Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

James Mill

First published Wed Nov 30, 2005

James Mill (1773–1836) was a Scots-born political philosopher, historian, psychologist, educational theorist, economist, and legal, political and penal reformer. Well-known and highly regarded in his day, he is now all but forgotten. Mill's reputation now rests mainly on two biographical facts. The first is that his first-born son was John Stuart Mill, who became even more eminent than his father. The second is that the elder Mill was the collaborator and ally of Jeremy Bentham, whose subsequent reputation also eclipsed the elder Mill's. My aim here is to try, insofar as possible, to remove Mill from these two large shadows and to reconsider him as a formidable thinker in his own right.

Mill's range of interests was remarkably wide, extending from education and psychology in his two-volume Analysis of the Phenomena of the Human Mind (1829b), to political economy (he persuaded his friend David Ricardo to write on that subject, as Mill himself did in his Elements of Political Economy, 1821), to penology and prison reform, to the law and history, and, not least, to political philosophy. On these and other subjects he wrote five books and more than a thousand essays and reviews. It is with Mill the political philosopher that the present article is principally concerned.

1. Biography

Unlike his famous first-born son, James Mill never wrote an autobiography or even a sketch of his early life, the details of which remained unknown even to his children. What we do know is this. James Mill was born on 6 April 1773 at Northwater Bridge in the county of Forfarshire in the parish of Logie Pert in Scotland. His father, James Milne, was a shoemaker and small farmer of modest means who was quiet, mild-mannered, and devout. His mother, Isabel Fenton Milne, was a more forceful figure. Determined that her first-born son should get ahead in the world, she changed the family name from the Scottish "Milne" to the more English-sounding "Mill," and kept young James away from other children, demanding that he spend most of his waking hours immersed in study. His "sole occupation," as his biographer Alexander Bain remarks, "was study" (Bain 1882, 7). (A regimen rather like that imposed by his mother upon her eldest son was later to be imposed upon his first-born son, John Stuart Mill.) In this occupation young James clearly excelled. Before the age of seven he had shown a talent for elocution, composition, and arithmetic, as well as Latin and Greek. The local minister saw to it that James received special attention at the parish school. At age ten or eleven, he was sent to Montrose Academy, where his teachers "were always overflowing with the praises of Mill's cleverness and perseverance" (Bain 1882, 8). Before leaving Montrose Academy at the age of seventeen, Mill was persuaded by the parish minister and his mother to study for the ministry. Mill's decision evidently pleased Lady Jane Stuart, wife of Sir John Stuart of Fettercairn, who headed a local charity founded for the purpose of educating poor but bright boys for the Presbyterian ministry. Mill, eminently qualified in both respects, became the recipient of Lady Jane's largesse. As it happened, she and Sir John were just then looking for a tutor for their fourteen-year old daughter Wilhelmina. They offered the job to James Mill; he accepted; and when the Stuart family moved to Edinburgh, he accompanied them.

In 1790, Mill enrolled in the University of Edinburgh, where by day he pursued a full course of studies and in the evenings tutored young Wilhelmina. Each experience left its mark. The Scottish universities at Edinburgh and Glasgow (and to a lesser extent Aberdeen and St. Andrews) had earlier been the hub of the Scottish Enlightenment and were still the premier universities in Britain. They had numbered among their faculty such luminaries as Francis Hutcheson, Thomas Reid, John Millar, Adam Ferguson, Adam Smith, and — had the orthodox town council of Edinburgh not forbade his admission — would have included David Hume as well. At Edinburgh Mill took particular delight in the tutelage of Dugald Stewart, who carried on the tradition of Scottish moral philosophy. In addition to moral philosophy, Mill's course of studies included history, political economy, and the classics, including Mill's favorite philosopher, Plato. Mill's mind never lost the stamp of his Scottish education. As his eldest son was later to remark, James Mill was "the last survivor of this great school" (J.S. Mill 1843, 566).

