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The Distinction Between Innate and Acquired Characteristics

First published Tue Aug 4, 2009

The idea that some characteristics of an organism are explained by the organism's intrinsic nature, whilst others reflect the influence of the environment is an ancient one. It has even been argued that this distinction is itself part of the evolved psychology of the human species. The distinction played an important role in the history of philosophy as the locus of the dispute between Rationalism and Empiricism discussed in another entry in this encyclopedia. This entry, however, focuses on twentieth-century accounts of the innate/acquired distinction. These accounts have for the most part been inspired by the sciences of mind and behaviour.

Innateness must be clearly distinguished from heritability, at least in the scientific sense of that term. The idea that heritability scores measure the degree to which a characteristic is innate is a vulgar fallacy. Heritability is a statistical measure of the sources of individual differences in a population. While heritability itself is well understood, its relationship to the innate/acquired distinction remains highly controversial.

The belief that a trait is innate is today commonly expressed by saying it is ‘in the genes’. But genes play an essential role in the production of every trait. Consequently, it will not do to say simply that innate traits are ‘caused by genes’ whilst acquired traits are ‘caused by the environment’. Any relationship between genetic causation and the innate/acquired distinction will be far more complex than this.

Recent philosophical analyses of the innate/acquired distinction can be classified into four types. The first identifies innate traits with those characteristic of an entire species and identifies acquired traits with those that vary between populations and individuals. A second type of analysis identifies innate traits with those that can be explained by natural selection. The third, and currently the most influential, identifies innate traits with those produced by a particular patterns of interaction between genes and environment. A fourth, quite different, type of analysis suggests that labelling a trait ‘innate’ is a way to indicate that it lies outside the domain of psychology.

Finally, there is a tradition of scepticism about the innate/acquired distinction. Sceptics argue that it confounds a number of distinctions that are better kept separate, or, perhaps equivalently, that there is no one property of a trait that corresponds to its being innate.

1. The innate/acquired distinction in the sciences of mind and behaviour

Instinctive behaviour was at the heart of early 20th century psychology and accounts of instinct were offered by many leading psychologists of the period, including Conwy Lloyd Morgan, James Mark Baldwin, William James and William McDougall (Richards 1987). In the 1920s, however, a strong reaction against the idea of instinct developed in psychology in North America (e.g. Dunlap 1919; Kuo 1921). In part, this was a reaction to the apparently unconstrained postulation of new ‘instincts’. The critics were also suspicious of the vitalistic sympathies of some leading instinct theorists, particularly McDougall (1908; 1923). Most importantly, however, appeals to instinct appeared scientifically vacuous when set against the experimentally testable, mechanistic explanations offered by the emerging behaviorist school of psychology. The most radical critics believed that even John Broadus Watson, the founder of behaviourism, had conceded too much to instinct by allowing that a small number of links between simple stimuli and responses were inborn (Watson 1925). A scientist should never be satisfied to say that behaviour is ‘inherited’ or ‘instinctive’, argued Zing Yang Kuo, since this merely poses the question ‘How are our instincts acquired?’ (Kuo 1922). Few psychologists went as far as Kuo (see, e.g. Tolman 1922) but criticisms like this effectively banished the idea of instinct from scientific psychology, at least in North America.

The study of instinct was rehabilitated in the years on either side of World War Two by the founders of ethology, Konrad Lorenz and Niko Tinbergen (Tinbergen 1942; Tinbergen 1951; Lorenz 1957 (1937); Lorenz and Tinbergen 1957 (1938)). Ethology was a Darwinian approach to behaviour and the direct ancestor of today's behavioural ecology and sociobiology. It treated an organism's behavior as simply one more evolved characteristic alongside its skeleton and its digestive system. Instinctive behavior was thought to be composed of identifiable units– ‘fixed action patterns’ — whose evolution could be studied like that of a bone by comparing the different form taken by the same (homologous) behavior in different species. The evolutionary relationships of birds, for example, were thought to be reflected in similarities and differences in their courtship rituals as surely as in similarities and differences in their bones.

The early ethologists placed considerable emphasis on the ‘deprivation experiment’, in which an animal is raised without the opportunity to learn a behavior and then tested to see if it can perform the behaviour when provided with an appropriate stimulus. A songbird, for example, can be raised from egg to adult without hearing a member of its own species sing, and tested to see which song it produces the following spring. If it produces the typical song of its own species, then the song is innate. But the innate/acquired distinction was not defined solely by this test. The early ethologists also emphasised the stereotypical nature of the behaviours that constitute a fixed action pattern, the fact that the pattern is ‘released’ as a whole rather than requiring input from the environment for its completion, and the fact that innate behaviours occur spontaneously as ‘vacuum activities’ when the animal is deprived of the specific stimuli that usually elicits the behaviour. They drew further support from the fact that the comparative patterns found in the behaviour of different species were congruent with those found by comparing morphological characteristics. The idea of a distinctive realm of instinctive behaviour was thus a theoretical postulate supported by multiple lines of evidence, rather than a matter of definition (for more on Lorenz and Tinbergen's ideas about instinct, see Griffiths 2004; Brigandt 2005; Browne 2005 (Other Internet Resources); Burkhardt 2005).

