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Dewey's Political Philosophy

First published Wed Feb 9, 2005

John Dewey (1859-1952) was an American philosopher, associated with pragmatism. Over a long working life, Dewey was influential not only in philosophy, but as an educational thinker and political commentator and activist.

1. Biographical Sketch

John Dewey was born in Burlington, Vermont, on October 20th 1859. After a period as a schoolteacher, he became a graduate student in philosophy at Johns Hopkins University, under the tutelage of the Idealist George S. Morris. With Morris, he left Johns Hopkins to take up a position at the University of Michigan. Dewey's early philosophical work was characterised by the attempt to combine the tenets of the Idealism imbibed from Morris with the emerging approach of experimental psychology to understanding the mind, exemplified by the work of another of Dewey's colleagues, G. Stanley Hall. Through the 1890s, and particularly after a move to the newly founded University of Chicago in 1894, Dewey began a steady drift away from Idealist metaphysics, a process that he describes in an autobiographical essay ‘From Absolutism to Experimentalism.’ Influenced notably by William James's Principles of Psychology (1890), Dewey came to repudiate both the Idealist's claim that the study of empirical phenomena leads to the conclusion that the world is mind, and the belief that the only alternative to this is an atomistic empiricism.

After a dispute with the university president, Dewey left Chicago in 1904 for the Columbia University, where he remained until his retirement. Dewey's immense philosophical and other written output (painstakingly collected in thirty-seven volumes by JoAnn Boydston and colleagues for Southern Illinois University Press) extends over a long working life and encompasses most areas of philosophy as well as a host of other educational, social and political concerns. At the core of what may be called his ‘mature’ outlook, expressed in his essay ‘The Need for a Recovery of Philosophy’ (1917), is a concern that philosophy turns away from pseudo-problems in epistemology and metaphysics to concern itself with the ‘problems of men.’ This was a proposal for the recovery of philosophy, not for its abandonment, and it is very much as a philosopher that Dewey approaches these problems, not (on the whole) as the architect of detailed institutional reforms.

While at Chicago Dewey's interest in educational theory and reform came to fruition, in the foundation of a Laboratory School, and in books such as The School and Society (1899), The Child and the Curriculum (1902), and later in the culminating statement Democracy and Education (1916). Dewey's interest in education was embedded in a wider concern about progressive social change. He was a supporter of such causes as women's suffrage and the Settlement House movement of his friend Jane Addams. His immense range of public and political activities included presidency of the teachers' union, sponsorship of the ACLU, support for the ‘Outlawry of War’ movement in the interwar years, chairing the People's Lobby, and (persuaded by his Sidney Hook) participation in the ‘trial’ of Leon Trotsky in Mexico in 1938. After his move to New York, and particularly after the onset of the First World War, a substantial part of his published output consisted of commentary on current domestic and international politics, and public statements on behalf of many causes. (He is probably the only philosopher in this Encyclopaedia to have published both on the Treaty of Versailles and on the value of displaying art in post offices.)

The period between the wars also saw an imposing series of books articulating his philosophical beliefs. This includes Reconstruction in Philosophy (1920), Experience and Nature (1925), The Quest for Certainty (1929), Art as Experience (1934), A Common Faith (1934), Logic: The Theory of Inquiry (1938), and Theory of Valuation (1939). The Public and Its Problems (1927) contained a defence of participatory democratic ideals against sceptics such as Walter Lippmann, who argued that there was only space for a minimally democratic politics in complex modern societies. Dewey was a critic of laissez-faire liberalism and its accompanying individualistic view of society from his early writings. This criticism was amplified during the Depression, where he expressed a form of liberal and democratic socialism in writings such as Individualism, Old and New (1930), Liberalism and Social Action (1935), and Freedom and Culture (1939). He was a leading critic from the left of Roosevelt's New Deal while at the same time opposing Soviet communism and its western apologists.

After Dewey's death on June 1st, 1952, his reputation went into a rapid eclipse. His view of philosophy was seen as woolly and outmoded by the emergent orthodoxy of analytic philosophy. At the same time, his educational writings became the butt of criticism from those inclined to blame him for all the difficulties encountered by post-war ‘progressive’ education. More generally, his social and political thought came under fire from all directions. It was viewed by ‘realists’ such as Reinhold Niebuhr as blindly optimistic in the hopes that it vested in democratic participation, and by critics from both right and left as offering nothing more than an empty and perhaps ominous espousal of ‘scientific method.’ The subsequent transformation in the fortunes of Dewey's stock from this nadir is interesting. In part, the widespread philosophical questioning of many of the presuppositions of analytic philosophy played a role in opening up Dewey's work for serious consideration again. Philosophers such as Hilary Putnam, Richard Bernstein and perhaps above all Richard Rorty have (in quite different ways and with different emphases) guided contemporary philosophers back to Dewey, finding in his work a sympathetic questioning of epistemological ‘foundations.’ Sympathetic commentators on Dewey, it should be noted, tend to recoil from the identification of his philosophy, including his political philosophy, with Rorty's controversial and distinctive brand of pragmatism.

