Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Mon Aug 27, 2001; substantive revision Fri Jun 26, 2009

The medieval name for paradoxes like the famous Liar Paradox (“This proposition is false”) was “insolubles” or insolubilia.[1] From the late-twelfth century to the end of the Middle Ages and beyond, such paradoxes were discussed at length by an enormous number of authors. Yet, unlike twentieth century interest in the paradoxes, medieval interest seems not to have been prompted by any sense of theoretical “crisis.”

The history of the medieval discussions can be divided into three main periods: (a) an early stage, from the late-twelfth century to the 1320s; (b) a period of especially intense and original work, during roughly the second quarter of the fourteenth century; (c) a late period, from about 1350 on. The discussion in this article will be organized as follows:

1. Origins of the Medieval Discussion

The Liar Paradox was well known to antiquity. Its discovery is often credited to Eubulides the Megarian (4th century BCE), on the basis of a remark by Diogenes Laertius (Lives of the Philosophers II.108), although in fact Diogenes says only that Eubulides discussed the paradox, not that he discovered it.[2] A little later, the poet and grammarian Philetus (or Philitas) of Cos (c. 330-c. 270 BCE), if we are to believe the story in Athenaeus of Naucratis's Deipnosophists IX.401e, worried so much over the Liar that he wasted away and died of insomnia, as, according to Athenaeus, his epitaph recorded:

Philetus of Cos am I
’Twas The Liar who made me die,
And the bad nights caused thereby.[3]

Diogenes Laertius also reports (VII.196–98) that, in addition to an enormous number of other works on a variety of topics, the Stoic logician Chrysippus (c. 279–206 BCE) wrote:

1.1 Unlikely Ancient Sources

But it does not appear that medieval interest in insolubles was derived directly from these or any other known ancient sources that discuss the Liar. Many of the relevant works were lost (e.g., the works of Chrysippus), while others were never translated into Latin and so were effectively unavailable to the Latin Middle Ages, though things may be different for the Arabic and Byzantine traditions, which are only starting to be studied. (See, e.g., Alwishah and Sanson 2009.) Indeed, it is not at all clear just what it was that prompted medieval interest. One might have supposed that, even if particular theories about the Liar were not transmitted to the Latin West from antiquity, at least formulations of Liar-type paradoxes must have been known and available to stimulate the medieval discussions. In fact, however, there are strikingly few possibilities.

Seneca (Epistle 45.10), for instance, mentions the Liar paradox by its Greek name pseudomenon, but does not actually formulate it. Again, St. Augustine perhaps has the Liar in mind in his Against the Academicians (III.13.29), where he refers to the “most lying calumny, ‘if it is true [it is] false, if it is false it is true’.” But neither passage would likely be sufficient by itself to suggest the special problems of the Liar to anyone not already familiar with them.

Somewhat more explicit is Aulus Gellius's (2nd century CE) Attic Nights (XVIII.ii.10), “When I lie and say I am lying, am I lying or saying the truth?” But Gellius was not widely read in the Middle Ages, and no known medieval author cites him in the context of insolubles.[4] Again, Cicero's Academica priora, II.xxix.95-xxx.97, contains a fairly clear formulation: “If you lie and speak that truth, are you lying or speaking the truth? ... If you say you lie, and you speak the truth, you lie; but you say you lie, and you speak the truth; therefore, you lie.” But this passage is never cited in the insolubilia-literature. Moreover Cicero, who wrote in Latin and so did not have to be translated to be available to the Middle Ages, calls such paradoxes “inexplicables” (inexplicabilia). If he was the catalyst for the medieval discussions, we would have expected to find that term in the insolubilia-literature, and we do not; the unanimous medieval term is ‘insolubles’.

1.2 St. Paul's Reference to Epimenides

One initially plausible stimulus for the medieval discussions would appear to be the Epistle to Titus 1:12: “One of themselves, even a prophet of their own, said, The Cretians [= Cretans] are always liars, evil beasts, slow bellies.” The Cretan in question is traditionally said to have been Epimenides. For this reason, the Liar Paradox is nowadays sometimes referred to as the “Epimenides.” Yet, blatant as the paradox is here, and authoritative as the Epistle was taken to be, not a single medieval author is known to have discussed or even acknowledged the logical and semantic problems this text poses. When medieval authors discuss the passage at all, for instance in Scriptural commentaries, they seem to be concerned only with why St. Paul should be quoting pagan sources.[5] It is not known who was the first to link this text with the Liar Paradox.