The idea of instinct in classical ethology was strongly criticised by several North American psychologists, most famously by Daniel S. Lehrman in ‘A critique of Konrad Lorenz's theory of instinctive behavior’ (Lehrman 1953). This paper documented the role of environmental factors in the development of species-typical behavior patterns, drawing on many existing studies, including some by Kuo. Endogenous and exogenous influences on behavioral development interact in numerous ways, Lehrman argued, and no one pattern of interaction is distinctive of the development of evolved features of the behavioral phenotype. According to Lehrman, Lorenz's attempt to draw a sharp distinction between instinctive and acquired behavior was simply untenable in the light of what was already known about behavioral development. Lehrman summarised his position at a later date:

‘Natural selection acts to select genomes that, in a normal developmental environment, will guide development into organisms with the relevant adaptive characteristics. But the path of development from the zygote stage to the phenotypic adult is devious, and includes many developmental processes, including, in some cases, various aspects of experience.’ (Lehrman 1970, 36)

Lehrman was particularly critical of the use of the deprivation experiment to infer that a certain trait is innate simpliciter, rather than merely that the factors controlled for in the experiment are not needed for the development of that trait. Many of Lehrman's ideas were incorporated into mainstream ethological theory. By the 1960s Tinbergen regarded the use of the term ‘innate’ to characterize behaviors as “heuristically harmful” (Tinbergen 1963, 425) and endorsed Lehrman's critique of the deprivation experiment: “The conclusion can only be formulated correctly in negative terms, in describing which environmental aspect was shown not to be influential” (Tinbergen 1963, 424). In the same period Tinbergen and his students shifted their focus of their research from behaviors as stable taxonomic characters to behaviors as adaptations shaped by the ecological demands of the environment (Burkhardt 2005; Griffiths 2008). Determining the extent to which behaviour develops independently of the environment ceased to be important to the Tinbergen school, or to the new discipline of behavioural ecology in which students of Tinbergen like Richard Dawkins played such a prominent role. Interest turned instead to testing population genetic and game theoretic models of behavioural evolution

Lorenz responded to his critics with a new account of the innate/acquired distinction (Lorenz 1965; see also Browne 2005 (Other Internet Resources)). No trait is innate in itself, but “certain parts of the information which underly the adaptedness of the whole, and which can be ascertained by the deprivation experiment, are indeed innate” (Lorenz 1965, 40). A trait is innate insofar as its development is guided by ‘inherited information’ rather than ‘environmental information.’ Lorenz defined ‘information’ in terms of adaptation. An adaptive trait ‘fits’ its environment and hence can be said to contain information about that environment just as a key can be said to contain information about the lock it will open. The question is where that information comes from – how does the organism ‘know’ about its environment? If a woman has calluses on her palms rather than on the backs of her hands, this represents information about where her skin gets rubbed most. If she were born with calluses on her palms, as Ostriches are born with calluses that match pressure points on their legs, this would imply advance ‘knowledge’ of where her skin is going to be rubbed most. Such anticipatory information, Lorenz argued, must be in the genome. It is in the genome as a result of natural selection, which can be seen as a form of trial-and-error learning.

Lorenz's analysis can readily be expressed in information-theoretic terms, with the environment as the signal source and the organism as the receiver. Organisms need to reduce their uncertainty about what demands the environment will place on them and to develop in a way that meets those demands. There are two ways to do this. The first way is to gather information about the environment during development. The water flea Daphnia pulex monitors chemical traces of predators as it develops. If an individual flea detects evidence that predators are present, then that flea grows defensive armor. Thus, a flea's possession or lack of defensive armour reflects environmental information. The alternative is to inherit information from your ancestors. The human sickle cell allele has harmful effects in homozygotes and survives in a population only because it confers resistance to malaria in heterozygotes. Hence the fact that an individual carries the allele provides information about the prevalence of malaria in the ancestral environment and thus, probably, in the environment of the organism which inherits the allele. The sickle cell allele can thus be seen as passing on information about the environment which was ‘learnt’ by ancestors through natural selection. To the extent that the functional adjustment of a trait to its environment is explained by ‘inherited information’ of this kind, Lorenz argued, the trait is innate. Hence, albeit in a very different way from Tinbergen, Lorenz also came to see whether a behavior is an adaptation as the key issue. Writing in the 1960s Lorenz naturally assumed that genes were the only source of inherited information. It is now known that much information about the environment is transmitted from parent to offspring via epigenetic signals, such as methylation patterns on the DNA or RNAs from the mother included in the egg. For example, if a female water flea detects predators and grows defensive armor, its offspring will develop armor even if they do not detect any evidence of predators themselves. Lorenz's theory would imply that traits produced in this way are also innate, since they reflect inherited information, albeit epigenetically rather than genetically inherited.

Classical ethology flourished in the years immediately following World War Two (Burkhardt 2005). At the same time others started to question the emphasis on environmental factors in behavioral development which had developed between the wars. Numerous lines of evidence suggested that psychology would have to take account of species-specific biological endowments if it was to understand how different species interact with their environment and the distinctive things each species is able to learn from these interactions (e.g. Harlow 1953; Tomkins 1962; Seligman 1970). By far the most influential criticism of behaviorism, however, came from linguistics. The linguist Noam Chomsky argued that existing behaviorist accounts of the development of language were unworkable and offered a general argument for the conclusion that the ability to acquire language is innate (Chomsky 1957; Chomsky 1959; Chomsky 1966). According to this ‘poverty of the stimulus’ argument, the examples of speech to which children are exposed do not contain enough evidence to settle which utterances are grammatical in the language they are trying to acquire. Nevertheless, children reliably acquire the grammar of their native language. Therefore, Chomsky and his followers concluded, children must have innate knowledge about grammar which supplements the evidence to which they are exposed during development. If this argument is sound, every normal childhood is a deprivation experiment that confirms the innateness of grammar. The details of the original poverty of the stimulus argument, its elaboration by Chomsky's followers, and the current state of the evidence for linguistic nativism are discussed in detail in the entry Innateness and Language. I will not repeat them here. What matters for my purposes is that Chomsky's work produced a very broad consensus in psychology that language acquisition is explained by a complex, evolved mechanism that is present at birth and which can produce normal linguistic development in a wide range of environments, including those which are ‘impoverished’ with respect to language.

