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Medieval Philosophy

First published Tue Aug 3, 2004; substantive revision Wed Sep 1, 2004

Medieval philosophy is conventionally construed as the philosophy of Western Europe between the decline of classical pagan culture and the Renaissance. Such a broad topic cannot be covered in detail in a single article, and fortunately there is no need to do so, since other articles in this Encyclopedia treat individual medieval philosophers and topics. The present article will confine itself to articulating some of the overall contours of medieval philosophy. The reader should refer to the items listed under Related Entries below for more detailed information on narrower subjects.

1. The Geographical and Chronological Boundaries of Medieval Philosophy

‘Medieval philosophy’ refers to philosophy in Western Europe during the "medieval" period, the so called "Middle Ages." The notion of a "Middle Age" (or plural "Middle Ages") was introduced in the fifteenth century for the period between the decline of classical pagan culture in Western Europe and what was taken to be its rediscovery during the Renaissance. The first known documented use of the expression (in the form 'media tempestas') is from 1469.[1] (Robinson [1984], p. 748.)

The originators of the notion of the Middle Ages were thinking primarily of the so called "Latin West," the area, roughly speaking, of Roman Catholicism. While it is true that this region was to some extent a unit, culturally separate from its neighbors, it is also true that medieval philosophy was decisively influenced by ideas from the Greek East, from the Jewish philosophical tradition, and from Islam. If one takes medieval philosophy to include the Patristic period, as the present author prefers to do, then the area must be expanded to include, at least during the early centuries, Greek-speaking eastern Europe, as well as North Africa and parts of Asia Minor.

The chronological limits of medieval philosophy are equally imprecise. Henry [1967] takes it to begin with St. Augustine (354–430), as in effect do MacDonald and Kretzmann [1998]. On the other hand, Copleston [1950] and Gilson [1955] include the earlier Patristic period as well. At the other end of the period, things are even more imprecise. Robinson ([1984], pp. 749–50) amusingly summarizes the situation[2]:

Scholars have advocated many different termini for our period, and there seems to be little agreement and indeed little basis for reasoned argument on these points. The Middle Ages begin, we are told, with the death of Theodosius in 395, or with the settlement of Germanic tribes in the Roman Empire, or with the sack of Rome in 410, or with the fall of the Western Roman Empire (usually dated A.D. 476), or even as late as the Moslem occupation of the Mediterranean. It ends … with the fall of Constantinople, or with the invention of printing, or with the discovery of America, or with the beginning of the Italian wars (1494), or with the Lutheran Reformation (1517), or with the election of Charles V (1519). Several reference works I have consulted simply assert that the Middle Ages ended in 1500, presumably on New Year's Eve. Yet another terminus often given for the Middle Ages is the so-called "Revival of Learning," that marvelous era when Humanist scholars "discovered" classical texts and restored them to mankind after the long Gothic night. Medievalists must always smile a little over these "discoveries," for we know where the Humanists discovered those classical texts—namely, in medieval manuscripts, where medieval scribes had been carefully preserving them for mankind over the centuries. … In view of all this disagreement over the duration of the Middle Ages, perhaps we should content ourselves with saying that our period extends from the close of the classical period to the beginning of the Renaissance. If classicists and Renaissance scholars don't know when their periods begin and end, then that is their problem.

Still, it is perhaps most useful not to think of medieval philosophy as defined by the chronological boundaries of its adjacent philosophical periods, but as beginning when thinkers first started to measure their philosophical speculations against the requirements of Christian doctrine and as ending when this was no longer the predominant practice.[3] This view allows late ancient and early medieval philosophy to overlap during the Patristic period; thus Proclus (411–85) belongs to the story of ancient philosophy, even though he is later than Saint Augustine (354–430). Again, this view accommodates the fact that late scholasticism survived and flourished even in the Renaissance. Thus Francisco Suárez (1548–1617), who can arguably be regarded as the last chapter in the history of medieval philosophy, was contemporary with Francis Bacon (1561–1626). Nevertheless by c. 1450, at the latest, radically new ways of doing philosophy were clearly emerging.

This perhaps generous interpretation of the chronological limits of medieval philosophy implies that it lasted at least from the Greek patristic author Justin Martyr (mid-second century) until well into the fifteenth century — more than half the entire history of philosophy generally. Clearly there is much to be discussed.

2. The Main Ingredients of Medieval Philosophy

Here is a recipe for producing medieval philosophy: Combine classical pagan philosophy, mainly Greek but also in its Roman versions, with the new Christian religion. Season with a variety of flavorings from the Jewish and Islamic intellectual heritages. Stir and simmer for 1300 years or more, until done.

This recipe produces a potent and volatile brew. For in fact many features of Christianity do not fit well into classical philosophical views. The notion of the Incarnation and the doctrine of the Trinity are obvious cases in point. But even before those doctrines were fully formulated, there were difficulties, so that an educated Christian in the early centuries would be hard pressed to know how to accommodate his religious views into the only philosophical tradition available. To take just one example, consider pagan philosophical theories of the soul. At first glance, it would appear that the Platonic[4] tradition would be most appealing to an early Christian. And in fact it was. In the first place, the Platonic tradition was very concerned with the moral development of the soul. Again, that tradition saw the highest goal of a human being as some kind of mystical gazing on or union with the Form of the Good or the One; it would be easy to interpret this as the "face to face" encounter with God in the next life that St. Paul describes in 1 Cor. 13:12. Most important of all, Platonism held that the soul could exist apart from the body after death. This would obviously be appealing to Christians, who believed in an afterlife.

