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Anton Marty

First published Fri Dec 19, 2008

Anton Marty (October 18, 1847-October 1, 1914) was a philosopher of language, psychologist, and ontologist. He was born in Schwyz, Switzerland in a very large family and baptized as a Catholic with the full name of ‘Martin Anton Maurus Marty’. His oldest brother went into the priesthood and became a missionary to the Sioux in North America. Though Marty himself was ordained, he left the priesthood shortly after Brentano had done so (in 1873, a few years after the declaration of papal infallibility) and pursued an academic career instead. He died in Prague, at that time a city that belonged within the Austro-Hungarian Empire and where he had been professor at the German-speaking division of the Ferdinand Charles University for most of his academic career.

Marty's philosophical work is distinct especially as an application of Brentano's descriptive psychology to the study of language in opposition to many of the prominent currents in linguistics and philosophy of language during his time. These were in many cases much more historical rather than psychological in character, but also often based on psychological theories wherein intentionality was not fully or hardly at all thematized as it was in Brentanian psychology. Marty's philosophy of language is accordingly outstanding as a reflection on linguistic phenomena as essentially intentional.

1. Marty as a Follower of Brentano

Marty's career can be best viewed from the perspective of his relationship to Brentano. Already in 1867, before Marty began to study at a university, he had written a prize winning essay “St. Thomas' Doctrine of Abstraction of Supersensory Ideas from Sensory Images, with an Exposition and Critique of Other Theories of Knowledge”, in which he cited Brentano's recently published works on Aristotle (Brentano 1862 and Brentano 1867). He was so inspired by these works that he requested permission from his bishop to study in Würzburg, where Brentano, also at the time a Catholic priest, had just been appointed lecturer after triumphantly engaging in a formal disputation with a disciple of Schelling. One of the theses that Brentano defended in this disputation was: “The true method of philosophy is none other than that of the natural sciences” (Brentano, [ed.] Kraus 1929: 147). In the autumn of 1868 Marty began attending Brentano's lectures in which this thesis was applied to various areas of philosophy. He and Carl Stumpf, who had already been studying in Würzburg, became friends with each other and disciples of Brentano in the renewal of philosophy and religion (Stumpf 1919, 88 ff.). In such a renewal all the speculative excesses of German Idealism from earlier in the century had to be purged and replaced with rigor and clarity of thought, not to mention a relentless adherence to the empirical source of knowledge.

In 1869 Marty became a teacher in a secondary school in his home town and received higher orders the next year, though he continued to stay in contact with Brentano. Marty was hardly aware, however, that Brentano was having misgivings about his Catholic faith, especially in the light of the doctrine of infallibility that was declared in 1870. Though Brentano became a professor in Würzburg in 1872, he resigned from this position and left the church in the following year. Both Stumpf and Marty were soon to follow him in abandoning their pursuit of a profession as clergymen. This was not as damaging to Stumpf, who had never been ordained, as it was to Marty. As a consequence, he never married in order to avoid disappointing his family more than he already had done. His circumstances thus allowed him little choice but to pursue an academic career, as he did by receiving a doctorate in Göttingen with Rudolf Hermann Lotze as his dissertation advisor (as Stumpf had also done). An expanded version of the resulting work (Marty 1875) was subsequently published and he took a position at the newly established university in Czernowitz.

Brentano in the meantime had become a professor in 1874 in Vienna, where he continued to develop his philosophical views in the same spirit as he did in Würzburg, with no other method but that of the natural sciences. An important distinction that Brentano came to make in his lectures in Vienna, however, was that between two branches of psychology (Brentano, [eds.] Baumgartner and Chisholm 1982). One of these was descriptive psychology, also called descriptive phenomenology or psychognosy, and was concerned with analyzing consciousness into its elements and specifying their modes of combination. The other branch, genetic psychology, was to be concerned with causal explanations of mental phenomena. Though Brentano maintained that the latter branch required physiological investigations and also that physiology was not yet developed enough to deal with matters in genetic psychology, he thought that he had already contributed to descriptive psychology in his Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint (Brentano 1874) and continued making further elaborations in this area through his lectures.