1.3 Aristotle's Sophistic Refutations

By contrast with these passages, none of which was cited in the insolubilia-literature, there is a text from Aristotle's Sophistic Refutations 25, 180a27-b7, that, from almost the very beginning of the insolubilia-literature to the end of the Middle Ages, served as the framework for discussing insolubles. It occurs in Aristotle's discussion of the fallacy of confusing things said “in a certain respect” (secundum quid) with things said “absolutely” or “on the whole” (simpliciter). In this context, Aristotle supposes a man who takes an oath that he will become an oath-breaker, and then does so. Absolutely or on the whole, Aristotle says, such a man is an oath-breaker, even though with respect to the particular oath to become an oath-breaker he is an oath-keeper. Then Aristotle adds the intriguing remark, “The argument is similar too concerning the same man's lying and speaking the truth at the same time” (180b2–3). It was this sentence that many medieval authors took to be a reference to the Liar Paradox, which therefore, on the authority of Aristotle, could be solved as a fallacy secundum quid et simpliciter.

The widespread appeal to this passage throughout the history of the insolubilia-literature indicates that the text did play some role in prompting medieval interest in insolubles. This suggestion is reinforced by the fact that the earliest known medieval statement of the Liar occurs in 1132, around the time the Sophistic Refutations first began to circulate in Western Europe in Latin translation. (See Section 2 below.)

Nevertheless, it is not immediately obvious how Aristotle's remarks can be made to fit the Liar Paradox. The oath-breaker, as the example was generally interpreted, takes two oaths: one, which he keeps, that he will commit perjury, and a second (it does not matter what it is) that he breaks, thereby fulfilling the first oath. The man is an oath-breaker and an oath-fulfiller, but with respect to different oaths; by breaking his second oath, rendering it false, he fulfills the first oath, making it true. However, it is possible to interpret the passage as referring to a single oath, when the oath is broken at the same time as it is made. Seen that way, it connects the Liar paradox with the fallacy secundum quid et simpliciter.[6]

In short, it seems clear that the Sophistic Refutations was instrumental in prompting medieval interest in insolubles. But more must have been involved too. Martin (1993) suggests a connection with theories of obligations (cf. Section 3.3). Before medieval logicians could formulate genuine Liar-type paradoxes, they first had to go well beyond anything found in Aristotle's text. At present we cannot say whether they did this on the basis of some still unidentified ancient source or whether it was through their own intellectual power and logical insight.

2. Early Developments to the 1320s

In 1132, Adam of Balsham, the founder of the important logical school of the “Parvipontani” (so called because they gathered at the Petit Pont in Paris), wrote an Art of Discussing (Ars disserendi), in which he treats, among other things, various kinds of yes/no questions, including “whether he speaks truly who says he lies” and “whether he who says nothing but that he lies is saying the truth.” (Adam of Balsham 1956, p. 107.)

The importance of this passage should not be exaggerated. It is true that it gives us the earliest known explicit medieval formulation of the Liar.[7] But Adam gives no attempt to solve the paradox, does not say it was a current topic of discussion in his day, and in fact does not even indicate he recognized its paradoxicalness. He simply offers it as an example of one kind of yes/no question.

It is not until later in the twelfth century that one finds an explicit statement of the special problems raised by insolubles. In his On the Natures of Things (De naturis rerum), of unknown date but apparently well known by the end of the century, Alexander Neckham 1967, p. 289, says[8]:

Again, if Socrates says he lies, and says nothing else, he says some proposition. Therefore, either a true one or a false one. Therefore, if Socrates says only that he lies, he says what is true or what is false.

But if (1) Socrates says only the proposition that Socrates lies, and he says what is true, then it is true that Socrates lies. And if it is true that Socrates lies, Socrates says what is false. Therefore, if Socrates says only the proposition that Socrates lies, and he says what is true, he says what is false.

But if (2) Socrates says only the proposition that Socrates lies, and he says what is false, then it is false that Socrates says what is false. And if it is false that Socrates says what is false, Socrates does not say what is false. But if Socrates says only that he lies, he says either what is true or what is false. Therefore, if Socrates says he lies, he says what is true. Therefore, if Socrates says only that he lies, and he says what is false, then he says what is true.

But if Socrates says only that he lies, he says what is true or false. Therefore, if Socrates says only that he lies, he says what is true and says what is false.

Nevertheless, although clearly Neckham was fully aware of what is paradoxical about the Liar, he makes no attempt to solve the paradox. He presents it only as an example of the “vanities” logic deals with. This suggests that by his day others were trying to solve the paradox, and in fact in the discussion of the fallacy secundum quid et simpliciter contained in the so called Munich Logic (= Dialectica Monacensis) from sometime in the second half of the century, we find the remark: “But how this fallacy arises in uttering the insoluble ‘I am saying a falsehood’, that is a matter discussed in the treatise on insolubles.”[9]

The first text we have that actually tries to solve the paradox is an anonymous treatise from the very end of the twelfth or the very early thirteenth century (De Rijk 1966). From then on, there are a great number of surviving treatments. (See Spade 1975.) In the early 1320s, Thomas Bradwardine, in a preliminary section of his own treatise on insolubles, lists nine views in circulation in his day, including his own. (See Spade 1975, pp. 106–08; Spade 1987, pp. 43–46.) Some of these views can no longer be identified in the texts that survive from the period before Bradwardine, but among the surviving views, we can distinguish five broad approaches to “solving” the paradox.[10] (Sometimes these approaches are combined in a single author.)

