Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Logical Constructions

First published Wed Nov 20, 1996; substantive revision Mon Aug 31, 2009

Bertrand Russell described several different definitions and philosophical analyses as treating certain entities and expressions as “logical constructions”. Examples he cited were the Frege/Russell definition of numbers as classes of equinumerous classes, the theory of definite descriptions, the construction of matter from sense data, and several others. Generally expressions for such entities are called “incomplete symbols” and the entities themselves “logical fictions”. The notion originates with Russell's logicist program of reducing mathematics to logic, was widely used by Russell, and led to the later Logical Positivist notion of construction and ultimately the widespread use of set theoretic models in philosophy.

1. Honest Toil

Russell's most specific formulation of logical construction as a method in philosophy comes from his essay “Logical Atomism”:

One very important heuristic maxim which Dr. Whitehead and I found, by experience, to be applicable in mathematical logic, and have since applied to various other fields, is a form of Occam's Razor. When some set of supposed entities has neat logical properties, it turns out, in a great many instances, that the supposed entities can be replaced by purely logical structures composed of entities which have not such neat properties. In that case, in interpreting a body of propositions hitherto believed to be about the supposed entities, we can substitute the logical structures without altering any of the detail of the body of propositions in question.This is an economy, because entities with neat logical properties are always inferred, and if the propositions in which they occur can be interpreted without making this inference, the ground for the inference fails, and our body of propositions is secured against the need of a doubtful step. The principle may be stated in the form: ‘Whenever possible, substitute constructions out of known entities for inferences to unknown entities’ (1924, p.160)

Russell was speaking of logical constructions in this memorable passage from his Introduction to Mathematical Philosophy: “The method of ‘postulating’ what we want has many advantages; they are the same as the advantages of theft over honest toil. Let us leave them to others and proceed with our honest toil.” (1919, p. 71)

The notion of logical construction appears frequently with the idea that what is defined is a “logical fiction”, and an “incomplete symbol”. The latter term derives from the use of contextual definitions, providing an analysis of each sentence in which a defined symbol may occur without, however, giving an explicit definition, an equation, or a universal statement giving necessary and sufficient conditions for the application of the term in isolation. The terms “fiction” and “incomplete symbol” apply with differing aptness to different constructions.

Russell's first use of construction, and the model for later constructions, is the Frege/Russell definition of numbers as classes. This follows the kind of definitions used in the arithmetization of analysis of the preceding century, in particular, Dedekind's earlier construction of real numbers as bounded classes of rational numbers. Russell's logicist program could not rest content with postulates for the fundamental objects of mathematics such as the Peano axioms for the natural numbers. Instead numbers were to be defined as classes of equinumerous classes. Russell also refers to this method as “abstraction”, now known as the abstraction of an equivalence class. The definition of equinumerosity, or of the existence of a one to one mapping between two classes, also called “similarity”, is solely in terms of logical notions of quantifiers and identity. With the numbers defined, for example, two as the class of all two membered sets, or pairs, the properties of numbers could be derived by logical means alone.

2. Definite Descriptions and Classes

The most influential of Russell's constructions was the theory of descriptions from his paper “On Denoting” in 1905. Russell's theory provides an analysis of sentences of the form ‘The F is G’ where ‘The F’ is called a definite decription. The analysis proposes that ‘The F is G’ is equivalent to ‘There is one and only one F and it is G’. With this analysis, the logical properties of descriptions can now be deduced using just the logic of quantifiers and identity. Among the theorems in *14 of Principia Mathematica are those showing that, (1) if there is just one F then ‘The F is F’ is true, and if there is not, then ‘The F is G’ is always false and, crucially for the logical manipulation of descriptions, (2) if the F = the G, and the F is H, then the G is H. In other words, proper (uniquely referring) descriptions behave like singular terms. Some of these results are contentious—Strawson noted that ‘The present king of france is bald’ should be truth valueless since there is no present king of France, rather than “plainly false”, as Russell's theory predicts.

The theory of descriptions introduces Russell's notion of incomplete symbol. Definite descriptions ‘The F’ do not show up in the formal analysis of sentences in which they occur, thus ‘The F is H’ becomes:

x[∀y(Fyy=x) & Hx]

of which no subformula, or continuous segment, can be identified as the analysis of ‘The F’. Similarly, talk about “the average family” as in “The average family has 2.2 children” becomes “The number of children in families divided by the number of families = 2.2”, there is no portion of that analysis that corresponds with “the average family”. Instead we have a formula for eliminating such expressions from contexts in which they occur, hence the notion of “incomplete symbol” and the related notion of “contextual definition”. It is standard to see in this the origins of the distinction between between surface grammatical form and logical form, and thus the origin of linguistic analysis as a method in philosophy which operates by seeing past superficial linguistic form to underlying philosophical analysis. The theory of descriptions has been criticized by some linguists and philosophers who see descriptions and other noun phrases as full fledged linguistic constituents of sentences, and who see the sharp distinction between grammatical and logical form as a mistake.

