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Finitism in Geometry

First published Wed Apr 3, 2002
First published Wed Apr 3, 2002

In our representations of the world, especially in physics, infinities play a crucial role. The continuum of the real numbers as a representation of time or one-dimensional space is the best known example. However, these same infinities also cause problems. One just has to think about Zeno's paradoxes or the present-day continuation of that discussion, namely, the discussion about supertasks, to see the difficulties. Hence, it is a very tempting idea to investigate whether it is possible to eliminate these infinities and still be able to do physics. This problem reduces first of all to the question of the possibility of a discrete geometry that can approximate classical infinite geometry as closely as possible. If a positive answer can be given to this question, the second question is what could be the possible physical relevance (if any).

1. What is Finitism in Geometry?

1.1 Finitism in mathematics

Finitism is one of the foundational views of mathematics that is listed under the broader heading of constructivism. It shares with the many forms of constructivism the fundamental view that mathematical objects and concepts have to be accessible to the mathematician in terms of constructions that can be executed or performed. The various forms are distinguished from one another as to how ‘execution’ or ‘performance’ is to be understood. Usually outside finitism the potentially infinite is allowed, i.e., if a procedure or algorithm will (provably) terminate at some moment in the future, then the outcome is accepted as constructable. See Bridges & Richman [1997] for an overview. However, finitism goes one step further and argues that an indefinite outcome is not be accepted as an outcome, since, as all computational resources are finite, it could very well be that these resources have been used up before the outcome has been reached.

Usually the label strict finitism is used to describe the view sketched above. The additional qualification serves to make the distinction with Hilbert's finitism which, roughly speaking, can be seen as a form of finitism on the meta-level (e.g., although mathematical theories can talk about infinite structures, still the proofs in such theories must have a finite length). Here the discussion will be limited to strict finitism.

As might be expected, strict finitism is not a popular view in the philosophy of mathematics. Nevertheless a number of proposals have been put forward. A history and an account of the actual (though now somewhat dated) state of affairs can be found in Welti [1987].

1.2 The special case of geometry

It is rather striking that the various proposals that are discussed in Welti's book focus mainly on numbers and numerals. Less attention has been paid to the problem of geometry. Nevertheless the basic premise seems easy enough to formulate, namely that a geometrical space is finitely extended and that it is composed of a finite number of geometrical basic units, that themselves are not decomposable. These basic units are sometimes called ‘(geometrical) atoms’ or ‘hodons’.

Formulated thus, the problem might seem trivial. After all, there is a separate branch of mathematics that studies finite geometries. There is however an important difference. Although such geometries can be very inspiring for a strict finitist proposal (as will be shown in section 2), their aim is not to provide an alternative for continuous infinite geometries. In addition for the strict finitist geometer, success or failure is not solely determined by internal mathematical arguments or considerations. Rather the hope is that such alternatives will prove to be relevant for applications to the sciences, the case par excellence being physics. If one could successfully replace the classical geometrical continuum structure of space-time by a strict finitist analogue, then, from a philosophical point of view, the consequences would be of great importance. Two obvious topics present themselves as test cases: Zeno's paradoxes and supertasks. If space and time are discrete, then the runner, the tortoise, Achilles and all other moving objects simply go through a finite number of space locations in a finite number of time elements and all the problems with supertasks vanish as a one-minute time interval is no longer divisible in a denumerable series of intervals. These topics will not be treated here and the reader is referred to the related entries.

In the very same sense, there is a clear difference with all the theories and proposals that have been put forward in the computer sciences. The problem one faces there is precisely to set up a translation from a classical geometrical model to a model whereof the domain (usually) consists of the finite set of pixels or cells that make up the computer screen. Although equally inspiring, the drawback here is that nearly all these models assume the classical (infinite) model in the background and, hence, do not have a proper foundation of their own (a situation quite analogous to numerical analysis that relies on classical analysis for proving the correctness of the procedures). Note also that these theories should not be confused with computer programs that have the ability to reason about geometrical objects. This is part of the research area of automated reasoning and its basic objects are proofs, not necessarily the mathematical objects the proofs are about.

