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Goodman's Aesthetics

First published Sat May 7, 2005

Nelson Goodman has certainly been one of the most influential figures in contemporary aesthetics and analytic philosophy in general (in addition to aesthetics, his contributions cover the areas of applied logic, metaphysics, epistemology, and philosophy of science). His Languages of Art (first published in 1968 [Goodman 1976]), together with Ernst Gombrich's Art and Illusion (1960) and Richard Wollheim's Art and Its Objects (1968), represents a fundamental turning point in the analytic approach to artistic issues in Anglo-American philosophy. His unorthodox approach to art is part of a general approach to knowledge and reality, and is always pervasively informed by his cognitivism, nominalism, relativism, and constructivism. From Languages of Art and subsequent works, a general view of the arts as contributing to the understanding and indeed to the building of the realities we live in emerges. Ultimately, in Goodman's view, art is not sharply divided, in goals and means, from science and ordinary experience. Paintings, musical sonatas, dances, etc. all are symbols that classify parts of reality for us, as do such things as scientific theories and what makes up common, ordinary knowledge.

1. Biographical Sketch

Goodman's personal life (August 7, 1906–November 25, 1998) was linked to art in several and important ways. From 1929 to 1941, he directed an art gallery in Boston: the Walker-Goodman Art Gallery. It is through this commitment that he met his wife, Katharine Sturgis, a skilled painter whose work is reproduced in Goodman's Ways of Worldmaking (1978). In 1941, he received a Ph.D. in Philosophy at Harvard University, with a dissertation, A Study of Qualities (1941), that laid out the nominalist view that would later be presented in his first book, The Structure of Appearance (1951). He taught at Tufts University (1945-46), The University of Pennsylvania (1946-64), Brandeis University (1964-67), and, from 1967, at Harvard University, where he became Emeritus Professor in 1977.

Throughout his life, he remained a passionate collector of ancient and contemporary art pieces, as well as a generous lender and donor to a number of museums. He was a rigorous philosopher who, however, never lacked the capacity to talk to artists and researchers in other fields. In 1967, at the School of Education of Harvard, he established an interdisciplinary program for the study of education and the arts, “Project Zero,” which he directed until 1971. Still at Harvard, he founded and directed the Summer Dance program. It is, then, not at all surprising that, amongst Goodman's works, we find, next to philosophical production, multimedia projects that combine—indeed very much in Goodmanian fashion—painting (including Sturgis's work), music, and dance: Hockey Seen (1972), Rabbit Run (1973), and Variations (1985).

2. Classifying and Constructing Worlds

One way of approaching Goodman's aesthetics, and of seeing both its unity and continuity with his work in other areas of philosophy, is by recalling some of the ideas presented in one of his early works, Fact, Fiction, and Forecast (originally published in 1954 [Goodman 1983]). There Goodman formulates what he calls “the general problem of projection” (of which the famous “new riddle of induction” is an instance), grounded in the general idea that we project predicates onto reality (a reality that is itself “constructed” by those projections, according to the constructivist approach Goodman defended from the time of A Study of Qualities [1941], hence in The Structure of Appearance [1951] and, later, in Ways of Worldmaking [1978]). Hume famously claimed that inductions are based on regularities found in experience, and concluded that the inductive predictions may very well turn out being false. In Fact, Fiction, and Forecast, Goodman points out how “regularities” are themselves in a sense problematic. Take such objects as emeralds that we classify by using the predicate “green.” They can also be said to be “grue,” i.e., observed up to a certain time t and found green, blue otherwise. Hence, our observation seems to equally grant two different inductions—that emeralds will remain green after t or that they will be blue. The problem is a general one, involving not just hypotheses but the projection of any predicate onto the world. Indeed, as we divide the world into green and blue things, so could we divide it into grue and bleen things (things that are observed up to t and found blue, and green otherwise). Notice that, under a description of the world using the green/blue predicates pair, there may be no change at time t (no change in the color of emeralds and sapphires for example), whereas there would be change under the alternative pair grue/bleen. Likewise, where at time t there is change under “green/blue” (in case that, say, an emerald is painted over at t), there may be no change under the alternative pair, “grue/bleen.” The new riddle of induction—and, in general, the problem of projection—is, then, to explain what are the bases for projecting certain predicates—green, blue, red, etc.—onto to the world, and not others—grue, bleen, gred, etc. For, as Goodman states it, “[r]egularities are where you find them, and you can find them anywhere” (1983, 83). There is no difference in principle between the predicates we use and those we could use, but rather a pragmatic difference in habit, or of “entrenchment” of certain predicates and not others.

When one combines the idea of the entrenchment of certain predicates to the idea that our successfully projecting certain predicates (and more generally symbols), rather than others, modifies our observation and very perception of reality (indeed it amounts to constructing different realities), one has the basis for Goodman's general approach to our cognitive relationship to the world, of which art is a fundamental component. Artworks, too, are symbols, referring to the world (or the worlds they contribute to construct) in a variety of different ways. Understanding the worlds of art is no different, in kind, from understanding the worlds of science or of ordinary perception: it requires interpretation of the various symbols involved in those areas. Which symbols are successfully projected—and, for instance, which artistic styles are perceived as familiar and which ones as revolutionary, or which linguistic formulas are categorized as literal and which ones as metaphorical—largely depends on what is customary, “entrenched,” within a certain cultural, artistic, or linguistic community.

3. The Theory of Symbol Systems in Languages of Art

Most of Goodman's aesthetics is contained in his Languages of Art (which he republished, with slight variations, in a second edition in 1976), although what is there presented is clarified, expanded, and sometimes corrected in later essays. As its subtitle, An Approach to a General Theory of Symbols, indicates, this is a book with bearings not only on art issues, but on a general understanding of symbols, linguistic and non-linguistic, in the sciences as well as in ordinary life. Indeed, Languages of Art has, amongst its merits, that of having broken, in a non-superficial and fruitful way, the divide between art and science. Goodman's general view is that we use symbols in our perceiving, understanding, constructing the worlds of our experience: the different sciences and the different arts equally contribute to the enterprise of understanding the world. As in his works in epistemology, metaphysics, and philosophy of language, Goodman's approach is often unorthodox and groundbreaking, and yet never in a way that fails to be refreshing and suggestive of future developments (some of those developments were pursued by Goodman himself in later essays and, most notably, in his last book, co-authored with Catherine Elgin, Reconceptions in Philosophy and Other Arts and Sciences [1988]).

