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Robert Grosseteste

First published Tue Jul 10, 2007

Robert Grosseteste (ca. 1168–1253), Bishop of Lincoln from 1235 to 1253, was one of the most prominent and remarkable figures in thirteenth-century English intellectual life. He was a man of many talents: commentator and translator of Aristotle and Greek patristic thinkers, philosopher, theologian, and student of nature. He was heavily influenced by Augustine, whose thought permeates his writings and from whom he drew a Neoplatonic outlook. But he was also one of the first to make extensive use of the thought of Aristotle, Avicenna and Averroes. He developed a highly original and imaginative account of the generation and fundamental nature of the physical world in terms of the action of light, and composed a number of short works regarding optics and other natural phenomena, as well as works of philosophy and theology. As bishop, he was an important figure in English ecclesiastical life, focusing his energies on rooting out abuses of the pastoral care, which in later life he traced to the papacy itself. He made a powerful impression on his contemporaries and subsequent thinkers at Oxford, and has been hailed as an inspiration to scientific developments in fourteenth-century Oxford.

1. Life

Grosseteste was born into a humble Anglo-Norman family in the county of Suffolk in England. He first appears in the historical record as a witness to a charter of the Bishop of Lincoln, written between 1189 and 1192. His title of master of arts indicates that he had acquired sufficient learning to be entitled to teach. Assuming that Grosseteste would therefore have been in his early twenties, Callus 1955 has suggested a birth date around 1168. Around 1195, in a letter of recommendation to the Bishop of Hereford, William de Vere, Gerald of Wales commends Grosseteste for his wide reading and skill in business and legal affairs, medicine, and the liberal arts, and remarks on his exceptional standards of conduct. Grosseteste appears as a witness to several of de Vere's charters over the next few years, but disappears from the historical record after de Vere's death in 1198. He reappears as a papal judge-delegate in Litchfield diocese before 1216 and in Hereford diocese between 1213 and 1216, acting with Hugh Foliot, Archdeacon of Shropshire. Grosseteste's name reappears twice more in legal documents connected with Shropshire before 1227. For at least part of the years 1208 to 1213, when England was under papal interdict, Grosseteste was in France, for in a death-bed conversation reported by the chronicler Matthew Paris, he recalls having seen and heard preaching in France Eustace of Flay, James of Vitry, Robert of Courson and the exiled Archbishop Steven Langton. In 1225, while still a deacon, Grosseteste was presented by the Bishop of Lincoln, Hugh of Wells, to the living of Abbotsley; in 1229 he was made Archdeacon of Leicester and presented with a prebend in Lincoln Cathedral. In 1229/1230 Grosseteste accepted an invitation to become the first lecturer to the Oxford Franciscans. In 1235 he was elected Bishop of Lincoln, a position he occupied until his death in 1253.

Besides the facts just mentioned, and despite confident statements about his early life in much of the literature, we know very little about Grosseteste's life before about 1230. He no doubt was educated in the liberal arts in England, possibly at Lincoln, and he probably studied in the late twelfth century at Hereford, then a center of scientific learning. He is thought to have studied theology in the early thirteenth century, though exactly where and when is a matter of disagreement, as is the related question of his relation to the then nascent Oxford University.

Scholars have proposed different hypotheses regarding Grosseteste's life between about 1200 and 1230. According to Daniel Callus (Callus 1945, 1955, with Crombie 1953 and McEvoy 1982, 2000 in substantial agreement), from about 1200 Grosseteste probably taught the arts at Oxford, only to leave Oxford in 1209 to study theology in France when the Oxford schools closed after two clerics were hanged by Oxford's mayor and officers. The resolution of the resulting town-and-gown dispute was delayed by the papal interdict of England but finally achieved in 1214, when the papal legate sent to England to negotiate a settlement between the King and Pope visited Oxford. The legate's resolution, known as the Legatine Award, placed the Oxford masters under the jurisdiction of the Bishop of Lincoln, who was to appoint as his representative a chancellor of the university. Remarks by Hugh Sutton, Grosseteste's successor as Bishop of Lincoln, indicate that Grosseteste had at one time occupied the position of chancellor at Oxford but had been allowed only to use the title “master of the schools” and not “chancellor.” According to Callus, Grosseteste probably returned from France in 1214 to become, in function if not title, Oxford's first chancellor, and lectured on theology in Oxford's secular schools from this year until 1229/30.

In contrast, Sir Richard Southern (1986) argued that until 1225 Grosseteste more likely occupied a provincial administrative position, perhaps supplemented by occasional short periods of teaching, possibly even at Oxford, among other places. His time in France was in consequence of the interdict rather than the closure of the Oxford schools, and was not spent in the study of theology. According to Southern, Grosseteste's permanent association with Oxford began after 1225, when, having received the prebend of Abbotsley, Grosseteste probably became a priest and began to lecture in theology. According to Southern's chronology, he would have become chancellor in the late 1220s.

Southern's important study had the salutory effect of forcing a reexamination of the assumptions upon which earlier accounts of Grosseteste's life rested, but his conclusions remain contentious. Joseph Goering, after looking closely at the content of Grosseteste's writings and the documentary evidence, concludes that "the evidence intimates that he was on the continent along with the bishop of Hereford and other English Churchmen in exile before 1215, that he returned to the diocese of Hereford when the interdict was lifted, and that he continued his diocesan service and his teaching as a master of arts, at Hereford or elsewhere, into the 1220s" (Goering 1995, 26). Yet Goering thinks that the sources used in Grosseteste's theological writings, as well as Grosseteste's known ties with important Parisian thinkers, best support the view that Grosseteste's study of scholastic theology — a casual and gradual process in his view — included at least some time studying in Paris in the 1220s, possibly around 1225 after receiving his substantial prebend in Abbotsley, which made (and perhaps was intended to make) such a course of study possible. Goering observes that there is no concrete evidence that Grosseteste taught at Oxford prior to the late 1220s or that his teaching in the secular schools at Oxford was in theology rather than the arts. Grosseteste's association with Oxford and chancellorship may indeed have only been in the late 1220s as a master of arts — the fact that he was a master in the lower faculty of arts, not the higher faculty of theology, would perhaps explain why he was not permitted to be called chancellor.

In 1229/30 Grosseteste began a formal association with the Franciscans at Oxford as their first lecturer. The Franciscans had arrived at Oxford in 1224. Their Minister Provinciial, Agnellus of Pisa, provided this small but growing group with their first school and requested that Grosseteste lecture to them. Grosseteste's high regard for the mendicants no doubt played a role in his acceptance of this request. Some indeed thought that Grosseteste would himself follow the path of many other eminent scholars of his day and join the Franciscan order, but this was not to be. Instead, in 1235 he was elected Bishop of Lincoln. He was not the electors' first choice but rather a compromise candidate, but he went on to become a powerful and exacting bishop. Grosseteste's teaching career was over, but he continued to enjoy close relations with the Franciscans for the rest of his life. They were members of his episcopal household and he employed them as assistants and bequeathed his books to them. These books, kept in the Oxford Franciscan convent library, were to become an important source for later thinkers' knowledge of Grosseteste's teachings.