On the other hand, there was another crucial aspect of Christianity that simply made no sense to a Platonist. This was the doctrine of the resurrection of the dead at the end of the world. Platonism allowed for reincarnation, so there was no special theoretical problem for a Platonist about the soul's reentering the body. But for a Christian this resurrection was something to look forward to; it was a good thing. This would be incomprehensible from a Platonic viewpoint, for which "the body is the prison of the soul," and for which the task of the philosopher is to "learn how to die" so that he might be free from the distracting and corrupting influences of the body. No, for a Platonist is it best for the soul not to be in the body.[5]

A Christian would therefore have a hard time being a straightforward Platonist about the soul. But neither could he be an straightforward Aristotelian. Aristotle's own views on the immortality of the soul are notoriously obscure, and he was often interpreted as denying it outright. All the harder, therefore, to make sense of the view that the resurrection of the dead at the end of the world is something to be joyfully expected.[6]

This problem illustrates the kind of difficulties that emerge from the above "recipe" for medieval philosophy. An educated early Christian, striving to deal with his religion in terms of the only philosophical traditions he knew, would plainly have a lot of work to do. Such tensions may be regarded as the "motors" that drove much of philosophy throughout the period. In response to them, new concepts, new theories and new distinctions were developed. Of course, once developed, these tools remained and indeed still remain available to be used in contexts that have nothing to do with Christian doctrine. Readers of medieval philosophy who go on to study John Locke, for instance, will find it hard to imagine how his famous discussion of "personal identity" in the Essay concerning Human Understanding could ever have been written if it were not for the medieval distinction between "person" and "nature," worked out in dealing with the doctrines of the Incarnation and the Trinity.

3. The Availability of Greek Texts

While the influence of classical pagan philosophy was crucial for the development of medieval philosophy, it is likewise crucial that until the twelfth and thirteenth centuries almost all the original Greek texts were lost to the Latin West, so that they exerted their influence only indirectly. They were "lost" not in the sense that the texts were simply unavailable but in the sense that very few people could read them, since they were written in the wrong language. As the Western Roman Empire gradually disintegrated, the knowledge of Greek all but disappeared. Boethius (c. 480–545/526) was still fluent in Greek, but he recognized the need for translations even in his own day; after him Greek was effectively a dead language in the West.

In the case of Plato, the Middle Ages for all practical purposes had only the first part of the Timaeus (to 53c), hardly a typical Platonic dialogue, in a translation and commentary by a certain Calcidius (or Chalcidius).[7] The Timaeus contains Plato's cosmology, his account of the origin of the cosmos.

There were also translations of the Meno and the Phaedo made in the twelfth century by a certain Henry Aristippus of Catania,[8] but almost no one appears to have read them. They seem to have had only a modest circulation and absolutely no influence at all to speak of.[9]

There had been a few other Latin translations made even much earlier, but these vanished from circulation before the Middle Ages got very far along. Cicero himself had translated the Protagoras and a small part of the Timaeus, and in the second century Apuleius translated the Phaedo, but these translations disappeared after the sixth century and had very little effect on anyone. (Klibansky [1982], pp. 21–22.) As Saint Jerome remarks in the late-fourth or early-fifth century, in his Commentary on the Epistle to the Galatians, "How many people know Plato"s books, or his name? Idle old men on the corners hardly recall him." (Migne [1844–64], vol. 26, col. 401B.)

This state of affairs lasted until the Renaissance, when Marsilio Ficino (1433–99) translated and commented on the complete works of Plato. Thus, except for roughly the first half of the Timaeus, the Middle Ages did not know the actual texts of Plato.

As for Plotinus, matters were even worse. His Enneads (the collection of his writings) were almost completely unavailable. Marius Victorinus is said to have translated some of the Enneads into Latin in the fourth century, but his translation, if in fact it really existed, seems to have been lost soon afterwards.[10]

For Aristotle, the Middle Ages were in somewhat better shape. Marius Victorinus translated the Categories and On Interpretation. A little over a century later, the logical works in general, except perhaps for the Posterior Analytics, were translated by Boethius, c. 510–12, but only his translations of the Categories and On Interpretation ever got into general circulation before the twelfth century. The rest of Aristotle was eventually translated into Latin, but only much later, from about the middle of the twelfth century. First there came the rest of the logical works, and then the Physics, the Metaphysics, and so on. Essentially all the works had been translated by the middle of the thirteenth century. (Dod [1982].) This "recovery" of Aristotle in the twelfth and thirteenth centuries was a momentous event in the history of mediaeval philosophy.

Still, while it important to emphasize this absence of primary texts of Greek philosophy in the Latin Middle Ages, it is also important to recognize that the medievals knew a good deal about Greek philosophy anyway. They got their information from (1) some of the Latin patristic authors, like Tertullian, Ambrose and Boethius, who wrote before the knowledge of Greek effectively disappeared in the West, and who often discuss classical Greek doctrines in some detail; and (2) certain Latin pagan authors such as Cicero and Seneca, who give us (and gave the medievals) a great deal of information about Greek philosophy.