With respect to art in particular and to symbolic activities in general, Goodman advocates a form of cognitivism: by using symbols we discover (indeed we build) the worlds we live in, and the interest we have in symbols—artworks amongst them—is distinctively cognitive. Indeed, to Goodman, aesthetics is but a branch of epistemology. Paintings, sculptures, musical sonatas, dance pieces, etc. are all entities composed of symbols, which possess different functions and bear different relations with the worlds they refer to. Hence, artworks require interpretation and interpreting them amounts to understanding what they refer to, in which way, and within which systems of rules.

Since symbolizing is for Goodman the same as referring, it must also be emphasized, first, that reference has, in his view, different modes, and, second, that something is a symbol, and is a symbol of a given kind, only within a symbol system of that kind, a system governed by the syntactical and semantic rules distinctive of symbols of that kind. Of course, natural languages are examples of symbol systems, but there are many other, non-linguistic systems: pictorial, gestural, diagrammatic, etc.

3.1 Modes of Reference

The fundamental notion which is at the core of Goodman's theory of symbols is that of reference—the primitive relation of “standing for”—seen as articulated in different modes, of which denotation is one, and as obtaining not just directly but indirectly as well, sometimes across long chains of reference. Indeed, one of the great contributions of Nelson Goodman to philosophy is his investigation of kinds of reference or symbolization. Denotation and exemplification are the two fundamental forms of reference out of which Goodman develops most of his analysis. Denotation is the relationship between a “label,” such as “John F. Kennedy,” or “The 34th President of the United States,” and what it labels (Goodman 1976, Chap. 1). In fact, according to Goodman's nominalist approach, possessing a feature (or what ordinarily would also be called a property, such as being blue) just amounts to being denoted by a certain predicate or, more precisely, by a “label” (such as “blue”). Hence possession is the converse of denotation. (Of course, labels can be particular or general, as reference can be to an individual, as in the “JFK” example above, or, severally, to all the members of a set, as with “blue” with respect to all blue items.) Furthermore, labels are not limited to linguistic ones, i.e., to predicates: pictures, musical symbols, and all other labels classify world items; and what something is as much depends on the nonverbal labels applying to it as on the predicates it falls under.

Exemplification—the sort of reference typical, for instance, of tailors' swatches—requires possession. In addition to possession, however, which of course by itself is not a form of symbolization, exemplification requires that the exemplifying symbol refers back to the label or predicate that denotes it. Hence, exemplification is “possession plus reference” (Goodman 1976, 53). When a feature is referred to in this way, it is “exhibited, typified, shown forth” (Goodman 1976, 86). While any blue object is denoted by the label “blue,” only those things—e.g., blue color swatches—that also refer to “blue” and analogous labels exemplify such color, are “samples” of it. An important characteristic of samples is that they are selective in the way they function symbolically (see also Goodman 1978h, 63-70). A tailor's swatch does not exemplify all of the features it possesses—or all the predicates that denote it—but rather only those for which it is a symbol (hence, e.g., predicates denoting color and texture, and not predicates denoting size or shape). Which of its properties does a sample exemplify depends on the system within which the sample is being used: color and texture are relevant to the systems used in tailoring, not size and shape. Exemplification is for Goodman a common and yet, philosophically, unrecognized form of reference. Indeed, throughout his own philosophical oeuvre, we find Goodman using exemplification to explain a number of issues: most notably, expression in art, but also, for instance, the notion of artistic style (1975), how works of architecture can be attributed meaning (1985), or the notion of a “variation upon a theme” in such arts as music and painting (Goodman, Elgin 1988, Chap. 4).

Yet the paths or “routes” of reference can be of many different sorts, and indeed symbols may combine in “chains of reference” to give rise to instances of complex reference (Goodman 1981a). There is, first of all, the sort of symbolization employed by metaphors (as when human beings are referred to as “wolves”), a mode of reference that becomes crucial to Goodman's analysis of expression in art. In analyzing metaphor, Goodman (1976, Chap. 2; 1979) follows suggestions included in Max Black's famous article on the topic (Black 1954) but expands and adapts them to his own view that denotational symbols—labels—don't work alone but rather as members of “schemata” (“a label functions not in isolation but as belonging to a family” [Goodman 1976, 71]), normally correlated to some referential “realm.” “Blue,” “green,” “red,” etc., for instance, typically belong to the same “schema”—a set of labels established by context and habit—and the realm of reference of such schema is made of all the ranges of things that each label in the schema denotes (all blue objects, all green objects, and so on).We have an instance of metaphorical reference when a symbol, linguistic or not, is made to refer to something not belonging to the realm normally correlated to the symbol's schema, i.e., not belonging to the sorts of things that the symbols in the schema normally refer to. Hence, calling a painting “sad” is metaphorical because a predicate that is normally projected upon bearers of mental, emotional states, is projected upon an inanimate object made of canvas and wood and paint. Using the notions of schema and realm allows Goodman's analysis to include the claim that typically metaphors bring about rearrangements in a field of reference, which affect several labels at once. It is important to emphasize that, for Goodman, metaphorical usage is no less real or connected to knowledge than literal usage, and metaphorical truth no less a form of truth than literal truth. Indeed, the literal and the metaphorical in a sense lie on the same continuum. Whether the application of a label (and the corresponding possession of a feature) should be considered literal or metaphorical is just a matter of habit—specifically, a matter of the age of the metaphor, for old metaphors lose their metaphorical status and become just literal applications. Using a metaphor himself, Goodman claims that “a metaphor is an affair between a predicate with a past and an object that yields while protesting” (1976, 69). Notice that such a formula includes two elements: that there is resistance to a metaphor (deriving from its literal falseness) but also attraction (deriving from the insightful reorganization of a schema of labels vis-à-vis a referential realm, which the metaphor may bring about). A metaphor is a voluntary misassignment of a label, but it is also more than that: “Whereas falsity depends upon misassignment of a label, metaphorical truth depends upon reassignment” (1976, 70 emphasis added).

Other rhetorical figures (although not all of them) can, in Goodman's view be explained in terms of metaphorical “transfers” of this kind, indeed as “modes of metaphor”: personification, synecdoche, antonomasia, hyperbole, litotes, irony… (1976, 81-85).