In 1231, after recovering from serious illness, Grosseteste resigned all his sources of revenue, save his prebend in Lincoln cathedral. He went on to compose a series of important theological works, the most notable being his Hexaæmeron, a long commentary on Genesis 1:1-2:17. A feature of these theological works is Grosseteste's increasing knowledge of ancient Greek. Just when Grosseteste began to study Greek is not known, but his studies appear to have been under way by the early 1230s (see Dionisotti 1988). Aided by assistants proficient in Greek, Grosseteste became one of the very few thinkers in the Latin West to know the language. He was not content, however, to employ his Greek learning simply as an aid in his theological studies, but he also embarked on important projects of translation of Greek works into Latin. The first of these projects, commenced after about 1235, focused on works by the theologian, John of Damascus. In the late 1230s and early 1240s, Grosseteste turned to the writings of the Pseudo-Dionysius. He completed a new translation of the Pseudo-Dionysius's works, to which he added his own original commentary. Grosseteste had also retained philosophical interests and in the 1240s turned again to the writings of Aristotle, with whose works he had engaged as a commentator in the 1220s. He made the first extant complete Latin translation of the Nicomachean Ethics to circulate in the Latin West, as well as translations of a large body of accompanying Greek commentary materials, some of which he supplemented, where they were lacking, with his own original commentary and notes. Grosseteste also translated, apparently very late in life, at least substantial parts of Aristotle's De caleo and Simplicius's commentary on it.

The 1240s also marked an important period of ecclesiastical activity. Conflict between the papacy and Emperor Frederick II had led Pope Innocent IV to flee to Lyon in 1244 and relocate the papal court there until 1251. In hope of resolving this conflict, among other pressing concerns, Innocent convened the First Council of Lyon in 1245. Grosseteste was included among the English delegation. Grosseteste returned to the papal court in 1250. Addressing the pope and cardinals, he bemoaned the failings of the church, which he located in its deviation from its pastoral mission. Grosseteste placed the blame for this state of affairs squarely at the feet of the papal court, suggesting that if matters continued on their present course the pope would not be due obedience. In 1253, the last year of his life, in a famous and angry letter to the pope (letter # 128), Grosseteste did indeed in no uncertain terms refuse to obey the pope's instructions to confer a benefice on one of the pope's nephews, whom he viewed as unfit for the pastoral care.

Grosseteste died on October 8-9, 1253. His English contemporaries remembered him as a saintly man. Three attempts were made to have him canonized, the last in 1307; all failed.

2. Works

Grosseteste's large and rich body of writings includes scientific works, commentaries on and translations of Aristotle's writings and works of Greek theology, commentaries on books of the Bible, works in philosophy and speculative and pastoral theology, collections of sermons and letters, and a large collection of short theological writings known as the Dicta. Grosseteste also composed some Anglo-Norman poetry. His works of philosophical interest may be classified, in modern terms, as follows:

In the present article the focus is on Grosseteste's thought in works from the first three categories.

3. Sources

The most fundamental influence on Grosseteste's thought was St. Augustine, from whom Grosseteste drew a Neoplatonic outlook. Yet Grosseteste was also strongly influenced by the Latin translations of Greek and Arabic philosophical and scientific writings that had poured into the Latin West in his lifetime, notably the thought of such thinkers as Aristotle, Avicenna and Averroes (whose works Grosseteste was one of the first to use). These influences often pull him in different directions and his thought can take on an eclectic character. In general, however, he attempts to subordinate Greek and Arabic philosophical learning, when necessary, to his Augustinian Neoplatonism.

Although there is little doubt that Grosseteste was to some extent influenced by his contemporaries, his writings show little concern to engage in debate with them, in contrast with the practice of his contemporaries in Paris. This perhaps reflects the provincial origin of Grosseteste's works, but may also reflect a conservative preference to engage with the ideas of the great thinkers of the recent and more remote Latin, and, later in life, Greek traditions. The Christian influences on his philosophical writings were in particular Boethius, St. Anselm, and St. Bernard of Clairvaux, in addition to Augustine. Grosseteste also made frequent use of the writings of Cicero and Seneca. Later in life, in the 1230s and 40s, the influence of Greek thinkers such as John of Damascus, St. Basil and the Pseudo-Dionysius is prominent in his theological writings.

Grosseteste's Tabula (Rosemann 1995) provides an unusual insight into his sources. This work is a topical concordance in which Grosseteste lists readings, Christian and non-Christian, on a wide range of topics of theological and philosophical interest. Grosseteste associated with each topic a sign, which, written in his own manuscript books, allowed him quick access to the material in question.

4. The Metaphysics of Light

If a single leitmotif runs through Grosseteste's works, it is that of light. The notion of light occupies a prominent place in Grosseteste's commentaries on the Bible, in his account of sense perception and the relation of body and soul, in his illuminationist theory of knowledge, in his account of the origin and nature of the physical world, and, of course, in his writings on optics. Just how tightly associated Grosseteste took the notions of light employed in such different contexts to be is unclear. From a philosophical point of view, which will be the focus here, undoubtedly his use of the notion of light in his account of the basic structure and origin of the physical universe is of fundamental importance and the greatest originality.

Grosseteste's so-called metaphysics of light rests on a hylomorphic (matter-form) account of the metaphysical makeup of bodies. On this basis Grosseteste explains the generation and nature of the cosmos. Grosseteste also interprets aspects of Aristotle's natural philosophy in terms of this theory. He sets out this theory most fully in On Light, but elements of it are present also in his commentaries on the Posterior Analytics and Physics, in On Corporeal Change and Light, and in his commentary on Ecclesiasticus 43: 1-5, also known as On the Operations of the Sun.

Grosseteste treats bodies as composites of a first or prime matter and a corresponding first form. This form, termed “corporeity,” is the form in virtue of which something is a body. Grosseteste takes bodies to be more or less metaphysically simple depending on whether, in addition to corporeity, they include other substantial forms. Thus, in On Light he holds the firmament or outermost heavenly sphere to be the most simple body, as it is composed simply of first matter and first form, but in his commentary on the Physics he speaks of the element fire as having in addition to first form the substantial form of fire.

Grosseteste's originality lay not in presenting a doctrine of first form and first matter. Aristotle was standardly understood to propound a notion of first or prime matter, and the notion of a first form may be found in texts of Neoplatonic inspiration, such as the Fons vitae of Avicebron (see McEvoy 1982, 158-162). What appears to be original, however, is Grosseteste's identification of first form with light (lux). On Light opens with an argument for this identification. Grosseteste asserts that first form and first matter are in themselves simple substances. Yet first form, corporeity, necessarily results in the extension of matter into three dimensions, thereby yielding a quantified body. A simple form without dimension could only have this effect, however, if it instantaneously multiplied and diffused itself in all directions, thereby extending matter along with its diffusion of itself. But these are characteristic features of light, for light is essentially self-multiplicative and self-diffusive, a sphere of light being instantaneously generated from a point of light. Thus, Grosseteste concludes that light is in fact the first form.

On the basis of this theory Grosseteste developed a cosmogony and cosmology. He saw in the metaphysics of light at least partial insight into God's creation of the physical universe and an explanation of why it took the form it did. At the beginning of time, Grosseteste asserts, God created first form or light in first matter. First form and first matter are in themselves indivisible and simple, and according to Grosseteste the finite multiplication of a simple cannot generate an item with size (quantum). But, he thinks, the infinite multiplication of a simple will generate a finite quantum. Thus, through the infinite multiplication of first form in first matter extended bodies, and thus the physical universe, were produced. To account for bodies of different sizes, Grosseteste posits that there are infinities of different sizes (see below) that stand in different ratios, numerical and non-numerical, to each other. Thus, "light through its infinite multiplication extended matter into larger and smaller finite dimensions related to one another in any given ratios, numerical and non-numerical" (Baur 1912, 53).

The infinite self-multiplication of light and the matter it informed extended that matter into a spherical form, since light diffuses itself spherically; this is why the cosmos is a sphere. The outermost parts of this extension of matter were more extended and rarefied than the innermost parts, which remained capable of further rarefaction when the outermost did not. In On Light Grosseteste identifies the outermost or first sphere generated by light with the firmament of the Bible. This sphere, in turn, diffused lumen from itself back into the center of the universe. Lumen is identified as "a spiritual body or, if you prefer, a bodily spirit" and is not to be confused with light (lux) itself. This lumen collected at the center and dispersed outward to form the second sphere under the first sphere. This second sphere was more dense than the first sphere, but more rarefied than the mass under itself. This second sphere, in turn, dispersed lumen into the center, and this in turn dispersed back outward to form the third sphere. This process was repeated until the nine heavenly spheres, the lowest of which is the sphere bearing the moon, were formed. In each of these spheres, Grosseteste holds, the matter was completed and incapable of further impression.