From 1790 to 1794 Mill served young Wilhelmina Stuart not only as a teacher but as a companion and confidant. Her admiration for her tutor quite likely turned to love, and the feeling was apparently reciprocated. But, however promising his prospects, Mill was no aristocrat, a social fact which he was not allowed to forget. In 1797 Wilhelmina married a member of her own class and died in childbirth shortly thereafter. She was said to have called out Mill's name "with her last breath." Mill never forgot her; he spoke of her always with wistful affection and named his first-born daughter after her.

After completing his first degree in 1794, Mill began studying for the ministry. For the next four years he supported himself by tutoring the sons and daughters of several noble families. The experience was not a happy one. For repeatedly forgetting his "place" in "polite society" he suffered one insult after another. He harbored ever after an abiding hatred for an hereditary aristocracy.

By the time he was licensed to preach in 1798 Mill had apparently begun to lose his faith and had by the early 1800s become restless and disillusioned. In 1802, at age twenty-nine, he left for London in hopes of improving his situation. For some years thereafter he worked as an independent author, journalist and editor. From 1802 until his appointment as an assistant examiner of correspondence at the East India Company in 1819 Mill's literary labors were prodigious. Besides some 1,400 editorials, he wrote hundreds of substantial articles and reviews, as well as several books, including his History of British India in three large volumes. Although some of these were doubtless labors of love, most were labors of necessity, for Mill had to support himself and his wife Harriet, whom he married in 1805, and a fast-growing family. The first of his nine children, born in 1806, was named John Stuart in honor of his father's Scottish patron.

2. Alliance with Bentham

In late 1807 or early 1808 James Mill met Jeremy Bentham, with whom he soon formed a political and philosophical alliance. The two were in some respects kindred spirits. Both wished and worked for religious toleration and legal reform; both favored freedom of speech and press; both feared that the failure to reform the British political system — by, among other things, eliminating rotten boroughs and extending the franchise — would give rise to reactionary intransigence on the one hand, and revolutionary excess on the other. But the two men were of vastly different temperaments and backgrounds. Bentham, a wealthy bachelor, was an eccentric genius and closet philosopher. The poor, harried and hard-working Mill was the more practical and worldly partner in that peculiar partnership. He was also a much clearer writer and more persuasive propagandist for the Utilitarian cause.

Bentham believed that the pursuit of pleasure and the avoidance of pain were the twin aims of all human action. His philosophy, Utilitarianism, held that self-interest — understood as pleasure or happiness — should be "maximized" and pain "minimized" (Bentham, incidentally, coined both terms). And, as with individual self-interest, so too with the public interest. According to Bentham, the aim of legislation and public policy was to promote "the greatest happiness of the greatest number." Mill agreed, after a fashion. Formerly a dour Scots Presbyterian and still something of a Platonist, he took a dim view of unalloyed hedonism. Like Plato, he ranked the pleasures in a hierarchy, with the sensual pleasures subordinated to the intellectual ones.

Despite their differences, Mill proved to be Bentham's most valuable ally. A better writer and abler advocate, Mill helped to make Bentham's ideas and schemes more palatable and popular than they might otherwise have been. But he also influenced Bentham's ideas in a number of ways. For one, Mill led Bentham to appreciate the importance of economic factors in explaining and changing social life and political institutions; for another, he turned Bentham away from advocating aristocratic "top-down" reform into a more popular or "democratic" direction. For a time their partnership proved fruitful. With Mill's energy and Bentham's ideas and financial backing, Utilitarian schemes for legal, political, penal, and educational reform gained an ever wider audience and circle of adherents. This circle included, among others, Francis Place ("the radical tailor of Charing Cross"), the Genevan Etienne Dumont, the historian George Grote, the stockbroker-turned-economist David Ricardo, and — certainly not least — the young John Stuart Mill. Each in his own way enlisted in the Utilitarian cause. The cause was furthered by the founding of the Society for the Diffusion of Useful Knowledge and, later, by the launching of the Westminster Review and the founding of University College London (where Bentham's body, stuffed and mounted in a glass case, can still be seen today). This small band of "philosophic radicals" worked tirelessly for political changes, several of which were later incorporated into the Reform Act of 1832. But Bentham and Mill became increasingly estranged. Bentham was irascible and difficult to work with, and Mill on more than one occasion swallowed his pride by accepting financial support and suffering personal rebuke from his senior partner.