Of course, the same item may perform several referential functions at the same time, denoting certain things while exemplifying certain features, and do so literally or metaphorically. Furthermore, sometimes reference is indirect or mediate (Goodman, Elgin 1988, 42), brought about by the combination of different forms of reference into instances of complex reference. Reference may, so to speak, travel along “chains of reference” made of symbols that refer to, or are referred by, other symbols. An obvious case is that in which a country like the United States is referred to by a picture of a bald eagle, thanks to the picture of the bald eagle being a label for a bird that in turn exemplifies a label like “bold and free,” which in turn denotes the United States and indeed is, furthermore, exemplified by it (Goodman 1984, 62).

3.2 Symbol Schemes and Symbol Systems

In general, how a symbol refers—whether it denotes or exemplifies, what it denotes or which of its features it exemplifies, whether it does so directly or indirectly, literally or metaphorically—depends on the system of symbolization within which the symbol is found. Furthermore, a symbol is the sort of symbol it is—linguistic, musical, pictorial, diagrammatic, etc.—in virtue of its belonging to a symbol system of a certain kind. And symbols differ from each other according to their different syntactic and semantic rules.

Indeed, a symbol system, say, the English language, actually consists of a symbol scheme (not to be confused with the above-mentioned notion of a label “schema”)—i.e., of a collection of symbols, or “characters,” with rules to combine them into new, compound characters—associated to a field of reference. In the English language, for instance, the symbol scheme is made of characters as the letters of the Roman alphabet—“a,” “b,” “c,” etc.—as well as compound characters such as “ape” or “house.” Each character comprises all the verbal utterances and ink inscriptions, i.e., all the “marks” that correspond to it. The mode of reference fundamental to symbol systems is denotation: characters denote, stand for items in the field of reference. The scheme is governed by syntactical rules—determining how to form and combine characters—the system by semantic rules—determining how the range of symbols in the scheme refer to their field of reference.

The fundamental notion with reference to which the different syntactical and semantic rules of systems can be explained is that of a notation—in brief, a symbol system where to each symbol corresponds one item in the realm, and to each item in the realm only one symbol in the system. Hence, for instance, a musical score is a character in a notational system only if it determines which performances belong to the work and, at the same time, is determined by each of those performances (Goodman 1976, 128-130). In a notational symbol scheme all the members of a character are interchangeable (that is, there is “character-indifference” between the marks that make a character) (Goodman 1976, 132-134). Hence, for instance, the Roman alphabet is made of characters in a notational scheme because any inscription of, say, the letter “a” (A or a or a…) expresses the same character and hence can be chosen at will, and because each of such marks cannot be used for any other letter of the alphabet. The same is true, for instance, of the set of the basic musical symbols used in standard musical notation. Accordingly, the two syntactic requirements of a notation are disjointness (each mark belongs to no more than one character) and finite differentiation, or articulation (in principle, it is always possible to determine to which character a mark belongs). Symbol schemes that are notational can be compared in their working to the way digital instruments of measurement work: for any measurement indicated by the instrument there is always a definite answer to the question: what is the measurement. By contrast, schemes that are non-notational are well exemplified by analog systems of measurement. For their complete lack of articulation, those systems can also be said to be dense throughout: given any mark (e.g., a mark in a scale) it could stand for virtually an infinite number of characters, hence of measurements; or, equivalently, given any two marks, there is a virtually infinite number of possible characters between them.

For the symbol system also to be notational, more than syntactic disjointness and finite differentiation is required. Symbol systems are notational when 1) the characters are correlated to the field of reference unambiguously (with no character being correlated to more than one class of reference, or “compliance class”), 2) what a character refers to—the “compliance class—must not intersect the compliance class of another character (i.e., the characters must be semantically disjoint), and 3) it is always possible to determine to which symbol an item in the field of reference complies (i.e., the system must be, semantically, finitely differentiated).With exceptions that will have to be spelled out below, a musical score in standard Western notation is a character in a notational system. Natural languages like the English language have a notational scheme but fail to be a notational system, because of ambiguities (in English, “cape” refers to a piece of land as well as to a piece of clothing) and lack of semantic disjointness (“man” and “doctor” have some referents in common). Finally, pictorial systems fail on both syntactic and semantic grounds.

4. From Languages of Art to Reconceptions: New Looks at Aesthetic Issues

The rich and systematic general analysis of modes of reference and of types of symbol systems presented in Languages of Art allows Goodman to address fundamental questions in the philosophy of art: on the nature of the different art forms and the symbolic functions that are central to them; on questions of ontology and the importance of authenticity; on the distinction between artistic and non-artistic forms of symbolization; and on the role of artistic value.

4.1 Pictorial Representation

Languages of Art prompted a lively debate especially concerning Goodman's claims about the nature of pictorial representation, or depiction. According to Goodman, the symbolic function that is distinctive of pictures is denotation (1976, Chap. 1)—hence pictures are labels and in that respect are analogous to linguistic predicates. The characteristics that distinguish pictorial systems from other denotational systems (e.g., from natural languages) make them the very opposite of a notation: pictorial systems are dense throughout and in that respect are similar to other analog systems, such as those of diagrams and maps (1976, 194-198; Goodman, Elgin 1988, Chap. 7).

At a first approximation, Goodman's claim that “denotation is the core of representation” (1976, 5) means that pictures are pictorial labels for their subjects, individuals or sets of individuals, analogously to how names or predicates or verbal descriptions are linguistic labels for their denotata. Yet, of course, not all pictures that have a subject—i.e., all pictures that are representational, versus paintings that are non-representational or abstract—have an actual individual as their subject. Some pictures have just a generic subject (say, a picture of a man, in the sense of a picture of no man in particular), others have a fictional object (a picture of a unicorn, for instance). Goodman's account of such cases is in terms of multiple denotation for the former and null denotation for the latter. Some pictures—exemplary is an illustration of an eagle placed, in a dictionary, next to the definition of the word “eagle”—refer, severally, to all the members of a given set, such as the set of eagles. Other pictures, such as pictures of unicorns, refer to nothing, since there are no unicorns in reality: they have null denotation. Goodman insists that the existence of pictures with null denotation does not represent a problem for the view claiming that “denotation is the core of representation.” Such pictures are, of course, to be distinguished from other pictures with null denotation, such as pictures of Pegasus or of Pickwick. Yet, they are so distinguished in being pictures of a certain kind—unicorn-pictures—classified differently from pictures of other kinds, such as Pegasus-pictures or Pickwick-pictures.

