Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Sun Jun 18, 2000; substantive revision Wed Apr 4, 2007

"Contractarianism" names both a political theory of the legitimacy of political authority and a moral theory about the origin or legitimate content of moral norms. The political theory of authority claims that legitimate authority of government must derive from the consent of the governed, where the form and content of this consent derives from the idea of contract or mutual agreement. The moral theory of contractarianism claims that moral norms derive their normative force from the idea of contract or mutual agreement. Contractarians are thus skeptical of the possibility of grounding morality or political authority in either divine will or some perfectionist ideal of the nature of humanity. Social contract theorists from the history of political thought include Hobbes, Locke, Kant, and Rousseau. The most important contemporary political social contract theorist is John Rawls, who effectively resurrected social contract theory in the second half of the 20th century, along with David Gauthier, who is primarily a moral contractarian. There is no necessity for a contractarian about political theory to be a contractarian about moral theory, although most contemporary contractarians are both. It has been more recently recognized that there are two distinct strains of social contract thought, which now typically go by the names "contractarianism"and "contractualism."

Contractarianism, which stems from the Hobbesian line of social contract thought, holds that persons are primarily self-interested, and that a rational assessment of the best strategy for attaining the maximization of their self-interest will lead them to act morally (where the moral norms are determined by the maximization of joint interest) and to consent to governmental authority. Contractarianism argues that we each are motivated to accept morality, as Jan Narveson puts it, "first because we are vulnerable to the depredations of others, and second because we can all benefit from cooperation with others" (1988, 148). Contractualism, which stems from the Kantian line of social contract thought, holds that rationality requires that we respect persons, which in turn requires that moral principles be such that they can be justified to each person. Thus, individuals are not taken to be motivated by self-interest but rather by a commitment to publicly justify the standards of morality to which each will be held. Where Gauthier, Narveson, or economist James Buchanan are the paradigm Hobbesian contractarians, Rawls or Thomas Scanlon would be the paradigm Kantian contractualists. The rest of this entry will specifically pertain to the contractarian strain wherever the two diverge.

1. Fundamental Elements of Contractarianism

The social contract has two fundamental elements: a characterization of the initial situation, called variously the "state of nature" by the modern political philosophers, the "original position" by Rawls, or the "initial bargaining position" by Gauthier, and a characterization of the parties to the contract, particularly in terms of their rationality and motivation to come to agreement. The initial situation posits what in bargaining theory is called the "no agreement position," the situation to which the individuals return in case of failure to make an agreement or contract. This situation may be more or less hostile, and more or less social, depending on what the theorist sees as human nature in the absence of rules of justice. But crucial to all contractarian theories, there is some scarcity or motivation for competition in the initial situation and there is some potential for gains from social interaction and cooperation.

In contemporary normative contractarian theories, that is, theories that attempt to ground the legitimacy of government or theories that claim to derive a moral ought, the initial position represents the starting point for a fair, impartial agreement. While contractualists justify the requirement of a fair, impartial agreement by reasons external to the contract itself, contractarians hold that the success of the contract in securing cooperative interaction itself requires that the starting point and procedures be fair and impartial.

Some points of controversy among contractarians concern the role of the initial situation in the theory: is it to be considered an actual historical situation, a possible historical moment, or is the contract situation completely hypothetical? Hume (1987/1777, 470–1) raised the decisive objection to any normative moral or political theory based on a historical contract: the consent of one's ancestors do not bind oneself. But Ronald Dworkin has raised similar concerns about a hypothetical contract: a hypothetical agreement, he objects, is no agreement at all. Hypothetical contract contractarians such as Gauthier counter that the point of the contract device is not to directly bind the contractors, but rather to provide a kind of thought experiment by which to discover the requirements of practical rationality. That is, they argue that if one is rational, and among rational others in circumstances in which agreement is both possible and beneficial, then rationality requires that one abide by the terms of the contract. While mainstream contractarian theories are hypothetical contract theories, an interesting and powerfully subversive use of contractarianism (Mills,1997; Pateman, 1989 — see section on Subversion of Contractarianism below) reads the contract situation as historical agreements to erect and maintain white supremacy and patriarchy or male dominance. These latter contractarian theories are not justifications of the status quo, of course, but rather explanations and condemnations, and therefore do not face Hume's objection. Other questions that divide contemporary contractarians include: What are the ideal conditions and who are the ideal contractors that will make obligatory the outcomes of the contract for actual persons? What is the content of the hypothetical agreement?