The ‘language acquisition device’ has served as an exemplar for research on whether other psychological and behavioral traits are innate. Like the language acquisition device these putatively innate traits are supposed to explain patterns in the development of the child's mind. These patterns can be seen as representing innate ‘knowledge’ or innate ‘theories’ about various cognitive domains. For example, the eminent cognitive developmental psychologists Susan Carey and Elizabeth Spelke argue that children possess four domains of innate ‘core knowledge’ which underlie much of their later cognitive development. These domains are ‘objects, agents, numbers and space’ (Carey and Spelke 1996, 517). Children think about each of these four domains in distinctive ways that do not seem to depend on the details of the child's environment. The distinctive way in which children think about living, as opposed to inanimate, entities has also been proposed as a domain of innate knowledge (e.g. Medin and Atran 2004). The recent philosophical literature on the concept of innateness which is outlined in later sections of this entry is mostly intended to analyse innateness as it is understood in this extensive body of ‘neo-nativist’ psychology (for a thorough introduction to this field and the controversies arising from it, see Carruthers, Laurence et al. 2005–9).

It may have struck some readers as odd that this brief sketch of the history of the innate/acquired distinction in 20th century science has concentrated on behavioural biology and psychology and barely touched on genetics. The next two sections deal with behavioral genetics and molecular genetics respectively, and make clear how tenuous the connections are between these fields and the innate/acquired distinction.

2. Innateness and heritability

Popular discussion of whether psychological and behavioural traits are innate is bedevilled by the conflation of this issue with whether psychological and behavioural traits are heritable. ‘Heritability’ is a quantity calculated by behavioural geneticists, with values between 0 and 1. Heritability scores for socially significant behaviors are regularly reported in the media. People who do not know how these numbers are calculated typically understand a score like the 0.49 reported for the mental disorder of schizophrenia to mean that this disorder is 49% innate, or innate in 49% of the people who suffer from it. To see why this is a mistake, consider these two facts: 1. In a population of genetically identical individuals, all traits have a heritability of zero. But it is absurd to suppose that my IQ would change from innate to acquired if I left a population of normal human beings and joined a population of my clones. 2. Providing equal access to education for all children in a community will increase the heritability of IQ in that community. So if heritability were a measure of innateness, then using education to increase IQ would also be a way to make IQ more innate, which is obviously absurd.

The measures of heritability used in behavioural genetics, and in quantitative genetics more generally, are not and do not pretend to be measures of whether the traits of individual organisms owe more to the genes or more to the environment. Instead, they report the results of an important but highly unintuitive statistical technique called the analysis of variance (ANOVA). This technique and the measures of heritability it generates are explained in the entry Heredity and Heritability. In very simple terms, however, we can say that heritability analysis asks how many of the pairwise differences between all individuals in a population can be correlated with genetic differences between each pair of individuals, and how many can be correlated with differences in the environment of each pair of individuals. That is why in our example above making people more genetically similar reduces heritability, because there are proportionally less genetic differences to correlate with any phenotypic differences. Conversely, making the environment more uniform increases heritability because there are proportionally less environmental differences to correlate with any phenotypic differences.

But although heritability is in no way a measure of innateness, this does not mean that it is irrelevant to the distinction between innate and acquired characteristics. The fact that traits are highly heritable has been used to argue that those traits cannot be changed by changing the environment, the issue at the heart of people's concerns when they ask whether a trait such as IQ or sexual orientation is innate. The argument connecting heritability to environmental malleability is simple. It starts with the assumption that trait differences are caused by the factors with which they correlate, an assumption I will not question here. Suppose that most differences between individuals in a population with respect to some trait are correlated with genetic differences and very few are correlated with differences in environment, which is simply to say that the trait is highly heritable. Surely, this implies that changing the environment will have little effect on the pattern of differences? For example, making the environments of all the individuals the same would not eliminate all the differences between them, because we have postulated that most of those differences were caused by genetic differences and those differences are still there.

But things are not that simple. The effect of a genetic difference on a trait sometimes depends on the environment. In that case, changing the environment can eliminate a difference caused by a gene. To take a simple but not unrealistic example, suppose that a gene produces an enzyme which only works below a certain temperature. If two individuals only one of whom has this gene are raised in environments below that critical temperature, then one will show the effects of the enzyme and the other will not. But if the two individuals are raised in environments above the critical temperature, then there will be no difference between them. So in this case, changing the environment eliminates a difference caused by a gene. In other cases, changing a gene can eliminate a difference caused by the environment. Effects like these show up in heritability analyses as statistical interactions between genes and environment, meaning that how heritable the trait is depends on the specific distribution of environments across the population. One practical implication of gene-environment interaction effects is that when they occur, heritability scores cannot be extrapolated from one population to another. A trait can show high heritability in one population, but low heritability in another. Another practical implication is that high heritability does not imply that changing the environment will not eliminate the differences between individuals (nor does low heritability imply that genetic manipulation cannot eliminate those differences.)

Statistical interactions between genes and environment are well-documented in behavioural genetic studies on animals (Fuller, Sarkar et al. 2005). Whether this lesson can be extrapolated to human behaviour, and why or why not, is the subject of a set of interlocking controversies which are too intricate to pursue here. There is an extensive philosophical literature on these controversies and their history. Some recent contributions which include citations of the relevant scientific literatures include: (Kaplan 2000; Sesardic 2005; Schaffner 2006a; Schaffner 2006b; Griffiths and Tabery 2008).

