Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Transitional Justice

First published Mon Jan 26, 2009

Once violent conflict between two groups has subsided, what is the best way to make a transition to civil society? Do former enemies need to ‘come to terms with their past’ if they are to live peacefully? If such a reckoning is required, what are the strategies of transition available to the parties?

The field of transitional justice, which takes up such questions, involves the philosophical, legal and political investigation of the aftermath of war. This entry will provide an introduction to the central problems animating this new field. I will do so by examining the history and difficulties associated with the operation of the two most important transitional policies: war crime tribunals and truth commissions[1]. We will consider, among others questions, the tension between a desire for calm after war and the importance of putting human rights violators on trial, the need, as part of a political transition, to create a reliable historical record of past abuses, the promise and limitations of international criminal law and the coherence of forgiveness in politics.

Part 1 examines the difficulties associated with war crime tribunals. Part 2 concentrates on the dilemmas involved in the operation of truth commissions. Part 3 considers the possibility of forgetting as a response to mass atrocity.

1. War Crime Tribunals

1.1 Historical Background

The 20th century's most famous and probably most significant war crime trials were held in Nuremberg, Germany after the end of World War II[2]. Between 1945-1949 the United States and its allies held a series of 13 trials. The first, and most famous of these, involved the prosecution of senior surviving Nazi officials including Hermann Göring, Joachim von Ribbentrop, Julius Streicher, Rudolf Hess and Albert Speer. Defendants in the other 12 trials, which took place between 1946-1949, included doctors, jurists, industrials, and other key stake holders in the Nazi state.

Initially it was not clear that the allies would put their defeated enemies on trial at all. The creation of the first Nuremberg Tribunal was preceded by a long debate, especially fierce in the United States. Hard liners, represented most vocally by American Secretary of the Treasury, Henry Morgenthau Jr., advocated the summary execution or forced removal of the entire Nazi chain of command and the destruction of Germany's industrial capacities. On the other hand, Legalists, led by Secretary of War Henry Stimson, insisted on affording the Nazis fair trials that would honor American procedural protections. The United States fought the war in defense of political freedom, the Legalists insisted. Such freedom depends on upholding the ideals of the rule of law. These ideals, in turn, require the individualization of guilt and giving defendants a fair chance to answer the charges against them. Germany, Stimson warned, must not be punished en-masse; such collective punishment would only serve to increase resentment and may well plant the seeds for another war. Instead, the careful and fair employment of the courts would allow the Germans to “internalize” their guilt. As Stimson put it: “…punishment is for the purpose of prevention and not for vengeance. An element in prevention is to secure in the person punished the conviction of guilt[3].”

On November 21st, 1945 Robert H. Jackson, Chief of Counsel for the United States at Nuremberg, began the case for the prosecution with the following, now iconic words: “The privilege of opening the first trial in history for crimes against the peace of the world imposes a grave responsibility. The wrongs which we seek to condemn and punish have been so calculated, so malignant, and so devastating, that civilization cannot tolerate their being ignored, because it cannot survive their being repeated. That four great nations, flushed with victory and stung with injury stay the hand of vengeance and voluntarily submit their captive enemies to the judgment of the law is one of the most significant tributes that Power has ever paid to Reason[4]”.

The prosecution team at Nuremberg had originally planned to concentrate on charges of aggressive war rather than on Germany's wholesale destruction of Europe's Jews. Much of the initial legal work revolved around the creation of a jurisprudence of conspiracy that would allow the conviction of the entire Nazi leadership. But the liberation of the Dachau and Bergen-Belsen concentration camps, and the horrific evidence discovered there, left the allies with little choice but to incorporate charges of crimes against humanity into their trial strategy (Bass 2002, 180).

The defendants' complaints about “victors' justice” and the retroactivity of the charges not withstanding (more on this to follow), the Nuremberg trials still stand out as “legalism's greatest moment of glory” (Bass 2002, 203). In spite of intense political pressure by Stalin, Churchill, and powerful figures inside the United States to dispense with trials all together, and in spite of the unprecedented nature and magnitude of the crimes, the judges at Nuremberg presided over a remarkably cool and orderly procedure. For the first time in history, senior political leaders were indicted and tried for “crimes against humanity”. The tribunals also established important principles of international justice, such as the responsibility of heads of state, the rejection of the infamous “I was just following orders” excuse, the weakening of retroactivity as a defense against crimes of mass atrocity, and the right of war criminals to a fair trial[5]. In addition to these important legal achievements, Nuremberg also established the trial as an invaluable instrument for creating a credible, lasting historical record of human rights abuses.

The Nuremberg trials were succeeded, in the spring of 1946, by the Military Tribunal for the Far East held in Tokyo. 28 Members of Japan's military and political leadership, including former Prime Ministers, War and Navy Secretaries, generals, diplomats and some economic luminaries were indicted for crimes against the peace.. Twenty-five of the defendants were convicted. Seven were executed, and the remaining 18 received prison sentences ranging between 7 years and a life sentence.

The Tokyo proceedings never achieved the prominence of the Nuremberg tribunals. Explanations for their relative obscurity include the unavailability of some of the trial records, the fact that the perpetrators were not household names in the west, and the allies' embarrassment about disagreements between the judges on using the death sentence, and on the fairness of the proceedings[6].

In spite of the ambitious standards of accountability for mass atrocity set at Nuremberg and Tokyo, the actual practice of international criminal justice went into a prolonged lull once the cold war had begun. The sharp ideological differences between the superpowers made the cosmopolitan ideals underlying such trials less relevant. Concerned that war crime prosecutions would become one more arena for political conflict, neither the Americans nor the Russians pursued them. The lull ended with the cold war, and the first significant war tribunals thereafter were established by the United Nations in the 1990's—the ad hoc tribunal for the former Yugoslavia at The Hague (ICTY), in 1993, and the ad hoc tribunal for Rwanda in Tanzania (ICTR), in 1995.

The ICTY got off to a rocky start. Financial resources were initially so meager that the court could not afford to pay more than a few months worth of rent and salaries (Bass 2002, Ch. 6). But in recent years, the tribunal has come into its own. While the historic trial of Slobodan Milosevic could not be completed because of the defendant's death, the ICTY has recently indicted the first President of Republika Srpska, Radovan Kardzic, and is said to be closing in on the military mastermind of the siege of Sarajevo and the Srebrenica massacre, Ratko Mladic. Biljana Plavsic, another former President of Republika Srpska, was convicted of war crimes in 2002. The court's annual budget is now upwards of $310 million and it employs more than 1,100 people from 82 countries.