As Brentano characterized philosophy as including all the disciplines which involve descriptive psychology, Marty did the same as the rector of the University of Prague in his inaugural address in 1897 (Marty, [eds.] Eisenmeier et al.: 69-93). On this view, philosophy encompasses at least three practical disciplines, namely logic (concerned with what judgments should be made), aesthetics (concerned with what ideas or, as we shall say, presentations we should have), and ethics (concerned with what to love and what to hate). As regards the theoretical branches of philosophy, Brentano and Marty considered them to be descriptive psychology itself and also metaphysics. While it may seem unacceptable to characterize metaphysics as involving psychological concepts, Marty says:

A closer consideration, however, yields the result that also metaphysics and psychology, in spite of the difference of their subject matters, closely belong together from a heuristic viewpoint and that the psychologist is the very one, more than any other researcher, who appears to be suited to formulate and solve metaphysical problems. Already with Kant, it is asked whether we have besides analytic judgments also synthetic ones a priori, and whether the latter are perhaps, like the former, everywhere necessary for scientific progress. In contrast to leaving them empty and void upon leaving the phenomenal sphere, however, it is clear that only psychological investigation can decide this matter. It is a question whose answer is a prerequisite for every ontological and cosmological investigation. Psychological experience and analysis is accordingly also that which leads to the source and the true sense of the most important metaphysical concepts such as those of causality and of substance. And as regards that problem which occupied Aristotle, Descartes, and Leibniz so intensely, the question whether an analogue of the understanding and the tactical will forms the last hidden cause of all being and occurrence, it is obvious that this could not arise on any other basis but a psychological one. The concepts of the understanding and the will are themselves taken from the domain of mind. What Aristotle says here is confirmed, that what is the first and earliest by nature is for our knowledge the last, for the area of psychology, in which the greatest complication and dependence obtains with regard to its processes, is for us the starting point for the investigation of what is most simple and independent. (Marty, [eds.] Eisenmeier et al. 1916, 79 f.)

Thus we see Marty defending the Brentanian conception of philosophy in general and metaphysics in particular, with an appeal to Aristotle, who was indeed Brentano's life-long guide through the labyrinth of philosophy. Moreover, though Marty's publications were mainly concerned with applying Brentanian descriptive psychology to the study of language, he lectured on all the branches of philosophy, both theoretical and practical, as well as history of philosophy. (See Bokhove and Raynaud 1990: 247-250.) It will be seen further below that metaphysics was indeed a very important concern of his.

As regards some of the particulars of Brentano's descriptive psychology, most important for understanding Marty's philosophy of language are 1) Brentano's thesis that mental phenomena (or acts of consciousness) are intentionally directed (as consciousness of an object), 2) his classification of mental phenomena into three basic groups: presentations (Vorstellungen), judgments (Urteile), and acts of love (Liebe) and hate (Haß), as already indicated in the division of practical philosophy into three corresponding disciplines, 3) his characterization of all judgments as instances of acceptance or rejection which can be formulated in existential statements (“A exists”, “A does not exist”), and 4) his view that every act of consciousness is inwardly perceived (innerlich wahrgenommen), though never inwardly observed (innerlich beobachtet), in the sense of being an object of attention. In addition, 5) an important ontological position held by Brentano in his Vienna period should be mentioned here, namely his distinction between reality and existence. While he held that existence corresponds to truth in all cases, reality is limited to substances and everything that pertains to substances (i.e. whatever belongs to the Aristotelian categories). Accordingly anything that can be accepted in a true judgment can correctly be said to exist, including possibilities and impossibilities, whereas not everything that exists in this sense is real. During this time Brentano allowed for a host of irrealia, such as a lack, a possibility, an impossibility, etc.

After publishing his work on the perception of color (Marty 1879), Marty became a professor in Prague, where some of his students (such as Oskar Kraus, Alfred Kastil, Hugo Bergmann, and even for a brief period Franz Kafka) also came to be followers of Brentano. In the following year Brentano had to resign as a professor in Vienna because he got married. Since he had earlier received holy orders, including of course the vow of celibacy, his marriage was not acceptable in Austria, where there was no institution of civil marriage and Catholicism was dominant. Nevertheless, Brentano continued to lecture in Vienna until his full resignation in 1895. In the later nineteenth century and early in the twentieth century Brentano developed a philosophical standpoint which Marty found objectionable. This was the view that only real things are conceivable and only real things can exist. Brentano therefore spent much of his philosophical effort during his retirement analyzing away all the talk of irrealia, which he had accepted in his Vienna period. Marty, by contrast, retained the irrealia, though with certain revisions in light of his correspondence with Brentano. Marty also corresponded with other students of Brentano, such as Stumpf and Edmund Husserl (see Schuhmann [ed.] 1994, 69-96), and of course with others in the wider philosophical and scientific community. Still the fact remains that Brentano was the dominant philosopher in his career.