Dewey's political philosophy has not only benefited as a by-product of serious philosophical (and, it should be said, historical) attention to his work as a whole. Some have read him as a precursor of recent concerns about the relationship between liberal individualism and the social setting in which the individual is embedded. Indeed, Dewey sometimes reads like a forerunner not of Rorty but of a writer such as the Canadian philosopher Charles Taylor, who is keen to marry a doctrine of a socially embedded self with a historically and culturally self-conscious form of liberalism. Dewey has also been seen as a source of inspiration for notions of participatory or deliberative democracy – and sometimes he reads like a forerunner of the German philosopher and social theorist Jürgen Habermas, who views autonomy and a particular talk-centred conception of democracy as mutually sustaining ideals for modern societies.

2. Situating Dewey's Political Philosophy

Two sorts of intellectual background are important to understanding Dewey's political philosophy. The first is an important formative condition of his ethical and political thinking, the Idealist and New Liberal assault on the misguided individualism of the classical liberal tradition. From a very early point of his intellectual development, Dewey, like the British Idealist T. H. Green (on whom he wrote several essays) and the New Liberal L. T. Hobhouse, accepted that traditional liberalism in part rested on a false conception of the individual, which was ethically pernicious in its effect on liberal thought. Accordingly, many of the themes that characterised Dewey's thinking about social and political theory after his turn to ‘experimentalism’ were present in his earlier, overtly Idealist political philosophy. In texts such as ‘The Ethics of Democracy’ (EW1) and ‘Christianity and Democracy’ (EW4), Dewey elaborates a version of the Idealist criticisms of classical liberal individualism. For this line of criticism, classical liberalism envisages the individual as an independent entity in competition with other individuals, and takes social and political life as a sphere in which this competitive pursuit of self-interest is coordinated. By contrast, the Idealists and New Liberals rejected this view of social and political life as the aggregation of inherently conflicting private interests. Instead, they sought to view individuals relationally: individuality could be sustained only where social life was understood as an organism in which the well-being of each part was tied to the well-being of the whole. Freedom in a ‘positive’ sense consisted not merely in the absence of external constraints but the positive fact of participation in such an ethically desirable social order. As Dewey puts it, ‘men are not isolated non-social atoms, but are men only when in intrinsic relations’ to one another, and the state in turn only represents them ‘so far as they have become organically related to one another, or are possessed of unity of purpose and interest’ (‘The Ethics of Democracy’, EW1, 231-2).

Other important themes also appear in these early statements. Dewey is anti-elitist, and argues that the capacity of the wise few to discern the public interest tends to be distorted by their position. Democratic participation is not only viewed as a bulwark against government by elites, but also as an aspect of individual freedom – humanity cannot rest content with a good ‘procured from without.’ Furthermore, democracy is not ‘simply and solely a form of government’, but a social and personal ideal; in other words, it is not only a property of political institutions but of a wide range of social relationships. This ideal is common to a range of social spheres, and should take ‘industrial, as well as civil and political’ forms (‘The Ethics of Democracy’, EW1, 246). For this ideal to be effective requires a democratically educated citizenry. A distinctive emphasis of these early works is that it is through democracy in this extended and ideal sense that, Dewey believes, ‘the incarnation of God in man … becomes a living, present thing … The truth is brought down to life, its segregation removed; it is made a common trust enacted in all departments of action, not in one isolated sphere called religious’ (‘Christianity and Democracy’, EW4, 9). While the Christian conception of democracy recedes (but does not entirely disappear) in Dewey's later work, the idea that democracy should be viewed as a form of relationship that cuts across different spheres of social life and unifies them remains important. These crucial features of his early political philosophy survived, then, the jettisoning of Idealism: holism about the individual; anti-elitism; democratic participation as an aspect of individual freedom; and the unconventional view of democracy as a form of relationship inherent not merely in political institutions but in a wide range of social spheres.