Hence, Goodman appears to analyze pictorial representation as an ambiguous concept, ambiguous, that is, between a denotational sense (“is a picture of a so-and-so”) and a non-denotational sense (“is a so-and-so-picture). This may be seen as a disadvantage vis-à-vis “perceptual” theories of depiction such as those proposed, for instance, by Richard Wollheim (1987) and Kendall Walton (1990) (cfr. Robinson 2000). Yet concerns on Goodman's treating the concept of depiction as ambiguous are misplaced, for the concept of depiction can quite plausibly be maintained to be ambiguous between a sense that has to do with what, if anything, the picture refers to, and a sense having to do with what sort of picture it is (see, e.g., Budd 1993). Indeed, Goodman is right in claiming that, with any picture there are always two questions: one, what the picture represents, if anything; two, what kind of picture it is (1976, 31). Rather, a much more real problem with Goodman's theory derives from his not addressing some of the most fundamental questions regarding depiction. Goodman articulates his account of the sense of depiction that has to do with the referential function of pictures in some detail: pictures are symbols in symbol systems that are devoted to denotation (although their members may have individual, multiple, or null denotation) and that have certain (primarily) syntactic characteristics. Yet Goodman has nothing to say on why certain pictures denote what they do. Nor can Goodman say much on the sense of depiction that has to do with the sort of picture a picture is (e.g., a man-picture or a unicorn-picture or a so-and-so-picture). Why pictures are classified in certain ways—as unicorn-pictures, man-pictures, and so on—ultimately, is a matter of entrenchment of certain predicates out of the many predicates available. The fact is that Goodman is interested in investigating the “routes” of reference (1981a)—how symbols can denote and exemplify and refer in even more complex and indirect ways. He is not interested in the origins, or “roots,” of reference—hence, with regard to pictures, in how certain marks and not others have become commonly correlated with certain kinds of items in the world. Given the actual history of the use of our symbols, certain pictorial labels (i.e., pictures) are projected rather than others, and certain verbal labels are projected over those pictorial labels. Accordingly, Goodman's theory of depiction is better seen for what it has to tell us on its own terms—in general, on what distinguishes pictorial symbols from symbols of other sorts.

There is indeed more that can be found in Languages of Art regarding depiction, and indirectly regarding the notion of being a so-and-so-picture or a such-and-such-picture. An important part of Goodman's view on depiction is his critique of the idea that resemblance is the distinguishing feature of this sort of symbolization. While Goodman may appear to be, and is usually discussed as, criticizing the resemblance theory of pictorial representation—the “most naïve view of representation” (1976, 3)—his real target is indeed much broader than that—after all, of the resemblance view he also claims that “vestiges” of it, “with assorted refinements, persist in most writing on representation” (1976, 3). What mainly concerns Goodman in Languages of Art is to establish the symbolic, and hence ultimately conventional, nature of pictorial representation—is to draw similarities between pictorial and nonpictorial forms of symbolization. With regard to resemblance Languages of Art echoes the claim in Fact, Fiction, and Forecast with regard to regularities: resemblances can be found anywhere, for anything resembles anything else in some respect or other. Hence, Goodman does not deny the existence of resemblances between a picture and its subject, rather he claims that which resemblances are going to be noticed depends on what the system of correlation employed makes relevant. To Goodman, pictorial representation is always relative to the conceptual framework (that is, to the system of classification) within which a picture should be interpreted, in the same way in which vision is relative to the conceptual frameworks with which one approaches the visual world. On perception, Languages of Art echoes what Goodman had already claimed in his 1960 review of Ernst Gombrich's Art and Illusion: “That we know what we see is no truer than we see what we know. Perception depends heavily on conceptual schemata” (Goodman 1972,142). Thinking that vision may ever take place independently of all conceptualization is to rely on the “myth of the innocent eye”: “there is no innocent eye […]. Not only how but what [the eye] sees is regulated by need and prejudice. [The eye] selects, rejects, organizes, associates, classifies, analyzes, constructs” (Goodman 1976, 7-8).

Accordingly, realism in pictorial representations is reduced to a matter of habit or familiarity, in contrast not only to a resemblance account of realism but to accounts in terms of amount or accuracy of conveyed information as well. Realistic pictures can include inaccuracies—indeed, those used in games of the type “find the n mistakes in the picture” include inaccuracies by definition (Goodman 1984, 127). And the amount of information is not altered, for instance, by switching from the realistic mode of representation of conventional perspective to the non-realistic mode of, say, reverse perspective (Goodman 1976, 35). Goodman's conventionalism is pervasive and uncompromising: even the rules of perspective in the representation of space, he claims, are conventionally established and provide only a relative—i.e., relative to culturally established conceptual schemata—standard of fidelity (1976, 10-19). Realistic paintings, drawings, etc. are those that are painted or drawn in a familiar style, i.e., according to a familiar system of correlation. To put it metaphorically, for Goodman, you always need a key to read a picture—sometimes the key is more ready at hand, part of one's cultural background, other times one must find it and learn how to use it.

Pictures are distinguished from symbols of other sorts in virtue of the distinguishing characteristics of pictorial symbol systems. In particular, pictorial symbol systems are syntactically and semantically dense. That is, given any two marks, no matter how small the difference between them, they could be instantiating two different characters, and given any two characters, no matter how small the difference between them, they may have different referents (Goodman 1976, 226-227; Goodman, Elgin 1988, Chap. 7). Hence, pictures are grouped together with such things as diagrams, ungraduated instruments of measurement, and maps—with those symbols, that is, for which, in simpler words, any difference may make a difference: any difference in a mark may correspond to a different character, and any difference in the character may stand for a different correlation to the field of reference. Even a simple picture, for Goodman, is dense, in the sense that any, however small, mark on the canvas may turn out being relevant to pictorial meaning. Whatever the merits of, or problems with, Goodman's technical analysis, the notion of density is certainly one way to account for what other thinkers—most notably Kendall Walton (1990)—have referred to as an “openendedness” in the investigation of pictures.