The second element of a contractarian theory is the rationality of the contractors. First, contractarian (as opposed to contractualist) theories usually take persons to be self-interested in order to justify rules of morality or justice. This is because persons are assumed to have given preferences and interests, that do not necessarily include the well being of others, which is taken to be a moral preference and as such not prior to morality. Such preferences are called (by Gauthier, following the economist Wicksteed) "non-tuistic" preferences. Secondly, persons are presumed to want the benefits of social interaction if they can be had without sacrifice of individual self-interest. (See Feminist Perspectives on the Self (Section 1. Critique) for a critique of this conception of the rational person.) These two aspects of the contractarian individual in part imply what Rawls called the "circumstances of justice": the conditions under which rules for justice could be both possible and necessary. Justice, and so a social contract, is only possible where there is some possibility of benefit to each individual from cooperation. Social contract theories take individuals to be the best judges of their interests and the means to satisfy their desires. For this reason, there is a close connection between liberalism and contractarianism. However, that is not to say that all contractarian thought is liberal. Hobbes, for example, argued in favor of what Jean Hampton has called the "alienation contract," that is, a contract on the part of a people to alienate their rights to adjudicate their own disputes and self-defense to a sovereign, on the grounds that that was the only way to keep the peace given the nature of the alternative, which he famously characterized as life that would be "solitary, poore, nasty, brutish, and short." Thus, given a bad enough initial situation, contractarianism may lead to the legitimation of totalitarianism. Another point of criticism that arises from the characterization of the parties to the contract is that they must be able to contribute to the social product of interaction, or at least to threaten to destabilize it. This is because each individual has to be able to benefit from the inclusion of all those included. But this threatens to leave many, such as the severely disabled, outside the realm of justice, an implication that some find completely unacceptable (Kittay, 1999).

Social contract theories also require some rules to guide the formation of agreement. Since they are prior to the contract, there must be some source of prior moral norms, whether natural, rational, or conventional. The first rule that is normally prescribed is that there must be no force or fraud in the making of the agreement. No one is to be "coerced" into agreement by the threat of physical violence. The reasoning for this is quite straightforwardly prudential: if one is allowed to use violence, then there is no real difference between the "contract" arrived at and the state of nature for the threatened party, and hence no security in the agreement. However, there is a fine line between being coerced by the threat of violence to giving up one's rights and being convinced by the threat of penury to make an unfavorable agreement. For this reason contractarians like Gauthier are able to argue for a fair and impartial starting point for bargaining that will lead to secure and stable agreements. The second rule of contract is that each individual who is a legitimate party to the contract must agree to the rules of justice, which is the outcome of the contract.

2. The Metaphor of Contract

The metaphor of the social contract requires some interpretation in order to apply it to the situation of morality or politics. The interpretation can be specified by determining answers to three questions. First, what is the agreement on? Possible answers include the principles of justice (Rousseau, Rawls), the design of the basic social institutions (Rawls), the commitment to give up to a sovereign government (some or all of) one's rights (Hobbes, Locke), the adoption of a disposition to be (conventionally) moral (Gauthier, Hampton). The second question is how the agreement is to be thought of: as a hypothetical agreement? An actual historical agreement? An implicit historical situation? The third question is whether the contract device is to be used as justification or explanation. As discussed above, normative contractarianism uses the contract device primarily as justification, but it may be that Hobbes and Locke thought that there was an explanatory element to the contract device. As will be discussed below (Subversive Contractarianism), an important contemporary contractarianism uses an implicit contract to explain the origin of oppression.

