Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Wed Feb 19, 1997; substantive revision Wed Feb 27, 2008

A trope is an instance or bit (not an exemplification) of a property or a relation; e.g. Bill Clinton's eloquence, Sydney's beauty, or Pierre's love of Heloïse. Bill Clinton's eloquence is understood here not as Clinton's participating in the universal eloquence, nor as the peculiar quality of Clinton's eloquence, but simply as Clinton's bit of eloquence, the eloquence that he and he alone has. Similarly, Pierre's love is not his participation in love as such, nor the special way he loves, but the loving peculiar to Pierre as directed towards Heloïse. The appeal of tropes for philosophers is as an ontological basis free of the postulation of supposedly obscure abstract entities such as propositions and universals. (To be sure, there is no dearth of those who find tropes more obscure.)

1. Name and Incidence in Philosophy

The ontological theory of tropes holds that properties and relations subsist as so many instances or tropes, one for each exemplification. These tropes are particulars, not universals, distinct from the concrete particulars they characterize. By other names, trope ontologies have arguably been espoused throughout the history of Western philosophy. According to D.W. Mertz (1996, ch. IV), variants can be found in the writings of Plato, Aristotle, Boëthius, Avicenna, Averroës, Thomas, Scotus, Buridan, Suárez, Leibniz, Husserl, the early Russell (1911), Stout, Cook Wilson, and Strawson. Tropes have been variously called ‘property (and relation) instances’, ‘abstract particulars’, ‘concrete properties’, ‘unit properties (and relations)’, ‘quality (and relation) bits’, ‘individual accidents’, and (in German) ‘Momente’. (Parenthesized years refer to the Bibliography below.)

The most compelling advocate of such objects in our time has been D. C. Williams (1953), who is responsible for the regrettable term trope. It has nothing to do with figures of speech in rhetoric, Leitmotive in music, or tropisms in plants. Williams coined it as a sort of philosophical joke: Santayana, he says, had employed ‘trope’ pointlessly for ‘essence of an occurrence’. Williams would go him one better and press it into service for ‘occurrence of an essence’ (1953: 78). [Far from ridiculing Santayana, Williams published an appreciation of his views on essence and occurrence in a memorial issue of the Journal of Philosophy (1954).] Ironically, the word ‘trope’ is to be heard correctly these days mainly from the lips of the dreaded poststructuralists. (In all my experience, I have encountered but one person outside of philosophy who knew Williams' special sense of the term.) Meanwhile, many trope theorists have adopted Williams' usage, but some avoid it (e.g. Mertz). Williams acknowledged the close affinity between his trope theory and G. F. Stout's theory of abstract particulars (1921, 1923).

Henceforward we shall join the ranks of those eschewing the inappropriate term ‘trope’, even while recognizing its recent currency. We use in its place ‘qualiton’ for a one-place trope and ‘relaton’ for a many-place trope, i.e. a relation-instance. ‘Relaton’ may also be used for qualitons and relatons together, much as we now use ‘relation’ for properties and relations in set theory and elsewhere. The suffix ‘-on’ is meant to call to mind the similar ending that is common in names of fundamental particles in physics, such as proton, neutron, soliton, etc. ‘Qualiton’ is reminiscent of ‘quality bit'’ and ‘property instance’. While we doubt that use of the term trope has actually scared off would-be adherents of trope-theory, it cannot hurt to have an accurate, suggestive, single descriptive expression for tropes of given degrees. Then one can focus on trying to decide which metaphysic merits adoption. We retain the titles ‘tropism’ and ‘trope theory’ for the entire theory (or theories of this kind). (Cf. Quine's use of ‘set theory’ for the entire theory of sets and classes.)

