Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Sun Sep 30, 2001; substantive revision Thu Nov 15, 2007

In contrast to the meaning the word ‘sophism’ had in ancient philosophy, ‘sophisma’ in medieval philosophy is a technical term with no pejorative connotation: a sophisma is an ambiguous, puzzling or simply difficult sentence that has to be solved. As an important element of scholarly training in universities, closely related to different kinds of disputations, the sophismata not only served to illustrate a theory but, from a more theoretical point of view, were also used to test the limits of a theory. The so-called sophismata-literature assumed more and more importance during the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries, and it is not an exaggeration to claim that many important developments in philosophy (mainly in logic and natural philosophy) appeared in texts of this kind, where masters could feel free to investigate problems and develop their own views, much more than they could in more academic and strictly codified literary genres.

1. The Word ‘Sophisma

Although some medieval theologians — and Humanists even more, of course, like Vivès or Rabelais — used the words ‘sophism’ or ‘sophist’ as a derogatory designation for quibbling philosophers, ‘sophisma’ in medieval philosophical literature has a very precise and technical signification. Hence, to avoid any confusion with fallacies and badly-constructed arguments, we shall here use the original term ‘sophisma’ rather than the word ‘sophism’ that even nowadays still has a pejorative connotation.

2. Description and Characteristics

2.1 Sophisma-Sentences

There are several important characteristics of sophismata. First of all, a sophisma is a sentence rather than an argument. In particular, a sophisma is a sentence that either:

  1. is odd or has odd consequences,
  2. is ambiguous, and can be true or false according to the interpretation we give it, or
  3. has nothing special about it in itself, but becomes puzzling when it occurs in a definite context (or “case,” casus).

Here are some some examples of kind (1), sentences that are odd or have odd consequences:

This donkey is your father.
A chimaera is a chimaera.

As examples of kind (2), ambiguous sentences that can be true or false according to the interpretation given to to them, consider:

All the apostles are twelve.
The infinite are finite.
Every man is of necessity an animal.

As an example of kind (3), sentences that have nothing special about them in themselves, but that become puzzling when they occur in a definite context (“case,” casus), consider:

The sentence ‘Socrates says something false’, in the case where Socrates says nothing other than ‘Socrates says something false’.

(This is paradoxical, and is one of the forms the Liar paradox can take.)

2.2 The Aim of the Discussion

Once the odd, ambiguous or puzzling sophisma-sentence is set out, one should try to understand what it means, what implications it has, and how it fits into or contradicts a particular theory under consideration. This is called “solving the sophisma,” and is the aim of the entire discussion. The way solutions are searched for and established is very similar to the highly formalized scholastic method for determining a “question”:

  1. First, one has to examine the arguments pro and contra.
  2. Second, one has to present his own solution to the problem. (Sometimes this part of the discussion is preceded by certain theoretical remarks or clarifications that make the terminology more precise.)
  3. Third, one has to refute the arguments supporting the opposite answer.

An Example

Let us take a very simple example, from Albert of Saxony, Sophismata, sophisma xi. The sophisma is:

Omnes homines sunt asini vel homines et asini sunt asini.
(All men are donkeys or men and donkeys are donkeys.)

In accordance with step (1), here are the pro and contra arguments:

Proof: The sophisma is a copulative sentence (in modern logical terminology, a conjunction) each part of which is true; therefore the sophisma is true, since its analysis becomes: [All men are donkeys or men] and [donkeys are donkeys].

Disproof: The sophisma is a disjunctive sentence each part of which is false; therefore the sophisma is false, since its analysis becomes: [All men are donkeys] or [men and donkeys are donkeys].