While the Idealist and New Liberal assault on individualism is one important element of the intellectual background to Dewey's political philosophy, this should also be located against the background of his own mature conception of inquiry. A distinctive and central theme in Dewey's epistemology was the rejection of a ‘spectator theory’ of knowledge, which he thought dominated western philosophy. For this kind of theory, knowledge was understood on the model of the observation of a fixed and independent object on the part of a subject. The spectator account of knowledge was accompanied by a ‘quest for certainty’ in epistemology; that is, a search for a fixed and certain foundation for knowledge claims, for example in a priori truths or in the incorrigible data of our senses. Dewey aimed to displace this conception of knowledge with a notion of inquiry, understood as the struggle of human intelligence to solve problems. The goal of such inquiry was not to arrive at a certain picture of the nature of things, but at an inevitably provisional solution to the practical and intellectual problem that sparked inquiry.

Three features of this conception can be usefully underlined here: inquiry as problem-solving, as historical and progressive, and as communal. We engage in inquiry, Dewey thought, as part of a struggle with an objectively precarious but improvable environment. Inquiry is demanded by what he calls an ‘incomplete’ or ‘problematic’ situation, that is, one in which something must be done. The goal of inquiry is not simply a change in the beliefs of the inquirers but the resolution of the problematic situation, in what he calls a ‘consummatory’ course of action or state of affairs. The modern natural sciences, he argues, have been progressive and cumulative, giving us greater and greater control of the natural world. This has above all been the result of their experimental character, in which no intellectual element is taken to be beyond rational scrutiny. Theories and hypotheses are invented, used, tested, revised, and so on. At the same time, new methods for the invention, use, testing and revision of theories and hypotheses are developed and refined, and so are new standards for evaluating theories and hypotheses. What counts as success in inquiry is some practice's meeting these standards, but these standards themselves may be judged in the light of how they square with ongoing practices of inquiry. In this way, the methods used by science are not fixed but themselves have a history and develop progressively and sometimes in unexpected ways. What counts as knowledge is defined as ‘the product of competent inquiries’; beyond this, the meaning of the term ‘is so empty that any content or filling may be arbitrarily poured in’ (Logic, LW12, 16). Third, inquiry is social or communal, in the sense that its findings must be subject to scrutiny and testing by other inquirers: ‘an inquirer in a given special field appeals to the experiences of the community of his fellow workers for confirmation and correction of results’ (Logic, LW12, 484).

Dewey's conception of inquiry is intended as a general model of reflective intelligence, and he argues against drawing an a priori distinction between, for example, inquiry in ethics and politics and in the natural sciences. Indeed, he argues that values are constructed in order to resolve problematic situations, and valuation is conceived as reflective thought that responds to such situations, with the aim of providing means for what Dewey calls the ‘directed resolution’ of the situation. Strikingly, for example, in Art as Experience, he analyses the work of the French painters Paul Cézanne and Henri Matisse in terms of problem-solving, with the goal of ‘consummatory’ experience.

It is of course crude to see Dewey's political philosophy as the marriage of the Idealist and New Liberal view of liberalism with his pragmatist or experimentalist conception of inquiry. Many other influences were significant over a long working life. But to view matters in this way does capture a great deal of what is distinctive about Dewey's political thinking.

3. Liberalism

Values, Dewey suggested, can be viewed as constructs to solve practical problems. Like an outmoded piece of technology, a past value which was once constructed to address a problem in one set of circumstances can outlive its usefulness, and become a hindrance to the capacity of those in the present to deal with their practical needs and worries. This, Dewey believes, is the case with values of classical liberalism. These have come to block the capacity to resolve social problems in a way compatible with what he takes to be liberalism's core commitment to individual liberty. It is in this way that ‘the slogans of liberalism in one period can become the bulwarks of reaction’ in the next (‘Logical Method and Law’, MW15, 76). He develops this thought in discussing the relation of individual and society, the character and value of freedom, and the scope of legitimate social and political action.

3.1 Individualism and Abstraction

Dewey criticises classical liberalism for conceiving of the individual as ‘something given, something already there’, prior to society and for viewing social institutions for coordinating the interests of pre-social individuals. Instead, he argues, social institutions are not ‘means for obtaining something for individuals. They are means for creating individuals’ (Reconstruction in Philosophy, MW12, 190-192). In this way, classical liberalism exemplifies ‘the most pervasive fallacy of philosophical thinking’ (‘Context and Thought’, LW5, 5). This is the tendency to divide up experienced phenomena, and to take the distinct analysed elements to be separate existences, independent both of the analysis and of each other. That this abstraction is in particular circumstances essential for inquiry is an important theme in Dewey's philosophy. But this abstraction goes wrong ‘whenever the distinctions or elements that are discriminated are treated as if they were final and self-sufficient’ (‘Context and Thought’, LW5, 7), as when classical liberalism treats the individual as ‘something given.’ Instead, Dewey argues, ‘liberalism knows that an individual is nothing fixed, given ready-made. It is something achieved, and achieved not in isolation but with the aid and support of conditions, cultural and physical: — including in “cultural”, economic, legal and political institutions as well as science and art’ (‘The Future of Liberalism’, LW11: 291).