Of course, as pictures are likened to things like diagrams, they also need to be distinguished from them. Goodman's claim is that the difference between pictures and diagrams is syntactic, i.e., has to do with the composition of the characters or symbols. Pictorial symbol systems, when compared to diagrammatic systems, tend to be relatively replete. That is, to the interpretation of a picture typically a larger number of features is relevant than to the interpretation of a non-pictorial dense system. A drawing by Hokusai may be made of the same marks as an electrocardiogram. Yet, while in a linear diagram as the electrocardiogram only relative distances from the originating point of the line matter, in the drawing a higher number of features—color, thickness, intensity, contrast, etc.—are relevant (Goodman 1976, 229-230). Diagrams typically are relatively “attenuated.” Accordingly, the difference between diagrams and pictures is only a matter of degree: typically, with a picture a smaller number of features can be dismissed as contingent or irrelevant.

There are claims, in Goodman's account of depiction, that are left unexplained, especially with respect to pictures with indeterminate or fictional reference, that is, with pictures that Goodman would classify by predicates like “man-picture,” “unicorn-pictures,” etc. Of them, Goodman claims that they have “purported” denotation (1976, 67), yet without saying anything on how that should contribute to pictorial meaning. Furthermore, as the analysis progresses, and keeps facing the necessity to account for pictures with indeterminate or fictional reference, as well as with the notion of representation-as (as in a picture that represents Winston Churchill as a bulldog), a somewhat puzzling claim makes its way into Goodman's account: that depiction in such cases is really a matter of exemplification—exemplification of labels such as “unicorn-picture,” “man-picture,” or “bulldog-picture” (1976, 66). The motivation for such a claim may be that of finding, after all, a mode of reference capable of explaining the way in which such pictures have meaning; yet Goodman provides no argument to support the claim that a picture representing, say, a unicorn is not just denoted by labels such as “unicorn-picture” but also refers back to those labels. Lack of actual or determinate reference cannot be sufficient to establish that an item denoted by a label refers back to that label. Furthermore, precisely because samples refer selectively to the labels denoting them, an argument would be needed to the effect that pictures of unicorns exemplify labels such as “of-a-unicorn,” rather than labels as, say, “picture” or even “painted by someone” or “painted canvas,” which after all are labels applying to the item.

4.2 Expression and Exemplification in Art

The notion of exemplification allows Goodman to offer his theory of expression. More generally, it allows him to indicate an important source of meaning in addition to denotation. Most works of music, dance, and architecture, as well as abstract paintings, do not represent anything at all. Yet Goodman can show how, next to artworks' representational powers we must recognize, as a central and pervasive form of symbolization in art, the capacity of artworks to call attention to some of their features, that is, to exemplify them.

As for the features that an artwork appears to exemplify despite its not, literally, possessing them (as when, for instance, a painting is claimed to express sadness in spite of the fact that paintings cannot literally be sad) Goodman claims that such features are metaphorically exemplified, or expressed. In brief, a work of art expresses something when it metaphorically exemplifies it. Accordingly, expression is not limited to feelings and emotions but comprises any feature that can be metaphorically attributed to an artwork: in architecture, for instance, a building may express movement, dynamism, or being “jazzy” although, literally, it can't have any of those properties (Goodman, Elgin 1988, 40).

To expression and exemplification, too, the general rule, for which the relationship between a symbol and what it symbolizes is never “absolute, universal, or immutable” (1976, 50), applies. Hence, like representation, exemplification and expression are relative, in particular they are relative to established use (Goodman 1976, 48).

Goodman's applications of the notion of exemplification to art are in many ways enlightening, by allowing him to explain the significance of certain features of artworks in referential terms. A poem, for instance, is not just a representational symbol, for what it exemplifies is as important to its artistic value as what it represents. Accordingly, the goal of the translator must be “maximal preservation of what the original exemplifies as well as of what it says” (1976, 60).

As is the case for Goodman's analysis of depiction, with regard to exemplification and expression in art, too, one wonders whether Goodman's claims are meant to provide an exhaustive account of such notions, and not rather just a very general, structural, analysis of them. In any event, Goodman's proposal is much more acceptable at that general level. More specific claims, such as that expression and exemplification are relative, like the analogous claim regarding representation, prompt questions on the necessity, for Goodman, to recognize naturalistic constraints on what can be exemplified or expressed or represented by what. More importantly, when we examine specific cases, it appears unclear whether the distinction between exemplification in general and expression in particular has been well drawn. Since, for Goodman, not only feelings and emotions can be expressed but also such properties as color or sound pitch, one wonders what notion “expressing red,” said of a non-red symbol, amounts to: how different is it from the notion referred to by “expressing sadness” said of something (a musical sonata) that literally is not sad? Furthermore, as a more general concern on Goodman's attempt to account for the nature, interpretation, and values of artworks fully extensionalistically (i.e., just in terms only of what they refer to), one wonders whether the role of property possession is not undermined by Goodman's insistence on what a work exemplifies. Certainly, works of art have significant features that they simply possess, without also exemplifying them. A work of art may have to be recognized as, e.g., calm just in the sense of having such feature (if needed, having it metaphorically), and such feature be recognized as relevant to the work's nature and value—as something that the beholder ought to perceive—without it being the case that the work exemplifies or expresses calmness.

4.3 Conditions of Identity for Works of Art

Goodman's theory of symbol systems, as composed of schemes of characters that are governed, depending on the sort of system, by different syntactical rules, and correlated to their extensions according to differing semantic rules, is at the basis of his claims on the identity conditions of works of art of different kinds. Given the syntactic and semantic characteristics of notational systems, the different artforms can be arranged on a spectrum made of the sorts of systems that stand between a pure notation—where there is perfect preservation of identity between replicas (or performances) of the work—and fully dense pictorial systems—where every work is an original.

The issue of identity of works has to do, for Goodman, with whether a work's history of production is integral to the work or not. In brief, it appears that in painting and related artforms, such as drawing, watercolor, and the like (where there is only one instance of a work), but also in etching, woodcut, and the like (where there can be multiple instances of the same work), aspects of the work's history of production are indeed essential to the identity of the work. Only the actual canvas that was painted by Raphael in 1505 counts as the Madonna del Granduca, and only those prints that come from the original plate used by Rembrandt for his Self-Portrait with a Velvet Cap with Plume (1638) count as the originals of that work—anything else is a copy, however apparently indistinguishable from the original. Artforms like painting and etching are for this reason named by Goodman “autographic” arts: “a work of art is autographic if and only if the distinction between original and forgery of it is significant; or better, if and only if even the most exact duplication of it does not thereby count as genuine” (1976, 113). You are looking at Raphael's Madonna or at Rembrandt's Self-Portrait only if you are looking at specific items properly connected, historically, to the artist who produced them. By contrast, music, dance, theater, literature, architecture, although in different ways, seem to allow for instantiations of the work that are independent of the work's history of production. You can listen to a performance of Beethoven's V Symphony even if it is performed (as it would normally be) from a contemporary print of the score. Artforms like music, dance, etc., accordingly, can be called “allographic.”

