Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Carl Stumpf

First published Wed Jan 28, 2009

The name Carl Friedrich Stumpf (1848-1936) is historically associated with one of the most important philosophical trends in the early twentieth century phenomenology. Stumpf supervised Husserl's habilitation thesis in Halle in 1887; Husserl's seminal work on phenomenology, Logical Investigations (1900-1901), is dedicated to Stumpf in recognition of his friendship and his philosophical contribution to the book. Stumpf is also known as the founder of the Berlin Institute of Psychology, which gave birth to Gestalt psychology, another important current during the early twentieth century and whose main adherents were among others, his students W. Köhler, K. Koffka, W. Wertheimer and K. Lewin. Founder of the Phonogram Archive in Berlin, now under the protection of the UNESCO, he is also considered as one of the initiators of comparative musicology and a pioneer in ethnomusicology. He held positions in the philosophy departments at the Universities of Göttingen, Würzburg, Prague, Munich and Halle, before obtaining a professorship at the University of Berlin, where he was also rector in 1907-1908. His two main sources of inspiration in philosophy were Franz Brentano, of whom he was the first student in Würzburg, and Hermann Lotze, who in Göttingen supervised his doctoral thesis on Plato (1868) and his habilitation thesis on mathematical axioms (1870). The philosophical work he left us is as original and as diversified as his academic and institutional achievements. Besides many treatises in the fields of acoustics and musicology, his important contributions to the development of the “new psychology” and to the philosophy of the mind in general should also be mentioned. His friend William James said of him in his Principles of Psychology (p. 911) that he was “the most philosophical and profound of all writers; and I owe him much.” His studies in the field of descriptive psychology and phenomenology (known as the science of phenomena), for example, are of particular interest to current research in the fields of philosophy of mind and cognitive sciences.

1. Biographical Sketch

Stumpf's intellectual biography is rich and complex due to his long university career that lasted more than 50 years, his academic achievements, and his philosophical work. To complete this biographical sketch, the reader is invited to consult Stumpf's autobiography (published in 1924) and Sprung's biography, published in German under the title Carl Stumpf – Eine Biografie (2006).