3.2 Freedom

The abstraction of the individual from social context in classical liberalism shapes its ethics. If the individual is thought of as existing prior to social institutions, then it is easier to envisage securing freedom for the individual in terms solely of the removal of external impediments on individual action, such as legal restrictions on freedom of speech. By contrast, Dewey argues that mere absence of external constraint is not a sufficient condition for freedom in the sense in which the latter is a value for liberals.

For classical liberalism or ‘old individualism’, the individual is viewed as surrounded by a protective cordon of rights, which define his or her freedom. Freedom is taken to consist in the absence of some intentional constraint on the individual's ability to pursue his or her chosen goals. For Dewey, this negative view of freedom is at the root of the wider social, ethical and political defects of this form of individualism (‘Religion and Morality in a Free Society’, LW15, 181). What is valuable about freedom is not the negative absence of interference but the positive ‘power to be an individualized self’ (The Public and Its Problems, LW2, 329).

Dewey's view of individuality is complex, but three elements seem most prominent: individuality is reflective, it is social, and it must be exercised in order to be enjoyed. The first point is that freedom is held to consist in the capacity and willingness on the part of a person to reflect on her or his own goals, aims and projects, and to revise them as a result of this reflection. Individuality in what we may call a weak sense is universally possessed and consists in the distinctive patterns of response to the environment that each person displays, ‘a distinctive way of feeling the impacts of the world and of showing a preferential bias in response to these impacts’ (Individualism Old and New, LW5, 121). In the strong sense in which it is a value for liberals, individuality consists in the personal capacity for choice, ‘the most characteristic activity of a self’ (Ethics, 2nd edition, LW7, 285). This is not a matter of arbitrarily or whimsically plumping for one option rather than another, for Dewey. Rather, choice that is expressive of individuality in the strong sense involves intelligent criticism of options. Accordingly, we can understand why Dewey claims that ‘to foresee future objective alternatives and to be able by deliberation to choose one of them and thereby weigh its chances in the struggle for future existence, measures our freedom’ (Human Nature and Conduct, MW14, 210).

Second, freedom as individuality is social: it is thought to involve participation in shaping the social conditions that bear on individuality. As Dewey puts it in The Public and Its Problems, liberty ‘is that secure release and fulfilment of personal potentialities which take place only in rich and manifold association with others: the power to be an individualized self making a distinctive contribution and enjoying in its own way the fruits of association’ (The Public and Its Problems, LW2, 329). Freedom in its fullest sense, then, is only possible in a canonical form of social order, in which all take part in shaping the conditions of common life.

Third, Dewey possesses what has been called an exercise rather than an opportunity concept of freedom. For some positive theories of liberty, including Dewey's, it is a necessary condition of an agent's being free that he or she should actually pursue those ends outlined by that theory as constitutive of the good – that is, he or she should exercise the opportunity. I am in possession of my liberty in the valuable sense for Dewey only if I actually act in these ways. The value of individual liberty requires the reconstruction of the social order along the participatory and democratic lines that Dewey sees as intrinsic to this value.

3.3 Social Action

This account of the character and value of freedom was for Dewey, as for the Idealists and New Liberals that he drew on, part of a debate about the proper scope of political action. The classical identification of liberty with negative liberty bolsters the identification of freedom with the sphere of life outside the scope of political action. By contrast, for Dewey the scope of legitimate social and political action had to be determined experimentally. The replacement of liberal laissez-faire policies with what Dewey called intelligent social control or social action is presented as a requirement of positive liberty or individuality, in modern industrial conditions. The identification of freedom with individuality in Dewey's sense allows the necessary means for achieving individuality to be understood as necessary conditions of freedom. So, for example, throughout his life he argued that education to produce undocile, unservile citizens was essential, in the name of individuality. More pointedly, Dewey argued, particularly in the 1930s, that a socialized economy was necessary for individuality. Dewey drew on a wide range of sources to bolster his conception of social action or social control (including the utopian Edward Bellamy and British guild socialist G. D. H. Cole), but much of his writing is unstructured and occasional – and spread across many different contexts over a long period – rather than systematic or prescriptive in a very specific way.