Finally, although there have been numerous proposals for discrete worldviews throughout the history of western culture, see, e.g., White [1992], the focus here is on the twentieth-century developments.

2. A Classic Proposal for a Discrete Geometry

As most of the work that has been done has been limited to the plane, this presentation will also be restricted to that particular case (in most proposals the extension to higher dimensional geometries is considered completely straightforward). There are different routes to follow. One possibility is to take any axiomatisation of the (Euclidean) plane—say, Hilbert's formulation of 1899 in his Grundlagen der Geometrie—and show what changes are required to have (a) finite models of the axiomatic theory, and (b) finite models that approximate the classical (infinite, Euclidean) models as closely as possible. One of the very first attempts dates back to the late 40s, early 50s and will therefore be presented here as an exemplar (in the sense that it has both all the positive qualities required as well as the oddities that seem to go together with such attempts). More specifically, it concerns the work of Paul Kustaanheimo in partial collaboration with G. Järnefelt in the period between 1949 and 1957.

2.1 A standard axiomatisation for Euclidean plane geometry

What does a Hilbert-type axiomatisation look like? The first thing one has to do is to fix a (formal) language. Usually one chooses first-order predicate logic with identity, i.e., a language containing names for variables (and, possibly, for constants), names for functions (if necessary), names for predicates including the identity predicate, logical connectives and quantifiers, and a set of grammatical rules to form sentences. The restriction to first-order logic means that only variables can be quantified over. Without going into details, it should be remarked that a more expressive language can be chosen, e.g., whereby quantification over predicates is allowed as well.

If a language has been chosen, the next problem is to determine the primitive terms of the language. For plane Euclidean geometry, these are points and lines, although sometimes lines are defined as particular sets of points. Next the basic predicates have to be selected. There exist a number of different axiomatisations at the present moment. The most frequently used predicates are: the incidence relation (“a point a lies on a line A”), the betweenness relation (“point a lies between points b and c”), the equidistance relation (“the distance from point a to b is the same as the distance from point c to d”), the congruence relation (“a part of a line, determined by two point a and b is congruent to a part of a line, determined by two points c and d”). Note that it is not necessary that all of them occur in an axiomatisation. As an example, if lines are not introduced as primitive terms, then usually there is no incidence relation.

The next step is the introduction of a set of axioms to determine certain properties of the above mentioned relations. As an example, if the axiomatisation uses the incidence relation, then the typical axioms for that relation are:

  1. Through two points exactly one straight line can be drawn.
  2. There are at least two points on every straight line.
  3. There are at least three points that are not on the same straight line.

Finally, one looks for an interpretation or a model of the axiomatisation. This means that we search for a meaning of the primitive terms, such as points and lines, of the functions (if any) and of the predicates in such a way that the axioms become true statements relative to the interpretation. Although we often have a particular interpretation in mind when we develop an axiomatisation, it does not exclude the possibility of the existence of rather unexpected models. In a sense finitist models rely on this very possibility as the next paragraph shows.

2.2 Kustaanheimo's finitist approach

Kustaanheimo's proposal—I reproduce here in rough outline the excellent presentation of his proposal in Welti [1987], pp. 487-521, which is far more accessible than the original work—is based on the following line of reasoning. A standard model for the classical axiomatic theory of Euclidean geometry consists of the cartesian product of the real numbers with itself. Or, as it is usually formulated, a point in the plane is mapped onto a couple of real numbers, its coordinates. The real numbers have the mathematical structure of an infinite field. But finite fields exist as well. So why not replace the infinite real number field with a finite field, a so-called Galois field?