3. Innateness and genetics

During the 2008 US presidential election journalists frequently referred to a candidate's characteristic beliefs or attitudes as ‘part of their political DNA’. This is an example of how in contemporary English ‘in the DNA’ or ‘in the genes’ has come to replace older phrases like ‘in the blood’. But if genetics can be used to elucidate the innate/acquired distinction it is certainly not because some traits, the innate ones, are caused by the genes whilst others, the acquired ones, are caused by the environment. While the difference between two individuals can be caused by a genetic or an environmental difference between them, the development of any trait in an individual depends on both genes and environment. Every aspect of development, including learning, consists in the regulated expression of the genome. Conversely, innumerable aspects of the environment are required at each stage in the life of the organism to keep development on its normal course, or, on other words, to ensure that the right genes are expressed in the right cells at the right time. Thus, all traits develop through the interaction of genome and environment. Philip Kitcher has referred to this as the ‘interactionist consensus’ (Kitcher 2001).

But if all traits depend on genes, it may still be that some traits depend on them in a special way. If asked about phrases like ‘in the DNA’ or ‘in the genes’, most people would probably refer to the idea that the genes contain instructions or a program. After all, everyone knows that there is a genetic code, so it must be coding for something. Perhaps genes ‘code for’ innate traits but not for acquired ones. However, as Peter Godfrey-Smith has noted, ‘All the genes can code for, if they code for anything, is the primary structure (amino acid sequence) of a protein’ (Godfrey-Smith 1999, 328). Considered as a language, the genetic code can only refer to the twenty-three standard amino acids and can only say which order to put them in. The only exceptions to this are the ‘start’ and ‘stop’ codons which affect where DNA transcription begins and ends. Many other things happen as a downstream causal consequence of the order of amino acids, but to paraphrase Godfrey Smith's argument, genes do not ‘code for’ these downstream causal consequences for the same reason that President Nixon's order to cover up the Watergate scandal was not an ‘order’ to get him impeached by Congress. ‘Coding for’, like ‘ordering’ and other semantic locutions, is not merely another name for ‘causing’. The idea that the ‘genetic program’ or ‘genetic instructions’ for phenotypes are literally written in the genetic code is a continuing barrier to the public understanding of genetics, one that is reinforced every time a journalist reports that scientists have ‘decoded’ the gene for something. In reality there are no tiny ‘traitunculi’ hidden in the genome awaiting a sufficiently powerful genetic microscope to read them (Schaffner 1998).

But although the sequences of nucleotides in the genome do not literally ‘code for’ phenotypic traits, they are, of course, amongst the causes of phenotypic traits. Several philosophers and scientists have introduced senses of ‘genetic information’ based on these causal relationships in order to explicate the intuitive idea that genes carry information about phenotypes. These proposals are discussed in more detail in the entry Biological information. Here I will simply make two points about these proposals. The first point is that there are some very straightforward senses in which genes ‘carry information’ about phenotypes. The human Y chromosome carries information about sex in the same way that ‘smoke means fire’: one can be predicted from the other. In addition, the SRY region on the Y-chromosome is an adaptation for making organisms into males, so we can apply a version of ‘teleosemantics’, an approach which defines information in terms of adaptation, to this piece of DNA (Millikan 1984; Sterelny, Dickison et al. 1996 and see the entry on teleological theories of mental content). The second point is that these straightforward senses of ‘information’ also seem to be applicable to environmental causes in development (Oyama 1985; Griffiths and Gray 1997; Griffiths and Knight 1998; Griffiths and Gray 2005). Mammals have a chromosomal system of sex-determination. But many reptiles use temperature, an environmental signal, to switch genetically identical eggs between male or female developmental pathways. Other reptiles have a genetic system which can be overridden by an environmental signal. Some fish even switch sex in adulthood in response to environmental cues. These environmental signals carry information about sex in the unproblematic ‘smoke means fire’ sense. Moreover, the behaviours that parents use to give appropriate cues to their eggs, and some of the products of those behaviours, such as nests of rotting vegetation which maintain a suitable temperature range, are designed by natural selection to ensure the correct sex-ratio in offspring, so the teleosemantic program can be applied to them too. The idea that genes ‘carry information’ about phenotypes in a special sense which distinguishes them from other causes is not the piece of common-sense it is often taken to be, but rather a highly contested idea that is the focus of current research in the philosophy of biology (Oyama 1985, Maynard Smith 2000, Griffiths 2001, Robert 2004).

If all traits are caused by both genetic and environmental factors, then reconstructing the innate/acquired distinction in genetic terms means distinguishing different ways in which genes interact with the environment. The pattern of interaction between gene and environment is commonly represented using ‘norms of reaction’ — graphical representations of a phenotypic variable as a function of genotypic and environmental variables. These diagrams were introduced at around the same time as the idea of the gene and the distinction between genotype and phenotype (Sarkar 1999) and have long been advocated as the clearest way to think about the role of genes in development (Hogben 1933; Lewontin 1974; Gottlieb 1995; Kitcher 2001). Suppose, for example, that with respect to some environmental variable (E) an organism with a given genotype (G1) will develop the same phenotype (P) way no matter what value the environmental variable takes (Figure 1).

Figure 1. A norm of reaction in which the phenotype P is ‘genetically determined’

If a norm of reaction has this shape, we can say that P is ‘genetically determined’ even though it has an environmental factor as one of its causes. Philip Kitcher suggests that some norms of reaction may have this form, but only in some limited, but perhaps contextually important, range of environments (Kitcher 2001). For example, a disease caused by the loss of one or both normal copies of a gene might develop in every environment except those specifically structured as clinical interventions to cure the disease.

Another norm of reaction is one in which genetic and environmental factors interact ‘additively’ (Figure 2). Genotype makes a constant difference across some range of environment. While the genetic variable does not determine the actual value of the trait in each individual, it does determine the differences between individuals. Moreover, when the norms of reaction has this form, heritability scores become relevant to the question of whether and how much a phenotype can be altered by environmental intervention, as discussed in the previous section. A famous diagram in the early days of behaviour genetics depicted the relationship between IQ (P), genotype (G) and the ‘enrichment’ of the environment (E) as having roughly this form (Gottesman 1963a). If correct, this would mean that educational enrichment would cause everyone to get higher test scores, but would not change the ordering of their scores.