During the first part of the Middle Ages, Platonic and neo-Platonic influences dominated philosophical thinking. "Plato himself does not appear at all, but Platonism is everywhere," as Gilson has said. (Gilson [1955], p. 144.[11]) This situation prevailed until the recovery of Aristotle in the twelfth and thirteenth centuries. Hence, even though it is sometimes still done, it is quite wrong to think of mediaeval philosophy as mainly just a matter of warmed-over commentaries on Aristotle. For most of the Middle Ages by far, Aristotle was of decidedly secondary importance. This of course is not to deny that when Aristotle did come to dominate, he was very dominant indeed and his influence was immense.

4. From the Patristic Period to the Mid-Twelfth Century

"Patrology" or "patristics" is the study of the so called "Fathers (patres) of the Church." In this sense, ‘fathers' does not mean priests, although of course many patristic authors were priests. Neither does it does mean "fathers" in the sense of "founding fathers," although many patristic authors were likewise foundational for everything that came afterward. Rather ‘fathers' in this sense means "teachers." See, for example, St. Paul: "For though you might have ten thousand guardians in Christ, you do not have many fathers. Indeed, in Christ Jesus I became your father through the gospel." (1 Cor. 4:15 [NRSV].) In early Christian usage, the term ‘father’ was applied primarily to the bishop, who had preeminent teaching authority within the Church. But gradually the word was extended until, much later, it came to include all early Christian writers who were taken to represent the authentic tradition of the Church. (Quasten [1950–86], I, p. 9.) The patristic period is generally taken to extend from the immediately post-Apostolic authors to either Gregory the Great (d. 604) or Isidore of Seville (d. 636) in the Latin West, and to John of Damascus (d. 749) in the Greek East. (Quasten [1950–86], I, 1.)

4.1 Augustine

By no means all patristic authors are of philosophical significance, but many of them definitely are. By far the most important is Saint Augustine (354–430). Augustine is certainly the most important and influential philosopher of the Middle Ages, and one of the most influential philosophers of any time[12]:

His authority has been felt much more broadly, and for a much longer time, than Aristotle's, whose role in the Middle Ages was comparatively minor until rather late. As for Plato, for a long time much of his influence was felt mainly through the writings of Augustine. For more than a millennium after his death, Augustine was an authority who simply had to be accommodated. He shaped medieval thought as no one else did. Moreover, his influence did not end with the Middle Ages. Throughout the Reformation, appeals to Augustine's authority were commonplace on all sides. His theory of illumination lives on in Malebranche and in Descartes's "light of nature." His approach to the problem of evil and to human free will is still widely held today. His force was and is still felt not just in philosophy but also in theology, popular religion, and political thought, for example in the theory of the just war. (Spade [1994], pp. 57–58.)

Yet despite his philosophical preeminence, Augustine was not, and did not think of himself as, a philosopher either by training or by profession. By training he was a rhetorician, by profession first a rhetorician and teacher of rhetoric, then later Bishop of Hippo (modern Annaba, or French Bône, in what is now northeast Algeria), where his concerns were pastoral and theological. As a result, few of his writings contain what we would think of as purely philosophical discussions.[13] What we find instead in Augustine is a man who is a "philosopher" in the original, etymological sense, a "lover a wisdom," one who is searching for it rather than one who writes as if he has found it and is now presenting it to us in systematic, argumentative form.

For more on Augustine, please consult the entry Saint Augustine.

4.2 Boethius

After Augustine, the first thinker of philosophical note was Anicius Manlius Severinus Boethius (c. 480–524/525). Boethius is no doubt best known today for The Consolation of Philosophy, a dialogue in five books between Boethius and "Lady Philosophy," an allegorical figure who appears to him in a vision while he is languishing in jail under sentence of death for treason. Boethius had occupied a high station in society and government. He was born into a family with an excellent old Roman pedigree, and rose to a position of immense power and influence in the Ostrogothic kingdom under Theodoric. Although for a while he was conspicuously successful, he nevertheless eventually fell into disfavor, was charged with treasonable conspiracy having to do with the Emperor Justin in Constantinople (Boethius claims he was innocent), was arrested and finally executed.[14] In the Consolation, Boethius and Lady Philosophy discuss the problem of evil and the fickleness of fortune—a particularly pressing issue for Boethius, given the circumstances under which the work was written.

But although the Consolation is justly famous, both in our own day and in the Middle Ages, Boethius's long-term importance probably rests more on his translations and commentary activity. For Boethius was well educated, and was one of the increasingly rare people in the West who knew Greek well, not just the language but the intellectual culture. He came up with the lofty goal to translate Plato and Aristotle into Latin, write commentaries on the whole of that material, and then write another work to show that Plato and Aristotle essentially said the same thing:

If the more powerful favor of divinity grants it to me, this is [my] firm purpose: Although those people were very great talents whose labor and study translated into the Latin tongue much of what we are now treating, nevertheless they did not bring it into any kind of order or shape or in its arrangement to the level of the [scholarly] disciplines. [Hence I propose] that I turn all of Aristotle's work—[or] whatever [of it] comes into my hands—into the Latin style and write commentaries in the Latin language on all of it, so that if anything of the subtlety of the logical art was written down by Aristotle, of the weightiness of moral knowledge, of the cleverness of the truth of physical matters, I will translate it and even illuminate it with a kind of "light" of commentary. [Then,] translating all of Plato's dialogues or even commenting [on them], I will bring them into Latin form. Once all this is done, I will not fail to bring the views of Aristotle and Plato together into a kind of harmony and show that they do not, as most people [think], disagree about everything but rather agree on most things, especially in philosophy. (Boethius [1880], pp. 79. 9–80.6 [my translation].)