3. Morals by Agreement — David Gauthier's Contractarianism

A brief sketch of an influential contractarian theory, David Gauthier's, is in order. Gauthier's project in Morals By Agreement is to employ a contractarian approach to grounding morality in rationality in order to defeat the moral skeptic. Gauthier assumes that humans can have no natural harmony of interests, and that there is much for each individual to be gained through cooperation. According to Gauthier, moral constraint on the pursuit of individual self-interest is required because cooperative activities almost inevitably involve a prisoner's dilemma: a situation in which the best individual outcomes can be had by those who cheat on the agreement while the others keep their part of the bargain. This leads to the socially and individually sub-optimal outcome wherein each can expect to be cheated by the other. But by disposing themselves to act according to the requirements of morality whenever others are also so disposed, they can gain each others' trust and cooperate successfully.

The contractarian element of the theory comes in the derivation of the moral norms. According to Gauthier, the compliance problem — the problem of justifying rational compliance with the norms that have been accepted — must always drive the justification of the initial situation and the conduct of the contracting situation. Gauthier likens the contract situation to a bargain, in which each party is trying to negotiate the moral rules that will allow them to realize optimal utility, and then he argues in favor of a bargaining solution that he calls "minimax relative concession." The idea of minimax relative concession is that each bargainer will be most concerned with the concessions that she makes from her ideal outcome relative to the concessions that others make. If she sees her concessions as reasonable relative to the others, considering that she wants to ensure as much for herself as she can while securing agreement (and thereby avoiding the zero-point: no share of the cooperative surplus) and subsequent compliance from the others, then she will agree to it. What would then be the reasonable outcome? Gauthier argues that it is the outcome that minimizes the maximum relative concessions of each party to the bargain.

Equally important to the solution as the procedure is the starting point from which the parties begin. For Gauthier there is no veil of ignorance — each party to the contract is fully informed of their personal attributes and holdings. But Gauthier argues that the initial position must have been arrived at non-coercively if compliance to the agreement is to be secured. He thus adopts what he calls the "Lockean proviso" (modeled after Locke's description of the initial situation of his social contract): that one cannot have bettered himself by worsening others. In sum, the moral norms that rational contractors will adopt (and comply with), according to Gauthier, are those norms that would be reached by the contractors beginning from a position each has attained through her own actions which have not worsened anyone else, and adopting as their principle for agreement the rule of minimax relative concession.

Gauthier concludes that contractarianism produces liberal individuals, who seem well suited to join the kind of society that Rawls envisioned. Jan Narveson, on the other hand, sees the Hobbesian contractarian argument leading toward the sparse government of libertarianism. The controversy here turns on the primary motivation for individuals to make agreements and cooperate. As we said before, there are two such motivations for the Hobbesian contractarian: fear of the depredations of others and benefits from coooperation with others. Libertarianism results when the first of these is primary, whereas when the second is primary, the kind of recriprocity and supportive government that will be discussed in the final section becomes possible.

4. Critiques of Normative Contractarianism

Many critiques have been leveled against particular contractarian theories and against contractarianism as a framework for normative thought about justice or morality. (See the entry on contemporary approaches to the social contract.) Jean Hampton criticized Hobbes in her book Hobbes and the Social Contract Tradition, in a way that has direct relevance to contemporary contractarianism. Hampton argues that the characterization of individuals in the state of nature leads to a dilemma. Hobbes' state of nature as a potential war of all against all can be generated either as a result of passions (greed and fear, in particular) or rationality (prisoner's dilemma reasoning, in which the rational players each choose to renege on agreements made with each other). But if the passions account is correct, then Hampton argues, the contractors will still be motivated by these passions after the social contract is drawn up, and so will fail to comply with it. And if the rationality account is correct, then rational actors will not comply with the social contract any more than they will cooperate with each other before it is made.