The best result one could obtain would be that every finite Galois field satisfies most of the axioms of Euclidean geometry. That however is not the case. The outcome of Kustaanheimo's research is slightly more complicated:

(a) Not all finite fields will do. If we call p the number of elements in the domain of the finite field, then p has to satisfy some conditions. This means that only finite fields of a particular size, i.e., a specific value for p, are potential candidates.

(b) For the “good” values of p, the full model will not do. As an example, take straight lines. According to their definition in a finite field, it turns out that there are two sorts of straight lines: open and closed ones. The latter ones violate some of the axioms, hence you restrict the model to the open ones. This restriction of the model is called the Euclidean “kernel” of the model.

In short, one cannot claim that any finite field will do, but only some and for that matter only part of it.

This approach raises some important philosophical questions:

(a) It is clear that the size of the model is an important feature. Does this have any meaning? Or, negatively, what does it mean that fields of a different size are not suitable as models? Suppose as a thought experiment that Euclidean geometry is a good model for the geometrical structure of the universe. Does it make sense to claim that the universe must contain exactly p points (not p-1, not p+1)? A new sort of Pythagoreanism seems to be lurking around the corner here.

(b) The example of the straight lines shows that there are “nice” geometrical objects (those that satisfy most of the axioms) and “bad” geometrical objects. Ignoring the bad ones is perhaps a mathematically interesting strategy, but it does not eliminate them from the full model. In other words, although they do not play any relevant part in the “kernel” of the model, they are there. What is the meaning of that? To continue the above thought experiment, the question is what corresponds to the “bad” objects in the universe? If they do not correspond to anything, why do we need them in the first place to find the “good” objects?

In defense of Kustaanheimo's approach it must be said that the connections between infinite and finite models are usually far more complex than one expects. A finite model is not merely a scaled-down version of an infinite model. Very often a different structure appears. As an analogy take the (infinite set of) natural numbers. Take a finite part, say the numbers 1 up to L. In the finite case it makes sense to talk about small and large numbers compared to L. This is classically not possible. So one finds additional structure. Metaphorically speaking, by making things finite, a more detailed or “fine-grained” structure appears, that is wiped out in the presence of infinities. Perhaps the distinction between “good” and “bad” geometrical objects is such an additional feature that disappears in the classical Euclidean model. More details about Kustaanheimo's approach are to be found in the following supplementary document

Finite Fields as Models for Euclidean Plane Geometry.

The counterargument could be that one of the major disadvantages of infinite models and theories is that ‘fine’ details or the ‘fine-grained’ structure is wiped out by the infinities present, much the same as infinite numbers wipe out the distinction between small and large numbers or numerals. Thus perhaps the prime numbers do have a significance. But still the question remains: is this a new sort of Pythagoreanism?

3. Recent Proposals

In recent years some authors have focused rather on particular problems related to strict finitist geometry instead of attempting to present a full alternative. Usually the problems have been raised by those who doubt the possibility of a strict finitist position. Three problems of this sort will be discussed: the distance function problem, the dimension problem and the isotropy problem.

3.1 Three problems to deal with

The distance function problem. The argument dates back to 1949 and was first formulated by Hermann Weyl: “If a square is built up of miniature tiles, then there are as many tiles along the diagonal as there are along the sides; thus the diagonal should be equal in length to the side” (Weyl [1949], p. 43). At least two solutions to this problem have been formulated.

Van Bendegem [1987] argued that in a finite geometry it should be a basic fact that lines and points have extensions. In particular, lines are supposed to have a constant width (independent of the orientation of the line) ND. Thus ND represents a large (finite) number, corresponding to the number of squares that form ND. Given a line, the width is always defined as perpendicular to that line. Now suppose that the line has an orientation corresponding to an angle α between the line and the x-axis. Then the width ND of that line, when projected on the x-axis will be [ND/sin α] where the expression [x] indicates the greatest integer less than or equal to x.