1848 Carl Friedrich Stumpf was born on April 21, 1848 in Wiesentheid in Franconia, Germany.
1859-1863 Attended the Gymnasium in Bamberg; studied music and composed several pieces.
1864-1865 Attended the Gymnasium in Aschaffenburg where he studied Plato with Hocheder.
1865 Entered the University of Würzburg; during his first year, he studied aesthetics and law.
1866 Met Franz Brentano on July 14, during the disputatio for his habilitation and then decided to study philosophy with Brentano. During the period from 1867 to 1870 he attended Brentano's lectures on the history of philosophy, metaphysics, Comte and the positivists, and logic.
1867-1868 Because Brentano had not been habilitated to supervise dissertations, he recommended that Stumpf study with Hermann Lotze in Göttingen; Stumpf attended Lotze's lectures on psychology, history of philosophy since Kant, philosophy of nature, and practical philosophy; he also took courses from the physiologist G. Meissner and the physician W. Weber.
1868 Graduated on August 13, 1868 with a dissertation on Plato and then returned to Würzburg in order to study with Brentano.
1869-1870 Entered the ecclesiastical seminary in Würzburg and due to the influence of Brentano and Lotze, he resigned in July 1870.
1870 Returned to Göttingen to prepare his habilitation on mathematical axioms under the supervision of Lotze and successfully defended it in October 1870.
1870-1873 Lectured at the University of Göttingen where he founded the Eskimo society along with mathematician Felix Klein; he also met Fechner and probably Frege, who studied in Göttingen during this period.
1873 Published an important treatise on the origin of space perception, and dedicated it to Lotze.
1873-1879 Appointed to his first professorship at the University of Würzburg at the age of 25 to replace Brentano, who moved to Vienna in 1874.
1878 Married Hermine Biedermann (1849-1930).
1879-1884 Moved to Prague and in 1880 his friend Anton Marty arrived there; Marty was a professor there until the end of his career; Stumpf developed professional contacts with Mach and maintained a close relationship with Ewald Hering.
1882 Visited by William James in Prague, and this encounter marked the beginning of a lasting friendship between both philosophers.
1883 Published the first volume of Tonpsychologie.
1884-1889 Replaced Ulrici at the University of Halle and became a colleague of Georg Cantor and J. E. Erdmann.
1887 Husserl published his habilitation thesis on the origin of the concept of number, which was supervised by Stumpf.
1889-1894 Arrived in Munich in 1889 as successor to Prantl.
1890 Published the second volume of Tonpsychologie; he also worked with H. Ebbinghaus, H. von Helmholtz, and G. E. Müller, among others, on the prestigious journal Zeitschrift für Psychologie und Physiologie der Sinnesorgane, of which Stumpf was one of the founding editors.
1891 Involved in a controversy with Wundt and his students on experiments and on Fechner's law.
1894 Joined the philosophy faculty in Berlin after a long period of hesitation; this marked the beginning of a new era in his intellectual life.
1896 Presided at the third International Congress of Psychology in Munich.
1898 Founded the Beiträge zur Akustik und Musikwissenschaft, which contains many treatises written by Stumpf and his students.
1900 Founded the Institute of Psychology in Berlin, which gave rise to Gestalt Psychology; started the Phonogramm-Archiv in Berlin, including some phonographic recordings of a Siamese company performing in Berlin; in the same year, along with Kemsies, he started the Berlin Gesellschaft für Kinderpsychologie.
1900-1901 Husserl's groundwork Logical Investigations was published and dedicated to Stumpf.
1904 Asked by the Board of Education to investigate the well-known case of “clever Hans”; and in 1907 the results of this investigation were published by Stumpf and his assistant O. Pfungst in the book Clever Hans (The Horse of Mr. von Osten): A Contribution to Experimental Animal and Human Psychology.
1906 Published three important treatises, which were extensively discussed by philosophers and psychologists: “Erscheinungen und psychische Funktionen,” “Zur Einteilung der Wissenschaften” and Über Gefühlsempfindungen.”
1907-1909 Accepted the honorific position of rector of the University of Berlin; pronounced his first address “Renaissance of Philosophy” on the state of philosophy since Lotze.
1908 Robert Musil, the author of The Man without Qualities, wrote a dissertation on Mach under the supervision of Stumpf.
1909 Wolfgang Köhler received his PhD with a dissertation supervised by Stumpf and published under the title “Akustische Untersuchungen I;” Travelled to Cambridge to celebrate the 100th anniversary of Darwin.
1911 Published Die Anfänge der Musik in which he summarized the results of his research on ethnomusicology.
1912-1913 Established a station for anthropoids on Tenerife for the Academy of Sciences; as a member of the Academy, Stumpf recommended his student Köhler as director of this station; Köhler began his investigations in 1913, the results of which were published in his classic book The Mentality of Apes (1917).
1921 Appointed as professor emeritus in Berlin and continued to teach philosophy in Berlin until Summer 1923.
1922 Köhler succeded Stumpf as director of the Institute of Psychology.
1923 With E. M. von Horbostel, edited four volumes of the classical Sammelbände für vergleichende Musikwissenschaft. The fourth volume contains a study on popular music in Romania by the well-known composor Béla Bartok.
1923 Festschrift in honor of Stumpf's 75th anniversary in the gestaltist journal Psychologische Forschung; this volume includes contributions by his students A. Gelb, C. von Allesch, W. Köhler, K. Koffka, M. Wertheimer, and K. Lewin, among others.
1926 Published the results of extensive research on the nature of vowels and sounds of speech in Die Sprachlaute; Experimentell-phonetische Untersuchungen.
1927-1928 Published a short biography on his friend W. James, based of their correspondence, William James nach seinen Briefen.
1928 Published Gefühl und Gefühlsempfindung, an important collection of papers on emotions and feelings.
1928 Celebrated his 80th birthday for which an allocution was given by his friend and colleague Max Planck.
1936 Carl Stumpf died on December 25 in Berlin at the age of 88.
1939-1940 On the recommendation of Max Planck, his son Felix Stumpf published the two volumes of his monumental work Erkenntnislehre.

