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Curry's Paradox

First published Wed Jan 10, 2001; substantive revision Wed Feb 13, 2008

Curry's paradox, so named for its discoverer, namely Haskell B. Curry, is a paradox within the family of so-called paradoxes of self-reference (or paradoxes of circularity). Like the liar paradox (e.g., ‘this sentence is false’) and Russell's paradox, Curry's paradox challenges familiar naive theories, including naive truth theory (unrestricted T-schema) and naive set theory (unrestricted axiom of abstraction), respectively. If one accepts naive truth theory (or naive set theory), then Curry's paradox becomes a direct challenge to one's theory of logical implication or entailment. Unlike the liar and Russell paradoxes Curry's paradox is negation-free; it may be generated irrespective of one's theory of negation. An intuitive version of the paradox runs as follows.

Consider the following list of sentences, named ‘The List’.

  1. Tasmanian devils have strong jaws.
  2. The second sentence on The List is circular.
  3. If the third sentence on The List is true, then every sentence is true.
  4. The List comprises exactly four sentences.

Although The List itself is not paradoxical, the third sentence (a conditional) is. Is it true? Well, suppose, for conditional proof, that its antecedent is true. Then

the third sentence of The List is true

is true. Since the third sentence of The List is `If the third sentence of The List is true, then every sentence is true', substitution (of identity) yields that

If the third sentence of The List is true, then every sentence is true

is true. But, then, Modus Ponens on the above two sentences yields that

every sentence is true

is true. So, by conditional proof, we conclude that

If the third sentence of The List is true, then every sentence is true

is true. By substitution (of identity, as above), it follows that

the third sentence of The List is true

is true. But, now, by Modus Ponens on the above two sentences we get that

every sentence is true

is true. By the Release rule for truth,[1] we conclude: every sentence is true! So goes (one version of) Curry's paradox.

1. Brief History and Some Caveats

In 1942 Haskell B. Curry presented what is now called Curry's paradox. Perhaps the most intuitive version of the paradox is due to Arthur N. Prior (1955), who recast Curry's paradox as a ‘proof’ of God's existence. (Let C = ‘If C is true then God exists’.) The version presented above is (in effect) Prior's version.

There are basically two different versions of Curry's paradox, a truth-theoretic (or proof-theoretic) and a set-theoretic version; these versions will be presented below. (There is also a third one concerning properties, which may or may not be the same as the set-theoretic version; it depends on whether sets and semantical properties are the same thing. This is briefly touched on below.) For now, however, there are a few caveats that need to be issued.

Caveat 1. Löb's Paradox. Prior's version is (in effect) rehearsed by Boolos and Jeffrey (1989), where neither Prior nor Curry is given credit; rather, Boolos and Jeffrey point out the similarity of the paradox to reasoning used within the proof of Löb's Theorem; and subsequent authors, notably Barwise & Etchemendy (1984), have called the paradox Löb's paradox. While there is no doubt strong justification for the alternative name (given the similarity of Curry's paradox to the reasoning involved in proving Löb's Theorem) the paradox does appear to have been first discovered by Curry.

Caveat 2. Geometrical Curry Paradox (Jigsaw Paradox). This is not the same Curry paradox under discussion; it is a well-known paradox, due to Paul Curry, having to do with so-called geometrical dissection. (The so-called Banach-Tarski geometrical paradox is related to Paul Curry's geometrical paradox.) See Gardner 1956 and Fredrickson 1997 for full discussion of this (geometrical) Curry paradox.

2. Curry's Paradox: Truth-, Set-, and Property-Theoretic Versions

2.1 Truth-Theoretic Version

Assume that our truth predicate satisfies the following T-schema.

T-Schema: T[A]↔A,

where ‘[ ]’ is a name-forming device. Assume, too, that we have the principle called Assertion (also known as pseudo modus ponens):

Assertion: (A & (AB)) → B

(NB: We could also use the principle called Contraction: ((A→(AB))→(AB).) Curry's paradox quickly generates triviality, the case in which everything is true.

By diagonalization, self-reference or the like we can get a sentence C such that

C   =   T[C] → F,

where F is anything you like. (For effect, though, make F something obviously false.) By an instance of the T-schema (‘T[C]↔C’) we immediately get

T[C] ↔ (T[C]→F),

Again, using the same instance of the T-Schema, we can substitute C for T[C] in the above to get (1).

1. C ↔ (CF)  [by T-schema and Substitution]
2. (C & (CF)) → F  [by Assertion]
3. (C & C) → F  [by Substitution, from 2]
4. CF  [by Equivalence of C and C&C, from 3]
5. C  [by Modus Ponens, from 1 and 4]
6. F  [by Modus Ponens, from 4 and 5]

Letting F be anything entailing triviality Curry's paradox quickly 'shows' that the world is trivial!