Figure 1

The distance d between two points p and q is then defined as the number of squares in the rectangle formed by the line from p to q and the width ND, divided by ND. The idea is that, although in a discrete geometry, lines must necessarily have a width, this is not an essential feature, so it can be divided out. Hence:

d(p,q) = NL · [ ND/sin α] (div ND).

NL here corresponds to the number of layers parallel to the x-axis between p and q and n (div m) is the quotient of the division of n by m.

As an illustration, consider the Weyl problem.

Figure 2

We have a right-angled triangle pqr such that for simplicity the right sides pq and qr are equal to one another and are aligned with the axes of the grid. Suppose that the number of squares in the right sides is NL. Then

d(p,q)= d(q,r) = NL · [ND] (div ND) = NL,

since, of course, [ND] = ND. However, the hypotenuse has an angle of α = √2/2. Thus,

d(p,r) = NL · [ND/sin α] (div ND)
  = NL · [√2 · ND] (div ND)
  = NL · [√2]n,

where [r]n means the number r up to n decimals. No calculations are needed to show that the Pythagorean theorem holds, i.e., d2(p,q) + d2(q,r) = d2(p,r). Finally, there is an easy explanation why the Weyl problem occurs: it corresponds to the limiting case ND = 1. When ND = 1, then [√2·ND] = [√2] = 1, hence d(p,r) = NL·1 = NL and Pythagoras' theorem fails.

Although the introduction of a width ND apparently solves the problem, it is equally clear what the drawbacks are. Without classical Euclidean geometry in the background, there is really no way to get the construction going. There is no definition of a line in terms of the discrete geometry, and, above all, the projected width on the x-axis of a line L is calculated according to a Euclidean distance function that is not explicitly mentioned. In short, there is a mixture of two distance functions.

Peter Forrest [1995] presents another solution. He starts by introducing a family of discrete spaces En,m, where n corresponds to the “classical” dimension of space and m is a scale factor, to be understood as follows: m is a parameter to decide when two points are or are not adjacent, which is the basic (and sole) concept of his geometry. Thus in the case n = 2, points are labeled by couples of integers (i, j) and two points (i, j) and (i′, j′) are adjacent if

  1. they are distinct, and
  2. (ii′) 2 + (jj′) 2m2.

Once adjacency has been stipulated, a distance function can be easily derived: the distance between p and q, d(p,q), is the smallest number of “links” in a chain of points connecting p and q such that each one is adjacent to the previous one. Next there is no problem to show that a straight line passing through two points is that chain of points that has the shortest distance.

If the parameter m has a small value, then the resulting distance function is not Euclidean. More specifically, if m = 1, then we have, once again, the situation presented by Weyl. But if, say, m = 1030 (the figure proposed by Forrest himself), then the situation changes. Then it is possible to show that the distance function on the discrete space will approximate the Euclidean distance function as close as one wants. Without presenting all the details, one can show that a Euclidean distance function dE and the discrete distance function d are related by a scale factor, i.e.,

dE(p,q)/d(p, q) = constant(m),

where the constant is determined by the value of m. No calculations are needed once again, to show that the original distance function d satisfies the Pythagorean theorem.

If one is looking for a weak point in this approach, then inevitably one must end up with the basic notion of adjacency. What is the reason for defining adjacency in Euclidean terms? For, after all, a condition such as (ii′)2 + (jj′)2m2 looks as Euclidean as can be.

A possible way out is suggested in Van Bendegem [1995]. One of the advantages of a discrete approach—and, as a matter of fact, this seems to hold in general for strict finitist proposals—is that definitions that are classically equivalent turn out to be distinct in a strict finitist framework. Thus, more specifically, a circle can be defined in (at least) two ways:

  1. as the set of points p that have a fixed distance to a fixed point,
  2. as the set of points p such that, given a fixed line segment ab, the angle formed by apb is a right angle.