2.1 Insolubles as Fallacies secundum quid et simpliciter

As might be expected in view of Section 1.3 above, many of these early theories attempted to analyze insolubles as fallacies secundum quid et simpliciter. Later in the insolubilia-literature, discussions often continued to be cast in terms of this fallacy. Spade (1987, p.32) claimed that their real focus was generally on entirely different theoretical issues, and that the role of the fallacy thus became purely “honorary,” preserving the authority of Aristotle. However, Dutilh Novaes and Read 2008 challenged that assessment. Bradwardine, for example, explicitly and repeatedly casts his solution in terms of Aristotle's discussion, making actual (not merely “honorary”) use of the conceptual framework offered by the fallacy secundum quid et simpliciter.[11]

Aristotle had suggested (180b5–7) that insolubles are false simpliciter (absolutely/on the whole), but true secundum quid (in a certain respect). Some authors in the early medieval literature, however, argued that insolubles are absolutely neither true nor false, but only true in a certain respect and false in a certain respect.[12] Others used the terminology of simpliciter and secundum quid, but applied it to reference (suppositio) rather than to truth and falsehood, so that in insolubles certain terms did not refer “absolutely” to their referents, but only “in a certain respect.” This view is in effect a kind of restriction on self-reference.[13]

2.2 The Theory of Transcasus

The theory of transcasus has nothing to do with the fallacy secundum quid et simpliciter, although it too seems to have had its origins in antiquity. The word transcasus is not a usual Latin word. It seems to be a literal translation of Greek metaptosis. In Stoic logic, propositions that change their true value over time were called metapiptonta (from the same root). Walter Burley in fact used the word transcasus exactly this way in 1302 in two short logical works. (Spade 1987, pp. 33–34.)

Nevertheless, in the particular context of insolubles, while the term transcasus does have an association with time, it does not imply any change of truth value over time. Rather the theory of transcasus held that in the proposition ‘This statement is false’, the term ‘false’ refers not to the proposition in which it occurs, but rather to some proposition uttered earlier. Thus, when the liar says “I am lying,” what he really means is “What I said just a moment ago was a lie.” If the speaker did not in fact say anything earlier, then his present statement is simply false and no paradox arises.[14]

This odd view, like the last of those discussed in Section 2.1 above, amounts in practice to a restriction on self-reference. But it is not clear exactly what motivated it. In any event, the theory of transcasus appears to have disappeared as a theory actually held by anyone after the early period, although it continued to be mentioned in later authors' surveys of earlier views.[15]

2.3 Exercised Act vs. Signified (or Conceived) Act

A third theory from this early period distinguishes the “exercised” act from the “signified” or “conceived” act. The details of this theory are not yet well understood, but the basic strategy is to distinguish what the liar says he is doing (namely, lying) from he really is doing. John Duns Scotus, who held a version of this theory in his Questiones on the Sophistic Refutations (Scotus 1958), thought that what the liar is really doing (his “exercised act”) is speaking the truth. In order to avoid the paradox, this theory would seem to be committed to saying that the exercised act and the signified act are two distinct acts, so that the theory, like the theory of transcasus (Section 2.2 above), is committed to some kind of restriction on self-reference.[16]

2.4 The Theory of Restriction

Even when not combined with transcasus or the theory that distinguishes exercised act from signified act, a very popular approach throughout the insolubilia-literature, in the early as well as the later period (and for that matter even in our own day), was to deny or restrict the possibility of self-reference. Such theories were called “restriction,” and their proponents were called “restricters” (restringentes). All such theories maintained that in some or all cases, terms in propositions could not “supposit for” (stand for, refer to) the propositions in which they occur.

Some theories of restriction went further and also ruled out other patterns of reference. For example:

As a general theory, restriction is open to an obvious objection: it rules out innocuous forms of reference along with pathological ones. The sentence ‘This sentence has five words’ is not paradoxical, after all, even though it is self-referential; in fact, it seems obviously true. Yet the theory of restriction would disallow it.

Medieval authors sometimes raised this objection. As a result, we find two kinds of restriction-theories in the medieval literature: (a) general or strong theories that rule out self-reference, and perhaps other patterns of reference too, in innocuous as well as pathological cases; and (b) more specialized or weaker theories that rule out certain forms of reference only when they result in paradox. Walter Burley and William of Ockham, for example, held the latter form of restriction (Spade, 1974).