Under the nine heavenly spheres is the sublunary realm. The repeated gathering of lumen emitted from the heavenly spheres below the lunar sphere left "a thickened mass, which was the matter of the four elements" (Baur 1912, 55). But the lumen generated from the lunar sphere did not have sufficient power to make subtle and disperse its outermost parts so as to produce a completed sphere below it, as occurred with the lumen of the super-lunary spheres. As a result, in each part of the sublunar mass "there remained incompletion and the possibility of the reception of congregration and dispersal" (Baur 1912, 55-56). This led to the generation of the incomplete spheres of the elements, in descending order, fire, air, water and earth; the incompleteness of these spheres explains why the elements, unlike the heavenly spheres, are capable of alteration, growth, generation and corruption.

Grosseteste also employs this theory of light as part of his explanation of the nature of the heavenly motions. He explains that the heavenly bodies can only move with a circular movement because the lumen in them is incapable of rarefaction or condensation, and as result cannot incline the parts of their matter upward (to rarefy them) or downward (so as to condense them). Indeed, the heavenly spheres can only receive movement "from an intellective motive power,” that is, an intelligence or angel, “that circulates the spheres in a corporeal revolution by driving its gaze back on itself in a corporeal fashion" (Baur 1912, 58). Because the elements, on the other hand, can be rarefied and condensed, they can incline the lumen in themselves away from the center of the universe, so as to rarefy it, or toward the center so as to condense it, and this accounts for their natural capacity to move up and down.

Although the metaphysics of light is fundamentally non-Aristotelian in nature, Grosseteste clearly was concerned to use it to explain many of the features of the Aristotelian cosmos — the system of nested spheres, the distinction between the motion of celestial and sublunary bodies, and so forth. In like manner, in his commentary on the Physics he interprets fundamental ideas in Aristotle's natural philosophy in terms of the light metaphysics, explaining Aristotle's theory of potentiality in terms of the replicability of form and holding that every corporeal species comes to be by "the greater or lesser replication of the simple first corporeal form," light (Dales 1963a, 17). Likewise, Aristotle's three principles: form, privation and the underlying subject, are interpreted as the first form light, the impurity of light in things, and first matter respectively. In On Corporeal Motion and Light, Grosseteste identifies nature, conceived by Aristotle as an internal source of motion and rest, with the first form, light, and claims that all kinds of corporeal change are the "multiplicative force" of the first corporeal form, light (Baur 1912, 92).

5. Infinity, Continuity, and Measurement

Grosseteste appears to have been the first in the Latin West to propose a doctrine of unequal infinities. In On Light he holds that there are infinite numbers that differ in size: "the sum of all numbers, odd and even, is infinite, and thus is larger than the sum of all even numbers, even though this too is infinite; for it exceeds it by the sum of all the odd numbers" (Baur 1912, 52-53). According to Grosseteste, infinite numbers can stand to one another not only in every numerical ratio, but also in every non-numerical ratio (Grosseteste has in mind the ratio of the infinite numbers of points contained in incommensurable lines). He clearly thinks lines and other continua contain different-sized infinities of points or indivisibles, viewed as dimensionless simples. But he also thinks points are parts of lines, and more generally, that indivisibles serve to make up continua. He is aware that Aristotle seems to reject this view and hold that magnitudes only have magnitudes as their parts, but he claims in On Light that the term “part” has a range of meanings depending on which mathematical relationship of parts to wholes is in question. Aristotle, he asserts, means by “part” in connection with continua an aliquot part and is concerned only to deny that continua are composed of indivisibles as aliquot parts. But this denial does not entail that indivisibles are not parts standing in a different mathematical relationship to the wholes to which they belong. According to On Light, a point is a part of a line in the sense that it is in a line "an infinite number of times and does not lessen the line when it is substracted from it a finite number of times" (Baur 1912, 54). Grosseteste says little about the ordering of indivisibles in continua but mentions without criticism Aristotle's view that indivisibles in continua must be densely or "mediately" ordered, so that between any two is yet another, a view attributed to him by Albert the Great and Thomas Bradwardine (see Lewis 2005).

Grosseteste's theory of unequal infinities served as the basis of a theory of how God measured the world he created. Grosseteste takes up measurement in his commentary on the Physics (Dales 1963a, 90-95), in one of the earliest theoretical discussions of measurement in the middle ages. He points out that human measurement of time involves taking some recurring movement — say, the daily movement of the heaven — and stipulating its duration to be a unit of measurement. In the same way, the magnitude of some body is taken as a unit of the measurement of spatial magnitude. Measurement of this sort, Grosseteste holds, is inherently relative in nature. To say that an event lasts for a day, for example, is simply to relate its duration to the duration of the motion of the heavens. But Grosseteste thought that this mode of measurement would not suffice for God, who, as he frequently mentions, "has disposed all things in number, weight and measure" (Wisdom 11: 21). God's creative activity requires that he create bodies with a definite magnitude and motions with a definite duration, and this requires that there be a non-relative measure intrinsic to magnitudes and durations. According to Grosseteste, this measure is provided by the different-sized infinities of indivisibles comprising spatial and temporal magnitudes. Grosseteste points out in his commentary on the Physics that were only a single line to exist, it would not be possible for us to measure its magnitude, and yet God could do so by counting the infinite number of points that comprise its magnitude. Only God can measure in this way, for only to him is the infinite finite, an allusion to Augustine's teaching in The City of God 20.19 that God alone can embrace an infinity in his mind.

6. Creation, Eternity, Time and Being

As a Christian, Grosseteste believed that God created the world with a beginning; indeed, he thought, as some sketchy arguments in the Hexaæmeron 1.9.7 indicate, that the beginning of the world could be proved. But his primary contribution to the medieval debate over the beginning of the world was his interpretation and refutation of Aristotle's arguments in Physics 8 for a beginningless or "eternal" world (see Dales 1986). In this connection Grosseteste was at odds with many of his early thirteenth-century contemporaries who thought that Aristotle did not mean to deny the beginning of the world but only that it had a natural beginning. Let those who adopt such an interpretation, he writes in his Hexaemeron, "not deceive themselves and pointlessly try to make a Catholic of Aristotle, thereby wasting their time and mental powers and, in making a Catholic of Aristotle, making heretics of themselves" (Dales and Gieben 1982, 61)

Grosseteste takes up Aristotle's arguments for a beginningless world in his Hexaæmeron and, in greater detail, in the closely related treatise On the Finitude of Motion and Time. In both works he holds that Aristotle was led to propose his erroneous arguments as a result of a failure to adequately grasp simple eternity. Grosseteste is prepared to grant that Aristotle and other philosophers proved that God exists and is unchangeable and non-temporal and that they indeed had some grasp of simple eternity. Even so, their incomplete understanding of simple eternity meant that they did not really understand what they proved. This lack of understanding was due to a disordering of their affectus or will, rather than of their aspectus or reason. This distinction between affectus and aspectus, which appears to derive from Augustine, is characteristic of Grosseteste's thought. According to Grosseteste, genuine understanding requires that one's will or desires be directed away from the sensible world to the unchanging eternal realm, but Aristotle and the other philosophers, being preoccupied with the sensible world, could not achieve true understanding.