2. Philosophy of History

From his two mentors Brentano and Lotze, Stumpf inherited a marked interest in the history of philosophy. This interest was not strictly historiographical; Stumpf's point of departure was Brentano's theory of the four phases in the history of philosophy, and he worked out his own philosophy of history, which forms the basis of his diagnosis on the course of philosophy in the nineteenth century, which was inseparable from the way he conceived his own practice of philosophy. According to Brentano's theory, each of the three main periods in the history of philosophy is characterized by four stages or moments. The first stage corresponds to the ascending development of philosophy and is characterized by a practice of philosophy guided by purely theoretical interests and by a method similar to that of the natural sciences. Its main representatives are Aristotle for Antiquity, Aquinas for the Middle Ages and Descartes for the modern period. The three other stages coincide with the decline of philosophy, the last stage being philosophy's extreme state of degeneracy. For Stumpf and for the majority of Brentano's students, the “building of dogmas” and the invention of artificial means of achieving knowledge based on principles devoid of any intuition is characteristic of this particular moment in the history of philosophy. It was a mystic stage of psychical life. Plotinus, Nicolas of Cusa, Kant and the German idealists belonged to this fourth stage, in their respective epochs. Brentano's thinking on the history of philosophy partly explains Stumpf's repeated criticisms of Kantianism throughout his work.

Stumpf's first address as rector of the university of Berlin in 1907. exactly 100 years after Fichte's “Address to the German nation” at the same university, was entitled “Renaissance of Philosophy,” in which he applied this philosophy of history to the nineteenth century and wondered if philosophy belongs to an ascending stage of history and if it tended toward a renaissance of philosophy. He identified two factors that marked the development of philosophy during this period: the empty space left by the decline of speculative philosophy and of German idealism during the first half of the nineteenth century; and the remarkable development of psychology and the physiology of senses during the second half of this century, thanks to the works of physiologists and physicists such as Fechner, Weber, Hering and Helmholtz. These two factors corresponded to two divergent orientations of philosophy at the same time Stumpf was undertaking his studies in philosophy. The first was the Kantian tradition with its various ramifications, including neo-Kantianism; the second orientation corresponds to what he called Erfahrungsphilosophie or philosophy of experience, which began with Fechner and, above all, with Lotze's works in psychology, especially space perception, which exerted a direct influence on his book Über den psychologischen Ursprung der Raumvorstellung. Although it does not represent a homogeneous tradition, the philosophy of experience refers to common features of several schools and currents of thought that tried to get closer to the sciences of nature, and specially the “new psychology” neglected and relegated to the background by the other tradition. Corresponding to these two orientations are two different ways of practicing philosophy: the philosophy of experience which starts from below, and like any empirical science, uses the inductive method. They differ from an a priori and speculative philosophy that favors an autocratic regime entirely disconnected from the empirical.

As Bertrand Russell pointed out in his An Essay on the Foundations of Geometry, Stumpf's main criticism against Kant and a priori philosophy concerns the dichotomy between form and matter, more precisely the postulate on a priori forms of thought and sensibility. This reproach was already clearly formulated in Stumpf's Raumbuch in which he studies the nativism-empiricism controversy on space perception, developed some years earlier by Helmholtz in the third book of his Handbuch. This controversy is at the origin of an important division in the middle of the nineteenth century among the proponents of the new psychology, involving, on one hand, empiricism represented mainly by Helmholtz and Wundt, and on the other hand, nativism which, according to Helmholtz, characterizes the works of Ewald Hering in physiology, and which in turn influenced the Brentano school and to a certain extent Gestalt psychology. Instead of using Helmholtz's terminology, Stumpf, as did most historians, preferred the term phenomenology to designate the study of phenomenal experience, which occupied center stage in the fields of physiology and psychology. In his Raumbuch Stumpf takes a stand in favor of a moderate form of nativism, according to which space is a unitary sense, its content is perceptible in an immediate and direct way, and inseparable from sensory qualities such as color and sound. Consequently, space and color constitute one and the same content, of which they are partial contents or attributes; they have a relation of logical dependency with the phenomena of which they form a part. Hence, extension and color form a concrete whole and can only be separated through abstraction. From this point of view, the concept of space, as any concept, draws upon its origin in sense perception and is, to use the scholastic formula, an abstracta cum fundamento in re.

This is the position that guided Stumpf in his criticism of empiricism and in his refuting of Kant's arguments in the first Critique, in favor of his conception of space as an priori and subjective form of the external sense. In short, Stumpf discards the metaphysical postulate of an empty space, which is a priori dissociated from phenomena, and the conception of sensations as unstructured and shapeless material serving as support for the activity of understanding. He agrees with Kant that there is no representation of matter without form, no quality without extension, since it is the form that allows the ordering of the sensitive multiplicity, according to certain relations. He does not, however, admit that it is possible to imagine the perception of space or form without a sensory quality or a positive content that serves as its foundation and is a necessary condition to the space order. Stumpf claims that a space without qualities is not a form a priori, but like all general concepts, is an abstractum formed through a complex process of abstraction.