2.2 Set-Theoretic Version

The same result ensues within naive set theory. Assume, in particular, the (unrestricted) axiom of abstraction (or comprehension):

Unrestricted Abstraction: x ∈ {y | A(y)} ↔ A(x).

Moreover, assume that our conditional, →, satisfies Contraction (as above), which permits the deduction of



ss → (ssA).

In the set-theoretic case, let C =df {x | xxF}, where F remains as you please (but something obviously false, for effect). From here we reason thus:

1. xC ↔ (xxF)  [by Naive Abstraction]
2. CC ↔ (CCF)  [by Universal Specification, from 1]
3. CC → (CCF)  [by Simplification, from 2]
4. CCF  [by Contraction, from 3]
5. CC  [by Modus Ponens, from 2 and 4]
6. F  [by Modus Ponens, from 4 and 5]

So, coupling Contraction with the naive abstraction schema yields, via Curry's paradox, triviality.

2.3 Property-Theoretic Version

On the surface, it's plausible that every meaningful predicate corresponds (or ‘expresses’, or ‘denotes’, or whathaveyou) a semantical property. In particular, for every meaningful predicate F, there is a semantical property <(y : F(y))> such that an object x exemplifies <(y : F(y))> just if F is true of x. Letting E be the exemplification relation, this unrestricted semantical property principle (USP) takes a familiar form, namely,

USP: xE<(y : F(y))> ↔ F(x).

Curry's property-theoretic paradox results from replacing ∈ (membership) with E (exemplification) in Unrestricted Abstraction (UA) and replacing the set-notation with the ‘property’ notion.[2]

3. Significance, Solutions, and Open Problems

3.1 Significance

What is the significance of Curry's paradox? The answer depends on one's approach to paradox in general. Any comprehensive theory of language has to give some sort account of the paradoxes (e.g., the liar, or Russell's, or etc.). Classical approaches tend to fiddle with the T-schema (or naive abstraction) or reject the existence of certain (paradoxical) sentences. Such classical approaches tend to respond to Curry's paradox in the same fashion — by rejecting the existence of Curry sentences or fiddling with the unrestricted T-schema (or naive abstraction). Some popular variations of these two options include Gupta-Belnap revision theory (1993), Tarski's familiar hierarchical theory (or Russellian type theory), Simmons's singularity theory (1993), Burge's indexical theory (1979), Kripke's fixed point semantics (1975), Gaifman's pointer semantics (1988), Barwise-Etchemendy situation-cum-Aczel-set-theory (1984), Glanzberg's contextual semantics (2001) and, similarly Parsons (1974), and others. (NB: These theories are quite different from each other; however, each of them fits under one of the two so-called classical options mentioned above; they either modify the naive T-schema or reject the existence of so-called strengthened liar sentences.)

Where Curry's paradox becomes especially significant is not with classical approaches but rather with certain non-classical approaches. In particular, Curry's paradox is a direct challenge to any non-classical approach that attempts to preserve one of the canvassed schemas — truth, sets, semantical properties — in unrestricted form (while nonetheless allowing Curry sentences to arise in the language).

The two most prominent non-classical approaches, at least with respect to dealing with Curry, are paraconsistent and paracomplete approaches. The former affords (negation-) inconsistent but non-trivial theories (by rejecting ‘explosion’, the rule from a sentence and its negation to an arbitrary sentence). The latter rejects ‘excluded middle’, that is, the validity of the disjunction of a sentence and its negation.[3]

In the target non-classical theories (all of which have classical logic as a proper extension), the so-called ‘material conditional’ (the ‘hook’ or ‘horseshoe’) is not a terribly adequate conditional, where the hook is a disguised disjunction, namely ¬AB. In target paracomplete theories, the hook fails to satisfy ‘Identity’ (validity of ‘if A then A’, in the hook sense of ‘if’). In the target paraconsistent theories, the hook fails to detach (fails to satisfy ‘modus ponens’). So, the target non-classical theories tend to seek out a conditional that goes beyond the hook.

To focus matters a bit more (though still keeping things slightly loose), let a suitable conditional be a conditional with the following minimal features.

  1. Identity: AA is valid.
  2. (Rule) Modus Ponens: The argument (form) from A and AB to B is valid.
  3. Curry-generating “contraction” is avoided!

There are other constraints one might impose (e.g., substitutivity of equivalents, avoidance of omega-inconsistency in arithmetic, perhaps more), but the above conditions serve as a minimal constraint on a suitable conditional.[4]

What Curry's paradox teaches us is that, regardless of their merits with respect to simple Liar-like sentences, not just any old paraconsistent or paracomplete theory will work if we're to preserve one or more of the given (unrestricted) principles. On pain of triviality, no connective in the language can satisfy contraction or absorption and support the Truth or UA or USP schemes (at least if the logic is otherwise relatively normal). Among other things, this constraint rules out quite a few popular candidates for (otherwise suitable) conditionals — including, for example, various popular relevant conditionals, including those of E and R.