The ICTR, located in Arusha, Tanzania can also boast substantial achievements. The court has issued the first ever genocide conviction by an international tribunal, as well as the first conviction in which rape was considered a crime of war. Given the massive domestic prosecution of génocidaires by the Rwandan authorities, the ICTR has primarily focused on the indictment of “big fish”—senior level suspects involved in the design and planning of the genocide. These indictments have resulted in genocide convictions of Rwanda's former Prime Minister, Jean Kambanda, and quite a few cabinet members.

In addition to securing significant convictions and setting legal precedents for the practice of international humanitarian law, the ICTY and ICTR were also successful in creating detailed records of atrocities. In this, both tribunals continued the legacy of the Nuremberg tribunals, which, as mentioned earlier, aimed not merely at the conviction of the guilty but also at reliably documenting the horrors for posterity[7].

A complaint consistently made against the ICTY and the ICTR has been that these tribunals do not operate on the sites where the crimes being investigated took place. This fact, so the criticism goes, creates a disconnect between the people who suffered throughout the war and the process in which their suffering is addressed. The attempt to address such criticisms has resulted in the creation of a rather innovative form of international justice—the Internationalized or Hybrid Courts. These bodies, which have been operating in Bosnia Herzegovina (since 2005), Kosovo (since 2000), Cambodia (since 2003), Sierra Leone (since 2002), East Timor (between 1999-2005) and Lebanon (since 2007), employ both international and local jurists and adjudicate on the basis of a mixture of national and international law[8].

Perhaps the most significant development in international criminal justice since the Nuremberg trials has been the establishment, by the Rome treaty in 1998, of the permanent International Criminal Court (ICC) in The Hague. The court has jurisdiction over serious crimes (genocide, crimes against humanity, aggression) committed after July 1st 2002, by a national of one of the states that are party to the Rome treaty. It also has jurisdiction over crimes committed on the territory of such state parties, or when the UN Security Council refers a specific case to it. The UN Security Council is authorized not only to refer cases to the court but also to ask its prosecutor to suspend proceedings.

Importantly, the court's authority is residuary: it acts only if member nations cannot or will not.

Most of the cases before the ICC involve ongoing conflicts. This has required the establishment of field offices in order to assist in investigations and the collection of evidence, as well as to conduct outreach operations to local populations. While there are immense practical difficulties in gathering evidence and enforcing arrest warrants in active war zones, senior ICC officials have claimed that their real time involvement has increased deterrence. [9]

So far the ICC has taken up cases of war crimes committed in Uganda, the Congo and the Central African Republic. All three countries have referred these cases themselves. In addition, The United Nations Security Council has referred the case of Sudan, which is not a party to the Rome treaty. After conducting an investigation into the referral, the court's prosecutor has recently issued an indictment against Sudan's President, Omar al-Bashir[10].

One of the most innovative features of the ICC is the fact that it gives a significant role to victims in its proceedings. Victims can send information directly to the court's prosecutor, they can request the opening of a preliminary investigation, they can appear before the court's pre-trial chamber when it deliberates on whether to open a full blown investigation into a case, and, most significantly, they can ask to present their position during the trial itself. Article 68 (3) of the ICC Statute reads: “where the personal interests of the victims are affected, the Court shall permit their views and concerns to be presented and considered at stages of the proceedings determined to be appropriate by the Court and in a manner which is not prejudicial to or inconsistent with the rights of the accused to a fair and impartial trial. Such views and concerns may be presented by the legal representatives of the victims where the Court considers it appropriate, in accordance with the Rules of Procedure and Evidence”[11]. The exact jurisprudence regulating victims' involvement is still being developed. Yet, it is already clear that the Rome statute gives them a far greater role in the international criminal process than they have had under traditional tribunals.

1.2 Criticisms of war crime tribunals

The employment of war crime tribunals has always been controversial. In what follows some of the central criticisms of such trials are examined. We will focus on substantial rather than technical concerns. By “technical concerns” is understood the lack of resources, the reluctance of the international community to provide material assistance (in direct funds or in apprehension of suspects), the ability of defendants to destroy evidence, the deplorable condition of the legal class in war torn countries, and problems of translation and common language. While these certainly are significant obstacles (as it was pointed out earlier, the operation of the ICTY was almost undermined by such difficulties), they do not challenge the rationale for using trials. The objections taken up here, on the other hand, represent concerns that call into question the coherence and fairness of the criminal courts as instruments of political transition.

1.2.1 Victor's Justice

According to some critics, post war tribunals, far from expressing a commitment to the rule of law, are merely a charade in which winners punish losers for the damage and suffering the war brought about. This kind of cynicism about doing justice after war (and about the role of justice in politics more generally) has ancient roots. In his History of the Peloponnesian War, Thucydides (B.5 Ch.17) imagines one of the Athenian generals offering a sobering reality check to a Melian politician who does not understand why Athens must conquer his tiny, politically neutral island: “we both alike know that in the discussion of human affairs the question of justice only enters where there is equal power to enforce it, and that the powerful exact what they can, and the weak grant what they must.” Hermann Göring made a similar observation in a conversation with Nuremberg's prison psychiatrist: “the victor will always be the judge, and the vanquished the accused.” (Bass 2002, 8).

The claim of victor's justice is difficult to dismiss[12]. After all, had the Allies lost the war, many of their senior military and political leaders would have gone on trial for the firebombing of Japanese and German cities. Curtis LeMay and Robert McNamara have publicly admitted as much[13]. And yet it is worthwhile noting, with Gary Bass, that there is a distinction between the circumstances under which a tribunal is created and how decently and fairly it operates. In other words, a tribunal that was set up after victory in order to punish the side that lost, might still either succeed or fail to follow fair procedures. And in so far as this is true, the retribution of some victors may be preferable to that of others. As Bass writes: “it is victory that makes justice possible but the fairness of the process is what makes it justice.” (Bass 2002, 329) And, he adds, even though we may be cynical about the fact that Americans are putting Germans on trial after they have defeated them, most of us, if given a hypothetical choice, would still prefer to be tried by an American rather than a Nazi court, because we assume it would be fairer.[14] Simply imagine the kind of charges the Nazis would bring against their defeated enemies: most likely, they would have not sufficed with indicting the allies for the firebombing of German and Japanese cities; they might also have charged then with protecting Jews or with miscegenation, and perhaps punished them severely for these charges. While an indictment for firebombing would have been substantially sound, the latter accusations would have been based, exclusively, on the Nazis warped racial theories. In other words, some victors' justice can be substantively flawed. Here, then, is the main advantage of allied over Nazi victor's justice: the Americans and their partners prosecuted their defeated enemies for crimes that really were crimes[15].