Simple eternity is God's eternity, the non-temporal mode of being enjoyed by God. Grosseteste, like Augustine before him in Confessions 12.40, thinks we can speak of eternity as before time and of time as after eternity, provided we bear in mind that the terms “before” and “after” are in this connection employed in non-temporal senses. According to Grosseteste, if Aristotle had more fully grasped simple eternity he would have realized his arguments for the eternity of the world rest on a failure to recognize non-temporal notions of before and after. Aristotle, he thinks, assumes in two of his arguments for the eternity of the world that a first motion would have to have been preceded by a potentiality for this motion and thus by time. But since, according to Aristotle, time requires motion and a potentiality for something can only be exercised through a motion, there follows the absurdity that the first motion would not be the first motion. Thus time and motion must be without beginning. Grosseteste objects that although the first motion exists after not existing and that there was indeed a potential for that motion before it, in this context “was’ and “before” refer to the relation of eternity to time and are used in a non-temporal sense. The first motion was preceded by a potentiality for itself, not in time, but in God's eternity, and the actualization of this potential involves no motion or change in God. As for Aristotle's third argument that there cannot be a first instant, hence nor a beginning of time or change, because an instant is a link between past and future, Grosseteste responds that this conception of an instant will appeal only to someone already committed to the eternity of time and change.

According to Grosseteste, the notion of eternity is key also to understanding the nature of time. In his commentary on the Physics he takes Aristotle's conception of time as a number of change in respect of before and after to be the result of a superficial discussion, adequate as far as the natural philosopher is concerned but inadequate as an account of time's true essence, an inadequacy, he thinks, Augustine had also seen. But Grosseteste is not attracted to what he takes to be Augustine's subjectivist conception of time and instead seeks an account of the true essence of time as an objective phenomenon.

According to Grosseteste, time is "the privation of the at-once of eternity from the totality of being" (Dales 1963a, 96). He means that for there to be time there must be items whose existence does not adhere as a whole, as he puts it, with the at-once of eternity, that is, whose existence is not instantaneous. Eternity, is, as it were, a fixed point subject to a continuous succession of the adherences of instantaneous bits of the totality of existence, one bit adhering to eternity only continuously to be replaced by another; this continuous replacement constitutes the flow of time. Grosseteste defines the instant, by which he means the now, as this adherence of being with the at-once of eternity, and likewise defines past and future in terms of this adherence. He realizes that his use of tenses in his explanations of these notions renders them ultimately circular, but asks that he not be criticized "for making these differences known in terms, as it were, of themselves, for it does not come to mind, or does not do so easily, how they could otherwise be made known" (Dales 1963a, 98).

Grosseteste's account of time appears to be closely related to his conception of existence, as presented in his commentaries on the Posterior Analytics and Physics and in On Truth (Rossi 1981, 290-291 ; Dales 1963a, 7; Baur 1912, 141). Grosseteste holds that a created thing's existence just is its dependence on God. Thus, a thing does not depend on God for its existence; its dependence on God is its existence. Grosseteste appears to equate this relation of dependence with the relation of adherence to the at-once of eternity mentioned in his account of time. He remarks that "something no more partakes of actual existence except insofar as it adheres to the first being that is all at once" (Dales 1963a, 96-97). He does not seem to realize that the relata of the relation of adherence in his account of time and of the relation of dependence in his account of being are different: in his account of time it is an instantaneous bit of a thing's existence that adheres, while in his account of existence it is the thing itself that is dependent and existence is itself treated as a relation, not as the term of a relation.

7. Divine Foreknowledge and Human Freedom

On Free Decision is one of Grosseteste's most influential and substantial philosophical works. Its first half is largely devoted to the problem of reconciling God's knowledge of the future with human freedom. Much of the importance of this discussion resides in the theory of modality that Grosseteste develops, but it is also of importance for the argument Grosseteste presents for the incompatibility of God's knowledge of the future and future contingency. Grosseteste correctly takes himself to be presenting a different argument, and different solution, from those found in Boethius and Anselm, who had written two of the most important earlier discussions of the issue.

Grosseteste presents this argument as follows: "Everything known by God is or was or will be. A is known by God (and let A be a future contingent). Therefore, A is or was or will be. But it neither is nor was; therefore it will be. It is clear that each of the premises is necessary. It also is clear that the entailment is necessary. Therefore, the conclusion is not only true, but also necessary, for only the necessary follows from necessaries" (Baur 1912, 152). The argument is in two parts: A sound argument without modal premises is presented for the conclusion that an event will occur. It is then claimed that its premises are necessary, and thus, by the principle that entailment transmits necessity from premises to conclusion, that its conclusion is necessary too. In his discussion of this argument Grosseteste focuses on premises formulated in terms of God's knowledge, but he clearly thinks that a range of arguments having the same form can be constructed, employing in their initial part not only premises about God's knowledge, but also premises formulated in terms of prophecy or even just past-tensed truths of the form "It was the case that A will be."

Grosseteste's appeal to the principle that entailment transmits necessity from the premises to the conclusions of a valid inference is a striking feature of the kind of argument he considers. This principle forms the focus of much of Grosseteste's discussion of the argument: "It doesn't seem," he notes, "that we can reply to the aforesaid arguments … except by saying that a contingent does indeed follow from necessaries" (Baur 1912, 166). But in the final analysis Grossetete does not reject the principle; he holds that entailment does indeed transmit necessity from premises to conclusion: "in a syllogistic inference the necessary does follow from necessaries with the kind of necessity the antecedents have and the conclusion, like the antecedents, has truth that cannot cease in the future and from which it cannot be altered" (Baur 1912, 171).

Grosseteste's response to such arguments is to grant that they in fact are sound and do indeed prove the necessity of true propositions about future acts. But he challenges the further conclusion drawn from them that if a proposition about a future act is necessary in the sense proved by such arguments, the act cannot really be a free act. Instead, Grosseteste takes the kind of necessity involved in such arguments to be compatible with freedom. His strategy is to hold that the freedom of future acts is incompatible only with a different kind of necessity, and that such arguments fail when formulated in terms of this conception of necessity, since their premises and conclusions are contingent in the correlative sense of contingency.

Grosseteste's response to the conflict between divine foreknowledge and free decision and related arguments therefore has two parts: first, the claim that there is a distinct family of modal notions in respect of which future events and true propositions about them may be contingent; second, the claim that freedom requires only this kind of contingency. Unfortunately Grosseteste has little to say in support of this second claim, but his introduction of a distinct family of modal notions is of philosophical interest in its own right, as it marks an important stage in the development of modal theory.

8. Modality and God's Power

When Grosseteste wrote On Free Decision modal concepts were typically understood in terms of the notion of change and thus of time. Thus, Grosseteste speaks of a necessary proposition, in this sense, as one that is true and cannot become false, or one whose truth is unable to cease to be. A contingent proposition can change its truth value; a possible proposition, if false, can become true, and an impossible proposition is false and cannot become true. Conceptions of modality along these lines were sometimes described as per accidens conceptions, since in many cases a proposition's modal status could change with the passage of time; its modal status, as it were, happens to or is incidental to it (accidit). “Caesar crossed the Rubicon,” for example, was once false and not necessary, but became true and necessary, because unable to become false, after Caesar crossed the Rubicon. Indeed, true propositions about the past were the standard examples of propositions necessary in the sense that their truth cannot cease.

Grosseteste holds that true propositions about the present may well be contingent on this conception of contingency, since they can become false; he gives “Socrates is pale” as an example (Lewis 1991, 49). But he holds that all true propositions about the future are necessary. It might be thought that this is incorrect, since it is not hard to think of cases in which a true proposition about the future becomes false after the occurrence of an event it predicts. But closer inspection reveals that Grosseteste thinks that true propositions about the future are necessary because they cannot become false prior to the obtaining of the state of affairs they are about; he has a limited unchangeability of truth in mind.