2. Approaches to Universals

Obviously one could see qualitons and relatons as complexes of some sort, perhaps composed of particulars and universals. (I use ‘universal’ here to cover both properties and relations.) Such a construction is, indeed, very strongly suggested by the grammatical subject-predicate form of our language. Philosophical ontologists have, however, long since considered departing from this linguistic pattern in various ways. Nominalists recognize the particulars as subjects, but hold that there really are no universals beyond the linguistic predicates themselves. Plato held, by contrast, that certain universals, the Forms, are the only realities, the particulars being mere figments of belief (380 B.C.E.). A less radical variant of nominalism recognizes properties and relations, but as mere set-theoretic constructs out of individuals. This approach is usual in model-theoretic semantics. A less otherworldly version of Platonism takes particulars to be clusters of universals; cf. Russell (1940, ch. 6, 8, 24) and Blanshard (1939, ch. 16, 17). For those students of ontology who are not obsessed with parsimony, however, the most natural course would probably seem to be to take a leaf from our language and to recognize both exemplifying individuals and repeatedly exemplified universals. Such a view is so common that it has no particular name; Armstrong calls it the ‘substance-attribute view’(1989: 59 et seq.). We shall say ‘thing-property view’.

This view need not deny that there are qualitons or relatons, but it denies that they are basic or simple or primitive or unstructured. Rather they must be composite structures involving a property or relation, some individuals, and an exemplification nexus: in the terminology of Chrudzimski (2004), they are propositional tropes. An ontology based on tropes takes the opposite approach. It recognizes tropes as basic and unstructured. Individuals and properties then require further analysis. Ontological theories thus based on primitive unstructured tropes may be called versions of tropism or trope theory. A major attraction of tropism has been its promise of parsimony; some adherents go so far as to proclaim a one-category ontology (Campbell, Mertz, even Chrudzimski).

The reader should realize that although, like philosophy itself, trope theory is over two thousand years old; it is just now in a quite lively phase of controversial development in more than one Western country. One man's tropism is another man's (woman's) execrated folly, and so it goes. I myself am not entirely hors de combat.

3. Varieties of Trope Theory

Trope theories divide according to their treatment of universals and individuals. What I should like to regard as the classic trope theory (Stout, Williams) treats universals and individuals as constructs or sets of tropes. This is the trope-cluster theory, called by some (Simons, Mertz) trope nominalism or moderate nominalism (Hochberg). (‘Nominalism’ because it repudiates primitive universals; ‘moderate’ because it still recognizes unit properties). Cf. also Chrudzimski, who sedulously refrains from calling any trope clusters properties or universals. Then there are trope theories that retain either primitive individuals or primitive universals. The former position, which I call kernel tropism, was taken in a way by Leibniz, who recognized individual substances (monads), but correlated with complete individual concepts comprising nonrelational tropelike representations of the whole world (1686: §§9, 14; 1714: §§8, 14, 17-19). [For a reinterpretation of Leibniz, with an eye to tropes inter alia, see C. Schneider (2001), bearing in mind Leibniz's own words: “Interpretari est docere circa orationem seu orationem non satis cognitum facere cognitum.”] A similar kernel view is hailed by C. B. Martin (1980) in Locke (1690: 159) and noted approvingly by Armstrong (1989: 114, 136). The latter view, tropes plus primitive universals, was held by Cook Wilson (1926, vol. 2, 713 et passim) and may be represented also by Mertz (1996), with the important qualification that his universals are accorded conceptual, not transcendental Platonic status. Such a position might be called trope universalism; Mertz calls his version ‘moderate realism’. (‘Realism’ because universals are recognized; ‘moderate’ because they are immanent: only their instances really exist.) Finally, there is the possibility of combining tropism with a full thing-property view, provided the tropes thereby countenanced are propositional in Chrudzimski's sense. Husserl (1913-21: 430f, 436f) may perhaps be read in this way, and certain truthmaker theories may come close. (Truthmakers, like tropes, may be posited in addition to states of affairs, complexes made up of particulars and universals.)

Another significant division among trope theories separates the actualists from the meinongians. (The term alludes to no specific teaching of Meinong, just the preparedness to recognize nonexistents.) For the actualist, there is a trope, say, of Old Faithful's heat, only if Old Faithful is actually hot. The only property instances are actual ones. For the meinongian, on the other hand, there are also tropes of Old Faithful's coldness, George Bush's intelligence, etc. (The contrast mirrors the traditional dispute over false facts or nonobtaining states of affairs.) These days actualism is popular. Meinongian tropism has, however, one great advantage: it affords a straightforward account of possible worlds (deemed by many hopelessly obscure). A possible world, on this approach, is simply a set of qualitons and relatons. (There are problems with nonlogically incompatible relatons, such as a's redness and a's greenness, but similar problems beset other theories as well. Not every set of qualitons and relatons will be a possible world.)