Marty's writings often contain very extensive polemics against his opponents and those of Brentano. Sometimes these polemics resulted in bitter animosity, as in his interchange with Christoph Sigwart (see e.g. Marty 1884 and Sigwart 1889). Sometimes Marty's criticisms were received in good humor, as in the case of his very thorough-going and penetrating review of William James' Principles of Psychology (Marty 1892b). Whatever effects Marty's polemical style had on his contemporaries, the great misfortune from a present-day standpoint is that his own positive views become overshadowed by his criticisms of the views of others. With patience, however, it is possible to sift out from such criticisms his positive views on a number of philosophical issues. The extent to which these views are original cannot be fully assessed until Brentano's literary remains are more adequately edited and published. Many of the views which were developed in his later work nonetheless diverged from Brentano's earlier positions (as well as his own), but also from Brentano's later positions.

2. Color Names and the Development of Color Perception

One of Marty's early works (Marty 1879) is concerned with a problem that differs from the ones he treats in his other writings. In the work under consideration he addresses the question whether the usage of color names in ancient Greek literature, especially Homer, provides us with reasons to assume that human color perception has evolved in the last couple of thousand years. The description of the color of the sea as “wine dark” and many other such instances in Homer, as has had been pointed out (Gladstone 1858: vol. III, 457 ff.), can be taken as a strong indication that the ancient Greeks perceived colors in a way that differs from our color perception. Some of Marty's contemporaries thought that this is not only the case (Wenning 1990), but also that the evidence suggested that the evolution of color perception starts with dark and bright and proceeds through the color spectrum. This would mean that the ancient Greeks could see red and perhaps yellow, though probably not green, blue, and violet. On the basis of the physiological work of Ewald Hering on color perception (Hering 1878), Marty argued that such a development could not take place. For it was a result of Hering's work that the perception of red and green was the result of the same neural system and that of the perception of blue and yellow was the result of a distinct one. Blindness to red consequently goes together with blindness to green, as does blindness to blue with blindness to yellow. Moreover, Marty argues from various data, most notably ancient paintings, that the ancient Greeks perceived all the colors that we do. Finally, and most importantly, however, he insists that the proponents of the evolution of color perception fail to distinguish between color sensation and judgments in which colors are classified and also fail to take into account value-feelings in the usage of color names. The fact that Marty elaborates on such distinctions is of particular significance because it already exemplifies how Brentanian descriptive psychology was being applied in his early work. This was of course to be done more elaborately and systematically in his later writings, especially his main work (Marty 1908a).

3. Language

Marty's philosophy of language deserves our attention for at least two reasons. First of all, while his predecessors and contemporaries were for the most part concerned with the development of language through history, e.g. phonological and semantic change, Marty devoted much more of his attention to language as it is. In his own terms, his investigations concerning language were primarily descriptive rather than genetic. In contemporary terms, his focus was synchronic rather than diachronic. In this regard he was a precursor of structuralism (Kiesow 1990). The second reason why Marty's philosophy of language is worth examining lies in the fact that in contrast to many others, who approached language as a product of either an alleged supra-human intelligence or lower psychological and physiological mechanisms such as association and reflex, he investigated language as something that arises from individual human minds as intentionally directed to objects. Not only does intentionality in the broad sense of consciousness of something become focal in Marty's philosophy of language; he is also concerned first and foremost with language “in the sense of the purposeful manifestation of inner life through certain signs, especially through sounds and in particular those which—like most words of our spoken languages—are not intrinsically intelligible, but owe their significant power to custom and tradition” (Marty 1908a: 3). His emphasis here on purposeful manifestation (absichtliche Kundgabe) not only involves intentionality in the broad sense, but is also intentional in the narrow sense (Formigari 2004: 162 ff.). In this regard Marty was a precursor of yet another later movement in the study of language, namely intentional semantics (Liedtke 1990).

As already indicated, Marty conceives of philosophy just as Brentano did, namely as a discipline involving psychological considerations in all of its branches, both theoretical and practical. Philosophy of language is accordingly restricted by him to that domain of linguistic inquiry which is tied up with the science of mind or consciousness. Those areas of linguistics which can be investigated independently of psychology, e.g. phonology, are no part of philosophy of language. It is altogether unacceptable to Marty to regard philosophy of language as distinct from the science of language, as if they were two endeavors concerned with one and the same subject matter and yet differing in their methods (Marty 1908a: 4 f.). In this regard he never swayed from Brentano's precept that the true method of philosophy is no different from that of the natural sciences.