No doubt this plan would have proved unmanageable even if Boethius had not been executed in his mid-forties. In particular, while the Consolation certainly shows a knowledge of the Timaeus, Boethius does not appear to have actually translated any Plato at all, despite his intentions. He did, however, translate Aristotle's Categories and On Interpretation, together with Porphyry of Tyre's Isagoge, a kind of "introduction" to Aristotle's Categories.[15] He also appears to have translated the other works in Aristotle's Organon (except perhaps for the Posterior Analytics, about which there is some doubt), but the fate of those translations is obscure; they did not circulate widely until much later. (Dod [1982], pp. 53–54.)

In addition to his translations, Boethius wrote a number of logical treatises of his own. These are, first of all, a commentary on Aristotle's Topics, which is no longer extant. Whether or not he translated the Posterior Analytics, there may have been a commentary on it, but if so it has not survived and did not have any influence. (Ebbesen [1973].) The same goes for a possible (incomplete) commentary on the Prior Analytics. (Obertello [1974], I, pp. 230–32.) More important were a series of commentaries (one on the Categories, two each on the On Interpretation and on Porphyry's Isagoge, and one on Cicero's Topics), together with several other works on categorical and hypothetical syllogisms, logical "division," and on the differences between Aristotle's and Cicero's Topics. (Chadwick [1981], Gibson [1981], Obertello [1974].) Together all these logical writings, both the translations and the others, constitute what later came to be called the "Old Logic" (= logica vetus). Some of the works were more influential than others. But basically, everything the Middle Ages knew about logic up to the middle of the twelfth century was contained in these books. As a result, Boethius is one of the main sources for the transmission of ancient Greek philosophy to the Latin West during the first half of the Middle Ages.

Boethius is also important for having introduced the famous "problem of universals" in the form in which it was mainly discussed throughout the Middle Ages. For more on the medieval problem of universals, please see the entry on the medieval problem of universals.

He also proved to be influential in the twelfth century and afterwards for the metaphysical views contained in a series of short studies known collectively as the Theological Tractates.

4.3 The Carolingian Period

After Boethius, as the classical Greco-Roman world grew ever more distant, philosophy—and to some extent culture generally—entered a period of relative stagnation, a period that lasted until after the year 1000. There was one short-lived bright spot, however, the late-eighth and early-ninth century court of Charlemagne (768–814) and his successors, the so called "Carolingian" period. The major philosophical figure in this period was John Scottus Eriugena[16] (c. 800–c. 877), an Irish monk who was at the court of Charles the Bald around 850. Curiously, the knowledge of Greek was still not quite dead in Ireland even at this late date, and Eriugena brought a knowledge of the language with him. At the Carolingian court, Eriugena translated several Greek works into Latin, including the very important writings of Pseudo-Dionysius the Areopagite (more on him below), a work by Maximus Confessor (also known as Maximus of Constantinople, c. 580–662), and Gregory of Nyssa's (died c. 385) On the Making of Man (= De hominis opificio). Eriugena also wrote several other works of his own.

Among his translations, the writings of Pseudo-Dionysius are surely the most important and influential.[17] The true identity of the man we call "Pseudo-Dionysius" is unknown, but he lived probably in the late-fifth century, somewhere in the Greek speaking near East, and was very much influenced by the late neo-Platonist Proclus. Whoever he was, he claimed to be a certain Dionysius who is reported to have been among the philosophers on the Areopagus in Athens when St. Paul went there to preach (Acts 17:19–34). Most of the audience on that occasion laughed at Paul and his novel doctrines.

But some of them joined him and became believers, including Dionysius the Areopagite and a woman named Damaris, and others with them. (Acts 17:34.)

Damaris and the "others" have disappeared without a trace, but our unknown later author pretends to be the Dionysius mentioned in this passage.

The Pseudo-Dionysian writings consist of four treatises and a series of ten letters. The most philosophically important of them are the two treatises On the Divine Names and On Mystical Theology. Through them the Latin West was introduced to what is sometimes called "darkness mysticism," the tradition that interprets mystical experience not in terms of an "intellectual vision" (compare Plato's Allegory of the Cave, where the Form of the Good is described as the dazzling sun), but in terms of the will rather than the intellect, darkness rather than light. (Compare later mystical expressions such as "dark night of the soul," "cloud of unknowing.")

It is also mainly through these two treatises that medieval philosophy got the still familiar view that there are three ways of talking about God, by trying to say what he is like (the via affirmativa), by saying instead what he is not (the via negativa), and by a kind of "combined" way that speaks of God with affirmative predicates, but with some kind of mark of superexcellence (the via eminentiae, "God is more than good, more than wise.").

Among Eriugena's own writings, the two most important ones were surely On the Division of Nature (= De divisione naturae or, under a Greek title, Periphyseon) and On Predestination (= De praedestinatione), both very strongly influenced by the neo-Platonic texts Eriugena was translating. Both works were condemned, On Predestination soon after it was written. On the Division of Nature is a large, systematic work in four books, presenting a vision of reality in strongly neo-Platonic terms. The unfamiliarity of this kind of thinking in Western Christendom, which was strongly influenced by Augustine, no doubt contributed to his later reputation of being a heretic.

For more on Eriugena, please see the entry on John Scottus Eriugena.