The theory of descriptions is often described as a model for avoiding ontological commitment to objects such as Meinongian subsistent entities, and so logical constructions in general are often seen as being chiefly used to eliminate purported entities. In fact, that goal is at most peripheral to most constructions. The principal goal of some of these constructions is to allow the proof of propositions that would otherwise have to be assumed as axioms or hypotheses. Nor need the introduction of constructions always result in the elimination of problematic entities. Some other constructions should be seen more as reductions of one class of entity to another, or replacements of one notion by a more precise, mathematical, substitute.

Russell's “No-Class” theory of classes from *20 of Principia Mathematica provides a contextual definition like the theory of descriptions. One of Russell's early diagnoses of the paradoxes was that they showed that classes could not be objects. Indeed he seems to have come across his paradox of the class of all classes that are not members of themselves by applying Cantor's argument to show that there are more classes of objects than objects. Hence, he concluded, classes could not be objects. Inspired by the theory of descriptions, Russell proposed that to say something G of the class of Fs, G{x: Fx}, is to say that there is some (predicative) property H coextensive with (true of the same things as) F such that H is G. That classes have the feature of extensionality is thus derivable, rather than postulated. If F and H are coextensive then anything true of {x: Fx} will be true of {x: Hx}. Features of classes then follow from the features of the logic of properties, the “ramified theory of types”. Because classes would seem to be individuals of some sort, but on analysis are found not to be, Russell speaks of them as “logical fictions”, an expression which echoes Jeremy Bentham's notion of a “legal fiction”. Because statements attributing a property to particular classes are analyzed by existential sentences saying that there is some propositional function having that property, this construction should not be seen as avoiding ontological commitment entirely, but rather of reducing classes to propositional functions. The properties of classes are really properties of propositional functions and for every class said to have a property there really is some propositional function having that property.

3. Other Constructions

For other constructions such as propositions no contextual definition is provided. In any case, constructions do not appear as the referents of logically proper names, and so by that account are not part of the fundamental “furniture” of the world. (Early critical discussions of constructions, such as Wisdom's, stressed the contrast between logically proper names, which do refer, and constructions, which were thus seen as ontologically innocent.)

Beginning with The Problems of Philosophy in 1912, Russell turned repeatedly to the problem of matter. As has been described by Omar Nasim (2008), Russell was stepping into an ongoing discussion of the relation of sense data to matter that was being carried on by G.F. Stout, G.E.Moore, T.P. Nunn and Samuel Alexander among others. The participants of this “Edwardian Controversy”, as Nasim terms it, shared a belief that direct objects of perception, with their sensory qualities, were nonetheless extra-mental. The concept of matter, then, was the result of a loosely described social or psychological “construction”, going beyond what was directly perceived. A project shared by the participants in the controversy was the search for a refution of Berkeleyan idealism, which would show how the existence and real nature of matter can be discovered. In Problems Russell argues that the existence of matter is a well supported hypothesis that explains our experiences. Matter is known only indirectly, “by description”, as the cause, whatever it may be, of our sense data, which we directly know by “by acquaintance”. This is the notion of hypothesis which Russell contrasts with construction in the famous passage about theft and honest toil which is quoted above. Russell saw an analogy between the case of simply hypothesizing the existence of numbers with certain properties, those described by axioms, and hypothesizing the existence of matter. While we distinguish the certain knowledge we may have of mathematical entities from the contingent knowledge of material objects, Russell says that there are certain “neat” features of matter which are just too tidy to have turned out by accident. Examples include the most general spatiotemporal properties of objects, that no two can occupy the same place at the same time, and so on. With the project of constructing matter, material objects are now to be seen as collections of sense data. Influenced by William James, Russell defended a “neutral monism” by which matter and minds were both to be constructed from sense data, but in different ways. Intuitively, the sense data occuring as they do “in” a mind, are material to construct that mind, the sense data derived from an object from different points of view to construct that object. Russell saw some support for this in the theory of relativity, and the fundamental importance of frames of reference in the new physics.