Though Marty's psychological approach differs from that of many other philosophers of language in the late nineteenth century as well as the early twentieth, one of the reasons why his work has been neglected by philosophers lies in their turn away from psychological considerations, as this can already be seen in Husserl's critique of “psychologism” (Husserl 1900) and also in Frege's anti-psychologistic work on logic and language, which has had an especially profound effect on a good many philosophers in the twentieth century and into the present one. (As regards the possibility of related charges of “mentalism” and “introspectionism”, see Rollinger 2008: 73-86.) During his lifetime he had already been under suspicion from the Neo-Kantian camp as a proponent of psychologism, though he vehemently insisted that he did not succumb to such a tendency in any invidious sense such as the one formulated by Husserl (Marty 1908a, 6-18). Above all, it must be remembered that for Husserl psychologism entailed relativism. Both Marty and Brentano pointed out that their applications of psychology in philosophy in no way involved relativism (Brentano 1925, 179-183). In view of the fact that consciousness and specific cognitive operations, particularly with an interest in intentionality, have become thematic in recent decades, it seems to be quite in order to take a new look at Marty's philosophy of language as not entirely unrelated to the philosophical landscape of our times.

3.1 The Origin of Language

Though Marty did, as already indicated, focus much of his work on the description of language as it is, his earliest work (Marty 1875) was concerned with the origin of language. Again, he published a series of articles “On Speech Reflex, Nativism, and Purposeful Formation of Language” (Marty 1884b, Marty 1886, Marty 1889, Marty 1890, Marty 1891, Marty 1892a) in which he continued to defend his earlier view and engaged in extensive polemics against new formulations of the opposing view he called “nativism”, as represented especially by Heymann Steinthal, Moritz Lazarus, and Wilhelm Wundt. (See also the lengthy appendix against Wundt in Marty 1908a: 543-738). These theories were in large measure developed out of Herbartian psychological theories and also meshed in with the whole program of a “psychology of peoples” (Völkerpsychologie). According to nativism, language develops out of sound-producing reflexes and associations of these sounds with certain sensations and images. That is to say, on the nativist view, language as the purposeful manifestation of inner life arose from behavior which was originally altogether unintended. By contrast, Marty maintains that language originated from the basic human need to communicate and was purposeful from the outset. Much of the psychology, including alleged observations of children and so-called primitive people, used to support nativism is on his view highly erroneous. His own theory of the origin of language is, no less than his approach to language as such, teleological in character rather than mechanistic and is of course supported by the psychology of intentionality. In spite of this teleological account of the origin of language, however, he also regards language as something that came about without planning (planlos). Marty's defense of this theory in opposition to nativism involves the descriptive semasiology, which was to be developed more fully in his subsequent writings, especially his main work, and is indeed the center piece of his philosophical endeavors.

3.2 Descriptive Semasiology

In the nineteenth century the term “semasiology” (Semasiologie) was often used in reference to linguistic investigations concerning meaning. Marty often uses this term in order to designate his philosophical investigations concerning language which are indeed by and large concerned with meaning. Other terms which are used by him more or lesss synonymously are “semantics” (Semantik) and “universal grammar” (allgemeine Grammatik), especially in reference to his synchronic undertaking. Among Marty's contemporaries Husserl spoke of “pure grammar” (reine Grammatik), which was, however, conceived of as part of formal logic (Husserl 1901: 286-321). Insofar as Marty's universal grammar is a semasiology developed in the framework of Brentanian descriptive psychology, Marty thinks that his endeavor is quite distinct from—and of greater philosophical significance than—Husserl's historically misinformed foray into the grammatical domain (Marty 1908a 56-63).

A crucial distinction in Marty's descriptive semasiology is that between those expressions which have meaning independently and those which do not (Marty 1908a, 205 ff.). He calls the former “autosemantic expressions” (autosemantische Ausdrücke) or simply “autosemantica” (Autosemantika), as exemplified by names and sentences of various kinds, whereas he calls the latter “synsemantic expressions” (synsemantische Ausdrücke) or simply “synsemantica” (Synsemantika), as exemplified by particles (“and”, “if”, etc.) as well as inflected nouns and verbs.

It is also of importance here to understand Marty's concept of inner linguist form. This concept had been introduced by Wilhelm von Humboldt in order to designate the total worldview (Weltanschauung) of a people who speaks the language in question and even tied with the notion of the spirit of a people (Volksgeist), but also with imagery that occurs in the usage of a language. While such notions as worldview and the spirit of a people play no role in Marty's descriptive semasiology, he still finds it appropriate to designate the inner linguistic form (or “etymon”), understood as “a presentation which serves as a link of association between the outwardly perceivable sign and its meaning” (Marty 1884: 298), whether it be autosemantic or synsemantic. Outstanding examples of inner linguistic form are provided by the ideas behind various figurative expressions which are built into a language, e.g. “to give hand” and “to sweep an opinion aside”. Here images are called to mind, as can readily be confirmed by inner perception, and are useful in making us understand what is meant, without resorting to more complex expressions. Though Marty was by no means unique among the linguists and philosophers of language after von Humboldt in making use of such a concept, he was also critical of many of his contemporaries, especially the nativists, who were, on his view, conflating the inner linguistic forms of expressions and their meanings. Such a conflation, he maintains, was already made by von Humboldt, for the worldview of a people who speaks a given language is more accurately identified with the meanings conveyed by applications of language and not with images or other inner forms which link these expressions with the meanings. Moreover, Marty finds some of his contemporaries, such as Berthold Delbrück, to be involved in a confusion between inner and outer linguistic form (i.e. the expression itself). This last point is also related to Marty's efforts to argue that there is a distinction between a linguistic expression and its meaning. As obvious as this may be at present, some of Marty's contemporaries wished to identify the two—perhaps as an after-effect of Schelling's “identity philosophy” which Brentano had already laid to rest in Würzburg. Accordingly Marty's semasiology is concerned with the complex unity (not identity) of “linguistic expression—inner linguistic form—meaning”.