In 1818, after twelve years' work, Mill's massive History of British India was published. Early in the following year he was appointed Assistant Examiner at the East India Company. His financial future finally secured, Mill no longer needed Bentham's largesse. The two men saw less and less of each other. Their political alliance continued even as their personal relationship cooled. Their uneasy friendship effectively ended some years before Bentham's death in 1832.

Besides being a tireless reformer and prolific writer, James Mill supplied his son John with one of the most strenuous educations ever recorded in the annals of pedagogy. The elder Mill gave young John daily lessons in Latin, Greek, French, history, philosophy, and political economy. Literature and poetry were also taught, although with less enthusiasm (James Mill, like Plato, distrusted poets and poetry). John was in turn expected to tutor his younger brothers and sisters in these subjects. Each was examined rigorously and regularly by their unforgiving father, and the nine children, like their mother, lived with in fear of his rebuke. As John Stuart Mill later wrote, "I … grew up in the absence of love and in the presence of fear" (J.S. Mill 1969, 33).

Mill's strained relations with his wife and children stand in stark contrast with his warm and cordial relations with others, and most especially the young men who sought him out for the pleasure of his company and the vigor of his conversation. As John Black, the editor of the Morning Chronicle, recalled on the occasion of Mill's death in 1836:

Mr. Mill was eloquent and impressive in conversation. He had a great command of language, which bore the stamp of his earnest and energetic character. Young men were particularly fond of his society ... No man could enjoy his society without catching a portion of his elevated enthusiasm … His conversation was so energetic and complete in thought, so succinct, and exact … in expression, that, if reported as uttered, his colloquial observations or arguments would have been perfect compositions (quoted in Bain 1882, 457).

Unfortunately the same cannot be said of Mill's writings, which tend to be both dry and didactic.

3. Mill's Writings

James Mill always attempted to write, he said, with "manly plainness," and in that endeavor he certainly succeeded. The reader is never at a loss to know just what his views are or where his sympathies lie. Mill's manly plainness is especially evident in his massive 3-volume History of British India, which begins with a remarkable preface in which he asserts that his objectivity is guaranteed by the fact that he has never visited India. His is, he says, a "critical, or judging history," and his judgments on Hindu customs and practices are particularly harsh (Mill 1818, I, x). He denounces their "rude" and "backward" culture for its cultivation of ignorance and its veneration of superstition, and leaves no doubt that he favors a strong dose of Utilitarian rationalism as an antidote. Although his History is in part a Utilitarian treatise and in part a defense of British intervention in Indian affairs, it is more than the sum of those two parts. Mill's History shows, perhaps more clearly than any of his other works, the continuing influence of his Scottish education. The criteria according to which Mill judges and criticizes Indian practices and customs derive from the view of historical progress that he had learned from Dugald Stewart and John Millar, amongst others. According to this view "man is a progressive being" and education is the chief engine of progress. And this in turn helps to explain not only Mill's harsh judgments on the Hindus but his continually reiterated emphasis on education (Mill 1992, 139-84).

Virtually everything that James Mill ever wrote had a pedagogical purpose. He was a relentlessly didactic writer whose most important essays — Government, in particular — take the form of clipped, concise, deductive arguments. It is a style which his contemporaries either admired or detested, as can be seen for instance in F. D. Maurice's novel Eustace Conway. When the Benthamite Morton discovers Eustace reading Mill's Essay on Government, he asks his opinion of Mill. Eustace replies:

"I think him nearly the most wonderful prose-writer in our language."

"That do not I," says Morton. "I approve the matter of his treatises exceedingly, but the style seems to me detestable."