Figure 2. Purely additive interaction between genotype and environment

In perhaps the most famous paper on this topic the geneticist Richard Lewontin (1974) argued that actual norms of reaction are likely to be non-additive (Figure 3). In that case, it makes no sense to talk of a particular genotype ‘determining’ a phenotypic difference. Genotype and environment jointly determine the outcome in the straightforward sense that the effect of each factor on the outcome is a function of the particular value taken by the other factor. Whether norms of reaction are typically non-additive and exactly what this implies is the subject of an extensive scientific and philosophical literature on ‘gene-environment interaction’, as discussed in the previous section.

Figure 3. Non-additive interaction between genotype and environment

Philip Kitcher has argued that ‘genetic determinism’ should be understood as the claim that many norms of reaction have roughly the ‘determinist’ shapes depicted in Figures 1 and 2 (for an alternative view, see Griffiths 2006). In Section 4.3 I discuss a recent proposal to define ‘innate’ in the same spirit.

4. Recent philosophical analyses of the concept of innateness

Recent philosophical analyses of the innate/acquired distinction can be classified into four types. The first identifies innate traits with those characteristic of an entire species and acquired traits with those that vary between populations and individuals. A second type of analysis identifies innate traits with those that can be explained by natural selection. The third, and currently most influential, distinguishes different patterns of interaction between genes and environment and identifies one pattern with the innate and another with the acquired. A fourth, quite different, type of analysis suggests that labeling a trait ‘innate’ is a way to indicate that it lies outside the domain of psychology.

4.1 Innateness as universality

In his seminal paper ‘The idea of innateness’ (1975) Stephen Stich made a number of tentative suggestions about the structure of the innateness concept. One was that an innate trait might be defined as a trait an organism will manifest in the normal course of development. But Stich himself offered a counterexample to this analysis: universally held beliefs, such as the belief that water quenches thirst, will count as innate traits on this analysis, which seems counterintuitive (Stich 1975, p. 9). André Ariew has offered another counterexample: humans acquire a typical gut flora during development, but these bacteria are intuitively an acquired trait rather than an innate trait (Ariew 1999, p. 133). Ariew suggests that Stich's analysis confuses evidence for innateness with innateness itself. Universality is evidence for the existence of a particular kind of developmental mechanism (Ariew 2006, p. 10, and see 4.3 below). A recent empirical study, however, suggests that universality influences judgments of innateness independently of beliefs about developmental mechanisms (Griffiths, Machery & Linquist, forthcoming), so Stich's analysis may still have something to offer to an understanding of the innateness concept. Additional support for this view comes from the fact that a number of scientific authors have used the term ‘innate’ to mean ‘shared by all members of the species’ (Bateson 1991; Mameli and Bateson 2006).

4.2 Innateness as adaptation

We have already encountered the suggestion that a trait is innate if its development is guided by ‘inherited information’ rather than ‘environmental information’ (Lorenz 1966; Browne 2005 (Other Internet Resources); see Section 1 above). A similar analysis was independently suggested by Stich (1975, 13–16). The first hurdle for any analysis along these lines, Stich noted, is to specify what is meant by ‘information’ (Stich 1975, p. 15). As we have seen above, Lorenz identified ‘information’ in this context with adaptive fit. In essence his ‘inherited information’ analysis amounts to the claim that a trait is innate if its fit to the environment can only be explained by evolutionary adaptation.

Stich's 1975 suggestion has been elaborated and defended by Muhammad Ali Khalidi who like Stich seems not to have encountered Lorenz's work (Khalidi 2002; Khalidi 2007). Both Stich and Khalidi restrict the analysis to innate cognitive traits, although it seems clear from Lorenz's work that it can be made general. Khalidi presents his analysis in terms of the ‘poverty of the stimulus’ argument outlined in Section 1 above : ‘…a belief (concept, idea, capacity) may be considered to be innate to the degree that it would emerge as the result of an impoverished stimulus’ (Khalidi 2002, p. 269). However, he goes on to define impoverishment as ‘informational impoverishment’ which is in turn defined as a gap between the information in the developmental environment and the information manifested in the trait that develops in that environment (e.g. Khalidi 2007, 100). Khalidi admits that severe difficulties stand in the way of actually measuring the information content of developmental environments and capacities. He suggests, however, that scientists have rough-and-ready ways to assess the informational gap, using various forms of deprivation experiment (see Section 1 above).

It is unclear whether Khalidi would endorse Lorenz's analysis of information and of the significance of the deprivation experiment. According to Lorenz, a trait contains more ‘information’ than its developmental environment if the functional adjustment of the trait to the environment cannot be explained by the developmental environment. The deprivation experiment is designed to eliminate just those factors that could explain the trait's functional adjustment to the environment. Khalidi makes no reference to the adaptive value of innate traits, and like Stich he thinks that the idea of innateness should be applicable to disease phenotypes as well as to functional phenotypes (Khalidi 2007, 97). But Khalidi's idea of an informational gap between the developmental environment and the innate trait seems rather problematic in the case of innate diseases. Is the normal developmental environment of the human child ‘informationally impoverished’ relative to the cognitive deficits seen in Trisomy 21 (Down's syndrome)? What information is manifest in a child born anencephalic and thus, presumably, with no cognitive traits at all? I suggest that without the additional resources offered by the concept of adaptation Khalidi's concept of ‘information’ would collapse into a simple notion of covariance, and his analysis of innateness would be a version of the canalisation analysis discussed in the next section.