Grosseteste does not reject this conception of per accidens modalities. Rather, he introduces another family of modal notions unconnected to considerations of time or change, a family of non-temporal modal notions. And he holds that many true propositions about the future, including those about future free acts, are contingent in the sense of contingency belonging to this family, as indeed also are true propositions regarding God's knowledge of those acts, past prophecies of them or even statements to the effect that it was the case that the acts would occur. Ideas along these lines, we may note, were not original to Grosseteste; they are implicit in some of his predecessors, such as Peter Lombard, whom Grosseteste cites. But they, unlike Grosseteste, had not attempted to work out in any detail a theory of modality severing a link with considerations of time and change (the twelfth-century thinker, Peter Abelard, is an exception, but his theory of non-temporal modality, which takes as its central notion that of a thing's nature, is very different from Grosseteste's and had little influence). Thinkers after Grosseteste, such as Duns Scotus, developed accounts of non-temporal modality in even more detail that share elements found in Grosseteste's account and perhaps were influenced by it (see Lewis 1996).

The guiding idea behind Grosseteste's approach to a notion of non-temporal contingency is that even if a proposition such as “Antichrist will exist” (to use his standard example of a true, future contingent proposition) is true now and cannot become false until Antichrist comes into existence, the world might nevertheless have been such that “Antichrist will exist” was never true. A present-day thinker might spell this idea out in terms of alternative possible worlds, but Grosseteste spells it out in terms of the notion of a proposition's eternal power for truth or falsity without beginning, and grounds such powers ultimately in God's eternal power to know or will propositions.

Grosseteste's discussion of non-temporal modalities and their relation to God's power is most fully set out in the first recension of On Free Choice. Focusing on necessity, he writes that "something is called necessary in that it does not have a power, either for non-being, or not-having been or not going to be, in the way that '2 and 3 are five' is necessary because it has no power not to be true, either in the present or future or past, or ever, whether with a beginning or without a beginning" (Lewis 1991, 48). He goes on to describe the corresponding notion of contingency as a matter of a proposition's having "a power to be true and false without beginning." What is necessary in this sense utterly lacks a power to be false. What is contingent, in the corresponding sense, could have had from the beginning a different truth-value, though it may well lack a power to change its truth-value from that which it actually has. Grosseteste holds that this kind of contingency of propositions about future events or things implies that the things or events the proposition is about may themselves be called contingent, and that this kind of contingency is sufficient for the freedom of our future acts.

Much of Grosseteste's account of modality is concerned with difficulties posed by the notion of the eternal power of a proposition to be true or false without beginning. He seems to hold such powers to be possessed not in time, but in eternity. He notes that God too has eternal powers, namely to know or will without beginning, and that the difficulties confronting the eternal powers of propositions also confront the eternal powers of God. In fact, Grosseteste explains the eternal powers of propositions in terms of God's eternal powers to know and will propositions, effectively grounding non-temporal modality in God's powers or lack thereof (in the case of necessity and impossibility). He notes, for example, that "the eternal power for that the Antichrist was future to have had truth and not to have had truth without beginning, is simply the power of God by which he was able from eternity and without beginning to will or not will that the Antichrist will exist or to know or not know that the Antichrist will exist" (Lewis 1991, 58).

The difficulties facing the notion of eternal powers stem from the idea that there are unexercised but nonetheless genuine eternal powers, as Grosseteste's account of non-temporal contingency seems to require. Put in terms of God's powers to know or will, one problem is what it could mean to say that God could have not known or willed what he in fact knows or wills (or the converse), as is implied, Grosseteste thinks, by the doctrine that God has the power to not know or not will what he knows or wills. For “could have” expresses the priority of power to act, the idea that prior to God's willing that p, he had a power not to will that p. But God is not in time and thus “could have” cannot express a temporal priority of God's power to its act. Grosseteste's solution to this problem is to hold that it expresses a so-called causal priority, a notion he drew from Eriugena (Grosseteste prefers not to call it a natural priority since there is no distinction of natures involved in God's power and act) (see Lewis 1996).

The notion of unexercised eternal powers also faces the difficulty that unexercised powers appear to be powers for future acts and, if genuine, can be exercised in the future. But how could a timeless being, as God is, exercise at a future time his power to know or will what he in fact does not know or will; indeed are not such powers described as powers to know or will without beginning? Such an attribution of power to God therefore seems to be empty (frustra). The problem Grosseteste confronts here is central to anyone who, like him, takes God to be timeless and yet to have powers to do what he does not do, and it is to Grosseteste's credit that he puts the problem squarely on the table. His solution appeals to the idea that God's powers to know or will are rational powers, powers that can be exercised in more than one way (the concept of a rational power is drawn from Aristotle). Thus the power to know that p is the same as the power to not-know that p. But given such a conception of power, if God knows that p, then his power to not-know that p is ipso facto exercised, since it is the very same power as the power to know that p. So there are no unexercised powers in God after all. Thomas Bradwardine noted in criticism of this account that a more plausible requirement on exercisability is that if an agent has a power to know that p and does not know that p, then he can exercise that power by knowing that p. Grosseteste has no reply to this objection; its answer would require a more thoroughgoing examination of the relation of power to time and change than Grosseteste gives (see Lewis 1996).

9. Free Decision and Freedom of the Will

Early thirteenth-century accounts of human action and the freedom it involves focus on the notion of free decision (liberum arbitrium). This term, a legacy of Roman law and patristic thinkers, has no present-day counterpart, and even to thinkers in Grosseteste's day its sense was unclear and stood in need of determination. But if the notion of free decision itself is now of merely antiquarian interest, accounts of free decision are nonetheless important for the insight they provide into their authors' understanding of human action and freedom, issues of perennial philosophical concern.

The expression “free decision” was understood to refer not only, as its grammar as a concrete term suggests, to a certain kind of act, but also to the capacity or capacities whose exercise such an act involves. The word “decision” was standardly taken to involve a reference to reason and “free” a reference to the will. Thus, it was often asked whether “free decision” refers to an act of reason or of the will, and whether the capacities that such an act involves are reason or will, either alone or in combination, or possibly other capacities besides these.

According to Grosseteste in On Free Decision, “free decision” in its concrete usage refers to a decision, a certain kind of act of reason. This act, no more than any other act of reason, is not itself free, but is said to be free in a derivative sense because it is an act providing direction to the will, whose acts are free. (Talk of will and reason or their acts as free or not is common in medieval thinkers, but is perhaps a mere manner of speaking, when what is intended is that the agent's exercise of reason or will is done freely or not.) Reason has the task of distinguishing between good and bad, better and worse, and of proposing to the will what it should choose or reject. The will by nature chooses after receiving such a directive from reason, but is free to reject reason's decision and choose otherwise than reason has pronounced. This freedom of choice is why the decision is, in a derivative sense, said to be a free decision. In proposing this view, Grosseteste indicates that he takes the choices made by the will not to be psychologically determined by reason: reason provides the will with advice, not necessity.

Grosseteste takes the capacities underlying free decision to be reason and will, which he identifies with aspectus and affectus respectively, two notions characteristic of his thought. He holds, probably under Augustine's influence, that these capacities are at root one, but this one capacity can be exercised in one way through a decision, and in another through a choice. In proposing this doctrine Grosseteste appears concerned to maintain the simplicity of the soul.

Since Grosseteste holds that a decision is said to be free because it provides direction to the free will, as we might expect he takes the freedom of decision (libertas arbitrii) to be the freedom of the will itself. But what, exactly, is the nature of this freedom? It is common to think that the freedom of the will is the will's capacity to will alternatives, or considered post factum, to have willed otherwise than it did. Grosseteste and his contemporaries speak in this connection of a flexibilitas or vertibilitas of the will. The importance of Grosseteste's account of the freedom of the will lies in the fact he is one of the few thinkers in his day to hold that the freedom of the will is indeed to be defined as a capacity to will alternatives. Many of his most important contemporaries, in contrast, explicitly reject such a conception. They understand the pertinent alternatives to be moral good and evil, and point out the standard teaching that some agents with freedom of the will (God and the angels confirmed in good) simply cannot will moral evil, whereas others (Satan and his cohorts) cannot will moral good. Thus, they conclude that the freedom of the will cannot be defined as a capacity to turn between alternatives, and instead present alternative definitions of freedom — some, for example, define the will's freedom as its inability to be compelled. Grosseteste saw that their rejection of a definition of freedom in terms of a capacity to will alternatives rested on the assumption that the alternatives in question must be moral good and evil. He rejected this assumption and instead held that the freedom of the will is the will's capacity to turn between what he calls "bare opposites considered in themselves." Though Grosseteste provides little detail about the notion of a "bare opposite", it is clearly to be understood by reference to his view, as propounded in On Free Decision, that the moral goodness or evil of an act is a matter of its relation to God's will. Considered in themselves in independence of their relation to God's will, as "bare" acts, acts are morally indifferent.