As already noted, Marty's approach to language differs from that of many others insofar as he makes the notion of intentionality central in his investigations. In his earlier work he followed Brentano in adopting an immanentist version of this notion. That is to say, for the early Marty the thesis that every mental phenomenon intentionally refers to an object is equivalent to saying that there is an object immanent to every phenomenon of mind. He was critical of other philosophers, such as William James (in connection with the thesis that an idea never occurs twice in consciousness, as stated in James 1890, especially Chapter XII), for failing to distinguish between the object immanent to an act of consciousness and the real object allegedly external to consciousness (Marty 1916a, 139 ff.). As the immanentist understanding of intentionality was eventually abandoned by Brentano and other students of his, Marty is no exception in this regard. In his main work he accordingly attempted another formulation of the notion of intentionality. The consciousness of an object is taken by Marty to be a similarity (Ähnlichkeit), “similarizing” (Verähnlichung), likeness (Gleichheit), conformity (Konformität), or adequation (Adäquation) between the mental act and its object, though he stresses that this similarity (to use one of his terms) is purely mind-dependent (ideell) and indeed altogether unique to these phenomena (Marty 1908a: 333, 406 ff., 413-418, 423 n. 1, 424, 430, 444, 453, 481, 487). It is for him in no way the same as the similarity to be found among physical objects. Marty is very critical of philosophers who make intentionality central in their treatment of mind and yet fail to take into account mind-dependent likeness. Such a philosopher, according to Marty, is Husserl, who allegedly construes intentionality in terms of the relation of sign to signified object and thereby falls into an unacceptable semanticism (Semantizismus) (Marty 1908a: 762; for a discussion of Marty and Husserl, see Rollinger 1999: 209-244). Marty's alternative concept of intentionality is, without a doubt, one of the most difficult aspects of his descriptive psychology. It is, however, fortunate that a good deal of what he says of mind and language does not require an understanding of this concept.

It is difficult to state Marty's theory of meaning for two reasons. First of all, he speaks of meaning in at least two different senses. While he often regards the contents of mental acts as meanings, he also often considers the meaning of an expression to be its communicative function. In this sense the meaning of a statement, for instance, is not merely something contained in the consciousness of the speaker who makes the statement or even some sort of entity that exists outside of his or her consciousness. The meaning of the statement can rather only be formulated by saying that the statement that such and such is the case is “that the interlocutor judges that such and such is the case”. Here, however, we confront the second reason why it is difficult to state Marty's theory of meaning in general terms. The communicative function of an expression will vary according to the type of expression in question. It is thus indispensable to elaborate on meaning as communicative function by examining its variety. This will be done here with respect to the autosemantica, as indeed Marty does at length in his main work.

It is in the classification of autosemantica where Brentanian descriptive psychology especially comes into play in Marty's descriptive semasiology. While Brentano had maintained that every act of the mind belongs to one of three classes, namely presentations, judgments, and acts of love and hate, Marty says that autosemantica likewise fall into three classes, each one corresponding to a class of mental phenomena. In his elaboration of this view he opposes three alternative views concerning the division of such phenomena held by certain predecessors and contemporaries: 1) the prevailing view of the nineteenth century in the German speaking world, namely that the phenomena of mind are to be divided into thinking, feeling, and willing, 2) the view attributed to Herbart as well as other philosophers, namely that the mind consists only of presentations (or, as one might also say, ideas), and 3) the view of Meinong and his followers in the Graz school, that there is a class of mental phenomena, called “assumptions” (Annahmen), which lies “between” presentations and judgments (see Meinong 1902, Marty 1905, Meinong 1906, Meinong 1910).