If general or strong theories of restriction are open to the objection stated above, the weaker theories are open to a different objection: they risk being vacuous if their proponents did not have any independent way of identifying paradoxical cases. Perhaps, their theories amounted to saying “all forms of reference are allowed, except for paradoxical ones, which are not allowed.” This is no doubt true, but it is also a tautology.[17]

2.5 Cassation

Unlike restriction, which remained (and remains) a popular view, the theory of “cassation” disappeared very early. It is maintained in the earliest known treatise on insolubles (De Rijk 1966) and in one other anonymous text (Spade 1975, pp. 43–44), but died out after about 1225, although it continued to be mentioned in later authors' surveys of previous views, no doubt because of its inclusion in Bradwardine's own survey.

‘Cassation’ is now an archaic word, but merely means “making null and void, canceling.” In effect, this theory holds that one who utters an insoluble proposition “isn't saying anything.” The second of the two texts just cited even gives a curious “ordinary language” argument, appealing to the rusticus (the man-on-the-street), who, if you were to say to him “What I am saying is false,” would reply “Nil dicis” (“You are saying nothing”).

The treatise in De Rijk 1966 presents more of a theory. Much of it is obscure to modern scholars, but it seems to appeal to a distinction between a mental act of asserting and a vocal act of uttering a proposition. “Saying” requires both acts; it is “an assertion with utterance.” In the case of the liar who says “What I am saying is false,” the mental act of asserting is present, and for that matter so is the physical act of uttering the words. But somehow (this is the obscure part) there is no “saying.”

It is tempting to interpret this view as an appeal to a kind of fallacy of composition; just as someone who is both good and an author is not necessarily a good author, so too something that is both mentally asserted and vocally uttered is not necessarily “said” (asserted with utterance). It is tempting, yes, but highly speculative. Nevertheless, whatever the correct interpretation, it appears that the distinction between asserting and uttering drawn by this theory escapes the facile “refutation” of it used as early as the mid-thirteenth century, that it “plainly contradicts sensation that is not deceived.”[18]

3. The Second Quarter of the Fourteenth Century

The preceding theories represent the earliest stage of the insolubilia-literature. Although these theories are sometimes mentioned in the later literature, and in the case of “restriction” often accepted in the later literature, much more sophisticated treatments began to emerge in the second quarter of the fourteenth century. The turning point is Thomas Bradwardine, whose own theory was enormously influential on later authors. Shortly after Bradwardine, two other English authors from this middle period are also important: Roger Swyneshed, and William Heytesbury. A little later, important contributions were made by Parisian authors, Gregory of Rimini John Buridan and Albert of Saxony.

3.1 Thomas Bradwardine

Thomas Bradwardine (c. 1300–1349) wrote his Insolubles at Oxford sometime between 1321 and 1324. It became one of the most important works on the topic in the Middle Ages. In fact, sometime in the third quarter of the fourteenth century, Ralph Strode, in his own treatise on the topic, surveys the earlier views (quoting Bradwardine's own survey and theory almost verbatim), and then says (Spade 1981, p. 116):

For the opinions mentioned above were those of the old [logicians], who understood little or nothing about insolubles. After them there arose the prince of modern philosophers of nature, namely Master Thomas Bradwardine. He was the first one who discovered something worthwhile about insolubles.

Bradwardine's theory is built around a theory of truth, which in turn depends on a conception of signification, described by Spade as an “adverbial” theory of propositional signification. (Spade 1996, pp. 178–85. Cf. Read 2008b §13.2.) By virtue of their constituent terms, propositions signify things; but, in addition, a proposition as a whole signifies that such-and-such is the case. This conception may be related to Walter Burley's theory of the propositio in re (see, e.g., Cesalli 2001). It is this latter kind of signification that is the basis for Bradwardine's theory of truth.

For him, a proposition is (D1) true if it signifies only as is the case (tantum sicut est), and (D2) false if it signifies otherwise than is the case (aliter quam est). Note the absence of the ‘only’ in the criterion for falsehood. Truth therefore, is more demanding than falsehood. In order for a proposition to be true, all of what it signifies to be the case must in fact be the case; if any of what it signifies to be the case fails to be the case, the proposition is false.

What is most distinctive in Bradwardine's theory is his theory of signification. For him, propositions signify many things, not in the sense of being ambiguous, but as requiring a multitude of conditions to be satisfied for their truth. For example, ‘Some man is running’ signifies not only that a man is running, but also that there is a man, and a runner. Indeed, Bradwardine claims that a proposition signifies everything which follows from it. This is his famous second postulate, (P2). There is considerable controversy over its correct interpretation. (For a recent discussion, see Dutilh Novaes forthcoming §1.) Spade (1981, p.120) interprets (P2) as what he calls “Bradwardine's Principle” (BP):

If p only if q, then P signifies that q,

where the name replacing ‘P’ names the sentence replacing ‘p’. However, he concedes that, when read in this way, the principle does not support the proof Bradwardine gives of his second thesis, (T2), which we will discuss below. Accordingly, Spade attributes a further principle to Bradwardine, the “Converse Bradwardine Principle” (CBP):[19]

Whatever a sentence signifies follows from it. If P signifies that q, then p only if q.