1.2.2 Retroactivity

A second important criticism of post war trials is that they hold defendants responsible for acts that were not prohibited at the time they were committed.

Many of the Nazi defendants at Nuremberg argued that no existing laws or international standards banned their conduct during the war. Consequently, they argued, there can be no legal basis for prosecuting them. Such claims are based on a fundamental precept of the rule of law: Nullum Crimen, Nulla Poena Sine Lege (no crime, no punishment without a legal prohibition). The main strategy used to counter these arguments at Nuremberg was “positivistic”: prosecutors strained to find sources in existing international law that did forbid aggressive war, and then moved to associate many of the other crimes for which the Nazis were accused with the waging of such war.(Minow 1998, 33) A related difficulty arose when the prosecution looked for a legal doctrine that would allow them to convict a large group of people for belonging to the Nazi war machine. Here, too, a creative positivistic solution was found: One of Stimson's aids, colonel Murray Bernays, devised the idea that the Nazis would be tried as part of a criminal conspiracy. The advantage of such a strategy was that it required nothing more than the conviction of specific organizations of the charges (the SA, SS, Gestapo among others) in order to hold all their members responsible. As Bass puts it: “once these organizations had been convicted, any member of them could be swiftly punished: instead of proving individual guilt… [prosecutors] would only have to provide that the defendant had been a member of a criminal group activities” (Bass 2002, 171)[16]

The severity of the problem of retroactivity decreased after the Nuremberg tribunal established the precedent that there was no need for a highly specific prohibition in order to be held responsible before an international criminal court. And yet, the tribunals for Yugoslavia and Rwanda still faced some problems of retroactivity when it came to deciding whether ethnic cleansing constituted genocide and what kind of intent was required for a genocide conviction. (Minow 1998, 34-35)

While prosecutors in Nuremberg settled on a positivistic strategy for countering the claims of retroactivity made by the defendants, another possibility for rejecting such arguments should be mentioned. This alternative is based in the “natural law” tradition. On this view, the response the Nazi defendants should have been given is, quite simply, that there are things that one does not do, or can expect severe punishment for doing, whether they are explicitly forbidden or not. Whether such severe actions defy “the moral law” to use the somewhat antiquated language of the classical natural lawyers, or whether they simply offend fundamental sensibilities of any civilized human being, the upshot is the same: at the extreme reaches of human behavior illegality does not necessarily depend on a prior legal prohibition. It was this kind of argument that the lead British prosecutor in Nuremberg, Hartley Shawcross, had in mind when he exclaimed in response to one of the iterations of the retroactivity complaint: “I suppose the first person ever charged with murder might have said: ‘now see here. You can't do that. Murder hasn't been made a crime yet’” (Persico 1994, 138)

1.2.3 Selectivity

A third important complaint against war crime tribunals maintains that they frequently fail to indict all of those who were involved in committing atrocities. According to this charge, courts find it easier to prosecute lower level officials and military personnel, often leaving the more senior figures who devised the violent policies (but do not have actual “blood on their hands”) untouched (Minow 1998, 40-41). To the extent that this complaint is well founded it is devastating, as it suggests that war crime tribunals do not result in a full or coherent exercise of retributive justice[17]. The principle of “Command Responsibility” (CR) originally devised at Nuremberg, and used extensively by the ICTY, has been employed, quite effectively, in order to counter complaints of selectivity. CR allows prosecutors to indict senior officials exclusively on the basis of their military or political leadership role (given the duties of supervision and control attached to that role).

Thus, the ICTY has been able to convict Serbian officers for war crimes because they did not prevent or curtail activities in which their troops were engaged. In an especially striking expansion of CR, a Bosnian Croat regional commander, Tihomir Blaskic, was convicted by the trial chamber of the ICTY of murder and other crimes against humanity, for atrocities that took place in the village of Ahmichi. The charges did not allege direct involvement or even turning a blind eye to the activities of subordinates, but, rather, focused on Blaskic's failure to investigate after the massacre was brought to his attention. His unwillingness to look into the events was equated by the court with responsibility for direct killing. In 2004 the appeals chamber of the ICTY rejected this interpretation of CR and overturned the relevant part of the conviction.

While CR can be instrumental for moving up the chain of command, it also comes into conflict with the legalistic premise underlying war crime tribunals. A criminal trial traditionally establishes individual responsibility by presenting direct evidence against the defendant. CR allows conviction and punishment based on a philosophical construct rather than on the garnering of such evidence. The construct, roughly speaking, is that certain roles come with built in accountability for the actions of others, whether or not the individual who holds the role was aware of these actions. Criminal law doctrine is, to say the least, suspicious of such a separation between intent and culpability, especially when it comes to very serious offenses (lesser offenses can be established by proving the defendant was reckless or indifferent). This tension points to a problem at the heart of international criminal law: does the unique nature of mass atrocity, wherein numerous people harm others with differing degrees of acquiescence and direction from a large bureaucratic class, really lend itself to the legalistic commitment to individualizing guilt on the basis of direct evidence? Or do the distinct features of such crimes require relaxing our standards of individual responsibility so as to implicate the entire state structure that made the atrocities possible[18]? If the latter, it may be difficult to hold fast to the justification of such trials as expressing a firm commitment to legalism and the idea of the rule of law[19].

Other significant (if less conceptually interesting) criticisms of the international criminal courts hold that they do not focus sufficiently on the suffering of victims, concentrating, instead, on establishing the guilt of perpetrators)[20], that the proceeding tend to become technical and tedious, thus trivializing the horrors being discussed,[21] that there can be a discrepancy between the (Western) cultural norms central to legalism and the local traditions of the society in which atrocities tool place[22], and that, in light of the repeated occurrence of genocide in the 20th century, the practice of international criminal law does not show great promise of deterrence[23]

2. Truth Commissions

2.1 Historical Background

The structural and political shortcomings of war crime trials, as outlined in the previous section, have led policy makers in war torn countries to turn to other measures of transitional justice. The most important among these is the non-judicial truth commission.