The question of identity, in Goodman, is addressed with reference to the question whether the given artform allows for a notational system, i.e., for a “score” that would “specify the essential properties a performance must have to belong to the work” (1976, 212). Accordingly, Goodman's can also be seen as a novel way to account for the fact that some artforms—painting and sculpture for instance—do not allow for performances, while other artforms—such as music and dance—do. Although advanced as a first, tentative approach, the proposal is presented very systematically, with clear ambitions to generality and exhaustiveness of the field. Music, painting, literature, theater, dance, and architecture are all addressed with respect to the question of their relationships with the syntactic and semantic requirements of a notation. The questions are not asked hypothetically or just as a mental exercise—in that sense, trivial notations could be devised for any artform (Goodman, Elgin 1988, Chap.7). Rather, the questions are addressed with reference to the systems of notations already existing, when they do.

Naturally, music and painting (and with the latter, of course, sculpture) end up standing on opposite sides of the spectrum, the first being allographic and allowing for a notation, the second autographic and not admitting of any notation compatible with practice. A work of music is, for Goodman, “the class of performances compliant with a character” (1976, 210), where the character is the musical work's score. Consider that music written in standard musical notation is, for the most part—or, more precisely, for the “main corpus of peculiarly musical characters,” (Goodman 1976, 183) i.e. for the flags arranged on the pentagram—in a notational language. All and only those performances that fully correspond to, or “comply with,” the score count as performances of the work. Even one small mistake on the part of the performer, say, in replacing one note for another, is sufficient to declare that, technically, a different work has been performed. On the other hand, other, important aspects of standard musical notation are not in a notational system: indications of tempo, for instance, as well as the convention of letting the performer choose the cadenza, give great latitude to the performer. Hence, in Goodman's view, while two performances that sound almost exactly alike may not be performances of the same work, radically differently sounding performances may be. Notice, however, how the question of identity is here sharply distinct from the question of value: “the most miserable performance without actual mistakes does count as [a genuine instance of a work], while the most brilliant performance with a single wrong note does not” (Goodman 1976, 186).

Goodman's proposals might be dismissed on the grounds of their conflicting with ordinary language and musical practice. Yet, it is most important to remember that Goodman is aware of ordinary practice and does not expect it to comply to the philosopher's technical requirements (as “one hardly expects chemical purity outside the laboratory” [1976, 186]). Nor is he interested in reforming ordinary language: “I am no more recommending that in ordinary discourse we refuse to say that a pianist who misses a note has performed a Chopin Polonaise than that we refuse to call a whale a fish, the earth spherical, or a grayish-pink human white” (Goodman 1976, 187). Indeed, Goodman's approach to the question of notation is, in an important sense, grounded in previous practice, for a notational system is an acceptable one only when projected from a previous classification of works. Furthermore, the history of an artform may include (as music did) an autographic stage, which only at a later time made room for the establishment of a notation, on the grounds of previous practice. Nor is Goodman's approach lacking in application to real musical cases, as his discussion of alternative musical notations proves. Without, again, evaluating the different systems of musical notation, Goodman shows how an alternative system, such as the one proposed by John Cage, is not notational, and is indeed in important ways closer to a sketch, hence to a drawing, than to a score (Goodman 1976, 187-190).

What was just said about music also applies largely, in Goodman's view, to the art of dance. While dance does not yet have a standard notation, Goodman finds the tentative notation proposed by Rudolf Laban (which indeed Laban proposed for movement in general) as being a good candidate for a notational system, interestingly one that has fewer departures from notationality than standard musical notation. And here is one of the many areas where the results, however tentative, point to a relevance for other areas of human knowledge and activity. Goodman points out how a successful notation for human movement could be of great assistance in studies ranging from psychology to industrial engineering, in which it is of utmost importance to find criteria for determining whether, say, a subject or an experimenter has repeated the same behavior: and “the problem of formulating such criteria is the problem of developing a notational system” (1976, 218).

The conclusion that Goodman reaches about architecture is also a good indicator of the importance placed, in his analysis, on the actual history of an artform. Goodman claims that architecture does have, in the architect's planes, something quite close to a notational system, and hence is, because of that, an allographic art: different buildings, built in different locations and even with certain differences in materials, would be instances of the same work, provided that they correspond to the same plan. Yet, aware of the history of the art form, namely, of its origins as an autographic art and of a certain dependence, even today, on the particular history of production of the particular building, Goodman concludes that in fact “architecture is a mixed and transitional case” (1976, 221).

As said, painting stands at the opposite extreme from a notational system, since works in this artform are “analogs,” characters in syntactically and semantically dense systems. It is important to emphasize how that does not mean that a classification of paintings according to a notational system could not be found, and even found easily: a library-type classification for paintings for instance. What it does mean, however, is that, given the history of the medium and of the ways of classifying works of painting, a library-type notation would be incompatible with established artistic practice. The painting itself (or, in the case of etching, only the prints using the original plate) counts (or count) as the work. And what is true of painting is true of the sketches that precede the painting. The sketch itself is a work of art, and one that is autographic, in spite of its being used as a guide to the production of the final work (Goodman 1976, 192-194).

Notice how the distinction between autographic and allographic arts is not the same as the distinction between arts that are singular and those that are multiple. Etching, for instance, is still autographic although multiple. Incidentally, this could allow Goodman to account for the interesting hypothesis, advanced by Gregory Currie (1989), of superxerox machines capable of reproducing paintings in a molecule-by-molecule faithful way. Such technique of, we could say, cloning could be accounted for in Goodman's terms as transforming the art of painting from singular to multiple and yet without changing it from autographic to allographic.