4. Trope-Cluster Theory

Classical tropism, the trope-cluster theory, would seem to hold the greatest promise of economy. For this theory dispenses with both primitive individuals and primitive universals, leaving at first glance only qualitons and relatons. However, second-level gathering relations of relatons prove necessary. Qualitons or relatons belong to the same individual if they are all compresent (concurrent) with one another. Qualitons and relatons belong to the same universal (property or relation) if they exactly resemble one another. The two second-level relaton relations of compresence and exact resemblance are essential to the cluster theory. They are similarity relations (reflexive and symmetric); compresence is also transitive, an equivalence relation on relatons. Thus universals become similarity classes and individuals equivalence classes of qualitons and relatons: both are products of abstraction. (This is a first approximation: individuals may ultimately have to be taken as more complicated; see §6. Individuals Refined.) Exemplification (as expressed by predication) is then simply overlapping. On the actualist approach, Bush is intelligent iff he (his equivalence class) overlaps intelligence (the set of intelligences). The meinongian approach brings in possible worlds: Bush is intelligent in w iff he, intelligence, and w all overlap.

Trope-cluster theory can be further developed to include a treatment of compound universals (also requiring further complications in the structure of individuals and universals) and propositions. The whole question of the relation of relatons to states of affairs is a vexed one, partly because intuitive conceptions of states of affairs diverge. For some, it is analytic that states of affairs are propositional complexes, making it unthinkable for them to be relatons. Others see an extensive parallel between the two notions. The latter view is ruled out if relatons are postulated as basic. But there is some interest in seeing what results if we plug states of affairs (complexes) into trope theory in place of basic relatons. Connections emerge both to situation semantics (see Barwise & Perry 1983) and to Armstrong's later theory of universals (1989: 94).

[Terminological note: I have substituted the term ‘relaton cluster’ here throughout for the more familiar ‘trope bundle’. Later I use ‘qualiton bundle’ for T. Mormann's sheaf-theoretic construction (1995), the importance of which has only gradually been borne home to me.]

5. Relations

The seemingly parsimonious relaton-cluster theory, as we saw, is pushed to acknowledge at least a second category besides relatons, the second-level relations. There are probably more such relations, e.g. temporal precedence and betterness. Williams advocated the obvious therapy here without working out the details. The second-level relations, he suggested, crumble into second-level relatons (qualitons) (1953: 84). But it should be clear that in order to gather second-level relatons into the requisite relations, third-level relations will be needed, and so forth. It turns out that a significant simplification is actually achieved at the third or fourth level, so the regress is not vicious (although almost every commentator on the problem has assumed that it is). At least one unpulverized relation is still needed though, and the third- or fourth-level relatons ultimately assumed are hardly plausible candidates for basic constituents of reality.

Mertz points out how hostile the Western tradition has been to recognizing genuine relations (1996, ch. 6). Only Russell's early insistence on their importance appears to have turned the tide in the last century. Few trope theories have a well worked out treatment even of first-level (ordinary) relations. Campbell holds that while relational discourse is ineliminable, relations themselves come down to their foundations, the properties of their relata in which they are grounded (1990: 98ff). As Mertz has pointed out (1996: 63-67), this general approach goes back at least as far as Ockham. Although Campbell does not give details, the project is not perhaps to be written off as hopeless.

Bacon, on the other hand, retains first-level relations in the same status as properties, grouped into universals by exact resemblance (1995, ch. II). But whereas modern predicate logic treats the semantic values of relational predicates as complicated (as sets of n-tuples), Bacon complicates individuals. He multiplies compresence into indexed 1-compresence, 2-compresence, … An individual (in the new extended sense) is then a chain (sequence) of a 1-compresence equivalence class, a 2-compresence equivalence class, and so on. This inobvious extension makes a unified treatment of predication possible. On the actualist approach, Putin is devious iff his first compresence class overlaps deviousness. Pierre loves Heloïse iff his first compresence class, her second compresence class, and love all overlap. The meinongian approach brings in possible worlds: Putin is devious in w iff his 1-compresence class, deviousness, and w all overlap. The dyadic case is similar. Williams considered the explication of exemplification to be one of the important achievements of tropism, ‘do[ing] much to dispel the ancient mystery of predication’ (1953: 82). Bacon extends that explication to relational predication. It must be conceded, though, that unanalyzed exemplification is presupposed at other levels of trope theory. This treatment of relations in trope theory is so complicated and inobvious that it has won few converts.

