, regardless of the intentions of the photographer or the presenter of the photograph. By contrast, a drawing of the two persons has the non-natural meaning of their illicit meeting, dependent on the intentions of the artists. This non-natural meaning is what a speaker's communicative intentions confers on his assertion. The speaker cannot first-personally view his assertion merely as evidence for its truth, since he must take his assertion as up to him (voluntary) and as expressing his belief, rather than serving as an indicator of the existence of a state of affairs, which is its truth condition. On the Assurance View, what gives the speaker's intention as the reason to believe his words “independent epistemic value”

can only be…the speaker's there and then explicitly presenting his utterance as a reason to believe, with this presentation being accomplished in the very act of assertion. The epistemic value of his words is something publicly conferred on them by the speaker, by presenting his utterance as an assertion… (Moran, 2005 15 )

On the Assurance view, the speaker constitutes his utterance as a reason for belief, whereas when presenting evidence, its epistemic import is independent of the presenter.

Because the speaker stands behind his words and invites the hearer to understand him, the hearer is entitled to hold the speaker to his words. Someone who overhears a conversation cannot complain should the speaker's assertion turn out false. (Hinchman 2005 develops a distinction between telling someone and asserting, where the latter alone is appropriate to a bystander.) The moral bond between speaker and hearer is incorporated into the DR, which is directed to the hearer to whom the speaker addresses his assertion. Does—can — this moral difference make an epistemic difference? The overhearer has no such social-ethical duty to the speaker, and the speaker feels no ethical obligation of veracity toward the overhearer. Yet the overhearer has, it would seem, the same evidence as the hearer. So if the epistemic reasons for acceptance are exhausted by this evidence, the social and ethical bonds between speaker and hearer do not seem to yield any independent epistemic weight. (Defenders of the Assurance view need not claim otherwise.) The result is troubling. That the moral bond of speaker and hearer would not provide any independent epistemic weight, as just indicated, seems right, since the bond does not affect the likelihood of truth of what the speaker asserts. Still, the moral bond imposes a constraint or bind on the hearer, but not the overhearer, which is a pressure toward acceptance, and acceptance is an epistemic judgment.

8.4 Rationality and Game-Theory

Since testimony or conversation constitutes a practice, not institutionally mandated or explicitly taught, which promises enormous benefits only if participants predominantly provide good information, an argument from rationality is waiting in which a cooperative arrangement coordinates our speech activities involving a mutual commitment to reliability and truthfulness. However, I will hardly venture into this topic since it would take us far afield, on topics covered elsewhere.

Although a game-theoretic understanding of testimony should be a component of any answer to the Vulnerability problem, there are no detailed proposals, as far as I know, that extend to the epistemic issues of testimony such as whether a game-theoretic approach can exclude all genuine possibilities of false testimony. Without empirical grounding, it is not likely that rationality could provide sufficient constraints to establish the conditions for warrant or knowledge transfer, beyond what has already been suggested (e.g., the assumption that in a null setting there is no incentive for a speaker to lie or deceive). For these reasons, I'll only briefly survey some suggestive proposals.

Grice's intention-based account of non-natural meaning, referred to in the previous section, is the background for analyses of linguistic conventions, and language meaning, more generally, as solutions to coordination problems (Lewis 1969, 1983, Schiffer 1972). Conventions require common or mutual knowledge–very roughly, each participant knows that each knows — that others, who are party to the convention, take themselves to have reasons to continue to conform to it. Consequently, if the conventions underlying language include truthfulness, hearers have forceful epistemic reason to believe the speaker's testimony.

In his account of conversational reasoning, Grice offered the ‘rationalist’ prospect that the conversational practice should be thought of

not merely as something that all or most do in fact follow but as something that it is reasonable for us to follow, that we should not abandon. For a time, I was attracted by the idea that observance of the Cooperative Principle and the maxims, in a talk exchange, could be thought of as a quasi-contractual matter, with parallels outside the realm of discourse…talk exchanges seemed to me to exhibit, characteristically, certain features that jointly distinguish cooperative transactions. (1989, 29; Grandy and Warner 1989)

The proposal is plausible from the viewpoint of our adherence to the DR, since the DR is not explicitly taught or promulgated, and defection from it can easily go undetected. If the Uniformity Claim, as support for our compliance with the DR, does accurately describe our practice, it seems that it must appear to us as manifestly rational. So even though hearers alone directly benefit from speakers' testimony, speakers are disposed to provide honest testimony. (However, speculation on the evolution of communication is that the practice arose from benefits to the speaker in manipulating the beliefs of the hearer; see Sperber 2001.)