"Oh!," says Eustace, "I cannot separate matter and style ... My reason for delighting in this book is, that it gives such a fixedness and reality to all that was most vaguely brilliant in my speculations — it converts dreams into demonstrations" (quoted in Thomas 1969, 255-56).

Many of Mill's readers were not so gentle. Thomas Babington Macaulay criticized Mill and his fellow Utilitarians for "affect[ing] a quakerly plainness, or rather a cynical negligence and impurity of style." In so doing,

they surrender their understandings ... to the meanest and most abject sophisms, provided those sophisms come before them disguised with the externals of demonstration. They do not seem to know that logic has its illusions as well as rhetoric, — that a fallacy may lurk in a syllogism as well as in a metaphor (Macaulay 1992, 272-73).

But if Mill's style of reasoning and writing was plain and unadorned, it was at least clear and cogent. And that, surely, is a virtue too often lacking among political theorists.

And indeed James Mill regarded himself as a theorist, which was, for him, a title to be worn proudly. Theory, he wrote, gives a "commanding view" of its subject and serves as a guide for improving practice. Theory precedes practice or "experience" and is not simply derived from it. Amidst the often contradictory welter of appearance, theory functions a priori, serving as a reliable weather vane and guide (Mill 1992, 141). This view of theory is much in evidence in all his writings, and in his political essays in particular. The most important of these — and the most controversial — is Government.

4. The Essay on Government

Whether justly or not, Mill's modern reputation as a political theorist rests on a single essay. The Essay on Government, Mill later wrote, was meant to serve as a "comprehensive outline" or "skeleton map" with whose aid one could find one's way across the vast, varied, and ofttimes confusing and dangerous terrain of politics (Mill 1820). Government, Mill maintains, is merely a means to an end, viz. the happiness of the whole community and the individuals composing it. We should begin by assuming that every human being is motivated by a desire to experience pleasure and to avoid pain. Pleasures and pains come from two sources, our fellow human beings and nature. Government is concerned directly with the first and indirectly with the second: "Its business is to increase to the utmost the pleasures, and diminish to the utmost the pains, which men derive from one another." Yet, "the primary cause of government" is to be found in nature itself, since humans must wrest from nature "the scanty materials of happiness" (Mill 1992, 4-5). Nature and human nature combine to make government necessary. It is man's nature not only to desire happiness but to satisfy that desire by investing as little effort as possible. Labor being the means of obtaining happiness, and our own labor being painful to us, we will, if permitted, live off the labor of others. To the degree that others enjoy the fruits of my labor, my primary incentive for working — namely my own happiness — is diminished if not destroyed.

Therefore, Mill continues, the primary problem in designing workable political institutions is to maximize the happiness of the community by minimizing the extent to which some of its members may encroach upon, and enjoy, the fruits of other people's labor. This cannot happen, Mill maintains, in a monarchy (wherein a single ruler exploits his subjects) or in an aristocracy (wherein a ruling elite exploits the common people). Nor can communal happiness be maximized in a direct democracy, since the time and effort required for ruling would be subtracted from that available for engaging in productive labor (Mill 1992, 7-9). The only system that serves as a means to the end of individual and communal happiness is representative democracy, wherein citizens elect representatives to deliberate and legislate on their behalf and in their interest. The problem immediately arises, however, as to how representatives can be made to rule on the people's behalf rather than their own. Mill's answer is that frequent elections and short terms in office make it unlikely that elected representatives will legislate only for their own benefit. After all, representatives are drawn from the ranks of the people to which they can, after their term in office ends, expect to return. Given what we might nowadays call the incentive structure of representative government, representatives have every reason to promote the people's interests instead of their own. Indeed, in a properly structured system, there will be an "identity of interests" between representatives and the electorate (Mill 1992, 22).

5. Mill on Representation

Mill's views on representation stand mid-way between two opposing views. On the one side are Jean-Jacques Rousseau and other "participatory" theorists who argue that to allow anyone to represent you or your interests is tantamount to forfeiting your liberty. On the other side are assorted Whig defenders of "virtual representation" — including Edmund Burke and, later, Mill's contemporaries Sir James Mackintosh and T. B. Macaulay — who contend that representatives elected by the few may best represent the interests of the many. On their view, one need not have a voice — or a vote — to be well represented in Parliament.