Another, possibly more intuitive approach, is that of Christina Schneider (2003). Instead of starting from exact similarity and compresence as basic and then forming relations of individuals as similarity classes, she proceeds directly to the classes. The domain of given qualitons and relatons T is first broken down into the power set T = 2T of T. Exact similarity then emerges as the sharing of such a member of T. A similar construction yields individuals as a partitioning of T and a corresponding equivalence relation. It is not, to be sure, automatically orthogonal to exact similarity, but one limits oneself to orthogonal partitionings.

In relating the individuals, Schneider presupposes nothing about their inner constitution (no ‘aspects’, as in Bacon). In catering for the multiple relata, several of the orthogonal partitionings may come into play. This is achieved via a defined relation of similarity-circles' being ‘relation-inducing-linked’, as Schneider puts it. For the precise details, the reader is referred to Schneider (2003). Schneider's way of handling relations of individuals in trope theory is probably not simpler than Bacon's, but it may well be less ad hoc. We have here in any case a challenge to further research that few seem to have the heart to take up. Indeed, this might be taken as a back-handed motive for sticking with familiar model-theoretic relations, were they not comparatively disappointing in intensional contexts. This knot in trope theory highlights the difficulty relations have perennially posed for philosophy.

6. Individuals Refined

For some trope theorists, a mere set of tropes, or even a chain of such, has too little inner coherence and unity to qualify as an individual. Thus Williams takes an individual to be the mereological sum of a compresence class (1953: 81). Martin writes,

An object is not a collectable out of its properties or qualities as a crowd is collectable out of its members. For each and every property of an object has to be had by that object to exist at all. (1980: 8)

Mertz constructs individuals with the help of what he calls integrated networks (1996: 76). The integrated network of a particular t comprises all the atomic facts about t. Since the integrated network is itself a nonrepeatable individual, it can have its own integrated network, and so on. A hierarchy of such integrated networks is then an ordinary individual. Mertz appears to leave it open whether the hierarchy ever terminates. He is also vague about facts (states of affairs): they are complexes consisting of a relaton and its exemplification or relata, the latter apparently also relatons. Facts serve as truthmakers. Mertz's account is developed partly to avoid positing individuals as bare particulars. The price would seem to be to obscure the truth condition for simple predication sentences.

7. Nucleate Individuals

A further refinement of individuals is offered in Simons' nuclear theory (1994). In place of compresence, Simons takes over Husserl's foundation relation (1913-22.478f). A trope s is founded on t if t's existence is necessary for the existence of s. s and t are directly foundationally related if either is founded on the other. Foundational relatedness, the ancestral of direct foundational relatedness, is an equivalence relation on tropes. Its equivalence classes are foundational systems. An integral whole [Husserl: whole in the pregnant sense (1913-22.475)] is the mereological fusion of a foundational system. An integral whole forms the nucleus or individual nature of a substance. Its accidents are a nimbus of qualitons dependent (founded) on the nucleus, generically though not individually required by it. Thus Simons envisions a tight cluster within a looser cloud of qualitons, the whole making up a thick particular. The tight cluster (the nucleus) is like a substratum, but is not assumed as basic.

8. The Glue of Being

The assault on the trope-cluster theory has been led by Mertz. His objections appear to stem from two deeply held intuitions, which I will call the predication intuition and the glue intuition. According to the former, it is unacceptable to conceive of relatons as free-floating (Mertz 1996.26). They are not genuine property instances unless they are saturable, properties of something. Compresence classes do not possess enough unity to be genuine subjects of predication. At the same time, as we have seen, Mertz hesitates to posit primitive individuals lest they turn out to be bare particulars, which would be incoherent by his lights. Hence his hierarchies of integrated networks of tropes (relatons) (see §7).