In the cases where there is incentive to defect, the evident benefits of cooperation suggest a repeated Prisoner's Dilemma setting, where the strategy of Tit-for-Tat — cooperate to start, and then mimic the other player — scores better overall in a large number of simulated environments than any other strategy. (On Tit-for-Tat, Axelrod 1984. For a debate over applications to testimony of an approximation to Tit-for-Tat, Blais 1987, 1990; Woods 1989. For a game theoretical approach to the pragmatics of linguistic communication Parikh 2001.) Additional to its overt features of cooperativeness, the Tit-for-Tat strategy is not a ‘sucker’, it will retaliate, and it does not hold a grudge, after punishing a defector by defecting, Tit-for-Tat is immediately willing to resume cooperation.

Tit-for-Tat is successful also because those who play it are readily recognized by others as doing so, thereby inviting them to adopt that strategy as well. The invitation accords with basic communicative intentions that one's intention be overt. Still, in normal testimonial settings, it is not easy to recognize who is playing Tit-for-Tat—is a current ‘defection’ by a speaker a reprisal for a previous defection by another or simply that the speaker is not playing Tit-for-Tat?

The cooperative arrangement that would accord with the testimonial practice would be among very many persons, which allow for a problem of free riders—those who seek their greatest individual reward by defection because they think that the cooperative arrangement is robust and that they will not get caught, as long as their defection stays hidden or too costly to police. A standard example of a free rider problem is a water conservation effort, where some use much more than their fair share, but they are very unlikely to be found out, unless many others start to free ride as well. But, in typical, and certainly core, cases of testimony we observed earlier that there is simply no benefit to defection (e.g. deliberate misinformation) to motivate free riding.

Among further disanalogies between testimonial settings and those paradigmatic for Tit-for-Tat to arise is that motivation for defection is not as salient for ordinary testimony as in repeated Prisoner's Dilemmas, as noted already. Defection in testimony has a diffuse impact, since the participants in continued interactions are less definite, rather than being attached to the specific defector, who can be ‘punished’ in turn. Defection in testimony can also be less decisively pinned to a speaker if he misleads, rather than outright lies.

Cooperation can arise through Tit-for-Tat not through the development of trust, but through the perceived benefits of maintaining the cooperative arrangement. As already noted, a stronger grounding in trustworthiness seems necessary to sustain the transmission of justification, warrant, or knowledge in testimony. A stronger ground is realized in game-theoretic arguments in ethics that dispositions to trustworthiness and rule-following will emerge from Prisoner's Dilemma-like settings (Gauthier 1986, McClennan 1990)

9. Autonomy, Social Epistemology and the Problem of ‘Informational Cascades’

Until very recently, the study of testimony has not featured prominently in epistemology as a topic in its own right. Is this because of a bias toward an individualist epistemology, rather than a social one, or is it just academic happenstance? Individualists' claim that testimony is an inferior source of knowledge because the hearer believes without his own autonomous judgment of its truth. Reductionism is generally identified with an individualistic epistemology for maintaining that testimonial knowledge rests upon non-social sources e.g. perception, memory, inductive reasoning. As reductionism has been presented here, however, it is not restricted to evidential sources for testimony that are either non-social or inferior. For one thing, testimonial inferences can appeal to other testimony as evidence. But if an individualist epistemology does have those restrictions, testimony is held to fail a ‘litmus’ test for an adequate epistemology (Schmitt 1994, 4).