Priscilla Hayner (2002), in her landmark book on truth commissions enumerates four characteristics typical of these bodies: 1. They deal with the past 2. They investigate continued patterns of abuses and not specific cases 3. They operate for up to two years and then submit reports summarizing their findings and, 4.They are usually official bodies sanctioned by the state. These commissions, Hayner continues, most often have some or all of the following goals: unearthing, clarifying and formally acknowledging past abuses, responding to the needs of victims, helping create a culture of accountability, outlining institutional responsibility and possible reforms, advancing the prospects of reconciliation and reducing conflict over the past (Hayner 2002, 24).

While truth commissions have fewer coercive powers than courts (they cannot compel governments to carry out their recommendations, they have no authority to punish etc.), their mandate for investigating the broader pattern of abuses, and their tendency to put the victims at the center of their proceeding, gives these bodies a great degree of moral credibility and legitimacy.

The work of South Africa's Truth and Reconciliation Commission (hereafter TRC) has sparked a great deal of interest in the use of truth commissions after war. The celebrity of its chair, Desmond Tutu, the massive scale of the public hearings it held, the intensive media coverage, and its controversial amnesty-for-truth mechanism, generated a great deal of international curiosity. Ever since the TRC completed its hearings and published its report, nations facing a transition to democracy have consistently asked themselves whether they too should use truth commissions to confront past abuses. Some scholars even go so far as to say that the truth commission has now replaced criminal prosecution as the most important norm of international justice[24].

While the TRC has become paradigmatic of truth commissions, it is worthwhile noting that it was not the first such body. Argentina, Chile, and El Salvador all employed relatively effective truth commissions during the 1980's and early 1990's[25].

These efforts provided both inspiration and valuable lessons for the designers of the South African body[26].

In Argentina a truth commission was set up to investigate the abuses committed by the military junta during the country's “dirty war” (1976-1983). It is estimated that up to 30,000 suspected ‘subversives’ were “disappeared”—abducted, tortured and disposed of secretly—by security forces during those years. Unlike the South African TRC, the Argentinean body, officially named “National Commission on the Disappearance of Persons”, did not hold public hearings. The commission also lacked the authority and incentive structure to compel cooperation from the military. And yet, it was able to produce a substantive report. More than 7000 statements were taken, 1500 of which were given by survivors of military detention camps. The commission focused on locating and exposing military detention and torture centers. Much of the evidence it gathered was handed over to prosecutors, eventually aiding in the convictions of several high-ranking officers. The truth commission's report, titled Never Again (Nunca Mas) was published in 1984 and has become one of the best-selling books in Argentinean history.

Seven years later, Chile's National Commission on Truth and Reconciliation published a report documenting human rights abuses committed by the Chilean army during General Augusto Pinochet's 17-year reign. As in Argentina, Chile's security forces practiced routine torture, abductions and extrajudicial executions. The abuses were especially severe in the first few years of the dictatorship. In 1978 Pinochet issued a sweeping amnesty order, protecting all members of the security forces. This amnesty created a complex constitutional environment for the truth commission. The commission, chaired by former senator Raul Retting, consisted of an equal number of Pinochet supporters and critics. Its mandate was defined in relatively narrow terms, focusing on executions, disappearances and cases of torture that resulted in death (leaving out a large number of torture survivors). Like its Argentinean counterpart, the commission had no way to compel members of the security forces to testify. The Commissioners looked into 3400 cases and issued an 1800 page report in February of 1991 strongly (and, significantly, unanimously) condemning Pinochet and his generals. The impact of the report was weakened by a series of armed attacks carried out by left leaning militants shortly after its publication. In spite of the limited public attention it received at the time, the report was instrumental in creating a reparations program for the relatives of Pinochet's victims. The commission's work was also useful in providing evidence to support the Spanish extradition request that eventually led to Pinochet's arrest in Britain. Pinochet was later returned to Chile, and died before he could be convicted of any crimes.

El Salvador's truth commission was probably the least successful of the three. The commission was created to investigate abuses carried out in the course of the civil war between government forces and FMLN guerillas. According to some estimates, the 12-year war (1980-1992) claimed the lives of 75,000 citizens. As in Argentina and Chile, the military engaged in executions, torture, and abductions, in addition to large-scale massacres. The El Salvadorian commission operated for 8 months. Appointed by the Secretary General of the United Nations, its members included former Colombian President Belisario Betancur, former President of the Inter American Court of Human Rights Thomas Buergenthal, and former Minister of Foreign Affairs of Venezuela Reinaldo Figueredo Planchart. The animosity and diffidence between the former combatants was such that no Salvadorians were allowed to serve as commissioners.

The commission gathered testimony on more than 7000 cases of severe human rights violations. Its final report, titled “From Madness to Hope,” outlined a set of harsh conclusions against 40 government and military officials and stated that the vast majority of atrocities had been committed by government backed security forces (rather than by FMLN fighters). Very shortly after the report's publication, a national amnesty law was passed, rendering many of the commission's recommendations irrelevant. However, the report was helpful in shaming and eventually removing from service some of the military officials accused of especially egregious abuses.

Three years after the release of El Salvador's report, On April 15, 1996, Archibishop Desmond Tutu, the head of South Africa's Anglican Church, addressed a crowd gathered at East London's city hall. “We are charged to unearth the truth about our dark past,” he told his listeners, “and to lay the ghosts of that past to rest so that they will not return to haunt us; and that we will thereby contribute to the healing of the traumatized and the wounded—for all of us in South Africa are wounded people”(Meredith 1999,3). Thus began South Africa's controversial experiment in transitional justice[27].

As they debated how to manage the transition from apartheid, negotiators on behalf of the African National Congress (hereafter ANC) and the outgoing National Party clashed repeatedly on the question of how to address human rights abuses committed during the apartheid era. In the negotiations leading up to the 1993 interim constitution, which laid down the terms of the transition, the most contentious issue concerned the question of amnesty. After a great deal of wrangling, the two sides agreed to add a postamble to the constitution containing the following language: “in order to advance… reconciliation and reconstruction, amnesty shall be granted in respect of acts, omissions, and offenses associated with political objectives and committed in the course of the conflicts of the past[28]”. Many ANC supporters, who wanted to see apartheid officials brought before Nuremberg style war crime tribunals, were understandably upset by the arrangement. Nelson Mandela, who insisted on the importance of steering clear of “victors' justice”, remained adamant about the need for some kind of accountability for apartheid's crimes. Without such reckoning, he threatened, the unaddressed atrocities of the past would live with South Africans like a “festering sore” (Meredith 1999, 18).

The convergence between these two commitments—to amnesty on the one hand and to accountability on the other—was to result in the establishment of the TRC.