Against Rousseau and other opponents of representation tout court Mill maintains that representative government is "the grand discovery of modern times," inasmuch as it allows the interests of the many to be represented efficiently and expeditiously by the few — so long, that is, as the many have the vote in order to register their views and can moreover hold the few strictly accountable for their actions while in office. Properly structured, such a system serves to enhance liberty, since it frees most people from the burdensome and time-consuming business of governing, thereby allowing them to get on with their more productive individual pursuits and, most especially, their productive labors (Mill 1992, 21).

But it was against Whigs who defended "virtual representation" and advocated slow and piecemeal reform of the representative system that Mill's main arguments were directed. He holds that the very idea of virtual representation is a recipe for misgovernment, corruption, and the triumph of the aristocratic or "sinister interests" of the few at the expense of the many. The public interest can be represented only in so far as the public, or a considerably enlarged portion thereof, has the vote. Mill is a radical individualist in that he insists that each person is the best, perhaps indeed the only, judge of what his own interests are. And if — as he also insists — the public interest is the sum of all individual non-sinister interests, it follows that the wider the franchise, the more truly representative the government. Mill deems Whig defenses of a greatly restricted franchise and virtual representation to be arguments against representative government itself.

6. The Meritocratic "Middle Rank"

Mill's view that each individual is the best judge of his own interests appears to stand in stark contrast with his praise and apparent privileging of one particular collectivity — the "middle rank, … that intelligent, that virtuous rank … which gives to science, to art, and to legislation itself, their most distinguished ornaments, and is the chief source of all that has exalted and refined human nature…" It is to this middle rank — the forerunner of the modern "meritocracy" — that common laborers look for advice and guidance, especially in moral and political matters (Mill 1992, 41-42). Although such remarks have struck many modern commentators as a militant defense of middle class power and privilege, it is, in fact, nothing of the sort. Mill rarely uses the phrase "middle class," preferring instead the more archaic "middle rank." And this, once again, underscores the continuing importance of Mill's Scottish education. The notion of "ranks," as analyzed at length in John Millar's Origin of the Distinction of Ranks (1806), had left a deep impression. Millar's (and Mill's) "ranks" are not (quite) "classes" in our modern sense — that is, purely descriptive, fairly distinct, and normatively neutral socio-economic entities — but are instead meant to pick out people of particular intellectual merit and to mark gradations of moral and civic influence.

Mill is quite careful to distinguish between a "class" and a "rank." The members of a "class" are united by shared (and usually selfish or "sinister") interests. Members of the "middle rank," by contrast, are marked more by their education, intellect, and public-spiritedness than by their wealth or any other social or economic characteristics. They are "universally described as both the most wise and the most virtuous part of the community which" — Mill adds acidulously — "is not the Aristocratical [class]" (Mill 1992, 41). Members of the middle rank owe their position not to accident of birth but to "the present state of education, and the diffusion of knowledge" among those anxious to acquire it. By these lights the "radical tailor" Francis Place, the stockbroker David Ricardo, the wealthy philanthropist Jeremy Bentham, the Quaker editor William Allen, and even James Mill himself — although not all "middle class" by modern standards — belonged to the esteemed middle rank. Clearly, then, the idea of a middle rank cuts across the kinds of class divisions with which we are familiar today. Hence any attempt to classify Mill as an apologist for "the middle-class" simpliciter is anachronistic and rather wide of the mark. He is instead an early defender, avant la lettre, of the idea of a meritocracy whose members are drawn from all classes and walks of life.