According to the glue intuition, complexes need to be held together, and relations are the glue. They are ‘ontoglial’, Mertz says, i.e., from the Greek, the “glue of being” (1996: 25). Sets and clusters as such lack unity. Thus Mertz is obliged to reject the cluster theory of relations as well as that of individuals. Only genuine relations can be ontoglial. Together with the predication intuition, this yields Mertz's distinctive dualism about relations, his trope universalism or moderate realism. The basic universals do the gluing, but the basic relatons get predicated. What is the connection between the two? They are both aspects of the relaton, the relation instance. The instance aspect is the fundamental ontic unit; the repeatable aspect is conceptual. It might seem that this rather waters the glue down, but Mertz speaks also of extra-conceptual intensions (universals) as goals of total science (1996: 32).

9. Individuals Distinguished from Universals (Ramsey)

D. H. Mellor and Thomas Hofweber have objected, in independent conversations with the author, that the above tropist account of predication in terms of overlapping makes exemplification symmetric: it fails to explain which is the subject and which is the the predicate, or which is the individual and which is the universal. (Mellor cites Ramsey (1931) for this kind of worry.) So long as compresence classes can be distinguished from exact-resemblance classes (particulars from universals), there is no problem. But what if the same class could be both a particular (or a link in its cluster chain) and a universal? Bacon rules out this possibility, but seemingly ad hoc. Might it not be, for example, on a radically monotheistic scheme, that the qualiton God's divinity was the sole qualiton in the individual God as well as the sole qualiton in the property of divinity? Mormann, however, suggests that compresence is adequately distinguished from exact resemblance by being transitive, which resemblance need not be (1995: 136).

10. Trope Bundles and Sheaf Theory

Some of the most original and exciting new work on tropes has been carried out in the last decade by Thomas Mormann and his co-workers, at first in Munich. Mormann could count among his students there Christina Schneider, whom we have already had occasion to cite. Mormann has seen how, with a slight reformulation, trope theory can be incorporated into the topological theory of sheaves. Thus known results of the latter theory are made available to illuminate the tropist project. One extremely suggestive revelation is that sheaf theory is equally at home in category theory as in set theory. For philosophers who perennially worry about supping with the devil and imbibing his Cantorian works with set theory, this is reassuring news.

It is an oddity of the sheaf-theoretic approach, however, that it wet-blankets one of the most distinctive features of classical tropism: the construction of individuals as qualiton clusters. With Martin, Armstrong, Simons, and others (perhaps Leibniz), Mormann is a kernel tropist, taking individuals as primitive, along with qualitons. (For clarity, I will confine my exposition here to qualitons, involving a single individual each.) With that restriction understood, relating the domain of qualitons T to the individuals I is a many-one onto projection function P: TI, giving rise to the structure <T, P, I>, called a ‘bundle’. T is the total space and I the base space of the bundle. For each individual x in I, the qualiton set P-1(x) is called the ‘fiber’ of the bundle over x. In the fiber we recognize x's qualiton equivalence class (what would count as x in a trope structure).

Let us call a triple <T, R, C> consisting of a set T of qualitons, a binary relation thereon of exact similarity R, and a binary relation C of compresence, a trope structure (Mormann: generalized trope space). Such structures gives rise to bundles as follows. Let P(t) be t's compresence equivalence-class, and let I be {P(t): t in T}. Then <T, P, I> is a qualiton bundle in the above sense. In the course of this definition, properties have got lost in the shuffle. They are now easily recouped as ‘sections’. Where B = <T, P, I> is a bundle, let S be a subset of T (intuitively, the set of S things) and s: ST, where s(x) is x's S-ness (a qualiton). Then the section s or {s(x): x in S} will be the general property of S-ness. Clearly P(s(x)) = x, for x in S. Thus Mormann makes serviceable for trope theory a conception of property already put forward in essence by R. H. Thomason in the context of modal logic. According to Thomason and Stalnaker, a propositional function is a function from individuals to propositions (1973: 209). Let § be the set of sections associated with the bundle B. Clearly <B, §> can now do the work of a trope structure, or generalized trope space.