3. Psychology and Philosophy of Mind

Descriptive psychology represents one of the main axes of Stumpf's program in philosophy. His treatises in this domain are quite diversified, ranging from animal and developmental psychology to acoustic psychology and Gestalt psychology. Other than his Raumbuch, the book that gave Stumpf a certain renown in psychology is Psychology of Sound (published in two volumes in 1883 and 1890) which was widely received in Germany and England (see reviews by P. Natorp, A. Meinong, T. Lipps and J. Sully). This book deals with phenomena related to the perception of sounds, specifically with judgments caused by sounds; Stumpf developed several important concepts such as analysis, attention, relations, and the well-known concept of fusion, which is the basis of his theory of music. The first volume deals with isolated sound judgments while the second, dedicated to Brentano, studies the consciousness of simultaneous sounds. In his initial plans, Stumpf's objective was to write two more volumes. The third was to focus on musical phenomena such as consonance, dissonance, chords, melodies, etc., while in the fourth he planned to study feelings generated by sound [Tongefühle]. Part of his research on these issues was published separately in his Beiträge zur Akustik und Musikwissenschaft [9 volumes].

In this book, as in most of its treatises on psychology, Stumpf's approach is similar to Brentano's descriptive psychology. It differs, however, from experimental and physiological psychology in that it conceptually analyzes and describes what physiological psychology explains through the descriptive apparatus of natural sciences such as biology or physiology. Between these two branches of psychology there exists a form of division of labor wherein the first analyses and describes what the other explains. There is however a methodological priority to descriptive psychology compared to experimental psychology, in that analysis and description of the explanandum is a prerequisite to its explanation. The two main tasks assigned to psychology are the analysis and classification of mental states, also called acts or mental functions. In his influential study entitled “Phenomena and Mental Functions,” Stumpf shows how these are closely linked in that they form a real unity, which can only be separated by abstraction. He conceives of phenomena as unitary wholes and not as aggregates, and claims that they are perceived as concrete and unitary wholes. As such, phenomena are the contents of sensations that are characterized by certain properties or attributes (e.g. extension, intensity, brightness), and these contents of sensations are first order phenomena, as opposed to second order phenomena such as “mnemonic images” or color and sound, to the extent that these “are merely represented.” Although Stumpf rarely uses the concept of intentionality, one might say that mental functions are distinct from phenomena in that they relate to the objects with which they have an intentional relation. This relation is characterized, on the one hand, by the notion of specific content or what he also calls a formation, [Gebilde] and on the other hand, by the quality and matter of a function.

Descriptive psychology's second task is the classification of acts or psychical functions based on the distinction between two classes: intellectual and emotional functions. All functions falling under either of these two classes have relationships ranging from the simplest to the most complex, so that functions of the second class presuppose and are based on lower level functions of the first class. This class of intellectual functions subsumes all acts ranging from sense perception to judgment. Sense perception in this classification has a particular status as a channel. It gives direct access to first order phenomena and, as such, it is the function of consciousness (attention) through which something is noticed or apprehended. It serves as the foundation of all functions in that it provides them their sensory materials. Between perception and judgment, there is a series of intermediate acts: the act of presentation, which has as content second order phenomena, the act of abstraction, and what he calls the acts of synthesis, whose specific contents are sets [Inbegriffe].