However, he admits that Bradwardine never states or mentions this principle, and that with it, Bradwardine's solution collapses.

Read (2009) claims that (P2) should be interpreted more generously, not in terms of how it is actually stated by Bradwardine, but how it is actually used by him. As used, it is a closure principle, that a proposition signifies everything which follows from what it signifies. This has (BP) as a consequence, but is stronger than it, and sufficient for Bradwardine's proof of (T2).

Bradwardine's solution to the insolubles is stated in his second thesis, (T2): “Every proposition which signifies that it itself is not true, or is false, also signifies that it is true and is false.” The proof has four stages:

  1. suppose first that a signifies that a is not true, and nothing else. If a is not true, then by (D1) it does not signify only as is the case, so it is not the case that a is not true (since we are supposing that is all it signifies), that is, a is true. So if a is not true, it is true. But a signifies that a is not true, so by (P2) a signifies that it is true.
  2. suppose next that a signifies that a is not true and also that b is c. If a is not true, then by (D1) it does not signify only as is the case, so it is not the case that a is not true and b is c, that is, either a is true or b is not c, by (P4), a statement of the De Morgan Laws. So again by (P2), a signifies either that a is true or b is not c. But a signifies that b is c, so by (P5), Disjunctive Syllogism, a signifies that a is true.
  3. suppose that a signifies that a is false. Then by (P1), Bivalence, and (P2), a signifies that a is not true, so by (1) and (2) above, a signifies that a is true.
  4. so if a signifies that a is not true or that a is false, a also signifies that a is true. But a cannot be both true and false. So things cannot be only as a signifies, so by (D2) a is false.

In the subsequent chapter, Ch. 7, Bradwardine considers the problem of revenge in various guises. Take Socrates' utterance of ‘Socrates utters a falsehood’, where Socrates utters nothing else. Bradwardine's claim is that Socrates' utterance is false, that is, that Socrates utters a falsehood. How can Bradwardine's claim that Socrates utters a falsehood be true, while Socrates' utterance of the same thing is false? The reason, Bradwardine replies, is that Socrates' utterance is self-referential, and signifies not only that Socrates' utterance is false but also, by (T2), that it is true (and so is false), whereas Bradwardine's utterance is not self-referential and so not subject to (T2).[20]

3.2 Roger Swyneshed

Sometime between roughly 1330 and 1335, the English Benedictine Roger Swyneshed adopted a theory in some respects reminiscent of Bradwardine's, but with interesting features of its own. Like Bradwardine, Swyneshed held that for a proposition to be true, it is not enough that it “signify as is the case.” But whereas Bradwardine maintained that in addition the proposition must not signify otherwise than is the case (that is, it must signify only as is the case), Swyneshed said that in addition the proposition must not “falsify itself.” Insolubles do falsify themselves, and so are false for that reason, even though they signify as is the case. Propositions that falsify themselves are said to be those that are “relevant (pertinens) to inferring that they are false.”

The notions of “relevance,” “self-falsification,” and “signifying as is the case” (or “otherwise than is the case”) are puzzling ones in Swyneshed's theory and the subject of ongoing study.[21] But the main historical interest of his theory does not lie there. Rather, it lies in three famous and controversial conclusions he drew from his principles:

Many authors found these conclusions ridiculous, especially the second and third ones. But they had their defenders as well.[24]

Two other features of Swyneshed's theory should be at least mentioned, although our understanding of his view does not yet allow a thorough treatment of them. Along with other authors (e.g., Buridan), he explicitly holds that while valid inference does not always preserve truth, it does preserve the property of signifying as is the case. Second, Swyneshed explicitly considers a situation where a = ‘a does not signify as is the case’, and says that a is neither true nor false in that situation. This is the only known case of a medieval author's actually allowing failure of bivalence for insolubles, even though several authors refer to (and reject) such theories.[25]

3.3 William Heytesbury

In 1335, the Mertonian logician and philosopher of nature William Heytesbury wrote an important treatise Rules for Solving Sophisms (Regulae solvendi sophismata).[26] The first of its six chapters is on insolubles. The Rules as a whole, and this first chapter in particular, were widely read and commented on, particularly in Italy in the late-fourteenth and fifteenth centuries. Indeed, Heytesbury's theory is a competitor to Bradwardine's as the most influential theory of insolubles in the whole of the Middle Ages.[27]

Heytesbury treated insolubles as paradoxical only with respect to certain assumed circumstances (what he calls the casus or “hypothesis”). For example, the proposition ‘Socrates is saying a falsehood’ is not paradoxical in the abstract, all by itself, but only in contexts where, say, it is Socrates who utters that proposition, the proposition is the only proposition Socrates utters (it is not an embedded quotation, for instance, part of some larger statement he is making), and where his proposition signifies just as it normally does. Spoken and written language are thoroughly conventional, for medieval authors, so that the vocal sequence or inscription ‘Socrates is saying a falsehood’ could theoretically signify any way you want. It might, for example, signify that 2 + 2 = 4, in which case it would not be insoluble at all but straightforwardly true.