4.4 Anselm of Canterbury

After its brief "renaissance" during the Carolingian period, education and culture declined once again for roughly another 200 years. Then, shortly after the turn of the millennium, things began to revive. The Germanic "barbarian" tribes that had so disturbed the late Roman empire had long since settled down, and the later Viking raiders had by this time become respectable "Normans." Trade began to revive, travel became relatively safe again, at least compared to what it had been, new cities began to emerge, and along with them new social arrangements began to develop. Education was part of this general revival, and with it philosophy. The major medieval philosophers before the year 1000 are probably fewer than five in number (depending on how generously one wants to take the word ‘major’). But after 1000 their numbers grow exponentially. It is no longer possible to treat them individually in chronological order; indeed, it is difficult to keep track of them all. As time goes on, the complications and the numbers only increase.

Simultaneously, philosophy becomes increasingly technical and "academic." Anselm of Canterbury (1033–1109) represents a major transitional figure. His writings are not yet laden with the technicalities and jargon that make so much later medieval philosophy formidable and inaccessible to the non-specialist. And yet his writings are philosophically "argumentative" in a way much earlier medieval philosophy is not and that looks much more familiar to present-day readers.

Anselm is no doubt best known as the originator of the famous "ontological argument" for the existence of God.[18] But he wrote much else besides, on many philosophical and theological topics. His writings abound in subtle and sophisticated reasoning; indeed, they illustrate the increasing role of "dialectic" in philosophy and theology. In Anselm's hands, theology begins to develop into an argumentative discipline, less exclusively a matter of "scripture studies" and spirituality and increasingly a matter of systematic exploration and presentation of doctrine. This development grows even more pronounced after Anselm.

For more on Anselm, see the article Saint Anselm.

4.5 Peter Abelard

By the early twelfth century, the revival of education that had begun shortly after the millennium was in full swing. During the first half of the century, the most important philosopher by far was undoubtedly Peter Abelard (1079–1142). He was also one of the most colorful figures in the entire history of philosophy. His affair with Héloise and his consequent castration are the stuff of legend, and his controversy with the much more traditional Bernard of Clairvaux (1090–1153) has only enhanced his reputation among those who have viewed him (with considerable oversimplification) as a champion of reason over authority. His autobiographical Story of My Adversities (= Historia calamitatum) is a "good read" even today, and is one of the most intensely personal documents of the Middle Ages.[19]

Abelard represents the full flower of "early medieval philosophy," just before the new translations of Aristotle and others transform everything. It is important to realize that, except for the works of Pseudo-Dionysius, which do not appear to have had an important role in Abelard's thinking, he had access to no more of the original sources of philosophy in the ancient world than anyone else in Europe had had since the time of Boethius. Yet his philosophy is strikingly original. His views on logic and what we would call philosophy of language are sophisticated and novel; indeed, he is a serious contender for the title of the greatest logician of the entire medieval period, early or late. He is one of the first nominalists, and certainly the first important one. His writings on ethics put a new and very strong emphasis on the role of the agent's intention rather than exterior actions. He also wrote on theological topics such as Trinity.

Abelard's writings further amplify the tendency, already seen in Anselm, to increase the use of reasoning and argumentation in theology. But whereas Anselm had managed to deflect criticisms of this new approach in theology, Abelard's disputatious personality alarmed those who were more comfortable with the older style. He was subject to ecclesiastical censure during his lifetime, a fact that no doubt contributes to the relatively few explicit citations of him in the later Middle Ages. Nevertheless, it is undeniable that his influence was widespread.

For more on Abelard, please see the article Peter Abelard.

4.6 General Characteristics of This Early Period

Throughout this early medieval period, we find many writers, usually of a broadly "Platonic" persuasion, who deal with philosophical topics in an unsystematic but far from shallow way that does not clearly distinguish philosophy from theology, or for that matter from "wisdom literature" generally. Frequently their views are presented by arguments that amount to an appeal to a "vision" of how things are ("Look, don't you see?").[20] This is simply a general although not universal observation about these authors, and should not be regarded as a philosophical limitation or defect. After all, some of the world's most important philosophy has been presented in such a "visionary" way. Consider the role of "intuition" in twentieth-century phenomenology, for example, not to mention Parmenides's poem (where the philosophy is presented by a goddess) and much of Plato's philosophy, including the Allegory of the Cave.

There are many exceptions to this generalization. Boethius's logical commentaries, for example, are purely philosophical and frequently genuinely argumentative, even if they are often obscure and inaccessible to modern readers. Eriugena's On the Division of Nature, while definitely "visionary," is nevertheless quite systematic in its structure. And by the time of Anselm, the role of logical argumentation is beginning to grow. Certainly for Abelard the above generalization fails entirely.

Nevertheless, a big change is about to occur. Prior to Abelard, philosophy in the Middle Ages had not been an exclusively academic affair. It had been addressed for the most part to any well educated reader interested in the topics being discussed. Boethius's Consolation, for instance, or almost any of Augustine's or Anselm's writings, could profitably be read by any literate person. Soon, however, this all changes. Philosophy becomes an increasingly specialized discipline, pursued by and for those whose livelihood is found only in educational institutions. Philosophy and theology become more clearly distinguished from one another; both become more systematic, rigorous and precise. These virtues are accompanied by an increasingly technical jargon, which makes so much late-medieval philosophy intimidating and formidable to non-specialist readers. By the same token, this increasing technicality diminishes the overall sense of moral urgency one finds for example in Augustine's Confessions or Boethius's Consolation.