From this class of intellectual functions, Stumpf sets apart the class of feelings or emotional functions. Stumpf's works in the field of emotions gave rise to a debate with Brentano and to many discussions, in particular with the American psychologist Titchener. At issue was whether the nature of pleasure provided by an object such as a work of art for instance is intentional, as in Brentano's theory, in which it is closely related to the class of emotions, or phenomenal as in Husserl's and the sensualist theories of James and Mach. Stumpf claims that there is a specific difference between sense-feelings (bodily pleasure, pain, etc.) which are sensory qualities like sound and color, and emotions (joy, sadness, anger, disgust, etc.), which are intentional states directed towards states of affairs. Between emotional and intellectual functions, there is the same relation of foundation as that between judgment and perception, since judgment, or more precisely states of affairs, are presupposed by emotional functions which, although more complex than these, are nevertheless structured in the same way. In addition to emotions, this class of feelings subsumes the acts of desire and will, upon which the field of ethics is based. Between emotions and will, there is a hierarchy comparable to that of the class of intellectual states, with the difference being, however, that the phenomenal basis of the class of emotional acts is nothing other than sense-feelings (pleasure and displeasure). Emotions belong to the subclass of passive feelings, while desire and will belong to the subclass of active feelings. Feelings are passive in that that they have something existent as object (that is any object of a true judgment) while active feelings are related to a duty (object of a voluntary act). Values are the specific content of the class of active feelings (desire and will) while the contents of an emotion are states of affairs. Emotions are evaluative states concerning the content of a judgment and the evaluative element of emotions lies in the positive or negative stance with respect to the judged state of affairs. The difference between these two classes of acts lies therefore in their quality, meaning their negative or positive stance [Stellungsnahme] regarding their object: acceptance and rejection in the case of judgment, love and hate in the case of the entire class of feelings. The relation of foundation between emotions and judgments or beliefs presupposes, on the one hand, a causal relation between state of belief and valuation (or stance), and on the other hand, an intentional relation between the content of belief and the emotion. From this point of view, jealousy, to use Stumpf's example, would be a negative stance the state of affairs that a given person possesses and which another person wants or covets, and this state is caused by the belief or judgment (true) that this state of affairs exists [besteht].

4. Philosophy and the Classification of Sciences

If the study of descriptive psychology is limited to psychical functions, then to which science does the study of phenomena, relations, and formations belong? Stumpf tackles this question in the essay “On the Classification of Sciences” in which he also addresses the issue of the status of philosophy and its specific tasks in comparison with other sciences. Although he does not accept the existence of a unique criterion of classification, he nevertheless maintains the traditional division between social or human sciences and natural sciences, which in this essay he uses as a starting point. Being the science of elementary functions, descriptive psychology is considered the foundation of all the human sciences, understood as the sciences of complex functions, in that they presuppose the contribution of the functional activity of several agents and their coordination. Psychology is to the human sciences what physics is to the natural sciences. The study of phenomena, relations, and formations, however, belongs to neither the natural sciences nor to the social sciences. Stumpf claims they represent three different fields of research, corresponding to three distinct sciences: phenomenology as the science of phenomena, eidology, which studies formations, and the general theory of relations understood as the science of relations as a whole. These three new sciences are said to be “neutral” with regard to existing sciences, and they have the function of “propaedeutic sciences” in that their field of study represents the raw materials, and the starting point of both the natural and social sciences. To use Stumpf's terms, they are the atrium and the organon of all sciences and of philosophy.

What Stumpf calls phenomenology in his two Academy treatises of 1906 is a field of study to which he dedicated many works, from his early investigation on the origin of spatial perception up to his 1926 book on vowels and phonetics. Note that this phenomenology is not to be confused with that of his student Husserl, whether in the latter's Logical Investigations, in which it is defined as descriptive psychology, or in his subsequent books, namely the first book of Ideas, in which it is understood as a transcendental phenomenology, and refers to a general program in philosophy. On the one hand, the field of phenomenology in Stumpf's sense is limited to phenomena and their properties, and is defined narrowly as a science of phenomena; on the other hand, while recognizing the significant contribution made by Husserl to phenomenology, Stumpf believes that the very idea of a “pure” phenomenology in Ideas I is simply a contradiction in itself. Stumpf's phenomenology is also different from Mach's phenomenalism and the latter's conception of the objects of physics as “permanent possibilities of sensation,” to use the expression found in J.S. Mill. Mach's doctrine of elements, while making an important contribution to the domain of phenomenology, must be dissociated from his empiricism, according to which objects of physics, just as those of psychology, are reducible to elements or to complexes of elements. Stumpf's reference regarding phenomenology is that of the physiologist E. Hering. Hering deserves merit for having recognized, for physiology and psychology, the importance of a preliminary study of phenomena and having thus conferred a privileged status to the field of phenomenology, in comparison to that of physics and physiology, serving as a starting point for empiricists such as Helmholtz. In fact, by adopting this starting point in Sehdinge, Hering would have recognized the methodological primacy of phenomenology over the other sciences and its propaedeutic status in the study of the essential properties or attributes (space, intensity, brightness, etc.) of sense phenomena.