The process that led to the commission's creation was characterized by an unprecedented degree of transparency and public participation. During 1994 two major conferences were held to lay the groundwork for the TRC's work. Both were organized by Alex Boraine, an Anti-Apartheid activist who served as president of the South African Methodist Church, MP for the progressive party, and the director of important civil society NGO's. The first of these conferences focused on the lessons of political transitions in Latin America and Eastern Europe[29]. The second solicited input from stakeholders inside South Africa[30]. After the conferences, South Africa's parliament began deliberating on the National Unity and Reconciliation act, which would set up the commission. The Parliamentary Standing Committee on Justice held extended public hearings asking individuals, political parties and NGO's for their advice on the design of the TRC. The law was finally passed, after a great deal of bickering and debate, in May of 1995, a year or so after it was first presented. The TRC thus became the first commission of its kind to be created through a parliamentary process rather than executive decree[31]. Whether by design or inertia, this open, deliberative approach was also applied to the selection of commission members. Nominees were suggested by NGO's, churches, and political parties, and were then interviewed in public by the selection committee. Finally, the cabinet and president chose the commissioners from a shortlist.

The Promotion of National Unity and Reconciliation act set the following three goals for the commission: “to develop a complete picture of the gross violations of human rights that took place in and came through the conflicts of the past; to restore to victims their human and civil dignity by letting them tell their stories and recommending how they could be assisted; and to consider granting amnesty to those perpetrators who carried out their abuses for political reasons and who gave full accountings to their actions to the commission” (Graybill 2002, 6).

The commission would respect the ANC's promise to offer amnesties, but the reprieve would not be granted automatically. It would, rather, be linked to a demand for full disclosure from perpetrators. Those seeking amnesty would have to apply for it, provide full details about what they had done, and establish that their activities were politically motivated (rather than the result of greed, sadism etc.)[32]. Applicants would not, however, be required to apologize or otherwise express regret. Furthermore, the arrangement would eliminate not only criminal responsibility but also civil liability[33]. Successful applicants could be neither charged nor sued for their conduct during the apartheid years. The commission would be charged with investigating abuses that took place between March 1st, 1960 and May 10th 1994.

The commission was divided into three committees in order to realize the aims set out by the law: the committee on human rights violations, the committee on amnesty and the committee on reparation and rehabilitation. The first would collect testimony and conduct public hearings regarding the abuses. The second would consider applications for amnesty from members of the security forces and ANC, and determine whether the acts in question were committed in a political context and whether applicants had provided full disclosure about them. The third would come up with recommendations and criteria for whom to compensate and how.

The TRC's authority and resources were unprecedented in the history of truth commissions. It had the power to subpoena witnesses and the authority to order searches and seizures. It had a witness protection program, 300 staff members, and an annual budget of 18 million dollars. Its proceedings were broadcast on a daily basis on both radio and television, and were widely covered by the printed press. During the course of its tenure the commission took testimony from more than 22,000 victims and witnesses, hearing upwards of 2000 of them in public.

Unsurprisingly, the main controversy surrounding the commission's work concerned its amnesty-granting powers. The opportunity afforded to perpetrators of egregious human rights abuses to walk away from prosecution enraged many black South Africans who wanted to see those who had tormented them and their families put behind bars. As far as many blacks were concerned, the TRC allowed some of apartheid's worst offenders to “get away with murder[34]”. As Martin Meredith (1999, 315) puts it in his superb survey of the commission's tenure: “…the work of the TRC provoked…anger in parts of the black community…particularly over the way security force operatives responsible for heinous crimes were given freedom in exchange for a bit of truth telling, while victims and their families were denied access to the courts. What many wanted more than truth was justice—prosecution in the courts and prison sentences.” Many academic observers of South Africa's transition were dismayed as well, remarking that neither political necessity nor the attempt to create social solidarity can justify the kind of sacrifices of retributive justice the TRC's work entailed.

The outrage is more than understandable, when one considers cases like that of Vlakplass commander Dirk Coetzee who testified to killing ANC activist Sizwe Kondile and burning his body on an open bonfire. Coetzee and his men stood by, drinking beers and smoking for more than seven hours, until nothing remained of Kondile. The sight of such a man walking away from his testimony cannot but turn one's stomach.

Much of the scholarly literature on the TRC centers on the question of justification, on the attempt to locate a rationale which might make sense of an arrangement that goes against a great deal of our untrained intuitions about justice. “If justice requires the prosecution and punishment of those who commit gross human rights violations”, writes Elizabeth Kiss (2000, 68), “then the amnesty offered by the TRC violates justice. Can the TRC be defended against, or in spite of, this criticism?” Similarly, Amy Gutmann and Dennis Thompson (2000, 22) point out that: “In a democratic society, and especially in a society that is trying to overcome injustices of the past, trading criminal justice for a general social benefit such as social reconciliation requires a moral defense if it is to be defensible.” Kent Greenwalt (2000, 191) echoes the same concern when he reminds us that “those who decide whether to include amnesty as an adjunct to a truth commission must face two basic issues. Does granting amnesty to murderers and torturers involve doing injustice? What might justify the state's doing such an injustice?”

In what follows we offer a critical survey of some of the most important philosophical justifications of the TRC. The discussion applies to any truth commission with comparable powers[35].

2.2 Justifying Truth Commissions

2.2.1 Deliberative democracy

Gutmann and Thompson (2000) argue that a justification of a truth commission needs to meet three criteria relevant for the justification of all democratic institutions: it must be moral in principle, inclusive, and moral in practice. The first condition rules out what the authors call the realist justification—the claim that the compromise embodied in the TRC was necessary in order to avoid a civil war. The second demands that the justification employ reasons that are “broadly accessible and therefore inclusive of as many people as possible” (23). The last requires that the justification be based on reasons that “are to the extent possible embodied or exemplified by the commission's own proceedings” (23). The justification that most fully meets these three requirements, argue the authors, is one rooted in the concepts of deliberative democracy and reciprocity. Central to deliberative democracy is “the idea that citizens and officials must justify any demands for collective action by giving reasons that can be accepted by those who are bound by the action…” (35-36). This, in turn, presupposes the notion of reciprocity “which asks citizens to try to justify their political views to one another, and to treat with respect those who make…efforts to engage in this mutual enterprise even when they cannot resolve their disagreements” (36).