As with the previous generalization, this one should not be regarded as a philosophical fault of the later authors; it is simply a different way of doing philosophy. As David Hume knew, there are two styles of philosophy, each with its own advantages (An Enquiry concerning Human Understanding, § 1). What we see in passing from the earlier to the later Middle Ages is a transition from one to the other.

5. The Twelfth Century and the Rise of Universities

5.1 New Translations[21]

As part of the cultural revival described above, and from the late-eleventh century on, there was a new and increasing interest in having translations of previously unavailable texts, not all of them philosophical by any means. No doubt this new interest was prompted in part by Western Europe's exposure to the Greek and Islamic world during the First Crusade (beginning in 1095). But, for whatever reason, new translations soon began to appear from:

The Spanish translators worked from Arabic texts. In the case of Aristotle, they used Arabic translations of Aristotle's Greek, sometimes with an earlier Syriac link in between. After such a circuitous route, it is no less than amazing that the Latin Europeans were able to understand anything at all of these newly available Aristotelian works. Eventually the extensive and thorough commentaries by the Moorish Ibn Rushd (in Latin, Averroes, 1126–98) were translated from Arabic as well. These commentaries were extremely important in shaping the late medieval understanding of Aristotle, although some of the views contained in them became highly controversial.

By the end of the twelfth century, almost all of Aristotle's works available today had been translated into Latin and, together with the commentaries and other newly translated texts, gradually began to circulate. By the mid-thirteenth century, they were widely known. The first things to spread were the remaining logical writings of Aristotle's Oranon, those not already widely known from Boethius's translations some six hundred years previously. These new logical writings, as distinct from the "Old Logic" (= Logica vetus) stemming from Boethius, became known collectively as the "New Logic" (= Logica nova). After them, the Physics, Metaphysics and other Aristotelian writings gradually became known.

This relatively sudden injection of so much new and unfamiliar material into Western Europe was a stunning shock, nothing less than revolutionary. It was no longer possible for philosophers and theologians to regard their task as simply one of deepening and elaborating traditional views that had come mainly from the Church Fathers and other familiar and approved authorities. It was now a matter of dealing with an entirely unfamiliar framework, with new ideas, accompanied by powerful arguments for them, some of which ideas were plainly unacceptable to a Christian—for example, Aristotle's rejection of anything like divine providence, and his views on the eternity of the world.

5.2 New Forms of Education

As part of the revival that began after the turn of the millennium, new forms of education began to emerge in Western Europe. In general, we may distinguish four main types of educational practices in the Middle Ages[22]:

The University of Paris was the premier university in Europe in the thirteenth century. Its statutes were officially approved by the papal legate Robert de Courçon in 1215. The official founding of the University is usually put at this date, although it is clear that the statutes existed earlier. Oxford and Cambridge also date from the early-thirteenth century, although their period of greatest vigor in the Middle Ages came in the late-thirteenth and early-fourteenth century. Toulouse was founded in 1229 by papal charter. Salamanca was founded by royal charter in 1200. There were also universities in Italy; indeed, Bologna was the first university in all of Europe, and had the peculiarity of being a student-run university.

Universities were divided into "faculties." The four most common ones were the faculties of arts, law, medicine and theology. Most universities had arts faculties, in addition to one or more of the others. The arts faculty was for the basic training of students, before they proceeded to one of the "higher" faculties. In effect, the arts faculty was the equivalent of the modern undergraduate program. As for the "higher" faculties, Bologna was primarily a university for the study of law. Others were best known for medicine. Paris had all four faculties, but the faculty of theology was considered the highest of the four.

In the medieval university, philosophy was cultivated first and foremost in the arts faculty. When the newly translated works of Aristotle first appeared at the University of Paris, for instance, it was in the faculty of arts. The works were clearly not law or medicine. (Some of them might be stretched a bit to count as medicine, but these were not the ones that were influential first.) Neither were they theology in the traditional sense of "Sacred Doctrine," although some of Aristotle's writings had important consequences for theology. Some of these consequences were thought to be dangerous for Christian doctrine, and they were. In 1210, a provincial synod at Paris ruled that Aristotle's "natural theology" could not be "read" in the faculty of arts at Paris. To "read" in this context means to "lecture on." It did not mean that students and masters couldn't study and discuss these works in private. In 1215, when Robert de Courçon approved the statutes of the University of Paris, one of them forbade the arts masters from lecturing on Aristotelian metaphysics and natural science. In 1231, Pope Gregory IX ordered that the works prohibited in 1210 not be used until they could be examined by a theological commission to remove any errors. In 1245, Innocent IV extended the prohibitions of 1210 and 1215 to the University of Toulouse. Despite these bans, study and discussion of Aristotle could not be stopped. By the 1250s, people were openly lecturing on everything they had of Aristotle's.

Why were these prohibitions issued? In part it was out of a genuine concern for the purity of the faith. Aristotelianism was thought, and rightly so, to be theologically suspect. Besides, European academics were just getting acquainted with most of Aristotle, and at this early stage of their acquaintance they weren't altogether sure just what he meant and what the implications were. A "go slow" approach was not an altogether unreasonable course of action to adopt. On the other hand, it cannot be denied that some of the basis for the prohibitions was simply a resistance to new ideas.

6. The Thirteenth Century and Later

By their very nature, universities brought together masters and students from all over Europe and put them in close proximity. Not surprisingly, the result was a "boom" in academic study, including philosophy. Already in the twelfth century, and certainly by the early-thirteenth, it is futile even to attempt anything like a sequential narrative of the history of medieval philosophy. Instead, the remainder of this article will mention only a few of the major figures and describe some of the main topics that were discussed throughout the medieval period. For a more complete picture, readers should consult any of the general histories in the Bibliography below, and for details on individual authors and topics the Related Entries in this Encyclopedia, listed below.