The study of formations and of objects of thought in general belongs to this second neutral science called “eidology,” an expression that Stumpf borrowed from Herbart. Stumpf first introduced the notion of formation [Gebilde] in 1902 in order to characterize the specific contents of functions or what he also calls the objective correlates of a psychical function. Formations are contents that enter into the consciousness by carrying out specific functions in the sense that to every class and subclass of acts there corresponds a certain content specific to each and every act. All psychical functions, from the simplest to the most complex, have their specific contents: concepts, states of affairs and values, to name only the most important ones. For example, the act of abstraction, which is responsible for the formation of concepts, namely the concept of space, has a concept as its own specific content. States of affairs are contents of judgment, and they are comparable to Meinong's objectives, Husserl's objectivity, and Bolzano's “proposition in itself,” and they play a central role in Stumpf's logic. They are “correlates” of thought, and contrary to individual acts, they have an objective character. The objectivity of formations, however, is not to be understood in terms of intentional inexistence (Brentano) or in the sense of Platonic realism (Bolzano and Frege), because any formation is logically dependent of the act that produces it, and the existence of states of affairs is logically linked to that of the act of judgment. States if affairs are therefore abstracted in the sense that they cannot exist independently of the acts by which they are produced. The same rule can be found in the field of more complex functions such as emotions, desires and voluntary actions, whose specific contents are values. The very possibility of a neutral science such as eidology shows that we can study values for themselves, independently of functions. Yet Stumpf claims that it is not possible to dissociate formations from their original functions.

Relations form the third group of objects whose study belongs to a general theory of relations. This theory represents an important part of logic and of formal ontology whose task, in fact, is to study those laws governing formal relations between objects and parts of objects. This aspect of the general theory of relations is comparable to Husserl's pure logic, while in the field of psychology it corresponds to what Lotze calls “relational thought” and to the analysis of elementary mental structures in Dilthey's descriptive psychology. The relations of structure between psychical functions and the hierarchy within the domain of simple and complex functions obey what Stumpf refers to as “laws of structure” between parts or aspects of a whole. Its task is to establish relations between phenomena, functions, and formations and to investigate the origins of complex relations in simple relations, fixed by means of definition, and to determine the structural laws to which they obey. To these Grundverhälnisse or fundamental relations belong, among others, the concepts of analogy, equality, and fusion that Stumpf examines succinctly in the second volume of Tonpsychologie, as being the relations of logical and real dependency, the part-whole relations, and relations of real dependency between psychical functions. These relations are not “forms of thought” in a Kantian sense; they are not imposed on sensory material by means of any psychical functions; rather, they are immanent to phenomena and are perceptible directly and without intermediary. Sensory contents are noticed or remarked in themselves, and each of these relations is, to again use the scholastic expression, anens rationis cum fundamento in re. The notion of fusion designates one of the forms of relations that structure the sensory material. It defines itself as the relation between two phenomena (or contents of sensation) by virtue of which they do not merely form a sum, but a whole. Stumpf argues that those elements which fuse into a whole, for example the quality and intensity of sounds in a melody, are not changed, but that this relation of fusion establishes a narrower unity between these contents that is perceptible as a gestalt. To use the well-known case of the melody, moments of quality and of intensity form in that case a unitary whole which is perceptible as a “quality of form,” and it is precisely the unitary character of this perception, the fact that it is perceptible in one stroke and immediately as unitary form, that Stumpf tries to account for through his notion of a relation of fusion.

Now, what is the place of philosophy in this classification of sciences? Considering Stumpf's involvement in the empirical fields of acoustics and ethnomusicology for example historians of philosophy have made contradictory judgments as to the philosophical bearing of his work. However, even in Stumpf's empirical research, philosophy has always remained the “lady of the house.” It is true that philosophy must start from below and that this bottom-up procedure is akin to the methodology of the natural sciences; but Stumpf's philosophy is as much alien to positivism as it is to constructivism and speculative philosophy in general. The importance he attached to the research domain of neutral sciences in philosophy and the task assigned to the sciences of nature in the study of these domains, clearly shows his distance from Kantianism. Stumpf believes, however, that the social sciences, understood as the sciences of complex functions, are privileged over the sciences of nature for reasons that explicitly concern the foundational status of descriptive psychology for human sciences and its central position in philosophy. In this regard, the philosophical disciplines par excellence, such as logic and ethics, are based on mental functions which, as we know, belong to the field of psychology. But philosophy as a whole is also distinct both from the sciences of nature and from the sciences of mind, in that it is the most general science of all. It defines itself as the science of the most general objects or metaphysics. As such, philosophy is prima philosophia, although in a sense quite different from the classical metaphysics, since it is meant as being in continuity with existent sciences. Its tasks are numerous and diverse, ranging from treating general issues related to time, and space to treating those related to mind-body problems. One of the questions to which Stumpf paid a particular attention was that of the psychophysical relations. In his studies on Spinoza and in his conference entitled “Body and Soul,” for example, Stumpf criticized the theory of parallelism that was dominant in the nineteenth century since Fechner, and which had adopted, after Lotze, the theory of interactionism, which recognizes the causal action of bodily processes on the psychical and vice versa. This interactionnism goes hand in hand with a form of critical realism, according to which the hypothesis of the existence of the spatiotemporal world is a necessary and unavoidable assumption, one that is also generally believed in the natural sciences.