It is the last condition that is the focal point for Heytesbury's attack. He holds that in the casus where Socrates himself says just ‘Socrates is saying a falsehood’ and nothing else, his proposition cannot, on pain of contradiction, signify just as it normally does (“precisely as its words pretend,” as he puts it). If it does signify as it normally does, it must signify some other way as well.

How else might it signify? Heytesbury did not think it was his duty to answer that question, as Bradwardine did. The proposition's additional signification cannot be predicted, given the conventionality of spoken and written language. Depending on what else it signifies, different verdicts about the proposition are appropriate. In short, Heytesbury's strategy is to say, “You tell me exactly what Socrates's statement signifies, and I'll tell you first of all whether the case you describe is possible, and if it is, I'll tell you whether his statement is true or false.”

This “shift the burden” strategy is a consequence of the fact that Heytesbury, even more than Bradwardine and Swyneshed, views the question of insolubles in the context of obligationes, a highly formalized medieval disputation context that is still not fully understood.[28] But many later authors felt that Heytesbury had simply sidestepped the real theoretical issue, and went on to stipulate what Heytesbury would not: an insoluble's “additional” signification. They held that, in circumstances that make it insoluble, a proposition not only signifies as it normally does; it also signifies that it is true. This “adjustment” to Heytesbury's theory has the effect of combining it with the tradition stemming from Bradwardine.[29] It proved to be an appealing combination.

3.4 Gregory of Rimini

Gregory of Rimini's main writing was done in the 1340s. Although today we know of no text or passage of his that discusses insolubles, there must have been one, because in 1372 Peter of Ailly cites Gregory's theory in some detail and uses it in writing his own treatise on insolubles. (Peter of Ailly 1980.)

Gregory's view relied on the traditional medieval notion (going back to Aristotle's On Interpretation 1, 16a3–5) of “mental language,” the “language of thought” that underlies and is expressed in spoken and written language.[30] Unlike spoken and written languages, where the signification of words and propositions is thoroughly a matter of convention, signification in mental language is fixed by nature once and for all, the same for everyone. It follows that propositions in mental language can never signify otherwise than they “normally” do. Thus Heytesbury's analysis, according to which insolubles do signify otherwise than they normally do, cannot be applied to propositions formed in mental language. Although Heytesbury himself did not draw this conclusion, it follows from his theory that insolubles cannot be formulated in mental language.

In the absence of any text by Gregory on the topic, we cannot be sure that he reasoned like this from Heytesbury's position. But for whatever reason, he apparently did confine insolubles to spoken and written language; for Gregory there are no insolubles in mental language. An insoluble proposition in spoken or written language corresponds to and expresses not the mental proposition one would normally expect on the basis of the usual linguistic conventions, but a complex and non-paradoxical mental proposition.

For example, where a is the spoken or written proposition ‘a is false’, a corresponds to and expresses the conjunction of two mental propositions. The first conjunct signifies that a is false. Note that this is not the insoluble a, since that was in spoken or written language whereas this proposition is mental. Unlike a, this proposition is not self-referential; it refers instead to a.

The second conjunct signifies that the first conjunct is false. Since the first conjunct signifies that a is false, this means that the second conjunct amounts to saying that a is not false, but rather true.

One way, therefore, of viewing Gregory's theory is to say that he adopted the hybrid view described at the end of Section 3.3 above, the view that combines Heytesbury with Bradwardine, but then moved that whole analysis into mental language. Just as for Heytesbury's theory, insolubles for Gregory do not signify “precisely as their words pretend” (they do not express the mental proposition one would expect from the normal linguistic conventions). Just as for Bradwardine's theory, insolubles for Gregory do signify “as their words pretend” (through the first conjunct of the mental proposition). But they do not signify precisely that way; they also signify that they are true (through the second conjunct of the mental proposition).

Given our present knowledge of Gregory's views, this reconstruction must remain speculative.

3.5 John Buridan

John Buridan was another logician of the 14th century also holding a theory of the insolubles similar to Bradwardine's. However, there may have been no direct influence. Buridan taught at the University of Paris, and rather unusually remained a teaching master in the Arts Faculty for his entire career, from the 1330s (or earlier) until at least 1358. We can trace the development of this approach to the insolubles from his early Treatise on Consequences, dating from the 1330s, through his commentaries on Aristotle's Posterior Analytics, Sophistici Elenchi, and Metaphysics, to the various treatises of the Summulae de Dialectica, which was repeatedly revised over twenty years. His final view is described in the ninth and last treatise of the Summulae, with the independent title Sophismata, in a version from the mid-1350s.