Testimonial knowledge is highly and noticeably fallible and overtly social. The alleged neglect of testimony in epistemology has been taken as the result of the dominant influence of epistemologies that are infallibilist and individualist, as well as of the ignoring of certain related topics, especially trust, as central to knowledge and inquiry. (Hardwig, 1985, 1991, Welbourne, 1981, 1993 Schmitt 1987, 1994, Baier 1993 Webb 1993, Goldman 1999, Jones 1999, 2002, Fricker 1999, 2006; Faulkner 2000, Kusch 2002) One hypothesis to explain the neglect within the tradition of epistemology is just that testimony will at best, on that view, transmit knowledge, rather than playing a role in its discovery or generation, a hypothesis denied by anti-reductionists and others (Lipton 1998 ; Kusch 2002)

A strong claim of a social epistemology is that an individual cannot be said to know, via testimony, that p, unless p is known in the community (Welbourne 1993, Brandom 1994, Faulkner 2002). Because testimony depends upon the judgements and interpretations of speakers, as well as being subject to their deceptions or distortions, it appears to lack the guarantee of knowledge. But this appearance itself owes something to the association of knowledge with certainty, an association broken by, for one, the U-W thesis that the common speech-act of assertion requires backing by knowledge.

An apparent individualist tradition broached in Plato's Theaetetus is that the ideal for knowledge is that of the autonomous knower determining or judging the truth for himself without dependence on others. (For historical background, see Coady 1992, part II.) The dependence on others, unlike the dependence on perception, filters one's information through another interpretive creature with his own biases, fallibility, and orientation. It is second best at best. In a section of the Theaetetus arguing that true judgment and knowledge are different, Socrates argues

Then suppose a jury has been justly persuaded of some matter which only an eye-witness could know, and which cannot otherwise be known; suppose they come to their decision upon hearsay, forming a true judgment: then they have decided the case without knowledge, but, granted they did their job well, being correctly persuaded? (Plato 1992, 201b-c)

More pointedly, Locke:

we may as rationally hope to see with other men's eyes as to know by other men's understanding…The floating of other men's opinions in our brains makes us not one jot the more knowledge, though they happen to be true. What in them was science is in us but opiniatrety. (Locke 1961, 58)

Although these quotations capture the worry of an epistemic inferiority to learning of an event from another, the epistemologies that Plato and Locke are working with do not align with contemporary views e.g., in the contrast of belief (or opinion) and knowledge. In the example from Plato, there are suggestions that the testifiers are “orators and lawyers” who are skilled at persuasion, rather than a core case of transmitting information by a stranger. The passage also indicates that there are tight time constraints in informing others about complex matters (“what happened to people who have been robbed or assaulted”201a-b) Similarly, there are passages that indicate that Locke's disfavor with the value of testimony was limited to judgements outside the secure and pedestrian domains, our core cases (e.g., Locke 1961: Bk 4 ch.16 sec8–9).

Were an ideal agent construed as a perfectly autonomous agent, one whose beliefs did not depend upon testimonial transmission, he would know very little. Any realistic epistemology must be naturalistic at least to this extent: it must admit that individuals are tightly constrained in inquiry by limits on time and resources. The individualism-autonomy ideal only appears plausible if we ignore our limitations and our need to economize. If we do not ignore it, it will appear irrational, since unfeasible, for us not to exploit a division of epistemic labor (Putnam 1975, Kitcher 1993 ) Think about how you determine from the vast information available on virtually any significant topic that you want to understand better, what sources to examine and which to avoid. For a more subtle and controversial application: when a speaker transmits his knowledge that p to a hearer, the hearer may be held to have borrowed the speaker's reasons for p, even if he does not know their content (Owens 2000).

On some views, our limits are incorporated into the epistemic grounding of testimony, the DR specifically. The incorporation would be problematic if the need to economize is meant to serve as a reason to justify a particular act of acceptance, in a position akin to that of evidence. But it can serve other — second-order — roles in epistemic grounding. In particular, it legitimizes the very acceptance of testimony, which ends search or inquiry well before all possible evidence is examined or absolute certainty is reached.

Our earlier example of a distant acquaintance telling you his name, shows why it is hardly believeable that any epistemic autonomy or individualist thesis extends to such simple or core cases. In that example, I not only ceased believing that the person's name is ‘Fred’, but I revised my belief in accord with his testimony that his name is ‘Sam’. But this situation is so ordinary and common as to constitute a counter-example too obvious for any serious defender of an autonomy thesis to ignore. The worries over autonomy are forceful in cases in which there is reason not to fully trust the judgments of others e.g., self-help testimony on the best methods for attracting someone romantically. In many common core cases, however, it is evident that others, either singly or as a group, are bound to be more reliable than oneself and to report accurately.