In the next two subsections, I sketch two basic (in various ways related) approaches to a suitable conditional, so understood. Details and refinements (of which there are many!) are left to cited work.

3.2 A simple non-normal worlds solution

One family of approaches to a suitable conditional invokes non-normal worlds (originally introduced by Kripke for purposes of modeling modal logics for which Necessitation fails). A particularly simple approach, which suits either paraconsistent or paracomplete (or both) approaches to paradox, is due to Graham Priest (1992) and, in a slightly different form, Routley and Loparic (1973). The idea may be seen easily through its semantics, as follows.[5]

Setting negation aside (for purposes of Curry), we assume a propositional language with the following connectives: conjunction (&), disjunction (∨), and entailment (→). (For purposes of resolving Curry's paradox, negation may be set aside; however, the current semantics allow for a variety of approaches to negation, as well as quantifiers.) An interpretation is a 4-tuple, (W,N,[ ], f), where W is a non-empty set of worlds (index points), N is a non-empty subset of W, [ ] is a function from propositional parameters to the powerset of W; we may, for convenience, see the range of [ ] as comprising propositions (sets of worlds at which various sentences are true), and so call the values of [ ] propositions. We let NN be the set of so-called non-normal worlds, namely NN = WN. In turn, f is a function from (ordered) pairs of propositions to NN. Now, [ ] is extended to all sentences (A, B, …) via the following clauses:

[A&B] = [A]∩[B]

[AB] = [A]∪[B]

The value of an entailment is the union of two sets: N, the class of normal worlds where the entailment is true, and NN, the of non-normal worlds where the entailment is true. Assuming the usual S5 truth conditions, N and NN are specified thus:

N = W, if [A]⊂[B]; otherwise, N = ∅.

NN = f([A],[B]).

With all this in hand, validity is defined in the usual way: namely, as truth-preservation at all normal worlds of all interpretations.

One could define validity over all worlds (of all interpretations); however, while this would yield a ‘suitable conditional’ in the going sense, the conditional would be even weaker than the (very) weak (but nonetheless suitable) conditional generated from the normal-worlds-only account of validity.

Priest (1992) gives a sound and complete proof theory for the given semantics, but this is left for the reader to consult.

3.3 A different solution

In very recent work, Field (2008) has championed a non-classical (paracomplete but non-paraconsistent) theory of truth that involves a related but, in various ways, more sophisticated approach to a suitable conditional. In particular, Field gives an extension of the familiar (Kripkean) Strong Kleene approach to truth, where the extended language contains a (primitive) suitable conditional.[6]

3.3.1 A “non-normal” neighborhood framework

For present purposes, I simply sketch (a proper part of) what Field calls a ‘general semantics’ for his conditional. (More constraints are needed to give Field's conditional, but the aim here is simply to sketch the basic idea.) Field also gives an elegant semantics that utilizes a variation on constructions due to Kripke (1975) and Brady (1989); however, the ‘worlds’ approach is sufficient for present purposes.

With the aim of giving an extension of Strong Kleene logic (see many-valued logic), Field proposes the following framework, letting the syntax be as in the ‘non-normal worlds’ approach above. (Of course, both approaches are to be extended to the predicate and quantification cases, but the propositional level gives the basic idea.) Let W be an infinite set of worlds, with @ a (unique) “actual” element. In turn, a ‘similarity’ relation is imposed on W so that each wW enjoys a set of ‘similar worlds’ (a so-called ‘neighborhood’ of w). Specifically, Field proposes that each wW be assigned a (possibly empty) directed family Fw that comprises non-empty subsets of W, where directedness means

(wW)(X,YFw)(∃ZFw) ZXY

Such directedness of Fw allows for ‘incomparability’, so that the similarity relation needn't be linear.

Towards avoiding Curry paradox, a few other tweaks are required. (Towards getting all of the features of Field's conditional, even more constraints are required, but these are left to Field's work (2008).) Define the following features for any wW.

  1. Normality: w is normal just if wX for all XFw.
  2. Non-normality: w is non-normal just if it is not normal.
  3. Loneliness: w is lonely just if {w} ∈ Fw.
  4. Happiness: w is happy just if it is not lonely.

Field's proposal stipulates that @ be both normal and happy on any interpretation, but otherwise worlds may be non-normal and lonely. (That @ is to be happy is not merely Field's warmheartedness; contraction-related validities would emerge were it lonely.)