Since the question of whether a notational system can be devised for a given artform is ultimately a question on the possibility of a “language” for that artform, i.e., at least of a notational scheme, artforms that use natural language bear interesting and sometimes surprising results. With a novel, poem, or the script used for a play or movie, the text or script is a character in a notational scheme. However, what counts as a work in such artforms is different. In theater, a work is a set of performances compliant with what established in the script. As in the case of music, Goodman's analyses involve a departure from the ordinary use of language: the dialogue of a play really works as a “score,” while stage directions and the like are a “script”—the former is fully notational, syntactically and semantically, the latter does not uniquely determine the performance, nor is it uniquely determined by the performance (1976, 210-11). By contrast, with a novel or a poem, the work, Goodman claims, is the text itself, i.e., a set of inscriptions fully corresponding, in spelling and punctuation, with each other. Even in the later work, Reconceptions, Goodman reemphasizes this claim. While endorsing pluralism with regard to the number of correct interpretations a text may yield—indeed considering it often a positive feature of the artistic use of language—Goodman insists that the work, in literary art, is the text. Hence, in Jorge Luis Borges's famous Pierre Menard case (that of a fictional French author trying to write a novel word-for-word identical to Cervantes's Don Quixote [Borges 1962]), Goodman claims that what Menard produced was another inscription of Don Quixote's text, hence an instance of the same work, albeit with his actions Menard may have suggested a possible, new interpretation of that work.

Goodman's theory of notation, and the analysis of the differing ways in which different artforms relate to that notion, establish almost a system for the arts, one that perhaps has not yet received sufficient credit from theorists working in aesthetics. Admittedly, for each of the artforms Goodman investigates, it may be relatively easy to find problematic cases that appear to be counterexamples to his claims. Yet, when looking at the system as a whole, one wonders whether it would not deserve, in the years to come, a re-evaluation in terms of its explanatory power, and one conducted in light of Goodman's awareness that the proposed system is indeed an abstraction from actual artistic practices as well as of his emphasis on the historical changes that always are possible in the fundamental nature of an artform.

4.4 Authenticity

An issue closely related to the ontological question of the identity of the work of art in the various artforms—indeed the very issue that Goodman uses, in Languages of Art, to introduce his theory of notation—is that of the importance of authenticity in art and of the aesthetic relevance of being a forgery. (Goodman's comments on the question of forgery prompted a small debate on that issue, mostly represented in a collection edited by Denis Dutton [1983].) The brief answer is that authenticity matters only where there is no notationality. Hence, for instance, it makes no difference whether a musical piece is performed from the original score or from a copy congruent with that, since the score is in a notational scheme. Yet it does matter whether one is presented with an original Rembrandt or with a copy of it, since paintings are analogs, symbols in syntactically dense systems.

With regard to two visually indiscernible paintings, an original and a copy, Goodman addresses the question whether there is any aesthetic difference between the two pictures (1976, 99-102). Notice that, if there is a difference, it must not depend on what one can visually discern at the present time, for ex hypothesis, there is no such visual difference that can currently be detected. Goodman's answer is that there is an aesthetic difference between the two paintings even now, when we are unable to tell one painting from the other, for an awareness that one is the original and the other a copy informs us that a difference may be perceived, and indeed modifies our present perception of the two paintings: now, for instance, we look for differences between the two paintings, we train our eyes and minds to discriminate differences that are currently indiscernible (1976, 103-105). Goodman's takes his claims to be general and as granting the conclusion that “the aesthetic properties of a picture include not only those found by looking at it but also those the determine how it is to be looked at” (1976, 111-112). Hence, even with pictures that are not “perfect” copies of other pictures, indeed with any picture, knowing how it should be classified—including its classification by authorship, as a Rembrandt, a Vermeer, or a Van Meegeren—makes a difference to how the picture may be perceived. For perceiving is, after all, determined by the labels that one projects over what is presented in front of one's eyes. It must be noticed, then, that this claim is all within a theory of perception and, while claiming that non-perceptible features are relevant to perception, hence are relevant to aesthetic experience, it does not claim that non-perceptible features as such are relevant to aesthetic experience.

4.5 Artistic Style

Goodman's account of style is a good example of a Goodmanian “reconception”: the philosophical approach to the issue must not only abandon the characterization of style as related to form and hence contrasted to content (for, after all, that an author writes, say, of social issues rather than battles should count as an aspect of the author's style), but must, most importantly, recognize the role that classifications in terms of style have in understanding and appreciating a work.

Goodman invites us to recognize elements of style in a work's content, in its form, and in the feelings it expresses. His proposal is that the stylistic features of a work make up a subset of the features “of what is said, of what is exemplified, or of what is expressed” (Goodman 1978h, 32). In particular, stylistic features are those symbolic properties of a work that allow us to place the work in a certain place, time period, and artist's oeuvre. That is, style properties help in answering questions as “where?”, “when?”, “who?” with respect to a work—they function, metaphorically, as a signature for a work: “style consists of those features of the symbolic functioning of a work that are characteristic of author, period, place, or school” (1978h, 35). Given what Goodman has said, when discussing the issue of authenticity, regarding the aesthetic importance of historical properties of a painting, knowing the style of an artwork is aesthetically relevant, since “knowledge of the origin of a work […] informs the way the work is to be looked at or listened to or read, providing a basis for the discovery of nonobvious ways the work differs from and resembles other works” (1978h, 38). It is in virtue of stylistic properties' link to the symbolic functions of a work of art that identifying a work's style, especially when complex and challenging and even difficult to identify, is integral to “the understanding of works of art and the worlds they present” (1978h, 40).

4.6 The Question of the Aesthetic and the Question of Merit

Goodman's conclusions, on what roughly could be considered the question of what is art as well as on the question of artistic value, follow from his view that aesthetics is really a branch of epistemology and that there is ultimately no sharp division between art and other forms of human knowledge.

The aims of art are the aims of symbolic activity in general, and they have to do with understanding. (Understanding is, for Goodman, a broader concept than knowledge, one that is not bound by literal truth, and that is thus applicable also to the literally false and to what admits of no truth value: metaphors and paintings for example.) Artistic symbols, as symbols in general, are to be judged for the classifications they bring about, for how novel and insightful those categorizations are, for how they change our perception of the world and relations to it. The cognitive value of art counts as artistic merit only because the symbols involved and the experiences they bring about belong in some sense to what Goodman refers to as “the aesthetic.” Hence, the question of when such symbolic activities and experiences are aesthetic or artistic is important, although, for Goodman, more in order to recognize the commonalities between art and other human activities, including science, than to isolate the artistic or aesthetic realm from other areas of knowledge and experience.