To the extent that a truth commission promotes such reciprocal exchanges

it is morally justifiable, because such an exchange is, in itself, a moral good. The first condition is thus met. A commission based in a conception of deliberative democracy is also inclusive since the principle of reciprocity involves appeals to reasons that make sense to a large number of participants in the political process: “the standard of reciprocity also satisfies the second requirement of justification by providing an inclusive perspective. A reciprocal perspective is one that cannot be reasonably rejected by any citizen committed to democracy because it requires only that each person seek terms of cooperation that respect all as free and equal citizens” (37). Finally, a commission committed to the principle of reciprocity is likely to function in a way that embodies that principle. “Such a commission practices what it preaches about the democratic society that it is trying to help create. Reciprocity serves as a guide… for the commission itself, calling on the commissioners and the testifiers to practice some of the skills and the virtues of the democratic society they are striving to create… the openly participatory process by which members and staff of the TRC were appointed, and the generally public process in which its proceedings were conducted, demonstrated its own commitment to democratic practices” (37).

Reciprocity, argue the authors, implies another commitment—to “the economy of moral disagreement”. Citizens must justify their positions by using the least controversial rationale available. The principle of economy encourages those engaged in deliberation to look for justifying reasons that overlap with rather than contradict beliefs held by others. To be morally justifiable under a conception of deliberative democracy, a truth commission needs to economize on disagreement. An example of economizing in the work of South Africa's TRC is the decision not to grant blanket amnesties and to insist on the indictment of some of the worst perpetrators.

The proposed justification presents several difficulties. First, it assumes that a justification of truth commissions must meet the same demands that justifications of existing democratic institutions need to satisfy. But a truth commission is not a democratic institution. Rather, it is an institution that is meant to facilitate the transition of a society to democracy. More often than not, countries undergoing such transitions lack a democratic tradition, have no history of significant public dialogue, and have not secured the minimal economic conditions required for meaningful political participation. Under these circumstances, expecting truth commissions to reflect and promote the ideals of deliberative democracy might be too ambitious.

Second, the justification is not specific enough. It is not clear why deliberative democracy, and its accompanying attributes of reciprocity and minimizing disagreement, justify truth commissions any more than other transitional instruments. Thus, for example, a war crimes tribunal may generate as much public discussion as a truth commission, it may be based on reasons or principles as widely accessible as those underlying a truth commission, and it may insist on trying only the worst offenders, thus economizing on moral disagreements. It seems, in other words, that the deliberative democracy-based argument justifies more than one transitional policy.

Finally, it is questionable whether the TRC can be justified through a deliberative democracy rationale at all. The commission did not embody a particularly open, deliberative stance in its operation. Though many of its hearings were public, some of the important procedures associated with them were confidential by default. Thus, for example, the proceedings of the amnesty commission were public, but the amnesty applications themselves, as well as the supporting documentation, remained confidential until declassified by the commission. Furthermore, the commission was exempt from standard rules of legal procedure and evidence. Perpetrators named in the testimony of victims, or in the testimony of other perpetrators, were not given an opportunity to defend themselves; second-hand information, which a traditional court would have disqualified as hearsay, was admitted, etc. Now a commission making these sorts of exceptions to the precepts of procedural justice can still be justified (for example by showing that these exceptions were necessary for establishing the chain of responsibility leading to the higher ranks of government). But it is doubtful whether the best way to justify it is by invoking a conception of deliberative democracy. For public deliberation to be meaningful and substantial, strong protections of procedural justice must be in place. As mentioned previously, these were lacking in the case of the TRC.

2.2.2 Justice as Recognition

A second justification holds that truth commissions, by focusing on victims and providing them with the opportunity to tell their stories to a sympathetic forum, recognize victims as moral agents with stories worth telling. As Kiss (2000, 73) puts it, “providing a platform for victims is one of the core tasks of truth commissions, not merely as a way of obtaining information but also from the standpoint of justice…Those whose lives were shattered are entitled to have their suffering acknowledged and their dignity affirmed, to know that their ‘pain is real and worthy of attention’… We affirm the dignity and agency of those who have been brutalized by attending to their voices and making their stories a part of the historical record”.

The TRC did not adhere to the strict, skeptical approach to witnesses prevalent in law courts. Standard laws of evidence were relaxed. Commissioners offered unusual gestures of acknowledgement such as rising when the witnesses entered the courtroom, visiting the sites of atrocities, and participating in public reburials[36]. These practices were aimed at making the process about the victims of apartheid; witnesses were assumed to be speaking the truth, and were treated as people with valuable tales to tell and lessons to teach.

The justification of the TRC sketched above is a powerful one. A transition from mass atrocity into civil society, if it is to be stable and lasting, requires that the value of the individual lives of an entire class—the class of victims—be affirmed. By allowing victims to testify in an uninterrupted manner, and by creating a setting in which their testimonies were presumed to be true, the hearings of the TRC in South Africa went beyond establishing the crimes of the security forces, or presenting the hardships of everyday life under apartheid. They also posited blacks, for the first time, as persons whose stories ought to be heard with care and respect. In other words, not only the content of the testimonies before the TRC was of significance; the mere act of blacks testifying was transformative as well. The class of whites, the majority of whom had supposed that a black man or woman cannot be the bearer of legitimate, significant information, was made to think again.

However, the argument from recognition raises a serious difficulty. Some victims argued that the restoration of their dignity requires that those who hurt them be punished; that in order to feel worthy of respect, they must know their injuries merit the criminal law's protection. For such victims, dignity is manifested not by the capacity to testify, but primarily by the commitment of the state to apply its coercive power on their behalf. For some of us, in other words, the currency of recognition is punishment rather than storytelling; being recognized as a human being again can consist, first and foremost, in knowing that one is part of a civic zone protected by law, where the use of violence against her is met with strict sanctions. Under this understanding, the newfound capacity to testify, even if combined with promises of future protection by the law, simply does not cut it.

2.2.3 More truth

Some defenders of truth commissions claim that these bodies are better than trials at producing comprehensive accounts of past abuses. This superiority, they say, justifies compromises in retributive justice. In the case of the TRC, it was not only the dismissal of regular rules of evidence that allowed commissioners to unearth more information. The commission's amnesty-for-truth mechanism created an incentive for perpetrators to come forward. Once they started to do so, a domino effect resulted: offenders who were exposed in the testimony of their colleagues rushed to testify lest they be indicted. Furthermore, since the commission was authorized to deny amnesty to anyone who had not provided ‘full disclosure’, those who came before it tried to give as much detail as they could.