Classically speaking, these two definitions are equivalent. However, they are not in a discrete geometry. If, e.g., the distance function is defined as the lowest number of hodons that connect two given points, then the two definitions are not equivalent. Using definition (a), the circle will have the shape of a square (a well-known fact in so-called taxicab geometry) and thus useless to define adjacency as done above. Definition (b) on the other hand produces a figure that can approximate a Euclidean circle as close as one likes. In that way Forrest's definition for adjacency is acceptable within a discrete framework, as no reference is made to a Euclidean distance function.

The dimension problem. Not much attention has been paid to this problem although it is fundamental. If the plane consists of a discrete set of elements, hodons or atoms, then this set must have dimension zero. For, in order to determine the dimension, this set must be equipped with a topology and the only possible candidate is the discrete topology. This entails that the dimension is zero. Either one takes the option to simply drop the notion of dimension on the basis of the argument that the concept of dimension presupposes a concept of continuity and topology and hence has no finitist meaning. Or one searches for an analog, but it is not clear at all what that could be. Something one should not try to do is to derive a notion of dimension from an ordering relation. Suppose that the hodons are labeled by integers (i, j) in some appropriate coordinate system, such that -Li, jL, where L is some upper bound. Then quite different ordering relations are possible. One possibility is to define (i, j) < (k, l) if and only if i + j < k + l. But another possibility is to define (i, j) < (k, l) if and only if either i < k or, if i = k, then j < l. It therefore requires additional arguments to claim that among all possible order relations on a given set, one and only one has a special status. So far no such arguments have been produced.

The isotropy problem. If the plane is built up from square hodons, as in the paragraph above, then the hodons are arranged in such a way that every hodon touches four other hodons, i.e., the plane can be modeled as a square grid, then it is obvious that there are preferred directions, in this case, there will be two preferred directions. However if instead of squares, hexagons are taken as hodons, then there are four preferred directions. Thus no matter what the shape is of the hodon, there will be preferred directions and this implies that the space is anisotropic. However, for physical applications one would like to have isotropy (or at least as close as possible).

Two approaches are possible. Either the hodons have a definite shape or they do not. In the first case it has been suggested that instead of a regular periodic tiling of the plane, one should look for an irregular aperiodic tiling, such as the Penrose tiling.

Figure 3

Although no worked-out examples are available, it seems a promising line of attack (see, e.g., Penrose Tilings and Wange Tilings, in the Other Internet Resources section), as a source of inspiration). In the case of the Penrose tiling it is interesting to see that there are no classically straight lines anymore, precisely because of the aperiodicity. In the second case vagueness is a possible way out. As Peter Forrest defends in his [1995], the whole idea of a specific representation of a discrete space, e.g., as built up from tiny squares is fundamentally mistaken. If a hodon has a specific form, then one cannot avoid asking questions about parts of a hodon, such as its border, but that does not make sense if hodons are the smallest spatial entities possible. An intermediate position defended in Van Bendegem [1995] is to consider a series of discrete geometries Gi, each with a hodon of a particular size, hi, such that hihj, for ij and, in addition, there are M and N such that M < hi < N, for all i. One can then apply a supervaluation technique to the series. This means that a statement will be True (False) if it is true (false) in every geometry Gi. In all other cases it is Undecided, i.e. true in some and false in some others. Now if A is the statement ‘hodons have size α’ (where α is a specific number), this will be Undecided, if a corresponds to at least one of the hi. Such an approach however introduces all problems connected with vagueness into the discussion, which is not necessarily an encouraging situation.

3.2 The empirical question

As said in the beginning, the final test of a discrete geometry will be its application first and foremost to physics. There are basically two ways to think about such a test. Either one can think of a ‘strong’ version, viz., that is possible to design an experiment that would allow us to decide between the continuous and the discrete case. Or one can think of a ‘weak’ version, viz., that the discrete version does at least the same things as the classical version.