4.3 Innateness as canalisation

Andre Ariew has published an influential series of papers (1996; 1999; 2006) arguing that the concept of an innate trait can be explicated using the idea of ‘developmental canalization’. This concept was introduced by the influential mid-20th century embryologist and theoretical biologist Conrad H. Waddington (1940; 1942; 1957; 1959).

Developmental canalization was part of a broader vision of how an organism develops from the fertilized egg. The entire collection of genes and their interactions makes up a ‘developmental system’ (Waddington 1952) which produces a phenotype. Many features of the phenotype are explained by the dynamical properties of that developmental system as a whole, rather than by the influence of one or a few specific alleles. Thus, for example, Waddington sought to explain one of the major biological discoveries of his day – the fact that extreme phenotypic uniformity can be observed in many wild populations despite extensive genetic variation in those same populations – by appealing to the global dynamics of developmental systems. A genetically canalized developmental system takes development to the same endpoint from many different genetic starting points. The development of wild-type phenotypes can thus be buffered against genetic variation. Waddington represented this idea with his famous ‘developmental landscape’ (Figure 4).



Figure 4. Waddington's developmental landscape (A) and its underpinnings (B) (Waddington 1957, 29 & 36, reproduced with permission)

The ‘developmental landscape’ is a representation of development as a system whose parameters are genetic loci and whose state space is a set of phenotypic states. The state space is depicted as a surface, each point of which represents a phenotype. The genetic parameters are depicted as pegs that pull on the surface and thus determine its contours. Epistatic interactions between genetic loci are represented by links between the strings by which those loci pull on the surface. The development of the organism is represented by the trajectory over the surface of a ball which passes through a series of phenotypic states as it rolls ‘downhill’ from conception to death. Waddington intended this diagram to make vivid the idea that the effect of a change at one genetic locus depends upon the states of all the other genetic loci, since it is all the loci together which determine the shape of the landscape. Some genetic changes, such as those which affect the tops of inaccessible ‘hills,’ will have no effect on development. Other changes of the same intrinsic genomic magnitude which affect the entrance of a valley or ‘canal’ will have a massive effect on development. The phenotypic impact of a genetic change is not proportional to the magnitude of the genomic change, but depends on the structure of the developmental system. Furthermore, the phenotypic difference produced by a genetic difference is not explained by that genetic difference in itself, but by how that change interacts with the rest of the developmental system. This picture retains considerably validity in the light of contemporary developmental genetics.

If we suppose that some of the ‘pegs’ in Waddington's model are environmental factors, rather than genetic loci, then we can define separate notions of ‘environmental canalisation’ and ‘genetic canalisation’. A phenotypic outcome is environmentally canalised if those features of the surface which direct development to that endpoint are relatively insensitive to the manipulation of the environmental parameters. A phenotypic outcome is genetically canalised if those features of the surface which direct development to that endpoint are relatively insensitive to the manipulation of the genetic parameters. Ariew proposes to identity innateness with environmental canalization. Innateness-as-canalization is a matter of degree. A trait is more innate the more environmental parameters its development is buffered against and the wider the range of variation in those parameters against which it is buffered.

Griffith's and Machery have offered a counterexample to Ariew's analysis (Griffiths and Machery 2008). The developmental psychobiologist Celia Moore showed that the spinal cord nuclei of male rats differ from those of female rats in ways that allow the male to use his penis during copulation (Moore 1984; Moore 1992). These neural differences result from differences in gene expression in the developing spinal cord of the rat pup, which in turn result from differences in the amount of licking of the genital area by the mother, which in turn results from greater expression in male pups of a chemical that elicits maternal licking. According to Ariew's characterization of innateness as canalization, these experiments show that the rat's ability to copulate is not innate:

“Distinguish between two reasons why the trait appears invariantly in an environmental range: the first, because an environmental condition is developmentally required yet is found everywhere the system develops; the second, because the system develops independently of the environmental condition. Innateness should be identified with the second sort of invariance, not the first.” (Ariew 2006, 10)

The rat's ability to copulate depends on an environmental condition that is found everywhere the system develops and so, according to Ariew, it is not innate. But intuitively the rat's ability to copulate is innate. Griffiths and Machery argue that this intuition results from the fact that the ability to copulate is an evolutionary adaptation and universal in male rats. Additional counterexamples can be constructed using this formula.

However, Ariew has argued, and his critics accept, that the existence of intuitive counterexamples is not really to the point. His analysis is not meant to capture what everyday speakers of English mean by the word ‘innate’, although it obviously has some continuity with what they mean. Instead, the analysis is meant to explicate a research strategy used by scientists like Chomsky. The use of terms like ‘innate’ and ‘instinct’ by these scientists should be interpreted in the context of this research strategy, which Ariew calls ‘biologicising the mind’ (Ariew 2006). ‘Biologicising the mind’ means analysing the development of a psychological or behavioral trait on the model of paradigmatically ‘biological’ traits such as legs and livers. According to Ariew, canalised development is the hallmark of the development of these paradigmatically biological traits, and the research programs of scientists like Chomsky should be seen as attempts to demonstrate the canalised development of psychological traits.

Other recent contributors to the philosophical literature on innateness have adopted a similar methodological stance. Ron Mallon and Jonathan Weinberg argue that much neo-nativist psychology can be seen as an investigation into psychological traits that are ‘closed process invariant’ (Mallon and Weinberg 2006). This means that they develop in all normal environments (the ‘invariance condition’) as the result of a set of developmental mechanisms that are only capable of producing one or a few developmental outcomes across a wide range of possible environments (the ‘closed process condition’). Mallon and Weinberg suggest that their account of innateness applies to paradigmatically biological traits such as legs and livers, so ‘closed process invariantism’ can be seen as another attempt to elucidate the strategy of ‘biologicising the mind’.