Thus, the freedom of the will is the will's capacity to will, or more particularly, choose alternatives in the sense of morally indifferent alternatives. This is not to say that the objects of choice are considered as neither good nor bad; Grosseteste believes that one can only choose what one takes to be good. Rather, the notion of goodness involved in the choice of bare opposites is not the notion of moral goodness. Grosseteste describes it as natural goodness, but says very little about it. Given his views about the non-determination of the will by reason, he would seem to think that an agent who is choosing among natural goods can choose contrary to reason's dictate as to which of these is the best option or the one that should be chosen, though he provides no account of how this is possible. It is to be noted also that Grosseteste's conception of freedom does not mean that an agent can choose any natural good at all. His point, presumably, is that in a given situation of choice, in which an agent has arrayed before himself a range of alternative natural goods that he has some reason to choose, he can choose any one of these goods, despite the advice given by reason.

According to Grosseteste, this capacity to choose morally indifferent alternatives underlies our capacity for moral choice when it is present, though he provides little explanation of how it does so. He holds that human beings cannot choose moral good without the assistance of God's grace, but he does not discuss just how that assistance, combined with the aforementioned freedom, helps to make moral choice possible. Possibly he thinks that God's grace makes it possible for the fact that something is willed by God, and thus is morally good, to serve as a reason one has for choosing it. In any event, he makes it clear that the capacity to choose moral good is not intrinsic to possession of reason and will; otherwise the aid of grace would not be needed. Likewise, the capacity to choose moral evil is made possible by a feature that is not intrinsic to possession of reason and will, since God, who has reason and will, cannot choose moral evil. Rather, in ways not explained, the creature's capacity to choose moral evil is due to the fact, as Augustine too had held, that the creature is created from nothing, an inherent and unavoidable defect in any creature. In those confirmed in good, however, God has so made it that this capacity cannot be exercised, and so they are incapable of making an evil moral choice.

10. Exemplarism, Truth and Illumination

10.1 Exemplarism

Grosseteste's exemplarism (see Lynch 1941) is in part an adaptation of Plato's theory of Ideas to a Christian framework. Like other medieval thinkers, Grosseteste takes the existence of an eternal, self-subsistent realm of Platonic Ideas to be inconsistent with the dependence of all things on God. Nevertheless, following Augustine and Seneca, he does not reject the Platonic ideas outright. Rather, he treats them as eternal models (exempla) or, as he also calls them, reasons (rationes) of things in God's mind. Like the Platonic ideas, these reasons function as paradigms or models created things can accord with or fall short of. God looks to these reasons of things in creation, somewhat as a craftsman looks to the idea in his mind of what he is to make.

Given that God is absolutely simple, the reasons of things in God's mind must in the final analysis be identified with God. Thus Grosseteste moves between speaking of the reasons in God's mind as exemplars or models and speaking of God himself as such. Indeed, he describes God, following Augustine in the Confessions and De libero arbitrio, as first form, noting expressly that he is not using the notion of form in this connection in Aristotle's sense as what enters into a form-matter composite (as the first form corporeity does) (Luard 1861, 4). In On the Halt of Causes he identifies the first form, God, with "the form that is both a model and that in virtue of which a thing is" and notes that this form "is not conjoined with a thing but exists on its own, simple and separate. This is the first form, and how it is the first form is hard to explain" (Baur 1912, 125).

10.2 Truth

Grosseteste wrote in a tradition that employed the concept of truth in a number of different contexts. We may speak not only of the truth of propositions or thoughts, but also of things — e.g. of a tree or a human being — and God himself or the eternal Word is identified with truth. In his treatise On Truth Grosseteste takes up the question, raised by Anselm, whether there is just one truth (veritas), God, or many truths (veritates). But much of his account is concerned to present a uniform conception of truth that embraces these different applications of the term noted above. The doctrine of eternal exemplar forms plays an important role in this account.

According to Grosseteste's treatise On Truth, truth is the conformity or adequation of things and speech, or more particularly, the thought expressed by speech. This conception of truth as adequation had only recently entered the Latin West, but Grosseteste gives it a twist all his own, taking the speech in question to be that of God, the eternal Word. Thus truth (veritas) is a conformity between things and the eternal Word. Grosseteste claims that the eternal Word is itself its very own conformity to itself and thus may be identified with truth. As for created things, their truth is their conformity to their eternal model or reason in the eternal Word. Likewise, the truth of propositions — a subclass of things — is their conformity to their eternal model or reason in the eternal Word. This, on first appearance, would appear to clash with the idea that a proposition's truth is not its conformity to anything in God, but rather to the state of affairs in the world whose obtaining it asserts; but this appearance is deceptive. A thing's conformity to its eternal reason, its truth, is its having the being its exemplar specifies. Now, Grosseteste holds that created items have two kinds of being or perfection. In his commentary on the Posterior Analytics he holds that the second perfection of a thing is "the completion of the activity of the thing to which it has, as such, been established to be fitted and for the sake of which it has been established" (Rossi 1981, 240). The first being of a thing is its simply being the kind of thing it is. Thus, there is a twofold conformity possible of things to their eternal reasons. On the one hand, the eternal reason of a thing specifies the very kind of thing that thing is, and simply in virtue of existing as an item of a determinate kind a thing will necessarily conform to its exemplar in this respect and be true. Thus all human beings and all propositions are true, in this sense, in that they are the kinds of things they are, this being specified by their exemplar. A human being is a composite of body and soul, and a proposition is "the statement of one thing about another or one thing from another" (Baur 1912, 143). On the other hand, the eternal reason specifies the second perfection a thing ought to have but may nonetheless lack. In this sense a human being will be a false human being if, for example, she is vicious, falling short of the perfection of virtue specified in the eternal reason of a human being. Likewise, a proposition will be a false proposition if it fails to perform the function of a proposition, this being to state things as they in fact are in the world. Thus, the ordinary notion of propositional truth, described by Aristotle as "to so be in the thing signified as speech says," is a matter of a proposition's conformity, in respect of second being, to its eternal reason, and this is for it to perform the function perfective of propositions, namely, to be in conformity to the states of affairs it asserts.

With this account of truth Grosseteste thinks he can accomodate within one schema the divergent conceptions of truth present in his day. As to the initial question he drew from Anselm, whether there is just one truth or many, he holds that there are many truths (veritates), for otherwise the term “truth” could not admit a plural or be distributed (by which, roughly, he means we could not speak of "every truth"). Nevertheless, he concludes that "there is a single truth that the name ‘truth’ everywhere signifies and predicates, as Anselm holds — namely, the supreme truth — though this one truth is called many truths in the many truths of things" (Baur 1912, 139). Thus, for Grosseteste any use of the term "truth" involves in some way a reference to the supreme truth, God.

10.3 Illumination

Grosseteste subscribes, under Augustine's influence, to an illuminationist theory of human knowledge. According to this theory, human knowledge is understood by analogy to bodily vision: as a body can only be seen if light is shed on it, so something can only be known if a spiritual light is shed on it. Grosseteste presents versions of this theory in his treatise On Truth and in his commentary on the Posterior Analytics.