7. The Reception of Government

The idea that Mill was an apologist for middle-class interests was, of course, a later development. But what of his contemporaries' views of the Essay on Government? For so short an essay, Mill's Government proved to be remarkably controversial in his own day. Tories and Whigs thought its message wildly and even dangerously democratic, while many of Mill's fellow Utilitarians — including Bentham, John Stuart Mill, and William Thompson — believed that he did not go nearly far enough in advocating an extension of the franchise. Although more "democratic" in private discussion, Mill publicly advocated extending the franchise to include all male heads of household over the age of forty, leaving them to speak for and represent the interests of younger men and all women:

One thing is pretty clear, that all those individuals whose interests are indisputably included in those of other individuals, may be struck off without inconvenience. In this light may be viewed all children, up to a certain age, whose interests are involved in those of their parents. In this light, also, women may be regarded, the interest of almost all of whom is involved either in that of their fathers or in that of their husbands (Mill 1992, 27).

This, his eldest son later remarked, was "the worst [paragraph] he ever wrote" (J.S. Mill 1961, 98). Most of Mill's critics were quick to seize upon it, if only because its conclusion contradicts two of Mill's oft-stated premises, namely that each of us is the best judge of our own interests and that anyone having unchecked power is bound to abuse it. As William Thompson argued in Appeal of One Half the Human Race (1825), Mill's premises pointed to the widest possible extension of the franchise, and not to the exclusion of "one half the human race," viz. all women.

8. Other Related Writings

Although none of Mill's other essays — save, perhaps, "The Church, and Its Reform" (1835) — proved so controversial, each expands upon points made in passing in the Essay on Government. Jurisprudence deals extensively with rights — what they are, by whom they are defined, and how they are best protected. In a similar vein and in a way that anticipates (and arguably influenced) the younger Mill's On Liberty (1859) Liberty of the Press defends the right of free speech and discussion against arguments in favor of restriction and censorship. Free government requires the free communication of ideas and opinions, and good government requires an informed and critical citizenry. For both, a free press is an indispensable instrument.

Another of Mill's essays, Education, outlines and anticipates the main themes of his Analysis of the Phenomena of the Human Mind, Mill's most comprehensive inquiry into what his son would later call "ethology, or the science of character formation" (A System of Logic, Book VI). In Education Mill describes the conditions most conducive to creating good men and, more particularly, good citizens. Civic or "political education," he says, is "the key-stone of the arch; the strength of the whole depends upon it" (Mill 1992, 93). Mill was fond of quoting Helvetius's dictum l'éducation peut tout ("education makes everything possible"). And certainly no other political thinker, save perhaps Plato and Thomas Jefferson, set greater store by education than did James Mill. By "education" Mill meant not only formal schooling, but all the influences that go into forming one's character and outlook.

In Prisons and Prison Discipline Mill applies his theory of education to penal reform. Just as one's character can be well moulded by a good education, so too may one's character be badly moulded through miseducation. The latter, Mill maintains, is especially evident in the criminal class. Criminals commit crimes and are sent to prison because they have been badly educated. Punishment, properly understood, is a kind of remedial education, and prison, properly structured, presents the opportunity to re-mould inmates' misshapen characters. Prisons and Prison Discipline delineates the types of punishments likely to deter offenders or, failing that, to re-mould and re-educate criminals to be productive members of society. In these and other respects Mill's theory of punishment mirrors Plato's. Like Plato, Mill draws a sharp distinction between punishing someone and harming him. The purpose of punishment is to reform (literally re-form) the soul or character of the inmate so that he may be released into society without fear that he will harm others. But to harm someone is to make him worse, and an even greater danger to society (Ball 1995, ch. 7).

Mill envisaged a society inhabited by active citizens, always on their guard against rulers or representatives who would violate their rights and deprive them of their liberties. This, after all, is the central theme of the Essay on Government, and the thrust of the argument of Mill's article The Ballot, published in 1830 as a contribution to the public debate preceding the passage of the 1832 Reform Act. Mixing logical acuity with withering ridicule, Mill restates and refutes arguments against extending the franchise and introducing the secret ballot. Only those with sinister interests could oppose such reform.