But <B, §> = <T, P, I, §> sheds new light on the two structural relations, exact similarity (R) and compresence (C), apparently presupposed for qualiton structures. For now § does the work of R, and I together with P-1 does the work of C. Trope theorists split up into those with realist leanings (like me) and those with nominalist proclivities (e.g. Mormann). § is accordingly a godsend to Mormann and his ilk: “ ‘the problem of individuation’ or ‘particularization of universals’… disappears. We no longer need to assume that a universal has to occur as a constituent in an individual since a function … need not be thought of as a constituent of some of its values” (1995: 138). The function mapping you into your wisdom and me into my wisdom does not presuppose one universal wisdom wholly present in you and also in me. Granted; fair enough. But there is still the one function the wisdom of, just as unitary (so it would seem) as Wisdom itself.

With some further constraints, qualiton clusters become qualiton sheaves. For the technical details, the reader is referred to Mormann's paper (1995: 142 et seq.). It may be wondered if the move to kernel tropism in qualiton-bundle and sheaf theory is absolutely necessary. The answer, I think, is no, but it is nevertheless very natural. It could be avoided, however, by stipulating that in a qualiton bundle <T, P, I>, I is a subset of T. It appears to me that this could be done without loss of generality. Then the individual onto which P mapped a trope would also be a trope. In effect, it would be a representative of the compresence equivalence-class constituting the individual (from the qualiton-structural point of view). [The possibility of using representatives—always a natural option where equivalence classes are concerned—was envisaged by Bacon (1995: 36).]

The angle of sheaf theory that Mormann particularly develops and exploits is intimately connected with topology. [In the following, Mormann uses ‘generalized trope space’ in roughly the same sense as we have been using ‘qualiton structure’.] Mormann prefaces his formal development with this comparison of the two approaches to qualitons: “Obviously, a trope bundle can be defined from its generalized trope space and vice versa. … Thus … the ‘space-concept’ and the ‘bundle-concept’ are strictly equivalent. However, as we shall see in following, the crucial topological concepts we are going to introduce ‘live’ on trope bundles rather than on trope spaces” (1995: 136).

That is an interesting use of live as an intensional, nonmathematical verb. As an unreconstructed tropist, I can't help suspecting that Mormann's tremendously insightful researches have grown for him like a favorite child whom the doting parent can but imagine in one costume, that of kernel tropism rather than classical tropism. Yet here, as elsewhere, the considered wisdom is, I suppose, to let a hundred flowers bloom. Notwithstanding the richness and suggestiveness of Mormann's and Schneider's results, I think it is too early to second-guess what they may come up with. (Besides discovering the connection of sheaves and qualitons, Mormann also has the distinction, so far as I know, of being the only philosopher to have taught trope theory in Basque!)

11. Tropes, Existence, and Existenz

Trope theory opens up some new perspectives on the question of existence. If, as suggested above, a possible world can be approximated as a set of qualitons and relatons, then it is natural to take an individual or a property as existing in a world if it overlaps that world, i.e. shares a relaton with it. This very natural approach has the effect of denying existence the status of a property, or at all events the status that other properties have. It is not a similarity-circle of relatons.

Again and again, however, the idea crops up in philosophy of making existence or being a genuine property. For example, the early Heidegger said of Dasein that “It is Being with which this very being [scil. Dasein] is in its being in every case itself concerned” (1927: 42). The Dasein and being referred to here seem to be genuine properties, albeit not properties of concrete content, like ‘house’ or ‘tree’ (ibid.). Now, if existence (or being) is a genuine property, i.e. qualiton set, which qualiton set is it? I put forward the following suggestion just for the sake of its inherent interest. Suppose we are working with a nucleate or kernel version of trope theory. We may suppose that the kernel of each individual is compresent with its other qualitons. But let it be exactly similar only to itself, so that the singleton of the kernel forms a similarity-circle all by itself. That, I suggest, is the existence of the individual that has lent its kernel. If this suggestion is accepted, then an individual exists in a possible world just in case its kernel is in that world.

Thus when Heidegger urges the ontological difference between Being itself and that which is (1929: 14f), we must interpose a third item: the being- or existence-qualiton of the individual being. The ontological difference turns out to be the hypotenuse (as it were) of the ontological triad: a being, that being's being (qualiton), and Being itself.