This critique has an analog for Gauthier's theory, in that Gauthier must also claim that without the contract individuals will be stuck in some socially sub-optimal situation that is bad enough to motivate them to make concessions to each other for some agreement, yet the reason for their inability to cooperate without the contract cannot continue to operate after the contract is made. Gauthier's proposed solution to this problem is to argue that individuals will choose to dispose themselves to be constrained (self-interest) maximizers rather than straightforward (self-interest) maximizers, that is, to retrain themselves not to think first of their self-interest, but rather to dispose themselves to keep their agreements, provided that they find themselves in an environment of like-minded individuals. But this solution has been found dubitable by many commentators. (See Vallentyne, 1991)

Hampton also objects to the contemporary contractarian assumption that interaction is merely instrumentally valuable. She argues that if interaction were only valuable for the fruits of cooperation that it bears for self-interested cooperators, then it would be unlikely that those cooperators could successfully solve the compliance problem. In short, they are likely not to be able to motivate morality in themselves without some natural inclination to morality. Interestingly, Hampton agrees with Gauthier that contractarianism is right to require any moral or political norms to appeal to individuals self-interest as a limitation on self-sacrifice or exploitation of any individual.

In an important article, "On Being the Object of Property," African-American law professor Patricia Williams offers a critique of the contract metaphor itself. Contracts require independent agents who are able to make and carry out promises without the aid of others. Historically, while white men have been treated as these pure wills of contract theory, Blacks and women have been treated as anti-will: dependent and irrational. Both ideals are false; whole people, she says, are dependent on other whole people. But by defining some as contractors and others as incapable of contract, whole classes of people can be excluded from the realm of justice. This point has been taken up by other critics of contractarianism, such as Eva Kittay (1999) who points out that not only are dependents such as children and disabled people left out of consideration by contractarian theories, but their caretakers' needs and interests will tend to be underestimated in the contract, as well.

5. Subversive Contractarianism

A descriptive use to which contractarianism has been put is to exploit the in-group/out-group nature of the contractarian project to illuminate the phenomenon of oppression. Carole Pateman's The Sexual Contract (1989) uses contractarian theory to argue that there has been an implicit contract among men to enforce patriarchy. She calls her approach a "conjectural history," which she uses both to illuminate the actual history of patriarchal oppression of women and the ideology of social contract theory. Similarly, Charles Mills argues in The Racial Contract (1997) that whites have had an actual, historical, sometimes explicit, though often only implicit, contract to enforce white supremacy. The arguments are similar in their contractarian outlines, though they differ in the historical and factual details. According to both theories, there are moral, political, and epistemological terms of the contract, and its effect has been to allow one group of persons effectively to dominate, subordinate, and exploit another group. The moral terms require the dominant group to evaluate the lives of their group more highly than those of the subordinated, the political to deprive the subordinate group of effective political power, and the epistemological terms require the members of the dominant group to see themselves as intellectually superior to the dominated. The social contract then can be seen as a justification by the parties to the contract of their interaction, and of their exploitation of those who are not parties to the contract, but only if the fundamental division of in-group and out-group is accepted. If the racial and sexual contracts were to be shown to be rational, they would constitute prima facie critiques of normative contractarianism, since they would then seem to justify racism and sexism.