Statements (Aussagen) make up the autosemantica which express judgments. This class of expressions received considerable attention from Marty in his early work, especially with regard to the problem of statements which apparently have no subject, so-called “impersonals” (Impersonalien). While statements of this kind were a grave embarrassment to the traditional conception of judgment as predication, Marty argued at length, in opposition to the views of many philosophers, psychologists, and linguists, that the impersonals are best understood as expressing judgments in which something is accepted or rejected or, as one may alternatively formulate his view, regarded as existent or non-existent. If, for instance, the impersonal “It is raining” is under consideration, there is no need to theorize about a mysterious entity to which “it” refers, for this statement only expresses the judgment that there exists the event of raining within the speakers vicinity. Such an approach to impersonals had already been advanced by a specialist in the Slavic languages (Miklosich 1883; cf. Brentano 1889: 109-133). Marty cites this philological work with approval, but it is clear that the main inspiration behind his approach is Brentano.

In his attempt to defend the Brentanian theory of judgment in the linguistic domain Marty makes an effort to reformulate various statements in order to show that they are actually instances of accepting or rejecting. As Brentano maintained that the judgments in the traditional square of opposition are to be exhibited by construing the universal ones as negative (“Every A is B” = “There is no A which is not B”, “No A is B” = “There is no A which is B”) and the particular ones as affirmative (“Some A is B” = “There is an A which is B”, “Some A is not B” = “There is an A which is not B”), Marty finds such reformulations acceptable. Moreover, he identifies a class of judgments such as “This tree is blossoming” as double judgments (Doppelurteile), which is again a notion he explicitly takes from Brentano (Marty 1897: 179 ff.). What is peculiar about double judgments is that the subject term, e.g. “this tree”, already expresses an instance of acceptance and there is a predication, e.g. “is blossoming”, built upon this acceptance. While the statements which belong to the four classes identified in the traditional square of opposition are regarded as “pseudo-categorical” (i.e. having the appearance of being predicative without actually being so) because they are better expressed in the existential form rather than the predicative one, double judgments on Marty's view are to be considered genuinely categorical because they cannot be reformulated without the subject-predicate form. Moreover, he also identifies certain statements as “categoroid”, namely those disjunctive and hypothetical statements which do not express double judgments. Marty's attempt to regard these as instances of acceptance and rejection, which can ultimately be reformulated existentially, involves him in some rather intricate considerations.

While Marty ascribes to statements the communicative function (and thus in one sense the meaning) “that one should judge as the speaker does”, he points out that a demand on the interlocutor's will is not thereby made as it is in the case of certain other linguistic expressions. A statement is, by contrast to these, only “a suggestive of judging” (ein Suggestiv zum Urteilen) (Marty 1908a 288). Moreover, there are certain aspects of the judgment which cannot be communicated in a statement, namely whether the judgment is evident or blind and whether it is apodictic or assertoric (Marty 1908a 289 ff.). As Marty further elaborates, he says:

In a narrower sense, however, we call … something in addition the meaning of a statement. Whoever states, “A is”, provided that he himself judges so, treats A as an entity and asks of the interlocutor as well that he, with trust in this externalized conduct of the speaker, should treat A as an entity. In this regard we say also that the statement makes known the being of A and aims at making it known or believes that it is doing so and means it in this sense. And since we often also designate the being of A or that A is, also A‘s being-B or that A is B, as the content of the judgment “A is” or “A is B” and again designate the non-being of A and A‘s not-being-B as the content of the judgment “A is not” or “A is not B”, we can also say: the statement makes known the content of judgment and means it in this sense. (Marty 1908a: 292)

When Marty speaks of the meaning of a statement as the content of the judgment which is thereby expressed, he is well aware of opening the possibility of comparisons with similar concepts in the work of various philosophers, e.g. the proposition in itself (Satz an sich) (Bolzano), the state of affairs (Sachverhalt) (Stumpf and Husserl), and the objective (Objektiv) (Meinong). Accordingly he faces the same difficulty that these others also had to face, i.e. determining the ontological status of such a thing (or non-thing). It is Marty's view that contents of judgment exist in the sense that it is correct to accept them and are furthermore non-real. What it means to be real for the mature Marty is to be involved in a causal nexus. (On his earlier view, real was whatever could be subsumed under the Aristotelian categories.) While he regards physical and mental things or events as real, he maintains that contents of judgment, i.e. the meanings of statements “in the narrower sense”, have only a co-becoming (Mitwerden), which does not allow them to be characterized as real. Thus, in working out a descriptive semasiology of statements Marty puts forward a very important ontological thesis.