9. Macaulay's "Famous Attack"

Always the critic, Mill was himself a frequent target of criticism, much of which came from quarters hostile to the kinds of sweeping reforms favored by Bentham and the philosophic radicals. Mill's Essay on Government first appeared in 1820, and was subsequently reprinted in editions of his Essays in 1823, 1825, and 1828, which reached an ever wider audience, including (Mill boasted) "the young men of the Cambridge Union." Fearing that the cause of moderate reform was in danger from Mill and the philosophic radicals, Whig polemicists weighed in against Mill. One of them, Sir James Mackintosh (1765, 1832), was an old Whig stalwart with a plodding and ofttimes pompous prose style. The other, T. B. Macaulay (1800–59), was a much younger and altogether more formidable foe.

Macaulay's "Mill on Government," published in the March 1829 issue of The Edinburgh Review, is a remarkable mixture of logical criticism, irony, mordant wit, and droll parody. That Mill's Essay on Government is remembered at all today doubtless owes something to Macaulay's memorable critique. The most remarkable feature of Macaulay's critique is that it seems to be largely aloof from particular political issues, focusing instead on what we would nowadays call methodological matters. Against his older adversary the twenty-eight-year-old Macaulay defends the "historical" or "inductive" approach to the study of politics against Mill's abstract, ahistorical, and "deductive" method. Macaulay maintains that we learn more from "experience" than from "theory," and had best beware of the simplifications and "sophisms" to be found in Mill's Essay on Government. The most pernicious of these is the "law" that men act always on the basis of self-interest. This law, Macaulay counters, is either trivially true (because logically circular) or patently false; in either case it hardly suffices as a foundation upon which to erect an argument for radical reform, much less a comprehensive theory of politics. And if Mill's deductive logic fails, the entire edifice — including his supposedly "scientific" arguments in favor of radical reform — collapses with it (Macaulay 1992).

That James Mill, fierce polemicist that he was, did not respond quickly and with no holds barred seems surprising, to say the least. His eldest son offers one possible explanation. In his Autobiography J. S. Mill remarks that "I was not at all satisfied with the mode in which my father met the criticisms of Macaulay. He did not, as I thought he ought to have done, justify himself by saying, ‘I was not writing a scientific treatise on polities. I was writing an article for parliamentary reform’. He treated Macaulay's argument as simply irrational; an attack upon the reasoning faculty; an example of the saying of Hobbes, that when reason is against a man, a man will be against reason (J.S. Mill 1969, 95)."

Yet the younger Mill's account of his father's reaction to Macaulay's "famous attack" (as the son later described it) is misleading in at least two respects. In the first place, James Mill did not, and given his own premises could not, distinguish between a "scientific treatise on politics" and a coherent and compelling argument for "parliamentary reform." For he believed that any reforms that were workable and worth having could be based only on an adequately scientific theory of politics. The Essay on Government was intended to be both, if only in brief outline. Moreover, the younger Mill leaves the impression that his father, although angered by the attack, never replied to Macaulay. But this is untrue.

For a time James Mill tried, without success, to persuade his friend and fellow Benthamite Etienne Dumont to reply to "the curly-headed coxcomb, who only abuses what he does not understand" (Mill to Dumont, 1829b). In the meantime there appeared Sir James Mackintosh's Dissertation on Ethical Philosophy (1830) in which Mill's Essay on Government was singled out for special censure. There was nothing new in this; but what caught Mill's eye was that Mackintosh's mode and manner of argument was borrowed, as the author acknowledged, from "the writer of a late criticism on Mr. Mill's Essay. — See Edinburgh Review, No. 97, March 1829." "This," says Mill with evident relish, "is convenient; because the answer, which does for Sir James, will answer the same purpose with the Edinburgh Review" (Mill 1992, 305). Of course, the "writer of a late criticism" to whom Mackintosh refers was none other than Macaulay, whom the elder Mill then proceeds to answer in the guise of replying to Mackintosh.