Several of the critiques surveyed above, then, center on the questions: who is allowed to be a party to the contract, and how are those who are excluded from the contract to be treated? On the normative contractarian view, it is only rational to include all of those who can both benefit and reciprocate benefits to others. Normative contractarianism, then, on the assumption that non-whites and women can both benefit and reciprocate benefits to others, shows the sexual and racial contracts to be fundamentally irrational. Gauthier, in fact, explicitly argued that his contractarianism aids the feminist project of ending exploitative intimate relationships. Contractarian morality disapproves of relationships that are not mutually advantageous without assuming ties of affection. He writes, "sociality … becomes a source of exploitation if it induces persons to acquiesce in institutions and practices that but for their fellow-feelings would be costly to them" (1984, 11). Jean Hampton (1993) takes up this theme in her defense of what she calls feminist contractarianism, although she claims that to be feminist it must shift to the Kantian contractualist strain that begins from the assumption of the intrinsic value of persons. Ruth Sample (2002) furthers the debate over contractarianism in feminist thought, arguing against Hampton's contractualist version on grounds that contractualists beg the question of intrinsic value. Sample argues, however, that (Hobbesian) contractarianism can underwrite feminist claims about the exploitative nature of caring relationships without the intrinsic value assumption.

6. Disability, Reciprocity, and Trust

Disability rights activists, however, would still seem to have a serious complaint to lodge against normative contractarianism, since it is surely the case that there are persons who cannot reciprocate benefits to others. Such persons would be, on the normative contractarian view, beyond the scope of the rules of justice. Recent literature on disability argues that, to the contrary, contractarianism can be inclusive of the disabled. Lawrence Becker (2005) argues that in fact most disabled persons and all caregivers would be included in the bargaining group for clear strategic reasons. The basic contractarian insight that cooperation is mutually advantageous implies that whenever someone can be included as a contributing cooperator there are gains to be realized for all. Many disabled people are either already capable of contributing or could be so with accommodation or rehabilitation, and thus it is to the advantage of society to provide accommodations or rehabilitation at some level, requiring then reciprocal contributions from those thus benefitted. For those disabled persons who cannot be rehabilitated, Becker argues that contractarianism provides a different solution, namely a "mutually advantageous" social insurance scheme that offers a dignified standard of care for anyone who needs it. One might object that the currently healthy contractors would not see the need to pay premiums as high as the already disabled, since they have a lower probability of needing the care. For this insurance scheme to work (and to avoid adverse selection problems), everyone would need to agree to equal premiums without prior knowledge of their condition. But it is hard to see how a contractarian can justify this agreement. A contractualist, on the other hand, could argue that such an agreement could not be reasonably rejected. Furthermore, Becker's argument would have to show that a similar argument could not be made for any form of bad luck, on pain of this view devolving to egalitarianism.

Becker's view raises the objection that there is a level of need for rehabilitation or accommodation that goes beyond any possible future expected contribution for a given disabled person. And disabled persons are not well placed to hold out a threat to destabilize society, so the motivation to contract with them must be the expected benefit. Relying on only ideas of mutual advantage and reciprocity would continute to leave these people — the "outliers" — outside the contract, languishing below an acceptable level of functioning which they could, given another moral theory, rightfully claim. Anita Silvers and Leslie Francis (2005) advance an interpretation of contract theory that attempts to eliminate this outlier problem. They argue that contracting is not essentially adversarial. Since the benefits of mutual agreement are best achieved by "promoting stable compliance with mutual agreements," the essential element of contract is the development of trust, and the deeper and more widespread the trust, the lower the enforcement costs to contracting. Granting the importance of trust development, then, the disabled are as capable of contributing to this climate, perhaps more so because of their greater vulnerability, as the able-bodied. By this they mean that disabled persons who rely on others for care can decide to put aside fears of betrayal or neglect and remain positive and forward looking, and thereby bring about a positive affective climate in themselves and their caregivers. This affective work toward trust building becomes their contribution to the social good. Thus by focusing on the motivation of cooperation for mutual advantage rather than fear of the depredations of others, a more inclusive and positive contractarian political theory comes into view. This view depends on the assumption (similar to one made by Gauthier) that our moral psychology is such that, once we develop our disposition to cooperate, we lose the disposition to cheat on agreements we have made or harm others to satisfy our immediate self interest. As mentioned earlier, this assumption has often been questioned by critics of contractarianism.


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