Mallon and Weinberg's account is supposed to count examples like the penile reflexes of the rat described above as innate because they are produced by a ‘closed process’ – one that can only produce one or a few possible outcomes. The idea of a closed process remains in need of further elaboration. Mallon and Weinberg themselves are concerned about how to individuate developmental processes. They do not want early, general phases of development like the closure of the neural tube to count as part of the development of specific traits like language. Another significant hurdle for the account is to provide individuation criteria for developmental outcomes. If the outcomes in the previous example are classified simply as ‘functional penis’ or ‘non-functional penis,’ then the example involves a closed process. If we attend to the details of the nerve ganglia of the rat's spinal cord, different outcomes can be distinguished, resulting from different amounts of maternal licking and it becomes an open process. While this may seem somewhat artificial in this case, it is entirely natural when dealing with a quantitative phenotype such as the ‘stress reactivity’ phenotype in highly analogous work on maternal care in the rat by Michael J. Meaney and collaborators (Meaney 2001a; Meaney 2001b and see below).

4.4 Innateness as disciplinary boundary marker

Fiona Cowie (1999) and Richard Samuels (2002) have taken a rather different approach to the innateness concept. Cowie argues that the term ‘innate’ has been used by a number of significant figures in the history of psychology to indicate that the development of a trait does not involve the kinds of processes the study of which is distinctive of psychology. Samuels has suggested that this is the best explication of the concept of innateness in contemporary neo-nativist psychology. On this account innate traits are those which must be explained by developmental biologists rather than psychologists and which for this reason can legitimately be treated as primitives in psychological explanation (for this reason the approach is referred to as ‘primitivism’ about innateness). Primitivism becomes a more substantive thesis if it is linked to an account of the nature of psychological explanation, or perhaps of psychological explanation as conceived in the neo-nativist tradition.

There is an obvious symmetry between ‘primitivism’ and Ariew's ‘biologicising the mind’. Ariew suggests that innateness guides research by embodying a strategy of investigating psychological traits as if they were paradigmatically biological traits like hearts and hair. Cowie and Samuels suggest that innateness guides research by embodying a strategy of not investigating a trait as if it were a paradigmatically psychological trait like a belief or a phobia, but instead treating it as a boundary condition in psychological explanations of related traits. These two ‘strategies’ would seem to be complementary.

5. Scepticism about the innate/acquired distinction

While neo-nativism thrives in contemporary psychology and cognitive science, there is a strong sceptical tradition concerning the innate/acquired distinction in other areas of the sciences of mind and behavior. The incorporation of Lehrman's critique of Lorenz into the ethological tradition had a lasting impact on animal behaviour research. After a half-century of research on the development of birdsong the doyen of researchers in that field, Peter Marler sums up his view of innateness like this:

“we find ourselves confirming what Lehrman (1953) asserted 50 years ago, that in the long run classifying behavior as ‘learned’ or ‘innate’ is not conceptually productive; however, it is not clear whether this is worth getting upset about. The habit of labeling behaviors in this fashion is so deep-rooted that we will probably never succeed in eradicating it. And it does have some value in placing behaviors on a lability continuum, with some behaviors more ‘nurture dependent,’ more changeable and variable, and others more ‘nature dependent,’ more stereotyped and resistant to change.” (Marler, 2004, 31)

Other leading animal behaviour researchers see even this casual use of the distinction as pernicious. One concern is that the term ‘innate’ has no definite meaning and hence leads to fallacies of ambiguity. Ethologist Patrick Bateson urges researchers to “Say what you mean (even if it uses a bit more space) rather than unintentionally confuse your readers by employing a word such as innate that carries so many different connotations” (Bateson 1991, p. 22). Matteo Mameli and Bateson have recently systematically reviewed the scientific use of the term ‘innate’ and identified no less than twenty-six proposed definitions. They judge eight of these to be both genuinely independent definitions and potentially valuable scientific constructs (Mameli and Bateson 2006, p. 177–8). Unless it can be demonstrated that the eight properties picked out by these definitions are highly correlated with one another, something which they doubt on empirical grounds, the term ‘innate’ is confusing and unhelpful.

Sceptics also question whether there really is even a rough ‘lability continuum’ as Marler suggests. Several recent philosophical defenders of the innateness concept suggest in a spirit of common sense that whatever the limitations of the concept, traits can at least be placed along a rough continuum of dependence on the environment (e.g. Ariew 2006; Mallon and Weinberg 2006; Khalidi 2007). But this does not seem like common sense to many scientists who actually study behavioral development. Developmental psychobiology is a field that grew out of the research tradition of which Lehrman was part (for a textbook treatment see Michel and Moore 1995; two excellent popular introductions are Bateson and Martin 1999, and Moore 2001). The consensus in this field is that experimental research on the development of a trait typically reveals sensitive dependence on environmental parameters. These parameters are highly varied, and they interact non-additively with genetic parameters. The idea of a ‘lability continuum’ seems implausible to researchers in this tradition both because there is no single set of parameters with which to compare different species, and because the idea of partitioning developmental causation between genes and environment in the case of a single species is subject to the formal objections arising from non-additive interaction discussed in Sections 2 and 3 above (on this last point see Meaney 2001a; Suomi 2003).