Histories of medieval philosophy often treat Thomas Aquinas (1224/25–74), John Duns Scotus (c. 1265–1308), and William of Ockham (c. 1287–1347) as the "big three" figures in the later medieval period; a few add Bonaventure (1221–74) as a fourth. Although there is certainly ample justification for giving special emphasis to these authors, it would misleading if one thought one could get even a fair overall picture from them alone. Nevertheless, the list is instructive and illustrates several things.

First of all, not one of these three or four authors was French. Aquinas and Bonaventure were Italian, Scotus—as his name implies—was a Scot, and Ockham was English. All but Ockham spent at least part of their careers at the University of Paris. This illustrates both the preeminence of the University of Paris in the thirteenth century and the increasing internationalization of education in the later Middle Ages in general. But it also illustrates another odd fact: the relative absence of Frenchmen as major players on the philosophical scene during this period, even at the premier university in France. There are certainly notable exceptions to this perhaps contentious observation (see for example the articles on Peter Auriol, John Buridan, Godfrey of Fontaines, Nicholas of Autrecourt, Peter John Olivi, and Philip the Chancellor), but with the arguable exception of Buridan, surely none of them is of the stature of the four mentioned above.

The fact that Buridan has not been generally acknowledged in the same rank as the four "greats," even though he is certainly a formidable contender, points to an important feature of the twentieth-century historiography of later medieval philosophy. Buridan was what is known as a "secular master." That is, although he was a priest, he did not belong to any of the religious "orders."[25] Beginning in the early-thirteenth century, several new orders were founded, notably the Franciscans (1209) and the Dominicans (1216), both of which became very prominent in late medieval universities. Aquinas was a Dominican, while Bonaventure, Scotus and Ockham were Franciscans.

Religious orders tend to keep good records, including the writings of their members, so that historians of medieval philosophy typically have more material to work with for authors in the various orders than they do for "secular" figures like Buridan. Besides, other things being equal, orders understandably prefer to "champion their own" in academic as in other matters, and when the academic champion comes relatively early in the history of his order, he can come to be regarded as representing the order's authentic "position," thereby influencing the views of later members of the order.[26] In this way, Aquinas soon became the semi-"official" philosopher and theologian of the Dominicans, a status that was enhanced in 1879 in Pope Leo XIII's encyclical Aeterni Patris, which called Aquinas "the chief and master of all the scholastic doctors," and urged that preference be given to Thomistic doctrine in Catholic schools. As a result, Aquinas enjoyed a far greater authority in the late-nineteenth and the first half of the twentieth century than perhaps he ever did in the Middle Ages. To some extent, Bonaventure likewise came to be regarded as representing typically Franciscan views, and later on Scotus was highly respected and often favored among the Franciscans. Ockham is a special case. He was a controversial figure, mainly because of political disputes with the Pope that embroiled his later life (see the article William of Ockham). Nevertheless, as one of their own, the Franciscans have always been interested in him and in his writings.

The upshot of all this is that major late medieval philosophers, like Buridan, who did not belong to a religious order have often suffered from neglect in standard histories of medieval philosophy, at least until fairly recently. Another neglected secular master was Henry of Ghent, a very important late-thirteenth century figure who has turned out to be crucial for understanding much of Duns Scotus, but whose views have only in the last few decades begun to be seriously studied.

For that matter, even many important and influential late medieval philosophers who did belong to religious orders are still virtually unknown or at least woefully understudied today, despite the labors of generations of scholars. Their works have never been printed and exist only in handwritten manuscripts, written in a devilishly obscure system of abbreviation it takes special training to decode. It is probably safe to say that for no other period in the history of European philosophy does so much basic groundwork remain to be done.

For details on the four main authors mentioned in this section, please see the articles Saint Thomas Aquinas, Saint Bonaventure, John Duns Scotus, and William of Ockham. For other authors and topics in late medieval philosophy, see many of the Related Entries listed below.

7. Some Main Topics in Medieval Philosophy

Medieval philosophy included all the main areas we think of as part of philosophy today. Nevertheless, certain topics stand out as worthy of special mention. To begin with, it is only a slight exaggeration to say that medieval philosophy invented the philosophy of religion. To be sure, ancient pagan philosophers sometimes talked about the nature of the gods. But a whole host of traditional problems in the philosophy of religion first took on in the Middle Ages the forms in which we still often discuss them today:

As for logic, the great historian of logic I. M. Bocheński ([1961], pp. 10–18) remarked that the later Middle Ages was—along with the ancient period from roughly 350–200 BCE and the recent period from Boole and Peano on—one of the three great, original periods in the history of logic. Although we have learned much about the history of logic since Bocheński wrote, and although we can find individual notable figures in logic who fall outside any of his three great periods, his observation is still by and large correct. From the time of Abelard through at least the middle of the fourteenth century, if not later, the peculiarly medieval contributions to logic were developed and cultivated to a very high degree. It was no longer a matter of interpreting Aristotle, or commenting on the works of the "Old Logic" or the "New Logic"; wholly new genres of logical writing sprang up, and entirely new logical and semantic notions were developed. For logical developments in the Middle Ages, see the articles insolubles, literary forms of medieval philosophy, medieval semiotics, medieval theories of analogy, Medieval Theories of Demonstration, medieval theories of modality, medieval theories of Obligations, medieval theories: properties of terms, medieval theories of singular terms, medieval theories of the syllogism, and sophismata. For information on some contributors to medieval logic, see the articles Albert of Saxony, Anicius Manlius Severinus Boethius, John Buridan, John Wyclif, Johannes Sharpe, Paul of Venice, Peter Abelard, Peter of Spain, Richard Kilvington, Richard the Sophister, Walter Burley, William Heytesbury, and William of Ockham.