As just noted, our enormous dependence on the testimony of others, as the Far-reaching Dependence thesis holds, pays off only if the relevant social community functions well in regards to communication. Even as children, we learn of problems for those good workings, when we play the game ‘telephone,’ where a message started by one student is passed around one-by-one until it reaches the last student. Despite the request that students try to accurately repeat the message, inevitably, when the last student speaks his words, they are very different from the original message. A more obvious and contemporary worry for obtaining good information from others is the Internet, where immense amounts of useful information is readily available. But in getting to it one has to carefully navigate through loads of bad information, just as rapidly accessed (“googled”).

Social science and cognitive psychology teach us of a number of characteristic infirmities of social groups that undermine the transmission of good information, and here I want to briefly discuss only one — rumors. A well known example is the rumor that Eskimos had twenty-four words for snow, which had been offered as evidence for the thesis that language determines thought. The linguist Geoffrey Pullum (1989) exposed this rumor as a hoax. However, it was widely believed and transmitted. What does this tell us about the epistemics of testimony—about its basic reliability?

One account of how such rumors achieve lift-off is as social ‘cascades’, specifically ‘informational cascades’. (For discussion and extensive references, see Sunstein 2003.) Informational cascades are social phenomena. A new idea arises in a group such as of a ‘hot’ stock. It spreads rapidly because of our deference to others, fundamental to social epistemologies. The rumor is also spread by an assumption that the convergence is not feeding on itself, but that it arises from a good deal of independent corroborating sources. The Eskimo rumor gained momentum from these assumptions as well as that the ultimate source was scientific authority.

Nothing in the assertion that ‘The Eskimos have twenty four words for snow’ seems to mark it as controversial or in other ways to distinguish it from lots of run of the mill good testimony. Although not a banal core case, suspicion of it as problematic on its surface would likely demand a far reaching skepticism, if generalized, especially in view of its presumed scientific heritage. While informational cascades, and the rumors that they can generate, do present a problem for testimonial optimism, one ground of that optimism remains firm. Such cases still amount to a small portion of overall testimony, dominated as it is by the core cases. This disparity narrows, but does not eliminate, the epistemological problem. It is not likely that many of us can develop a discriminatory capacity that is fine tuned enough to put us on guard for rumors, as we are for, say, new car deals, without overreaching.

Studies on informational cascades intersect with those on ‘groupthink’ (Janis 1972) to tell us that it takes very few, sometimes only one, respected investigator to expose a rumor. Since investigators, in particularly, academics, are highly motivated by professional incentives and competition to try to be the first to puncture a popular rumor, we can expect over time that lots, if not most, rumors that reach the public level will be uncovered. This is precisely the outcome for the Eskimo ‘snow’ hoax. Does the difference between a pessimistic short run and an optimistic long run expectation about the exposure of a rumor favor one epistemic view of testimony over others? Can this future-oriented confidence about any particular rumor, even if not about the occurrence of rumors themselves, filter back to the justification or warrant for believing it? Can an individual garner reasons for current acceptance of a testimonial transmission by deference to the division of epistemic labor, and, specifically, to future investigators, who work in the specific area of the rumor?

10. Omissions

Among a number of topics or questions that this contribution does not treat, three stand out. First, within specialized domains of knowledge, what is the nature of, and basis for, the authority ascribed to expert testimony, as contrasted to that of lay persons? (Is it appropriate to ascribe authority or expertise in valuative domains like ethics and aesthetics?) Second, a dominant tradition holds that the justification of moral and political principles rest on their autonomous selection by those whom they are meant to govern. Important work on the pragmatics of communication in relation to democratic judgments, especially by Habermas (1996), has proposed conditions of openness and equality under which the conversational setting is optimal for a consensus that constitutes and expresses good judgment. Third, the presentation of an argument is a type of testimony, where reasons or evidence are needed for purposes of persuasion. The connection between argument and epistemology is tight, since an argument aims to establish its conclusion. If successful, hearers come to know the conclusion, if they accept it based on the argument.


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