Developmental psychobiologists reject a basic idea at the heart of much discussion of innateness, which is that evolution makes development reliable by making it insensitive to environmental parameters. Instead, they argue that evolution often makes development reliable by stabilizing environmental parameters at the right value or by exploiting pre-existing environmental regularities. The birdsong researchers Meredith West and Andrew King have described this as locating development in an ‘ontogenetic niche’ and research in developmental psychobiology can be conceived as the study of this niche and its interaction with the genome. West and King and their collaborators have conducted a long term study of the ontogenetic niche of the Brown-headed Cowbird Molothrus Ater (West and King 1987; West and King 1988; West, King et al. 2006). Cowbirds are obligate nest parasites (like cuckoos) and do not hear their parents sing as they grow up. It was therefore assumed that they sing ‘innately’. West and King showed that, amongst other processes, male song is shaped by feedback from female cowbirds, whose wing stroking and gaping displays in response to the songs they prefer are strong reinforcers for males. Female song preferences are themselves subject to social influences. As a result of these and other processes Cowbirds reliably transmit not only species-typical song, but also the regional song dialects typical of birds that acquire their songs as a result of exposure to parental song. In stark contrast to the suggestions of the philosophers discussed in Section 4.3 the researchers conclude that asking whether Cowbird song is innate or acquired is unhelpful because it demands that the developmental process be assimilated to one of two prototypes, neither of which is suitable (West, King et al. 1990).

In many species, of course, the stabilization of the parameters of the ontogenetic niche is achieved through parental care, as we saw in the case of the development of penile reflexes in the rat in Section 4.3. But parental care can also be used as a mechanism of adaptive phenotypic plasticity. Michael Meaney and collaborators' account of the role of parental care in the development of temperament in rats is a good exemplar of this phenomenon. The BALBc strain of laboratory rat is “highly fearful, and maze dull…these animals show increased endocrine and behavioral responses to stress, they are hyperactive and show profound learning and memory deficits that are associated with, among things, impaired hippocampal development” (Meaney, 2001, 57). Cross-fostering BALBc pups to mothers of the more laid-back C57 strain removes the differences between the two strains. Meaney and collaborators show how the amount of licking and arched-back nursing which pups receive from their mother regulates gene expression so as to direct the development of the pup's brain (Meaney, 2001). Although the phenotypes of these inbred laboratory strains are constant, it is plausible that in wild rats maternal behavior reflects the mother's stress levels. It may convey information to the pup about the likely quality of its environment and ‘preset’ stress metabolism to match that environment. This work reinforces another lesson of developmental psychobiology, which is that the relevant aspects of the ontogenetic niche are ‘non-obvious’. We might guess that the rat pup will respond to indicators of environmental quality, and we might guess that the mother's behavior is a useful source of information on this topic, but not that the information resides in whether the mother arches her back during suckling. Non-obvious parameters are typically overlooked in deprivation experiments designed to establish that a trait is innate, but are often revealed by positive efforts to understand how behaviour develops (Gottlieb 1997).

Developmental psychobiologists have an evolutionary rationale for the existence of the ‘ontogenetic niche’. Natural selection does not select for mechanisms which buffer traits against variation in the environment unless variation of that kind regularly occurs in the environments in which the species lives. In fact, any buffering mechanism which is not actively being used will tend to decay by mutation. One famous example is the inability of humans and their relatives to synthesise ascorbic acid (vitamin C). The ascorbic acid synthesis pathway was disabled by mutation during the long period in which our fruit-eating ancestors had no chance of developing vitamin C deficiences (Jukes and King 1975). As Terence Deacon has nicely put it, organisms are ‘addicted to’ innumerable aspects of their environments, from ascorbic acid, to gravity, to social interactions (Deacon 1997). Selection will also favour behaviours that allow animals to reliably ‘feed their addictions’.

Recent philosophical scepticism about the concept of innateness inspired by this research tradition can be seen in the work of Griffiths and collaborators (Griffiths 2002; Griffiths and Machery 2008; Griffiths, Machery & Linquist, forthcoming). These researchers have argued that the idea of an innate trait is simply one expression of a folkbiological theory of the ‘natures’ of living things. Just as there are commonsense ideas about physical objects and the forces acting on them (‘folk physics’), so there are commonsense ideas about biology (‘folkbiology’ — Medin and Atran 1999). It is part of folkbiology that some traits are expressions of the inner nature of animals and plants, whilst other traits result from the influence of the environment. Echoing the traditional critique of the innateness concept in animal behaviour research, Griffiths and collaborators argue that folkbiology conflates the issues of whether a trait is typical of the species, whether it is part of the design of the species, and whether its development is insensitive to the environment. Attempts to redefine innateness in a way that stresses just one of its many aspects and thus makes it a useful scientific construct have been and will continue to be stymied by the fact that the broad concept of innateness is part of our evolved psychological equipment.

6. Conclusion

Recent philosophical discussion of the innate/acquired distinction has been driven by the desire to make sense of innateness claims in neo-nativist psychology. Philosophical defenders of the innate/acquired distinction typically refer to its value for research in linguistics and psychology, and to the success of this research. It may be that resolving the disputes between the many competing analyses of the innateness concept outlined in Section 4 will require taking these claims more seriously and looking in detail at how nativist researchers use the idea of innateness, perhaps through detailed case studies.

Philosophical scepticism about innateness draws on a longstanding tradition of scepticism in developmental psychobiology. This research tradition interprets many of its own results as demonstrating the inadequacy of the innate/acquired distinction, and it is critical of the results and interpretations of results found in neo-nativist research. Philosophical defenders of the distinction would benefit from looking at these cases, in which the distinction is purportedly inapplicable or unhelpful, in addition to the cases used by neo-nativists to exemplify the distinction.

One thing seems clear, which is that efforts to clarify the distinction in psychology by appeal to the underlying genetics have not been successful. The innate/acquired distinction does not seem to get much grip on the findings of lower-level developmental sciences such as molecular developmental biology. Once again, this suggests that the distinction may be best understood via its actual use in psychological research.


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behaviorism | concepts | folk psychology: as a theory | heritability | information: biological | innateness: and language | mental content: teleological theories of | rationalism vs. empiricism


The author and editors would like to thank Taylor & Francis for granting permission to reproduce Figures 4A and 4B from C.H. Waddington's, The Strategy of the Genes, London: Ruskin House/George Allen & Unwin, 1957, pp. 29 and 36.