In On Truth Grosseteste presents an illuminationist theory of knowledge after outlining his theory of truth. Because created truth is a conformity between things and their eternal reasons, we can only know created truth if we know that a created thing conforms to its eternal reason. As in the commentary on the Posterior Analytics, Grosseteste employs an analogy with bodily vision. When we see a body as colored it is necessary that an external light be shed on its color, rendering it actually visible to us. Likewise, to see a created thing as true, an external light must be shed on its truth, rendering it actually visible to us. But this truth is the adequation of the thing and its eternal reason, and thus an external light, the light of the Supreme Truth, God, must be shed on both the thing and its eternal reason if it is to be visible to the mind. Grosseteste is quick to point out that this does not require that the knower see God himself or even be aware of him. Indeed, only the pure of heart see God as he is in himself, that is, have the face-to-face vision of God. All the same, all who know truth must in some way have at least an unwitting cognition of the Supreme Truth and its light, and of course, a vision of the eternal reasons, that falls short of the direct vision of God. How this can be is left unexplained.

On Truth makes no reference to Aristotle's views on knowledge; Grosseteste's sources are simply Augustine and Anselm. This is perhaps a consequence of the expressly theological concerns of the work. But in the commentary on the Posterior Analytics Grosseteste saw the need to to relate his illuminationist account of knowledge to Aristotle's account of scientific knowledge. The following remarks briefly examine some aspects of this attempt. (For further discussion and more technical aspects of Grosseteste's account of demonstrative science, see the entry on Medieval Theories of Demonstration, as well as Crombie 1953, Laird 1987, Longeway 2007, McEvoy 1982, Marrone 1983, 1986, Serene 1979, Wallace 1972.)

The Posterior Analytics is concerned to provide an account of scientia or “scientific knowledge.” By this is meant not scientific knowledge in the modern sense of a body of theory based on the experimental testing of hypotheses, but rather an understanding of the reason why a given fact obtains (knowledge propter quid), as opposed to knowledge simply that the fact does obtain (knowledge quia). We might describe it as a certain kind of explanatory knowledge. An Aristotelian science is a systematization of knowledge based on the structure of Euclid's axiomatic geometry and employing as its underlying logic Aristotle's logic of the syllogism. One arrives at scientia of a given fact by deriving it as the conclusion of a syllogism whose premises meets certain stringent conditions intended to render them explanatory of that fact. As Grosseteste puts it, the premises or principles — i.e., starting points — of such a syllogism must be true, immediate, prior and better known than the conclusion, must state causes, be necessary, concern essential connections, be universal, everlasting and incorruptible. A syllogism that meets these conditions is called a demonstrative syllogism or demonstration and will serve to provide explanatory knowledge of its conclusion. Grosseteste at one point states that only mathematics is comprised of demonstrations in this strict sense, though in another passage he seems to suggest that theology would most fully meet these conditions; the contradiction is resolved if we distinguish the demonstrative knowledge possible for us in this life (mathematics) from that in principle possible in the afterlife. The natural sciences do not, Grosseteste claims, fully meet the requirements for a fully demonstrative science, though if we relax the conditions governing demonstrations somewhat we may speak of a demonstrative science of natural phenomena (see the entry on Medieval Theories of Demonstration for details).

According to Grosseteste, the Posterior Analytics is not concerned to provide a method for arriving at demonstrations, but rather to provide criteria to evaluate whether a given syllogism counts as a demonstration. Nevertheless, Aristotle does make remarks regarding the source of the principles and definitions employed in demonstrations. It is in considering these remarks, in particular, that Grosseteste confronts Aristotle's conception of science with his own illuminationist epistemology.

The problem is that Aristotle holds that it is from sense experience that we obtain the universal concepts and principles of a science. Thus, if someone lacks a sense, he will also lack the scientific knowledge involving the concepts and principles derived from exercise of that sense. But Grosseteste points out that God and the intelligences (i.e., angels) know without reliance on the senses, and he holds that the intellective power, the highest part of the human soul, relies on no bodily sense or organ in its proper operation. Instead, this operation involves a mental vision in which one arrives at knowledge of things by viewing their exemplar forms or rationes in an irradiation one receives from God or an intelligence.

Grosseteste reconciles this doctrine with Aristotle's teachings by holding that with rare exceptions most individuals in the present life do not have knowledge of this sort. Their intellective power is “sick” and unable to perform its proper operation. Thus Grosseteste distinguishes our present fallen state, in which sense experience is necessary if we are to acquire the principles of demonstrative science, from the state of human beings prior to the fall or of the blessed in heaven.

But it would wrong to think that Grosseteste adopts an empiricist account of knowledge in the present life, if by this it is meant that he thinks that simply in virtue of having sense experience we have knowledge. Sense experience, he holds, is only the occasion for the operation of our rational powers. According to Grosseteste, the intellective power is sick because it is darkened and weighed down by the corrupt body. He intimates that human beings are born in such a condition, presumably as a consequence of the fall. This darkening of the mind is likened to vision on a day darkened by clouds. In the case of the mind, what darkens the operation of the cognitive powers are bodily appearances (phantasmata), which obstruct our mental vision and render it unable to see intelligible items in their purity. This darkening, Grosseteste holds, is the source of all error.

The acquisition of knowledge of the principles of demonstration is a process in which reason is stimulated to leave this darkness. Grosseteste holds that the powers of the rational soul in a newborn human being are as it were asleep and unable to act. But sense experience in some way involves reason, and as a result of repeated sense experience reason is woken up and carried by the senses to perceptible things. Reason then begins to distinguish and view apart the features confused in sense experience, and thereby formulate universal concepts. Repeated experience of correlated perceptible phenomena lead the senses to estimate an imperceptible relationship between them — a causal connection, for example. This too awakens reason and leads it to wonder whether this connection in fact obtains. Grosseteste uses the example, drawn from Avicenna, of the causal claim that scammony of itself causes the discharge of red bile. Wondering whether this is true, we set up what we should now call a controlled experiment. We exclude other known causes of the discharge of red bile and give someone scammony to see what will happen. And in this way, Grosseteste writes, we arrive “from sense at an observational (experimentale) universal principle” (Rossi 1981, 215).

Grossetese describes this as the process of the mind's being stimulated on the occasion of sense experience to seek and find its own light; to turn from corruptible corporeal objects to intelligible things. The mind moves out of the darkness it is in to find a trace of its light, which stands to it as the sun stands to the eyes in bodily vision.

Although Grosseteste does not suggest that in demonstrative knowledge or knowledge of its principles one sees the eternal exemplars of things in God, he does nonetheless take the mind of such a knower to be illuminated. In fact, Grosseteste expressly holds that all cognition is mental vision; thus he distinguishes opinion from knowledge in terms of the purity of one's vision of intelligible items. The shortcomings in mental vision in this life are due to shortcomings in the knower herself and not to a lack of spiritual light. The knower starts off in the dark, her vision clouded by bodily appearances. An external spiritual light is present, but obstructed. The suggestion seems to be that the light involved in all mental vision is a light shed by God or an angel. If we are to have full vision of intelligibles, Grosseteste holds, it is important that we reorient our affectus or will away from a preoccupation with the sensible world. As Grosseteste puts it, “to the extent that one's love is turned away from corruptible bodies, so far is its aspectus turned around to its own light and finds it.” It is in this way that we escape from the darkness and oppression the body has placed us under.