In metaphysics, the Middle Ages has a well deserved reputation for philosophical excellence. The problem of universals, for example, was one of the topics that were discussed at this time with a level of precision and rigor it would be hard to find matched before or since. But it was by no means the only such question. For some of the main topics in metaphysics on which medieval philosophers sharpened their wits, see the articles binarium famosissimum, existence, the medieval problem of universals, medieval theories of causality, medieval theories of haecceity, and medieval theories of relations. For some important contributors to medieval metaphysics, see the articles John Buridan, John Duns Scotus, John Wyclif, Saint Augustine, Saint Thomas Aquinas, and William of Ockham.

In natural philosophy and philosophy of science, medieval philosophy was of course very strongly—but not exclusively—influenced by Aristotle. See, for example, the articles medieval theories of causality and Saint Thomas Aquinas. Particularly from the fourteenth century on, the increasing use of mathematical reasoning in natural philosophy would eventually pave the way for the rise of early modern science later on. Important figures in this development include William Heytesbury and William of Ockham. Other important contributors to medieval natural philosophy include Albert of Saxony, John Buridan and Nicholas of Autrecourt.

Medieval epistemology was not, with some noteworthy exceptions, particularly worried over the problem of skepticism, over whether we have genuine knowledge. The tendency was to take it for granted that we do, and instead to ask about how this comes about: what are the mechanisms of cognition, concept formation, etc. Medieval epistemology, therefore, typically shades into what we would nowadays call philosophical psychology or philosophy of mind; after the recovery of Aristotle's On the Soul, it was regarded as a branch of the philosophy of nature. For some of the important topics discussed in the area of medieval epistemology, see the articles divine illumination, medieval theories of demonstration, and mental representation in medieval philosophy. For some important medieval authors in this area, see the articles John Duns Scotus, Nicholas of Autrecourt, Saint Augustine, Saint Thom, and William of Ockham.

For details on some important developments in medieval ethics, see the articles medieval theories of conscience, medieval theories of practical reason, and the natural law tradition in ethics. For some of the major contributors to medieval ethics, see the articles John Duns Scotus, Peter Abelard, Peter of Spain Saint Anselm, Saint Augustine, Saint Thomas Aquinas and William of Ockham, elsewhere in this Encyclopedia. For some important figures in medieval political theory, see the articles Dante Alighieri, John Wyclif, and William of Ockham.

The above lists of topics and important figures should be regarded as only representative; they are far from exhaustive.


This bibliography includes only items cited in the body of the article, plus general resources relevant to the study of medieval philosophy. More specialized bibliographies relevant to particular topics and individuals may be found in other articles in this Encyclopedia. See the list of Related Entries below.

General Histories of Medieval Philosophy

Useful Anthologies of Translations

Other Sources Cited in This Article

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Abelard [Abailard], Peter | Albert of Saxony | Alyngton, Robert | analogy: medieval theories of | Anselm, Saint [Anselm of Bec, Anselm of Canterbury] | Aquinas, Saint Thomas | Augustine, Saint | Auriol [Aureol, Aureoli], Peter | Bacon, Roger | binarium famosissimum [= most famous pair] | Boethius, Anicius Manlius Severinus | Bonaventure, Saint | Buridan, John [Jean] | Burley [Burleigh], Walter | causation: medieval theories of | Christian theology, philosophy and | condemnation of 1277 | conscience: medieval theories of | Cusanus, Nicolaus [Nicolas of Cusa] | Damian, Peter | Dante Alighieri | demonstration: medieval theories of | divine: illumination | Duns Scotus, John | Eriugena, John Scottus | fallacies: medieval theories of | Francis of Marchia | free will: divine foreknowledge and | future contingents: medieval theories of | Gersonides | Giles of Rome | Godfrey of Fontaines | Gregory of Rimini | haecceity: medieval theories of | Heytesbury, William | Holkot [Holcot], Robert | insolubles [= insolubilia] | John of Salisbury | Kilvington, Richard | Maimonides | Marsilius of Inghen | medieval philosophy: literary forms of | mental representation: in medieval philosophy | modality: medieval theories of | Nicholas of Autrecourt [de Altricuria, Autricuria, Ultricuria, Autricort] | obligationes, medieval theories of | Ockham [Occam], William | Olivi, Peter John | ontological arguments | Paul of Venice | Penbygull, William | Peter of Spain [= Petrus Hispanus] | Philip the Chancellor | practical reason: medieval theories of | Pseudo-Dionysius the Areopagite | relations: medieval theories of | Richard the Sophister [Ricardus Sophista, Magister abstractionum] | semiotics: medieval | Sharpe, Johannes | Simon of Faversham | singular terms: medieval theories of | sophismata [= sophisms] | syllogism: medieval theories of | terms, properties of: medieval theories of | Thomas of Erfurt | universals: the medieval problem of | William of Champeaux | Wyclif, John