The ontological thesis that there are in addition to real objects also non-real ones such as contents of judgment was for Marty an important departure from Brentanian doctrine. Though Brentano and the early Marty had allowed for irrealia strictly as objects immanent to consciousness, Brentano came to reject this theory in favor of saying that the non-real consists only of linguistic fictions. Marty himself came to have misgivings about the notion of immanent objects and his term “content of judgment” in his main work must not be taken as an indication of something that actually or “intentionally” exists in consciousness. At the same time, however, Marty's contents of judgment must not be construed as ideal objects, such as meanings according to Husserl's view in the Logical Investigations. While Husserl maintains that meanings are species (of meaning-giving acts or of certain parts of such acts) and are as such timeless (Husserl 1901: 23-105), Marty ascribes to them a co-becoming which of course involves temporality and certainly does not characterize them as self-subsisting species. Contents of judgment and other non-real entities, as Marty understands them, do not include universals of any kind, whether these be genera or species. In short, Husserl's view on such matters is closer to some sort of Platonism than Marty's is. There remains a very definite alliance with Aristotle in Marty's ontology (Marty 1908a 337 f.).

As Marty regards statements as autosemantica which manifest judgments and communicate to the interlocutor that he or she is to judge in the same way, he characterizes emotives or interest-demanding expressions (interesseheischende A.usdrücke) as those autosemantic which manifest not only emotions, but also volitions (which for him and Brentano belong to one and the same class), and communicate to the interlocutor that he or she is to feel or will in the same way. The analogy between statements and judgments is upheld by Marty to great lengths.

In view of this analogy the following passage is of particular interest:

Is an analogue of the judgment-content really missing in the realm of interest? I don't believe it is. To be sure, a thoroughly subjectivistic and in this sense erroneously “psychologistic” view is very widespread, which does not accept the distinction between what is merely loveable as a matter of fact and what is worthy of love and between a blind compulsion and an “ought” in the sense of a norm of correctness in this realm. However, even though it calls itself “value theory”, it is still unable to give a satisfactory account of the concept of value and disvalue just as the analogous psychologistic doctrine in the realm of epistemology is unable to give such an account of the concept of the true and the false. Only if value and disvalue are truly analogues of the true and the false … can there also be in the realm of interest an analogue of correctness and incorrectness, and both are possible only if there is something independent of the subjective phenomenon of loving and hating and in this sense objective that establishes that correctness of mental conduct, just as the being of the object is the objective foundation for the correctness of the acceptance thereof, its non-being for the rejection thereof. Without such a firm basis and standard all talk of value and disvalue, good and evil, and also of what is in accordance with duty and what is against it, etc. would be without natural justification and sanction (Marty 1908, 370).

Thus we see that in his descriptive semasiology of emotives Marty puts forward a very important axiological thesis. The mention of epistemology in the passage quoted should also not go unnoticed. There is accordingly a very strong sense in which Marty's descriptive semasiology involves a very forcefully stated anti-psychologism in all domains of philosophy. The price of this anti-psychologism, however, is an ontology that allows for non-real entities, whether they be the objective correlates of judgments or those of interest.

The final class of autosemantica for Marty consists of names and other expressions which serve to experess presentations. He calls these “presentational suggestives” (Vorstellungssuggestive) and devotes a very extensive chapter of his main work to the treatment of them. (See Marty 1908: 383-489.) He ascribes to these a communicative function just as he did to the other autosemantica. “As the direct purpose of a statement is to evoke in the interlocutor a certain judgment”, says Marty, “a presentational suggestive also and especially a name primarily in its proper usage aims at awakening in him a certain presentation, and as that primary intention is ultimately designated as the meaning of a statement, the analogue is called the meaning of the name” (Marty 1908a 384 f.). The autosemantica which have such function and are everywhere acknowledged as being able to stand as subjects in a predicative connection are called “names”, as exemplified by “a triangle”, “a rectangle”, “an equilateral triangle”, “a human being who has committed a crime”, “something red”, “something round”, “a red thing that is round”, and also infinitives such as “to get up early” and “to have one's hands full”. As regards the presentational suggestives which are not names, Marty points out the usage of language in poetry and fiction (Marty 474 ff.). While the sentences used in such instances may resemble statements, for the most part they have the function of expressing and evoking presentations and are not actually statements. However, these whole sentences are peculiar insofar as the relevant presentations have contents of judgment as their objects. Such presentations of contents of judgment are on Marty's view the acts of consciousness which Meinong erroneously identified as assumptions.

While it is thus possible to present contents of judgment and presentational suggestives also have a communicative function that is analogous to that of statements and emotives, the question arises as to whether there are also contents of presentation analogous to the contents in the other two cases of mental acts. In this regard Marty undertakes to criticize his older view that there are indeed such contents under the heading of “immanent objects” (Marty 1908a 384-406). He no longer holds this view in his later writings and also rejects the notion of a thorough-going analogy between presentations and mental acts of the other two classes. Accordingly he restricts the notion of meaning of presentational suggestives to their communicative function. As regards the old thesis that consciousness is always the consciousness of something, he endeavors to preserve this by appealing to the already mentioned notion of mind-dependent conformity, which may be either actual or potential (Marty 1908a 407-431). Moreover, he continues to uphold the thesis, as already found in Brentano's work, that all mental acts which are not themselves presentations are founded on presentations (Marty 1908a: 479-489).