It must be admitted that there is a great deal about Grosseteste's attempt to explicate Aristotelian science within the framework of an illuminationist epistemology that remains obscure. For example, one important tension in his account concerns the nature of demonstrative knowledge and our grasp of principles, described as intellectus. Grosseteste writes that intellectus and demonstrative knowledge are “like the vision of healthy eyes through the medium of pure air with clear light spread over the colored object. . . . Intellectus and demonstrative knowledge apprehend things in the purity of their essence, as they are in themselves” (Rossi 1981, 279-280). And yet Grosseteste's account of why we cannot employ our intellective power with its proper operation requires him to hold that in fact we cannot in this life apprehend things in the purity of their essence. Thus, discussing certitude, he holds that the degree of certitude we can have regarding an intelligible item depends on how close in nature it is to the spiritual light; those that are more akin to the light can be known with greater certainty. Now, divine things can in principle be known with the greatest certainty, since they are most akin to this light, but in this life we have greatest certitude in mathematics. Grosseteste explains that this is because to our sick minds, things covered over with bodily appearances are more visible, just as dark and shadowy things are more visible to sick bodily eyes than highly illuminated white things. To the intellect, however, as it would be in its optimal state, divine things would be more certain. The problem is clear: if our vision in mathematics is that of sick and darkened eyes, it is hard to see how we can be said to apprehend mathematical things in the purity of their essence as they are in themselves, and thus have knowledge of them.

11. Scientific Method

Grosseteste's numerous short scientific works made no significant contribution to scientific theory. Yet it has been argued that Grosseteste played a key role in the development of scientific method. In particular, Crombie 1955 (a summary of Crombie 1953) has claimed (1) that Grosseteste was the first in the Latin West to develop an account of an experimental method in science (98); (2) that he “seems to have been the first writer to make systematic use of a method of experimental verification and falsification” (107); (3) that he gave a “special importance to mathematics in attempting to provide scientific explanations of the physical world” (111). These claims have been the subject of considerable debate.

The claim that Grosseteste developed an account of experimental method in science puts great weight on the aforementioned passage in which Grosseteste describes a controlled experiment to see whether scammony causes the discharge of red bile. There can be little doubt that Grosseteste does indeed have in mind the idea of a controlled experiment. The question, however, is whether Grosseteste makes the notion of controlled experiment part of a general account of a scientific method for arriving at the principles of demonstrative science. The evidence that he does so is not strong. The discussion of scammony is the only reference to controlled experiment in his writings, and when Grosseteste refers back to this discussion later in the commentary as explaining how we come to acquire experiential principles, the notion of controlled experiment is sometimes inapplicable — as for example, regarding our knowledge of the cause of an eclipse. Moreover, Grosseteste is quite prepared to grant that in some cases we can know causal connections after only a single perception (see Marrone 1986). On balance, we may say that Grosseteste did introduce to the Latin West the notion of controlled experiment and related it to demonstrative science, but he hardly set it up as the method by which such knowledge is to be obtained; it is one among many ways of arriving at such knowledge and is not accorded the emphasis it has been given in scholarly commentary.

As for Grosseteste's actual practice in his scientific writings, if by an experimental method is meant a method of controlled experiment, then it must be said that Grosseteste makes no use of such a method in these writings. He arrives at his conclusions in his scientific writings on the basis of a mix of considerations. He appeals to authority and everyday observation ( "experimentum" in Latin) and makes use of thought experiments and certain metaphysical assumptions, such as that “every operation of nature occurs in the most finite, ordered, shortest and best way possible for it” (Baur 1912, 75). Nowhere does he describe a controlled experiment as the basis of his conclusions (see Eastwood 1968, regarding Grosseteste's works in optics). We may grant that Grossetete does cite empirical observation as one factor among others when he assesses the adequacy of certain accounts of natural phenomena, but this is far from employing a method of experimental verification and falsification in the sense of a controlled experiment.

The claim that Grosseteste gave a “special importance to mathematics in attempting to provide scientific explanations of the physical world” is on a stronger footing. In the opening of the treatise On Lines, Angles and Figures Grosseteste remarks that “the consideration of lines, angles and figures is of the greatest utility since it is impossible for natural philosophy to be known without them …. All causes of natural effects have to be given through lines, angles and figures, for otherwise it is impossible for the reason why (propter quid) to be known in them” (Baur 1912, 59-60). In the treatise, On the Nature of Places, which is a continuation of On Lines, Angles and Figures, Grosseteste sums up the preceding text with the remark that “the diligent investigator of natural phenomena can give the causes of all natural effects, therefore, in this way by the rules and roots and foundations given from the power of geometry” (Baur 1912, 65). Undoubtedly, then, Grosseteste saw a key role for geometry in the explanation of natural phenomena.

At the basis of this view was Grosseteste's view that natural agents act by the multiplication of their power or species, a view Roger Bacon was to develop in detail. Grosseteste was, of course, thinking of the action of light. He holds that knowledge propter quid must be through angles, lines and figures because a “natural agent multiplies its power from itself to what it acts upon, whether it act upon the senses or upon matter” (Baur 1912, 60). Grosseteste holds that the intensity of operation of the natural agent will be a matter of its distance from what it acts upon, the angle at which it strikes it, and the figure in which it multiplies its operation, this being either a sphere or cone. He establishes certain rudimentary rules to this effect, such as that the shorter the distance, the stronger the operation.

The remarks above should not blind us to the fact that Grosseteste was deeply concerned with the detailed investigation of natural phenomena. It was the inspiration of this attitude of mind, together with Grosseteste's emphasis on the importance of mathematics, that was perhaps his chief legacy to thinkers in fourteenth-century Oxford who were developing the beginnings of a mathematical physics.

12. Influence

By the fourteenth century, Grosseteste had achieved the unusual status of being an authoritative figure for Oxford thinkers — someone from whose writings quotations might be marshalled, on the strength of his name, in defense of one's views. Thus, both Thomas Bradwardine and Thomas Buckingham appeal to Grosseteste in support of their conflicting views on future contingency. John Wyclif likewise appeals to Grosseteste as a fellow traveller in support of his views on the continuum, among other issues, ranking him with Plato, Democritus and Augustine as one of the greatest of thinkers. Such appeals are signs of the reverence with which Grosseteste was held in fourteenth-century Oxford.

The influence of specific ideas of Grosseteste's may be found in numerous thinkers, especially those who flourished at Oxford. Their number includes Thomas of York, Adam of Wodeham, Ockham, Bradwardine, Wyclif, William of Alnwick, and others. But his greatest influence as a philosopher seems to have been as a source of ideas for thinkers flourishing in the first half of the thirteenth century. In particular, Richard Rufus of Cornwall makes extensive use of Grosseteste's writings in a large commentary on Aristotle's Metaphysics and his Oxford commentary on the Sentences of Peter Lombard, as does his Oxford contemporary Richard Fishacre in his commentary on the Sentences. These thinkers were heavily influenced by Grosseteste's On Free Decision as well as by his writings on the eternity of the world. Rufus also praises Grosseteste's scientific and mathematical expertise, as does Roger Bacon, a man by temperament more given to scorn than praise.

Grosseteste's philosophical influence on the Continent appears to have been largely as a scholar of Aristotle. His commentary on the Posterior Analytics achieved renown across the Continent and was used throughout the middle ages, and the same was true of his translation of the Ethics. Indeed, these two pieces of Aristotelian scholarship alone would have sufficed to acquire for Grossetete an important place in the history of medieval thought.



Biographical Studies

Important biographical material may also be found in a number of the more general studies listed below, especially Southern 1986 and McEvoy 1982, 2000. Grosseteste's early career remains a matter of controversy. The literature is filled with unjustified assertions of fact and outright errors regarding this part of his life and readers must be on their guard.

Primary Texts in Latin

It should be noted that the quotations from texts in Baur 1912 and Dales 1963a above at times rely on tacit alterations I have made to the Latin text on the basis of my own consultation of the manuscripts.

Primary Texts in English Translation

Secondary Literature

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Augustine, Saint | Bacon, Roger | continuity and infinitesimals | demonstration: medieval theories of | divine: illumination | free will: divine foreknowledge and | future contingents: medieval theories of | modality: medieval theories of