Goodman proposes no definition of art nor of what makes an experience aesthetic. Since to be a work of art is, for Goodman, to perform certain referential functions, the question “What is art?” should be replaced with the question “When is art?”. That is, the real issue is to know when, typically at least, the symbolic activity in question has features that bring us to call it “artistic.” Hence, he suggests the existence of symptoms of the aesthetic, i.e., symbol systems' characteristics that tend to occur in art. In Languages of Art, they were tentatively presented as conjunctively sufficient and disjunctively necessary for an experience to be aesthetic. There Goodman indicated four of such symptoms: syntactic density, semantic density, syntactic repleteness, and exemplificationality (1976, 252-255). In Ways of Worldmaking, the list is enriched by a fifth element: multiple and complex reference (Goodman 1978h, 67-68). In his later contribution that those are only symptoms seems to be taken even more literally: they are clues that indicate but do not guarantee the presence of a work of art; and artistic status is possible even without them. In other words, Goodman's tentative claims on this issue point to symbolic activities and features of symbolic activity that artworks tend to instantiate. On these grounds, Goodman can once again claim that “[a]rt and science are not altogether alien” (1976, 255). The same features that are characteristic, for instance, of numerical calculation—e.g., articulateness—can be found in musical scores, and the same features that could be called aesthetic—such as exemplification—can be found in scientific hypotheses as well. In a more complete statement: “The difference between art and science is not that between feeling and fact, intuition and inference, delight and deliberation, synthesis and analysis, sensation and cerebration, concreteness and abstraction, passion and action, mediacy and immediacy, or truth and beauty, but rather a difference in domination of certain specific characteristics of symbols” (Goodman 1976, 264).

Goodman links artistic status to the performance of certain symbolic functions in certain ways. Yet, his emphasis on the importance of asking when art is rather than what art is should be seen as anti-essentialist claim with respect to art: there is no one property or set of properties, not even a function or set of functions, that are distinctive of art objects. On the other hand, that emphasis should not be taken to suggest that artworks can slip in and out of artistic status just on the grounds of use. Certainly, Goodman is committed to claiming that something can be a work of art at one time and not another (1978h, 67). Yet, he also emphasizes how artistic status is somewhat permanent: “The Rembrandt painting remains a work of art, as it remains a painting, while functioning only as a blanket” (1978h, 69).

Goodman's positive claims with respect to the experience of art are certainly to be taken seriously, in spite of the fact that the negative claims preceding them, once read in light of the later developments and applications of cognitive science to art, may sound too quickly dismissive. Goodman emphasizes the cognitive role of emotions in the apprehension of a work of art (1976, 248). In art, he emphasizes, feeling emotions, whether positive or negative, pleasant or unpleasant, is a way to perceive the work and the world through the work. Feeling melancholy when listening to a piece of music, for instance, may be a way to perceive musical features of the work, as well as to perceive the world in terms of them. Hence, the emotions serve the understanding. On the other hand, such claims as, for instance, that the view according to which “art is concerned with simulated emotions suggests, as does the copy theory of representation, that art is a poor substitute for reality” (1976, 246) are, in light of more recent developments, in tension with other claims by Goodman, such as that the “actor or dancer—or the spectator—sometimes notes and remembers the feeling of a movement rather than its pattern, insofar as the two can be distinguished at all” (1976, 248). For the sort of phenomena mentioned in the latter claim may very well be best explained by cognitive theories that consider mental simulation and other forms of mimicry central to certain imaginative activities as well as to memory.

Art has a general importance to the knowledge enterprise, which is addressed with special clarity in Ways of Worldmaking. A primary thesis in that work “is that the arts must be taken no less seriously than the sciences as modes of discovery, creation, and enlargement of knowledge in the broad sense of advancement of the understanding, and thus that the philosophy of art should be conceived as an integral part of metaphysics and epistemology” (1978h, 102). A more general thesis of the book is that the multiple and competing “versions” of the world that humankind makes—through scientific theories (claiming, e.g., that the Sun is the center of the universe, or claiming that the Earth is) but also through mythology, art, philosophy, and so on and so forth—literally make worlds; they “fabricate” what we call “facts.” And there isn't just one, all-embracing version of the world: multiple and incompatible versions are possible. That is, Goodman is a constructivist and a relativist. His relativism, however, is not one of laissez-faire: versions can be distinguished between right and wrong, and indeed attempts to construct a world may fail. For the worlds that Goodman posits are not possible worlds brought about by possible descriptions of the world. Rather, when the versions are right, they are all part of the actual world.

For such metaphysical and epistemological approach to include the arts amongst the means to construct worlds, one needs only to add that versions of the world include non-verbal versions and non-literal versions as well. Artforms that do not use language, such as painting or music or architecture, can offer ways of perceiving and understanding the world—indeed ways to construct a world—allowing us, for instance, to see and hear and perceive things in new and refreshing ways. Works of art can participate in worldmaking precisely because they have symbolic functions (1978h, 102). As linguistic labels categorize the world (and new, unusual labels as “grue” and “bleen” categorize it differently), so do pictorial labels, for instance, categorize it in a number of ways (and some of them indeed in new ways). Visiting a museum can change our perception of the world, making us notice new aspects of reality and allowing us to encounter a different reality. Literal denotation, metaphorical denotation, as well as exemplification and expression, can all contribute to the construction of a world. Cervantes's Don Quixote literally denotes no one, yet metaphorically it denotes many of us. And artworks, by exemplifying shapes, colors, emotional patterns, etc., as well as by expressing what they literally do not possess, can bring about a reorganization of the world of ordinary experience. This is not just true in the sense that seeing a painting may change our way of seeing the world. Works of art may have effects that go beyond their medium, and hence music may affect seeing, painting affect hearing, and so on. Especially in “these days of experimentation with the combination of media in the performing arts” […] music, pictures, and dance “all interpenetrate in making a world” (1978h, 106).


A. Primary Works (in Aesthetics)

A.1 Books

A.2 Articles

A.3 Multimedia Works

B. Secondary Works

B.1 References

B.2 Edited Collections

B.3 Other Important Secondary Works on Goodman's Aesthetics

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

diagrams | logic: inductive | metaphor | predication | reference | relativism