12. Applications of Trope Theory

Various applications have been proposed for trope theory. Campbell suggests that qualitons are the natural relata of causation (1981: 480f). Although events are often cast in that role, Williams affirms that they are a kind of trope (1953: 90). It remains to see whether this insight will shed any real light on the nature of causation. [Bacon sketches a treatment of causation in trope theory, but it is not clear that he makes any essential use of relatons, other than to form possible worlds (1995, ch. VIII).] Campbell further suggests that qualitons are the natural subjects of evaluation (1981: 481). Again, while this seems feasible, it is not clear where it takes us. [Bacon tries to develop this idea too (1995, ch. IX), but his treatment would seem to work equally well with states of affairs rather than qualitons.] Campbell suggests a trope-theoretic interpretation of the fields recognized by modern physics, but a lot is expected of his field-tropes. Why not have just one qualiton, the-world's-being-the-way-it-is?

Mertz puts forward a distinctive system of logic, particularized predicate logic (PPL), exploiting the opportunity of quantifying over relatons in many places where we should expect second-order quantification over properties (1996, ch. IX). Impressive claims are made for PPL. It is said to be a provably consistent type-free extension of second-order logic, admitting impredicative definitions. Diagonal arguments and Gödel's incompleteness proofs are allegedly defeated, and solutions are proffered to Russell's paradox, the various liar paradoxes, and the generalized Fitch-Curry paradox.

13. Does Trope Theory Rest on a Mistake?

In an ingenious and thought-provoking paper some time ago, Jerrold Levinson put forward a novel and imaginative thesis purporting to explain why tropism never quite got off the ground, despite its respectable bimillennial launch history (1980). Levinson suggests that there are two kinds of attributes, qualities and properties. The difference may be explained by analogy to the familiar distinction between mass and count nouns. If the customs officer snatches a piece of my luggage, it will in general itself be luggage; if adoring groupies snatch an article of my clothing, it will be clothing; for ‘luggage’ and ‘clothing’ are mass nouns. On the other hands, if the customs official snatches a piece of my laptop, it will not in general be a lap top; and if the groupies grab a piece of my guitar, it won't be a guitar: ‘laptop’ and ‘guitar’ are count nouns. Now, analogously, if the customs official grabs a bit of my whiteness, it will be white, or itself an instance of whiteness; but if the groupies snatch a piece of my manhood, or my virtue, it will not itself have manhood, or virtue. Whiteness is a quality, capable of fission into bits; manhood and virtue, on the other hand, are properties, all of a piece, unfissile.

Now, Levinson's fascinating possible insight is this: only qualities can form qualitons, not properties. The perennial seduction, which perennially failed, was to form property qualitons. As it always ran up against one or another difficulty or infelicity or implausibility, tropism always came plunging back to earth, and it was back to the drawing board for the next generation of naive would-be tropists. Is Levinson right about this? It seems to me that his position is highly plausible. But it appears to me also that trope theory has made its case all the same: it works, notwithstanding the fascinating linguistic infelicities that Levinson has brought to our attention.

14. Ultimate Stocktake

While tropism, like any other theory, must stand or fall on its merits, it may be asking too much to expect metaphysical or philosophical arguments alone to secure its pre-eminence. The thing-property view, the property-cluster theory, the relaton-cluster theory, and even perhaps model-theoretic particularism are apparently all capable of modeling each other (Bacon 1988). If tropes deserve first place in first philosophy, it may be for epistemological or even pragmatic reasons. As we knock about the world, we seem regularly to bump up against facts or states of affairs or property instances or propertied particulars. What is it we bump up against? An intelligible theory can start there.

Alluring as trope (relaton) theory is to many of us as a basic metaphysical and ontological framework, in the end, as Aristotle pointed out, we all philosophize on the basis of what seems to us undeniably familiar, as well as what appears likely to be confirmed by tomorrow's scientific theories. Those who go with the familiar may well eschew primitive relatons: that's just not how they think of the world, and there would not appear to be any decisive reason why they should bend themselves out of shape in order to do so. On the other hand are those who find things-with-qualities, qualitied things, qualitons the most immediately familiar.

Again, those of us intuitively inclined to scientism or science fiction (or metaphysical mysticism) will tend to welcome relatons and the clever constructions they make possible. Ultimately, I think, there's no way for philosophers to decide between these two approaches. There's no agreed familiar, and there's no agreed best future science. All the same, I like tropism in preference to the thing-property view. Your move.


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