In his reply Mill reiterates and defends the arguments advanced in his Essay on Government: all men — including rulers and representatives — are moved mainly if not exclusively by considerations of self-interest, and therefore the only security for good government is to be found in making the interests of representatives identical with those of their constituents. But, unlike the cool, detached, and ostensibly deductive Essay on Government, Mill's reply contains a good deal of vitriol. He writes like a schoolmaster who, having lost all patience with a slow-witted pupil, is content to ridicule him before his cleverer classmates. The sight is not a pretty one, and shows James Mill at his polemical worst. Whether, or to what extent, such a splenetic rejoinder could suffice as a refutation is surely questionable.

10. Conclusion: Mill's Legacy

In reviewing the quarrel between Mill and Macaulay today, the modern reader may well experience a sense of déjà vu, not because the question of parliamentary reform remains relevant and timely, but because the epistemological and methodological questions raised by this debate are with us still. What is the nature of political knowledge, and how is it to be obtained? What sort of "science" can "political science" aspire to be? What is the connection between political theory and the practice of politics? Mill's answers rather resemble those of modern "rational choice" theorists, and Macaulay's those of their empirically minded critics. After all, Mill maintains that any scientific theory worthy of the name must proceed from a finite set of assumptions about human nature, with the self-interest axiom at their center. From these one can deduce conclusions about the ways in which rational political actors will (or at any rate ought to) behave. Macaulay, by contrast, claims that people act for all sorts of reasons, including — but by no means limited to — considerations of self-interest.

Mill's Essay on Government — and Macaulay's attack — earned for its author an unenviable reputation as an egregious simplifier of complex matters. Yet Mill remained unrepentant since such simplification was, in his view, the very purpose and point of theorizing. After all, to theorize is to simplify. But, as his critics were quick to note, it is one thing to simplify and quite another to oversimplify. In a modern echo of Macaulay's estimate, Joseph Schumpeter contrasts Mill's "monumental, and indeed path-breaking, History of British India" with the Essay on Government, which "can be described only as unrelieved nonsense" because of its simplistic assumptions and its equally simplistic conclusions (Schumpeter 1954, 254). A more charitable estimate is provided by Brian Barry. Barry observes:

The results [of Mill's reasoning] may appear somewhat crude, and yet it seems to me a serious question whether James Mill's political theory is any more of an oversimplification than, say, Ricardo's economics. The difference is, of course, that Ricardo's ideas were refined by subsequent theorists, whereas James Mill's Essay on Government had no successors until the last decade or so (Barry 1970, 11).

These successors, on Barry's telling, include such rational choice theorists as Mancur Olson and Anthony Downs, amongst others. Alan Ryan concurs. Although "an eminently dislikable document," Ryan writes, Mill's Essay on Government "has virtues that ought not to be neglected." One of these is that it "stands at the head of a line of thought extending down to Joseph Schumpeter and Anthony Downs, a line of thought that provides many of the explicit or implicit assumptions with the aid of which we still practice political science" (Ryan 1972, 82-83).

Although right in one respect, Barry's and Ryan's reassessments are rather wide of the mark in another. It is true that there is, methodologically speaking, a family resemblance between Mill's axiomatic deductive reasoning in Government and, say, Anthony Downs's An Economic Theory of Democracy (1957). But it is important to note that Mill, unlike Downs and other ostensible successors of the rational choice school, was never content to interpret interests as wants, desires or "revealed preferences." On the contrary, Mill was concerned with distinguishing between sinister and non-sinister interests, supplying causal explanations of their origins and development, rendering judgments about them, and attempting to alter the conditions that shape (or more often misshape) men's and women's characters. Hence his abiding interest in law, education, punishment, penology, psychology, and other avenues of "character-formation." Mill's aims were not only explanatory but critical, educative, and, by his lights, emancipatory. The point of almost everything he wrote — from his massive "critical, or judging" History of British India to the shortest essay — was, to borrow a phrase from Marx, not merely to understand the world but to change it. Not for Mill the vaunted "value-neutrality" of modern social and political science.


Primary sources

Mill's works

Other primary sources

Secondary sources

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Bentham, Jeremy | consequentialism | democracy | liberalism | Mill, John Stuart | Scottish Philosophy: in the 18th Century