The ‘more truth’ justification is a strong one. Two observations are, however, in order. First, as some critics of the TRC have noted, its choice to focus on gross human rights violations—on dramatic stories of suffering, has obscured some of the institutional aspects of apartheid. Thus, the interconnections between business and the security forces, the wildly discriminatory practices of many work places and the support that many white media outlets lent authorities in masking the practices of apartheid were largely overlooked by the commission's work. Insofar as these, too, are aspects of the truth, they were not revealed by the TRC.

Second, the fact that the TRC was the result of a political compromise meant that there were some areas in which it treaded carefully. Some worm cans remained closed. In a recent book on the history of apartheid, Terry Bell (2003, 4) mentions one remarkable example: as Fredrick de Klerk, South Africa's last white leader, was heading for Oslo to receive the Nobel peace prize in 1993, he ordered a strike on a house allegedly housing militants from the Pan African Congress liberation group. A police death squad ended up killing five teenagers sleeping in a private home in the town of Umtata. The incident was never investigated by the TRC.

2.2.4 Forgiveness

It has become fashionable of late to speak about the importance of forgiveness in politics. Forgiveness is said to be the only disposition that allows us to break free of the endless cycle of blow and counter blow characteristic of ethnic conflict. We are told that forgiving is our only chance to put to rest a tortured, complicated history of assaults and recriminations. One celebrated practitioner of political forgiveness, the Archbishop Desmond Tutu, called his book on South Africa's Truth and Reconciliation Commission No Future without Forgiveness. As the title suggests, Tutu argues that it is only by forgoing resentment and learning to forgive each other that South Africans could ever create a viable democracy. Can the prospects and benefits of forgiveness justify the tradeoff between truth and (retributive) justice involved in the TRC's work[37]?

The most prevalent argument in favor of political forgiveness concerns its potential to release victims and wrongdoers from the effects of vindictiveness. A desire for revenge can generate a never-ending violent cycle, trapping both sides in a dynamic of blow and response, eventually destroying all those involved. As Ghandi famously put it, “an eye for an eye can make the whole world blind”.

But forgiveness is not the only way to quell the desire for revenge. We can steer clear of revenge without forgiving. Victims might seek legal rather than private justice. They might agree to institutionalize their vindictive passions through the use of the courts. As Martha Minow (1998, 11) puts it, it is possible “to transfer the responsibilities for apportioning blame and punishment from victims to public bodies acting according to the rule of law”. This is, in essence, the rationale behind the attempts to expand the authority and centrality of the international criminal courts in recent decades.

Victims can (and very often do) simply move away from the scene of the trauma rather than seek revenge or engage in forgiveness. In recent years there has been a quiet exodus of approximately 100,000 Palestinians from the West Bank and Gaza to Europe, North America and Canada. Most Holocaust survivors, uninterested in revenge or forgiveness, simply moved thousands of miles away from the sites of their horrific memories and swore never to set foot in the countries that had persecuted them. Others replace revenge with commemoration, dedicating themselves to the creation and maintenance of monuments and museums. Thus, for example, many of those handing out the ID cards at the Holocaust Museum in Washington D.C. are holocaust survivors, as are many of the guides in Jerusalem's Yad Vashem memorial.

The basic point, to reiterate, is this: vengeance can, indeed, be a very dangerous thing. But one does not have to advocate forgiveness in order to avoid it. There are other ways to combat it, ways that might be free of some of the complications (more on this below) associated with forgiveness.

Many commentators assume that forgiving is the exclusive prerogative of victims. On this view, it is problematic to define a process of political reconciliation in terms of forgiveness, because forgiving is a very private business that cannot be promoted as a policy. While this position is intuitively powerful, we will take a somewhat more nuanced stance. Let us call it the ‘fading prerogative’ view: While forgiving is not exclusively up to victims, it certainly makes less sense to talk about forgiveness the further away we move from the partly directly injured. If X gets hurt in a bus bombing, she might forgive the person who planned the attack. It can make sense for her parents to forgive him too, though it is not obvious that they would be forgiving the same thing (the nature of the parents' injury is different from X's: the extent of her physical pain was greater than theirs; the degree of their emotional anguish might have well been higher than hers). It would be more problematic to speak of X's neighbors forgiving the bus bomber for X's injuries, and even more problematic to speak of people whom X has never met forgiving the bomber. Forgiveness, then, might not be the exclusive prerogative of victims, but the entitlement to grant it certainly seems to fade as we move away from them. There is, in other words, a limited radius in which it makes sense to speak of forgiveness. This does not, of course, mean that we cannot think of political reconciliation in terms of forgiveness. It only means that such an approach would exclude a (potentially) significant part of the community from the process.

There are other difficulties with making forgiveness into a political goal. A policy encouraging victims to forgive those who have harmed them risks adding insult to their injuries; it can induce a sense of moral inadequacy on top of the devastation already suffered. A victim's reaction to such a policy might run something like this: ‘isn't it enough that I had to go through all this? Now you are expecting me to forgive the person who did it? Now you are placing the moral burden on me? Such a reaction suggests that demands for forgiveness might exacerbate rather than quell resentment—both towards the offender, to whom the victim does not want to owe a moral debt, and towards the state which makes such demands. Ironically, then, a policy advocating forgiveness might undermine one of its own aims—the reduction of vindictive and resentful passions after conflict.

Finally, it is worth remembering that forgiveness is a deeply Christian notion. As J.G. Williams puts it: “forgiveness is at the religious, theological and ethical core of the Christian tradition” (McCullough et al 2000, 31). The term does have an important role in both Judaism and Islam, but its status in these faiths is more ambivalent. Thus, for example, while Judaism does, under some conditions, impose a duty to forgive, it is not clear whether this duty must be exercised towards non-Jews. Furthermore, Judaism, unlike Christianity, discourages unconditional forgiveness. Islamic doctrine does state that forgiveness is superior to revenge, but permits retributive practices, and even feuding under some circumstances. Unlike the famous Christian teaching encouraging the turning of the other cheek, the Koran recommends a middle way between absolute vindictiveness and absolute forgiving. It reads: “the recompense for an injury is an injury equal thereto (in degree): but if a person forgives and makes reconciliation, his reward is due from Allah: for Allah loves not those who do wrong”. The Koran also makes a division between forgivable and unforgivable sins, mentioning the trespass of shirk—the recognition of divinities other than Allah—as a prime example of the latter category. Finally, both Judaism and Islam allow for forgiveness without the resumption of relations between victim and offender, while Christianity insists that the possibility of full restoration of previous relations be left open.