Buridan's early view was that every proposition, not just insolubles, signifies its own truth. This idea can be found as early as Bonaventure's Quaestiones disputatae de mysteria Trinitate (Bonaventure 1969 q1 a1), composed in the 1250s. Unlike Bradwardine, Buridan gives only the briefest of arguments for this claim about signification, not grounding it in any principle like Bradwardine's (P2). Thus insolubles, which signify their own falsity, signify that they are both true and false, and so are false.

However, even in the Treatise on Consequences, Buridan thinks this final step needs qualification. For he rejects the idea that a proposition is true if things are how it signifies, even however it signifies. Things can be, e.g., how ‘No proposition is negative’ signifies, but it cannot be true (since it is itself negative, and thus falsifies itself when formed). Rather, affirmative propositions are true if their terms supposit for the same, negative if they supposit for different things. Indeed, he later rejects the suggestion that propositions signify their own truth. He did so both for ontological reaasons, since that would require some kind of propositional meanings (the famous complexe significabilia — see, e.g., Klima 2009, §10.2); and also because that would make every proposition meta-linguistic. Rather, his later theory claims that every proposition virtually implies another proposition asserting the truth of the first. Then an insoluble like ‘Socrates utters a falsehood’, uttered by Socrates, is false not because its terms don't supposit for the same, but because the terms in the implied proposition can't also do so. Buridan's solution has been much discussed in recent decades and has been edited and translated several times (see Buridan 1966, 1977, 1982, 2001, 2004), but it is deeply problematic (see, e.g., Read 2002 §5; Read 2006 §6).

3.6 Albert of Saxony

Much closer to Bradwardine than Buridan is another Paris logician, Albert of Saxony, who arrived in Paris in 1351 and taught there until around 1364. His view of the insolubles is similar to Buridan's early view, arguing in a similar way that every proposition signifies its own truth. But there is reason to doubt whether Albert was a student or even follower of Buridan, for Buridan belonged to the Picardian Nation at the University, whereas Albert was in the English (or by then “Anglo-German”) Nation, and in general his outlook follows the English logical tradition from earlier in the century. What is perhaps most impressive, and enjoyable, about Albert's treatise on Insolubles (Albert of Saxony 1988), ch.6 of his Perutilis Logica (A Really Useful Logic), is the extensive list of insolubles treated, and their variety.

4. The Late Period

The period of greatest innovation and sophistication in the medieval insolubilia-literature was the second quarter of the fourteenth century. After about 1350, little original work was done. Insolubles continued to be discussed, but it seems that for the most part the theories adopted were variations or elaborations of the ones already seen. Paul of Venice (1499) in a section of his Logica Magna as yet without a modern edition or translation, lists fifteen theories, supplementing Bradwardine's list of nine with later developments. (See Spade 1973, pp. 82–4) This period is not yet well researched, however, so it is too early for a final verdict.

4.1 John Wyclif

At any event, it is clear that one of the main (and one of the few genuinely new) theories to emerge from this late period is that of John Wyclif, who wrote a Summa of Insolubles (Summa insolubilium), probably in the early 1360s,[31] and included another discussion of insolubles in his Continuation of the Logic (Logicae continuatio), III.8. The theory is essentially the same in the two treatments.

For Wyclif, the key to resolving insolubles is to recognize various senses in which propositions can be true or false. There are three main senses of ‘true’, and accordingly of ‘false’:

The “independence” required by the third kind of truth is an obscure and difficult matter, not yet well understood. But here is how it applies to insolubles:

Where a = ‘a is false’, its primary significate either exists or does not. If it does, then in any event it is not independent of a in the sense required by the third kind of truth. In either case, then, a will be false in the third sense. If the word ‘false’ in a is taken in the third sense, therefore, a's primary significate does exist, since it is a fact that a is false in the third sense. In short, the insoluble is true in the second sense, but false in the third sense.

Our present understanding of Wyclif's theory does not go much beyond this. Many questions and problems remain. For instance, if the word ‘false’ in a is not taken in the third sense but in the second, the paradox seems to emerge all over again in a form that cannot be handled by this theory.

Whatever its virtues or defects, Wyclif's theory had some influence on later authors. Robert Alyngton's own Insolubilia, for instance, from around 1380, explicitly appeals to Wyclif's theory. Its influence can also be seen in an anonymous late treatise preserved in a Prague manuscript. (See Wyclif 1984, pp. xxiv-xxv.)