In the first case the aim is to think of a crucial experiment. It is quite interesting to see that already in 1961 Paul Feyerabend suggested such a possibility. However not much more is said, as “the difficulty of the present situation seems to lie in the fact that discrete alternatives for the mathematics, which at the present moment is being used in physics, are missing” (p. 160). Equally interesting is the fact that Feyerabend too mentions the standard argument that the lack of a Pythagorean theorem is a genuine problem. His proposal is that “we need only assume that measurements in different directions do not commute; and then perhaps we can retain the theorem as an operator equation” (p. 161). Here too, unfortunately, nothing more is said. Peter Forrest [1995] maintains that such an experiment is possible. The fundamental reason is that classical mathematics uses continuous variables whereas strict finitist mathematics uses discrete variables. Thus for differentation and integration finite analogs must be found and they will approximate the classical case, but never coincide with it. Hence, there will always be small differences and it cannot be excluded that these could be detectable. Although not much progress has been made in this connection, it is worth mentioning the curious fact that the differential equation, df/dx = ax(1 − x), produces a very neat continuous solution, whereas the analogue difference equation, Δf / Δx = ax(1 − x), depending on the value of the parameter a, produces chaotic effects. See Van Bendegem [2000] and Welti [1987], pp. 516-518.

In the second case there is a strong tendency to focus on the problem whether elements from the mathematical model can be either directly or indirectly linked to the physical constants. All things considered it seems not very interesting to look for direct connections. Suppose that one would be tempted to identify the hodon with the Planck length, lp = 10−35 m and the chronon—the smallest time unit—with Planck time, tp = 10−43 s, then, if it is accepted that an object can only move through neighbouring hodons, then there is a upper limit to velocities, namely c = 3.108m/s. But if an object is not moving at the top speed of one hodon per chronon, then the next lower value must be one hodon per two chronons, but that means a velocity of c/2. We seem to have missed out the whole range between c/2 and c. There is a way out, but it supposes that ‘jerky’ motion is considered possible, an aesthetically quite ugly idea. An object moves two hodons in two chronons and then waits for one chronon and then repeats the same motion. The average velocity is then 2c/3.

Nevertheless some philosophers and physicists seem especially interested in this kind of approach, see, e.g., Hahn [1934], Biser [1941], Coish [1959], Finkelstein & Rodriguez [1986], Meessen [1989], Buot [1989], to name but a very few. For the period 1925-1936, Kragh and Carazza [1994] is an excellent overview showing that many physicists were playing around with finitist ideas. Two types of arguments and considerations are often expressed:

The quantum mechanical connection. A strict finitist geometry makes sense because it is clear in quantum mechanics that discreteness is an essential feature of the world and hence should be reflected in our descriptions of that world. Although at first sight the argument seems plausible, it seriously underestimates the difficulty of the task. It is therefore not very surprising that in nearly all cases only rough suggestions are made and it is rather unclear what mathematical formalism could replace the existing mathematics used in quantum mechanics involving lots of infinities (such as infinite dimensional Hilbert spaces).

The numbers game. In this approach the focus is on the physical constants themselves including such constants as the velocity of light c, the Planck constant h, the mass of the electron me, and so on. As these values are necessarily finite, it seems worthwhile to investigate whether a finitist approach can explain why these constants have the values they happen to have. A very fine example of such an approach is the so-called Combinatorial Physics Program. Starting from a very simple model, combinatorial considerations on the size of certain mathematical objects lead to an estimation of some physical constants. The success of this program is rather modest as these models do not connect easily to existing physical theories. A self-contained presentation of this program is to be found in Bastin & Kilmister [1995]. There is a very strong similarity with the work of A. S. Eddington. Not very surprisingly, a presentation of the work of Eddington on his fundamental theory has been written by Kilmister [1994].

All things considered, both on the mathematical as on the physical level an enormous amount of work remains to be done. Probably the best way to characterize the present-day situation is that some ‘famous’ objections to a finitist approach in geometry have been (partially) answered so that it is legitimate to continue this research program.


Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

geometry: in the 19th century | space and time: supertasks | vagueness | Zeno of Elea: Zeno's paradoxes