Since the demands and centrality of forgiveness vary between the different faiths, it might be problematic to include the term as part of our notion of political reconciliation, especially in cases of inter-religious conflict. Even if the employment of the term were not offensive to anyone, it is likely that different religious parties would be speaking of different things when they refer to forgiveness. This, it strikes me, can create more confusion than benefit.

3. Forgetting

Having examined, in some detail, two of the most important ways in which nations can come to terms with their past, it is perhaps fitting to conclude this entry by considering the possibility that nations do not attempt such a reckoning. Is there anything to be said for forgetting in the aftermath of war? Is there an argument to recommend amnesia as the basis of a political transition?

Most often, forgetting cannot serve as the basis for peacemaking. It is destructive on both the individual and collective levels. It compounds the suffering of individuals by forcing them to watch their tormentors walk around freely, reenter politics, or maintain their posts in public service and the military. All of this takes place while their own painful memories and traumas remain unacknowledged. Furthermore, policies advocating forgetfulness decrease the chances that victims will be compensated for their suffering. The most common institutional products of such policies are laws granting amnesty. Typically, under such amnesties, perpetrators are protected from both criminal charges and civil liability. Amanda Pike, a reporter for PBS' Frontline, tells a story which starkly demonstrates the cost of forgetfulness for individual victims. During a trip through the Cambodian province of Pailin, Pike came across Samrith Phum, whose husband was executed by the Khmer Rouge. Phum knows the murderer well. He is her neighbor and he operates a noodle shop across the street from her house. He was never arrested and never charged with her husband's murder. There is no procedure through which he can be sued for damages. Phum must simply get used to the idea that her husband's killer quietly manages his store next door.

On the national level, a government advocating forgetfulness commits the political correlate of suicide: it undermines the ability of the group of people it governs to call itself a nation. The French thinker Ernest Renan (1882) defined a nation as consisting of “two things, which, in truth, are really just one…One is in the past, the other in the present. One is the possession in common of a rich legacy of memories; the other is current consent, the desire to live together, the willingness to continue to maintain the value of the heritage that one has received as a common possession”. Forgetting destroys both elements. It undermines the possibility of a common history by excluding an entire class of memories. At the same time, it obliterates the desire of formerly hostile parties to live together, or the possibility of social solidarity, by creating a bubbling, poisonous, pool of resentment among an entire group of people[38].

Now Renan was far from naïve. He admits that “forgetting” and perhaps even “historical error” are essential in the creation of national identity. Later he adds that “the essence of a nation is that all individuals have many things in common and also that they have forgotten many things.” Descriptively, he is surely right. Heroic historiography and intentional forgetting was instrumental in creating American, Israeli, Turkish, Spanish and French contemporary identities, to mention but a few. But identities based on amnesia are rarely stable. Israel's new historians, the countless young Armenians lobbying parliaments all over the world to recognize the Armenian genocide almost a century after it took place and the recent Spanish “Historical Memory Law” all attest that it is difficult to simply burry the past. If the groups that have been forgotten are not annihilated, their painful memories continue to fester until they eventually erupt in renewed conflict.

But what if all parties involved in a conflict really want to forget? What if there is a tacit or explicit agreement not to dwell on the past? What are we to make of Mozambique, for example, where in the aftermath of a long, bloody civil war, the combatants actively elected not to address past atrocities? In her superb book on truth commissions, Hayner (2002) describes an election rally in post-war Mozambique in which a candidate was literally chased out of a hall for bringing up the conflict. Can we really make a normative argument for remembering if both sides freely chose to forget? One possible way to make such an argument is by analogy. It is quite clear to us that, in the domestic context, the fact that two sides to a conflict agree to bury the hatchet does not preclude their prosecution by the criminal justice authorities. Thus, if two neighboring families become entangled in a massive brawl, during which property on both sides is destroyed, and some injuries are sustained, the District Attorney's Office may decide to issue indictments, even if all of those who did the fighting would like to put the whole incident behind them. The criminal law is not a private matter completely at the discretion of citizens. The public has a stake in upholding the criminal law, and is understood to be an interested party whenever it is broken. After all, in the example provided above, wider interests were compromised: traffic may have been disturbed by the fighting, the small children of other neighbors may have been watching, publicly funded hospitals may have been called on to treat the injured, reports of the fight may have made their way into the news media bringing down house prices, etc. In short, the fight, almost any fight, has repercussions for third parties. That is why, in important ways, such fights are everyone's business. And that is why criminal cases are typically titled Commonwealth vs. Jones rather than Smith vs. Jones.

Is there an analogous argument to be made about the aftermath of political conflict? Are there any third party interests that may justify some kind of reckoning with mass atrocity, even if all of those involved would freely choose to put the past behind them? Fully answering this question is beyond the scope of this entry, so we shall simply gesture at some of the difficulties that need to be addressed in order to do justice to it.

First, who are the third parties whose interests are implicated by a decision on the part of two warring parties to bury the past? Could we argue that, given the intense media coverage given to political conflicts, a failure to address massive violations of human rights in location X (for whatever reason) may endanger human rights in location Y (by, say, bolstering the confidence of would be perpetrators)? If so the third party could be described, vaguely, as the international community, a community with a serious interest in creating a robust culture of human rights wherein violations are documented and addressed rather than simply ignored.

Second, even if we agree that there are interested third parties in the international context, how could such parties ensure that their interests are protected? What sort of enforcement power do they have? Here the answers are both legal and political. The nascent International Criminal Court may be used in cases where its authority comes into play. Perhaps more significantly, the international community (or, more specifically, the most powerful international players) may resort to political pressure. After all, countries such as Mozambique, emerging from prolonged wars, are desperately dependent on international aid. Donor countries could, accordingly, make aid contingent on the addressing of past atrocities.

When all is said and done, it appears that the main difference between the domestic and international cases has to do with the consequences of the decision whether to use the courts. While in the domestic arena a failure to prosecute can result in increased cynicism about the law (and eventually in a weakening of the rule of law), imposing accountability in the aftermath of war may, under some circumstances, reignite violence. Insisting on doing justice in such cases recalls Lord Mansfield's famous dictum in the 1772 Somerset case: that justice must be done “though the heavens may fall”. The trouble, of course, with this Kantian pronouncement is that there is no one to reap the fruits of justice after the heavens have fallen.


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cosmopolitanism | nationalism | responsibility: collective | rights: human | torture | war | world government


I am grateful to Thomas Pogge and to Greg Fried for their comments and encouragement. Thanks are also due to my research assistant at Suffolk University, Michael McDonough.