4. Space and Time

Though Marty's publications are almost exclusively concerned with linguistic matters, he lectured extensively in all areas of philosophy. Most of his literary remains have indeed been left unpublished. (See the catalogue in Bokhove and Raynaud 1990: 250-264.) The extensive correspondence with Brentano, most of which is also unpublished, is of course of great interest in connection with both of these philosophers. No ultimate assessment of Marty's philosophical accomplishment will be possible until this material, including lecture notes, letters, and other manuscripts of interest, becomes accessible. A couple of years after his death, however, a work by him on space and time was published (Marty, [eds.] Eisenmeier et al. 1916c). This work gives us a rare look into Marty's mature ontology. Though the resulting ontology of space and time is very much in line with Newtonian physics, it should be noted that Marty's work on space and time was published posthumously in the same year in which Einstein's celebrated paper on general relativity appeared (Einstein 1916). Unlike Brentano, he did not have the advantage of living long enough to have the chance of responding to the new concept of space-time that won the day in physics (Brentano, [ed.] Körner and Chisholm 1976: 29 f.). The work may nonetheless prove of to be of value at least insofar as it contains criticisms of the views of such outstanding philosophers as Leibniz, Berkeley, Kant, and Lotze.

In the work under consideration Marty argues for the thesis that space and time exist objectively as non-real entities. This thesis is maintained in opposition not only to the various philosophical systems in which space or time is regarded as subjective, e.g. as an a priori form of intuition, but also in opposition to Brentano's later view, according to which space and time is to be regarded as a linguistic fiction used to describe real things in their various modes. While it is indeed a misfortune that Marty is relying on a discarded view from the standpoint of physics, his thesis that space and time are non-real entities must be distinguished from his Newtonian presuppositions. Just as followers of Kant have managed to adhere to his views on space and time in spite of emergence of non-Euclidean geometries and the theory of relativity, Marty's basic ontological view on these matters can be considered apart from such developments, however important they may be.

5. Marty's Legacy

As a professor in Prague Marty managed to exercise considerable influence, though this influence in many cases amounted to winning converts to Brentano's philosophy, even on points where he and Brentano diverged. Among these converts were Oskar Kraus, Alfred Kastil, and Hugo Bergmann. The former two were of course very active in editing Brentano's writings, many of which were taken from his literary remains. Though the resulting editions were not done according to the standards of critical editing and will ultimately have to be replaced, they served for a long time to keep Brentano's thought alive. Marty was accordingly very important in the continued interest among philosophers in Brentano through two world wars and an ever-changing philosophical climate that has not always been entirely conducive to the intellectual orientation of Brentano, Marty, or other students of Brentano.

As regards the reception of Marty's own philosophical views, this can be found in the case of the Prague Linguistic Circle which arose after his death (Lečka 1995) and also to some extent in Polish philosophy (Woleński 1990). Moreover, Marty was by no means unknown among the Munich phenomenologists (Schuhmann 1990) and may well, with his emphasis on communicative function, have had a hand in their theories of speech acts. The most salient case of the reception of Marty, however, is that of Karl Bühler's theory of language, in which Marty's contribution is explicitly acknowledged (Bühler 1934). Be this as it may, Marty's views still await further examination and possibly further absorption into the continuing developments of linguistics and philosophy of language. The lament which was expressed more than eighty years ago (Funke 1924), that Marty's work had not been sufficiently appreciated by the linguists of that time, can still very well be expressed today. The main obstacle here, aside from the already mentioned charge of psychologism, is the difficulty involved in reading his writings. While Meinong and Husserl wrote sentences which seem to go on forever, the polemics that Marty incessantly conducts make his works even less palatable than theirs for many a reader, especially since the targets of his polemics are in many cases authors who are either forgotten or known by less than a handful of specialists. It is thus no wonder that no extensive philosophical text of his has been translated into English. Nevertheless, a case can be made, as this has briefly been indicated in the foregoing discussion, that the voice of Marty was unique in philosophy of mind and especially in philosophy of language and perhaps in ontology as well. By no means have the possibilities of drawing philosophical sustenance from his work been exhausted.


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Brentano, Franz | Brentano, Franz: theory of judgement | color | Husserl, Edmund | innateness: and language | psychologism | Stumpf, Carl