This is a sophisma of the second kind above, one that rests on an ambiguity and can be read with a true interpretation or with a false interpretation. Many such sophismata, although not this one, resist being translated from Latin into another language without losing the ambiguity. For example, the sentence ‘aliquem asinum omnis homo videt’ can be translated by ‘Every man sees a donkey’ as well as by ‘There is a donkey that every man sees’. Similarly, in solving sophismata, sometimes Latin word-order is used as an arbitrary code for interpreting the sentence. For example, according to William Heytesbury, when the word ‘infinite’ is placed at the beginning of a sentence and belongs to the subject, it has to be interpreted as a syncategorematic term; in any other case, it is usually interpreted as a categorematic term (Heytesbury, Sophismata, sophisma xviii, fol.130va). Such word-order codes might seem like reasonable regimentations of language to a Latin-speaker, but in translation they often seem quite implausible and forced. No such problems arise with this example. (For clarity, square brackets have been inserted into the proof and disproof above, in order to indicate the ambiguity of the sophisma.)

In accordance with step (2) above, Albert of Saxony, who discusses this sophisma, solves it by just saying that it is either true or false depending on which interpretation we choose. He then takes the opportunity to review the basic principles governing the truth-value of copulative and disjunctive sentences.

In accordance with step (3), we would normally be required to refute the opposite answer. In this case, however, there is nothing to refute, since Albert's solution accepts both the pro and the contra arguments (for different readings of the sophisma).

In general, a sophisma was a good occasion to discuss all the problems related to a specific issue. For example, the sophismaAlbum fuit disputaturum’ (‘The white [thing] was about to dispute’) in thirteenth-century Parisian literature was the occasion to discuss all the problems related to the theory of reference in tensed contexts, as well as to refute the positions others held on this very controversial subject. This is why Pinborg 1977 (p. xv) says that at Paris in the thirteenth century “the sophismata seems — within the faculty of arts — to play a role analoguous to the Quaestiones quodlibetales [quodlibetal questions] in the faculty of theology.” Note that this use is quite common. (Note also that Pinborg here uses the word ‘sophismata’ to signify not only sophisma-sentences but the whole literature that discussed them as well.)

Syncategorematic Terms, Exponible Sentences

It is important to recognize that many sophismata involve syncategorematic terms that are responsible for their odd, ambiguous or puzzling character. The preceding sophisma can be considered quite characteristic of the genre insofar as we see that the syncategorematic terms ‘or’ and ‘and’ occur in it and are responsible for the ambiguity of the sentence.

The expression ‘syncategorematic term’ should be taken in a broad sense here, so that it not only includes classical syncategorematic terms like ‘and’, ‘if’, ‘every’, etc., but also categorematic terms like ‘infinite’ or ‘whole’ that can be used both categorematically and syncategorematically. Thus the sentence “Infinita sunt finita” (“The infinite are finite” — here, incidentally is another good example of a sophisma that cannot be translated into English without disambiguating it) is false if ‘infinite’ is used categorematically, for in that case its signification is “Things that are infinite are finite.” But it is true if ‘infinite’ is used syncategorematically, for in that case its signification is “Finite things are infinite in number” or “There are infinitely many finite things.” (See Heytesbury, Sophismata, sophisma xviii, fol.130va.)

Many sophismata too are what medieval logicians called “exponible sentences”, sentences that seem to be simple but actually imply several other sentences into which they can be decomposed. For example, the sentence “A differs from B” was said to be equivalent to “A exists and B exists and A is not B”; the sentence “A ceases to be white” was said to be equivalent either to “Now A is white and immediately after this A will not be white” or to “Now A is not white and immediately before this A was white”, depending on the theory.

2.3 The Main Fields in Which Sophismata Are Discussed

Just as the scholastic method can be applied to any subject, the use of sophismata is to be found in logic, grammar and physics as well as in theology. Let us concentrate here on the first three.

Logical Sophismata

As seen above, logical sophismata are closely linked to the discussions of syncategoremata. The aim is either to determine the truth-value of a sentence (including sentences involving self-reference) or to discuss subjects such as:

We could compare these discussions to contemporary discussions of sentences like “The morning star is the evening star.”

Physical Sophismata

The aim here is to discuss physical concepts (motion, change, velocity, intension and remission of forms, maxima and minima, etc.). But, as seen above with the sophisma “The infinite are finite,” physical problems are treated as logical and conceptual problems. This logico-semantical approach to physical problems is quite characteristic of medieval physics and should be kept in mind when we wonder the extent to which medieval physics can be considered a precursor to modern physics.