4.2 Peter of Ailly

As already mentioned (Section 3.4 above), in 1372 the Frenchman Peter of Ailly (Petrus de Alliaco) wrote an Insolubilia that preserves all we know of Gregory of Rimini's theory. Peter's theory looks much like Gregory's. Nevertheless, he did not accept Gregory's view entirely. Whereas for Gregory, an insoluble in spoken or written language corresponds to or expresses a conjunction of two propositions in mental language, for Peter it corresponds to or expresses two distinct mental propositions, not their conjunction. (The two distinct mental propositions are the same two that Gregory had conjoined.)

In medieval semantics, propositions that correspond to two distinct mental propositions are ambiguous or equivocal. (Indeed, that is the medieval account of equivocation.) Thus, for Peter, insolubles in spoken or written language are strictly equivocal and do not have a single signification. In one sense (answering to the first of Gregory's conjuncts), they are true; in another sense (answering to Gregory's second conjunct), they are false. By contrast, for Gregory, insolubles are just false, not ambiguous at all; they correspond to a single false conjunction, one conjunct of which is true and the other false.

Peter's theory has the phenomenological advantage that it accounts for the psychological “flip-flop” sense we have when thinking about insolubles. When we look at them one way they seem true; when we look at them another way, they seem false. No other medieval theory seems to account for this psychological fact. For further discussion, see Dutilh Novaes 2008 §3.8.

5. Observations

Several instructive observations can be made about the medieval insolubilia-literature.

First, although this article has focused on Liar-type paradoxes, and although the medieval literature did too, it also included other kinds of puzzles. For example, where a = ‘b is false’ and b = ‘a is false’, no Liar-type paradox arises; contradiction can be avoided by simply taking one of the two propositions as true and the other as false. But medieval logicians regarded such cases as problematic because they require us to assign different truth values to propositions that are semantically exactly alike; there is no reason to pick a as the true proposition rather than b or conversely. (See Read 2006) Cases like this, which violate only a kind of semantic “principle of sufficient reason,” were often included under the heading “insolubles.” (For example, Buridan, Sophismata VIII.8.) A variety of epistemic and pragmatic puzzles were often included as well.[32] There is often no attempt, as is usual in present-day literature on the paradoxes, to ignore all the inessentials and focus in on a single paradigmatic case that gets at the kernel of the issue. For medieval authors, the issue was a broad one. Most did not attempt to give any precise and rigorous characterization of what it takes to be an insoluble. Often, the definitions they did give are quite general and include much more than Liar-type paradoxes. In contrast, Bradwardine's definition is precise: an insoluble is “a difficult paralogism secundum quid et simpliciter arising from some [speech-] act's reflection on itself with a privative determination.” (Spade 1975, p. 106.)

Second, medieval authors did not have any sense of theoretical “crisis” over insolubles, as modern discussions of the paradoxes often do. The medievals did not regard the paradoxes as threatening the very foundations of reasoning. On the contrary, most authors seem to have regarded them as merely argumentative nuisances, and their main concern was to come up with a way of dealing with them when they arose in disputation. No doubt this difference is due to the different contexts in which the discussions emerged. Modern logic is a formalized, systematic discipline, closely tied to the foundations of mathematics; medieval logic, by contrast, was much looser and informal (which of course is not to say it lacked insight), much more tied to the give and take of live academic disputation.

Third, and related to the second point, most medieval authors thought it was entirely possible to find a completely satisfactory “solution” to insolubles. Insolubles were regarded as resting on a straightforward but pernicious fallacy, although authors disagreed over just what the fallacy is. William of Ockham, for instance, writes, “As for insolubles, you should know it is not because they can in no way be solved that some sophisms are called insolubles, but because they are solved with difficulty.” (Ockham 1974, III-3, 46.)

The only medieval author who is known to have departed from this confident view is William Heytesbury, who raises objections against his own view, and then remarks (Heytesbury 1979, p. 45, emphasis added):

Many objections of this sort can be raised against this view, which it would be difficult or impossible to answer to complete satisfaction.

Again, about his own view he says (p. 21, emphasis added):

I do not claim that it or any [opinion] is altogether satisfactory, because I do not see that this is possible. Nevertheless I rate this one among all of them to be nearer the truth.

Richard Lavenham, an English contemporary of Wyclif, perhaps put the prevailing optimism best (Spade 1975, p. 93; Heytesbury 1979, p. 8):

Just as the bond of love is sometimes called insoluble, not because it can in no way be untied (sit solubilis) but because it can be untied [only] with difficulty, so a proposition is sometimes called insoluble, not because it is not solvable but because it is solvable [only] with difficulty.


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Alyngton, Robert | Buridan, John [Jean] | Burley [Burleigh], Walter | dialetheism [dialethism] | Duns Scotus, John | fallacies: medieval theories of | Gregory of Rimini | Heytesbury, William | logic: paraconsistent | medieval philosophy | Ockham [Occam], William | Paul of Venice | sophismata [= sophisms] | truth: revision theory of | Wyclif, John