Yet it is worth stressing the liberal and democratic character of Dewey's conception of social action. Dewey was anti-authoritarian, in the sense that he did not believe that the liberal rights protected in the name of individual liberty (such as freedoms of speech, thought, movement, and so on) should be dispensed with. Individuality as an ethical ideal requires that individuals find their own way, and not have particular doctrines or social roles imposed on them. Furthermore, viewing liberty through the prism of individuality only opens up the possibility of political action in the name of liberty, but it does not itself require it. Finally, and in contrast to technocratic critics of laissez-faire such as Walter Lippmann, Dewey argues that an extensive form of democracy is essential for social action.

4. Democracy

There are three main lines of argument for democracy in Dewey's mature political philosophy: democracy as the protection of popular interests; democracy as social inquiry; and democracy as the expression of individuality.

At the minimum, for Dewey, democracy involves the expression of interests on the part of voters; the vote helps to protect individuals from putative experts about where the interests of people lie. A class of experts will inevitably slide into a class whose interests diverge from those of the rest and becomes a committee of oligarchs. So ‘the strongest point to be made in behalf of even such rudimentary political forms as democracy has attained, popular voting, majority rule and so on, is that to some extent they involve a consultation and discussion which concerns social needs and troubles’ (The Public and Its Problems, LW2, p. 364). Dewey stresses the importance of discussion, consultation, persuasion and debate in democratic decision-making. These processes extend and deepen the public awareness of the problems under discussion, and help to inform the ‘administrative specialist’ of social needs.

This way of viewing the desirability of democracy is instrumental and minimal; instrumental, in that the desirability of democracy derives from its protecting the interests of each individual against the depredations of an elite class, and minimal, in that the rationale for popular participation is limited to the need for the elite to be informed where the shoe pinches, if its policies are not to be misguided. Dewey deepens this minimal and instrumental justification by taking democracy to be a form of social inquiry: Democracy as public discussion is viewed as the best way of dealing with the conflict of interests in a society: ‘The method of democracy – inasfar as it is that of organized intelligence – is to bring these conflicts out into the open where their special claims can be discussed and judged in the light of more inclusive interests than are represented by either of them separately’ (Liberalism and Social Action, LW11, 56). Democratic societies are thought of as both seeking to attain desirable goals, and arguing over how to do so, and also as arguing over what a desirable goal is. In other words, democratic politics is not simply a channel through which we can assert our interests (as it is for the first argument), but a forum or mode of activity in which we can arrive at a conception of what our interests are. As the experimentalist conception of inquiry insists, this does not imply that we need a priori criteria in order to establish if this process has been successful. Rather, criteria for what counts as a satisfactory solution may be hammered out in the process of searching for one. Democracy is experimental for Dewey in that it allows, or should allow, a profound questioning of the idées fixes of the established order, even if, of course, much democratic politics will not take the form of such questioning.

The third line of argument is that democracy is a requirement of freedom in Dewey's sense of individuality. The collective exercise of the experimental ethos is an ethical demand of this conception of freedom. Exercised properly, this experimental ethos allows individuals to arrive at a common good. So, Dewey writes of democracy:

From the standpoint of the individual, it consists in having a responsible share according to capacity in forming and directing the activities of the groups in which one belongs and in participating according to need in the values which the groups sustain. From the standpoint of the groups, it demands liberation of the potentialities of members of a group in harmony with the interests and goods which are common. (The Public and Its Problems, LW2, 327-8)

Full liberation of an individual's potentialities can only be achieved in a democratic social order, one in which social conflicts are treated as the subject of social inquiry. Dewey's argument that the experimental character of democracy renders it desirable should not merely be interpreted instrumentally, then. He is not only saying that democracy allows a clearer view of social problems and how to address them. His suggestion is also that individuality can only be properly expressed if the individual participates in democratic practices, since social inquiry is a constitutive part of the individual good. And this is a claim about individuality in the specific ethical sense in which he develops the notion in his critique of classical liberalism.

The radical and unconventional character of Dewey's conception of democracy and his political philosophy generally derives from its boldness, which some readers find hard to stomach. The abstract character of conception of democracy is as far from a common and ‘realist’ view of democracy as the name of a set of specific political procedures and institutions as it is possible to find. Participation may not be a good, or appreciated as one, by every individual, such as those who are too shy or busy. Furthermore, it is a bold assumption to hope, as Dewey does, that complex industrial societies can be characterised by a high level of harmony among the interests of their members, to be secured through public discussion and communication. Of course, this very boldness is appealing to others, for whom the connection Dewey makes between an ethos of flexible openness and democratic self-government stands as an enduring critical challenge to a circumscribed democratic pessimism.


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democracy | liberalism | pragmatism