With this setup, sentences in the conditional-free fragment are assigned Kleene values (viz., 1, 0.5, 0) at ‘worlds’ in a standard way. In particular, conjunction and disjunction are min and max, respectively, and negation is 1 minus the value of the negatum — all relativized to worlds. The given ‘worlds’, of course, play no essential role in any of the extensional connectives; one needn't ‘look’ at other worlds to figure out the values of such sentences. The worlds come into play in the conditional. Where |A|w is the value of A at w,

  1. |AB|w = 1 if |A|y ≤ |B|y for some XFw and any yX
  2. |A→B|w = 0 if |A|y > |B|y for some XFw and any yX
  3. |AB|w = 0.5 otherwise.

With these valuation conditions in place, the validity (or semantic consequence) relation is defined only over ‘actual points’ of all interpretations. Let A be actually verified in an interpretation just if A takes the value 1 at @ in the given interpretation. Then an argument from set S of sentences to conclusion A is valid iff any interpretation that actually verifies S actually verifies A. (Here, a set S of sentences is actually verified just if all of its members are actually verified.)

Two notable features of the conditional

One notable feature of Field's approach is that, with his other constraints (omitted here) in place, the conditional ‘reduces to’ the hook in contexts in which Excluded Middle holds. (See Field 2008 for discussion.) This feature is absent from the simple non-normal worlds approach sketched above.

Another notable feature (in the broader, Fieldian construction) is that the conditional gives rise to a natural ‘determinacy’ operator — actually, to an infinite hierarchy of stronger and stronger ‘determinacy’ operators. Given Field's paracomplete purposes (in which some sentences, like Curry sentences, are ‘not determinately true’), this is a significant achievement. For present purposes, however, details are left to Field's work.

Open Issues and Problems

With either of the foregoing approaches — the simple non-normal or Field's — one need not reject the existence of Curry sentences (which are difficult to reject when one's language is a natural language) in order to keep any of the given ‘naive’ principles (truth, sets, properties); however, there are various philosophical issues that need to be addressed, a few of which are canvassed below.

One philosophical issue confronting either approach is the very nature of such non-normal worlds. What are they? (Of course, they're very different in the two approaches, but one might ask the question on either approach.) If, as Field (2008) is inclined to do, one takes a fairly instrumentalist approach towards the formal semantics, then perhaps this question is not terribly pressing. If, as Priest is sometimes inclined to do, one takes a ‘realist’ approach towards the formal setup, the question seems to be pressing.

Priest's suggestion (1992), with respect to the simple non-normal framework (or more sophisticated variants), is that non-normal worlds are simply (impossible) worlds where the laws of logic are different. But is there any reason, independent of Curry's paradox, to admit such worlds? Fortunately, the answer seems to be ‘yes’. One reason has to do with the common (natural language) reasoning involving counter-logicals, including, for example, sentences such as ‘If intuitionistic logic is correct, then double negation elimination is invalid’. Invoking non-normal worlds provides a simple way of modelling such sentences and the reasoning involving them.[7]

There are other philosophical (and logical) problems that remain open. One of the most important recent papers discussing such problems is Restall 2007. Restall argues that the sorts of non-classical approach discussed above must give up either transitivity of entailment, infinitary disjunction or distributive lattice logic (i.e., an infinitary disjunction operator distributing over finite conjunction); otherwise, as Restall shows, Curry's paradox arises immediately and triviality ensues. The importance of Restall's point lies not only in the formal constraints imposed on suitable non-classical approaches to Curry; its importance lies especially in the philosophical awkwardness imposed by such constraints. For example, one (formal) upshot of Restall's point is that, on a natural way of modelling propositions (e.g., in familiar world-semantics), some classes of propositions will not have disjunctions on the (given sort of) non-classical approach; the philosophical upshot (and important open problem) is that there is no obvious explanation for why such classes lack such a disjunction. (Needless to say, it is not a sufficient explanation to note that the presence of such a disjunction would otherwise generate triviality via Curry's paradox.) See Field 2008 for a recent reply to Restall.

The foregoing issues and open problems confront various non-classical approaches to paradox, problems that arise particularly sharply in the face of Curry's paradox. It should be understood, however, that such problems may remain pressing even for those who are firmly committed to classical approaches to paradox. After all, one might be interested not so much in accepting or believing such non-classical proposals, but rather in using such proposals to model various naive but non-trivial theories — naive truth theory, naive set theory, semantical property theory, naive denotation theory, etc.. One need not believe or accept such theories to have an interest in modeling them accurately. If one has such an interest, then the foregoing problems arising from Curry's paradox must be addressed. (See Slaney 1989, and the classic Meyer, Dunn, and Routley 1979, and also Restall 2000 for further discussion.)


Works Cited or Further Reading

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Related Entries

logic: paraconsistent | logic: relevance | logic: substructural | Russell's paradox