These prominent examples are not the only use of the notion of construction in Russell's thought. In Principia Mathematica the multiple relation theory of propositions is introduced by saying that propositions are “incomplete symbols”. Russell's multiple relation theory, that he held from 1910 to 1919 or so, argued that the constitituents of propositions, say ‘Desdemona loves Cassio’, which is false, are unified in a way that does not make it the case that they constitute a fact by themselves. Those constituents occur only in the context of beliefs, say, ‘Othello judges that Desdemona loves Cassio’. The real fact consists of a relation of Belief holding between the constituents Othello, Desdemona and Cassio, thus B(o, d, L, c). Because one might also have believed propositions of other structures, such as B(o, F, a) there need to be many such relations B, thus the “multiple” relation theory. Like the construction of numbers, this construction abstracts out what a number of occurrences of a belief have in common, a believer and various objects in a certain order. The analysis also makes the proposition an incomplete symbol because there is no constituent in the analysis of ‘x believes that p’ that corresponds to ‘p’.

Russell suggests that even propositional functions are logical constructions when he says that they are really “nothing”, but “nonetheless important for that” (1918, p. 96). Propositional functions are abstracted from their values, propositions. The propositional function ‘x is human’ is abstracted from its values ‘Socrates is human’, ‘Plato is human’, etc. Viewing propositional functions as constructions from propositions which are in turn constructions by the multiple relation theory helps to make sense of the theory of types of propositional functions in Principia Mathematica. The notion of “incomplete symbol” seems less appropriate than “construction” in the case of propositional functions and propositions. To classify propositions and even propositional functions as instances of the same logical phenomenon as definite descriptions requires a considerable broadening of the notion.

4. The History of Logical Construction

In the 1930s Susan Stebbing, John Wisdom and some others, forming what has come to be called the Cambridge School of Analysis, paid considerable attention to the notion of logical construction. Stebbing was concerned with the unclarity about whether it was expressions or entities that are logical constructions, and with how to understand a claim such as “this table is a logical construction” and indeed what it could even mean to contrast logical constructions with inferred entities. Russell seems to have been inspired by the logicist project of finding definitions and elementary premises from which mathematical statements could be proved. Stebbing and Wisdom were concerned with relating the notion of construction to philosophical analysis of ordinary language. Wisdom's series of papers in Mind interpreted logical constructions in terms of ideas from Wittgenstein's Tractatus.

Demopoulos & Friedman (1985) find an anticipation of the recent “structural realist” view of scientific theories in Russell's The Analysis of Matter (1927). They argue that the logical constructions of sense data in Russell's earlier thinking on the “problem of matter” were replaced by inferences to the structural properties of space and matter from patterns of sense data. We may sense patches of color next to each other in our visual field, but what that tells us about the causes of those sense data, about matter, is only revealed by the structure of those relationships. Thus the color of a patch in our visual field tells us nothing about the intrinsic properties of the table that causes that experience. Instead it is the structural properties of our experiences, their order in time, and which are between which in the visual field, that gives us a clue as to the structural relationships of time and space within the material world that causes the experience. The contemporary version of this account, called “structural realism”, holds that it is only the structural properties and relations that a scientific theory attributes to the world about which we should be scientific realists. Russell's initial project of replacing inference with logical construction was to find for each pattern of sense data some logical construction which bears isomorphic structural relations. That project was transformed, Demopoulos & Friedman argue, by now replacing inference from the given in experience to the cause of that experience with an inference to the rather impoverished, structural, reality of the causes of those experiences. It seems that in fact Russell's matter project was taken in this way, and led, in 1928, to G.H. Newman's apparently devastating objection. Newman pointed out that there is always a structure of arbitrarily “constructed” relations with any given structure if only the number of basic entities, in this case sense data, is large enough. According to Demopoulos & Friedman, Newman shows that there must be more to scientific theories than trivial statements to the effect that matter has some structural properties isomorphic to those of our sense data. The project of The Analysis of Matter faces a serious objection in “Newman's Problem”, whether or not those difficulties arise for the earlier project of “logical construction”.

The notion of logical construction had a great impact on the future course of analytic philosophy. One line of influence was via the notion of a contextual definition, or paraphrase, intended to minimize ontological commitment and to be a model of philosophical analysis. The distinction between the surface appearance of definite descriptions, as singular terms, and the fully analyzed sentences from which they seem to disappear was seen as a model for making problematic notions disappear upon analysis. The theory of descriptions has been viewed as a paradigm of philosophical analysis.

A more technical strand in analytic philosophy was influenced by the construction of matter. Rudolf Carnap attempted to carry out the construction of matter from sense data, and later Nelson Goodman continued the project. More generally, however, the use of set theoretic constructions became widespread among philosophers, and continues in the construction of set theoretic models, both in the sense of logic where they model formal theories, and as objects of interest in their own right.


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Related Entries

Carnap, Rudolf | descriptions | Moore, George Edward | neutral monism | Russell, Bertrand | Russell's paradox | structural realism