With respect to so-called physical sophismata, special attention should to be paid to certain fourteenth century English authors known as the “Oxford Calculators,” authors like Richard Kilvington, William Heytesbury, Thomas Bradwardine, Richard and Roger Swineshead. These people developed a peculiarly “English-style” of sophismata. Based on the theological dogma of the absolute power of God, the distinction between what is physically possible and what is logically possible (where non-contradiction is the only limit) allowed these authors to make use of imaginary thought experiments. For example, “Suppose that A is a distance to be traversed which Socrates cannot traverse, and that his power is increased until Socrates can traverse distance A completely, and that Socrates' power is not increased further.” Is the sophisma “Socrates will begin to be able to traverse distance A” true or false? (Richard Kilvington, Sophismata, sophisma 27, in Kretzmann 1990, p.60.) Thought experiments like these led these authors to, among other things, a theorem for uniformly accelerated motion (Thomas Bradwardine's “Mean Speed Theorem”).

Grammatical Sophismata

Sophismata like “Love is a verb,” “O Master,” “It rueth me” or “I run” gave rise to very sharp discussions of grammatical categories and theories. For example, does a change of word order change the meaning of a proposition? Can a participle be a subject? How should we interpret interjections? Can ‘est’ (“is”) be used impersonally?

3. The Various Roles of Sophismata

The first and most evident role of sophismata is pedagogical. In theoretical treatises, sophismata can play various roles. They can be used to explain a given statement or rule, illustrate a distinction or an ambiguity, show what would follow if a rule were violated, or test the limits of a theory.

In addition, although some differences can be identified between the Paris and the Oxford traditions, sophismata are important as oral exercises (disputations) in a student's training in philosophy, especially in the first years of universitary education in the Faculty of Arts. Nevertheless, it is clear that, while Heytesbury's Rules for Solving Sophismata is written for undergraduate students — at Oxford ‘sophista’ was the official name given to students who had disputed “on sophismata” (“de sophismatibus”) for about two years — this is probably not the case for his Sophismata, the discussions in which are much more complicated.

I think it is no exaggeration to say that sophismata in the Faculty of Arts were as important as Biblical exegesis in the Faculty of Theology.

4. Related Kinds of Treatises

If we look at the evolution of literary genres, we note that the twelfth- and early-thirteenth century syncategoremata-literature came to be absorbed in the sophisma-literature. In thirteenth and fourteenth century philosophical literature, sophismata can appear within many kinds of treatises. Besides in syncategoremata-treatises, sophismata are dealt with in separate collections of sophismata named simply Sophismata or On Sophismata, but they also play an important role in general manuals of logic, and in works — often by the same authors, or by different authors coming from the same milieu as the former collections — with titles like Abstractions, Distinctions, On Exponibles, On Consequences, Sophistry, etc.

Even if there are technical distinctions among these types of tracts, all of them play the same roles mentioned above — in short: to acquire logical skills that can be applied to any subject.


The medieval sophismata-literature is a vast and complex subject of research. Many questions are still unsolved, especially about its historical origins and development. It is of central interest for people interested in medieval logic, grammar and physics, but also for those interested in the history of universities.

The study of “sophismatic works” began around 1940 with Grabmann's Die Sophismatalitteratur des 12. und 13. Jahrhunderts, and much work has been done in the last two decades. But there are still a lot of texts to read, edit and analyze.

The bibliography is organized as follows:

Primary Literature

Most of the logical and grammatical texts on sophismata have been edited by S. Ebbesen and his collaborators in the review Cahiers de l'Institut du Moyen Age Grec et Latin, University of Copenhagen. We will here mention only books.


Secondary Literature

Many important studies are to be found in the following collective work: Read, S., (ed.) Sophisms in Medieval Logic and Grammar. Acts of the Ninth European Symposium for Medieval Logic and Semantics, St. Andrews, June 1990. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1993.

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Buridan, John [Jean] | Burley [Burleigh], Walter | Heytesbury, William | insolubles [= insolubilia] | Kilvington, Richard | Richard the Sophister [Ricardus Sophista, Magister abstractionum] | terms, properties of: medieval theories of