5. Language and Logic

Stumpf did not publish any specific work on the topic of logic and wrote only a few pieces on language. However, these are two research topics that generated great interest in Stumpf, along with some writing and a good number of lectures. The topic of language was central in a study of 1876 he devoted to Anton Marty's dissertation entitled Über den Ursprung der Sprache (1875), and in several other studies. Also worth mentioning is an essay on the psychology of music in England (1885) and his book Die Anfänge der Musik (1911), in which he discusses, in relation to Spencer and Darwin, the theory regarding the linguistic origin of music. Finally, Stumpf made a significant contribution to the field of phonology and conducted extensive research on the nature of vowels and linguistic sounds, which led to the publication of his book Die Sprachlaute (1926), in which he experimentally confirms Helmholtz's principles on the theory of vowels. As for the topic of logic, there are many syllabuses and extensive lecture notes, including those written by Husserl during his studies in Halle, that again show a direct influence of Brentano. We know that logic is closely related to Stumpf's theory of relations and eidology, which are central elements in both his philosophical and empirical works. More precisely, in these two areas of research, Stumpf's contribution to logic concerns both the specific content of judgment (belief), or what he calls states of affairs, and that part of the theory of relations pertaining to part-whole relations. The first leads to a theory on the states of affairs, while the second is useful in developing a formal ontology, one that occupied an important place in the logic of his student Husserl. Finally, mention should be made of Stumpf's publications on the relation between logic and the theory of probabilities, and his research pertaining to the elaboration of a theory of induction. He claimed that the application of probability concepts does not involve any presuppositions on the external world and on the law of causality, for the calculus of probability is purely a priori and is derived solely from the concept of probability itself.

As for his lectures on logic, while he adopted Brentano's important distinction between what a statement expresses and what it means, Stumpf did not subscribe to Brentano's central thesis on the reduction of categorical statements to existential statements. The meaning of a sentence corresponds to the contents of a function or cognitive state, which is distinct from the quality and matter of a predicative judgment. The quality of an act of judgment relates to its affirmation or negation, its acceptance or rejection of the matter of a judgment expressed linguistically by the copula “is” or its negation. The matter [Materie] of a judgment, which is provided by the lower level act of presentation, is what remains when one abstracts from affirmation and negation, or the simple complex of presentation (subject and predicate less the copula). In addition to its quality and matter, a judgment has content or a state of affairs. This notion roughly corresponds to what we call a proposition and it is expressed linguistically in subordinate clauses [daß-Sätzen] or in the infinitive form (the being p of S). The truth of a statement is defined as the adequacy of the judgment quality of its content, that is the property of a judicative content by virtue of which acceptance (or its opposite, rejection) is triggered by purely objective motives. This concept of truth is inseparable from the evidence of internal perception (is true what is mediately or immediately self-evident), and this also plays a central role in his theory of knowledge.

The study of the structures of the judgment's contents as such, apart from its functions and contingent states, is one of the tasks Stumpf assigns to this part of eidology (the neutral science which studies formations), which he calls the theory of states of affairs. States of affairs, like any other formation, are governed by general and necessary laws, and are distinct of the individual and the contingent act of judging. These are structural laws, or what he calls axioms in his Erkenntnislehre, that govern relations between elementary psychical formations. Stumpf distinguishes formal axioms, which apply to any objects, and material or regional axioms, which apply to specific domains of objects, such as in the domains of phenomenology (structural relations between phenomena) and that of psychology (structural relations between elementary psychical functions). Of particular interest to logic are the axioms of consequence [Folgerungsaxiome], which are expressed in propositions that posit a relation between the premises and the conclusion in terms of necessary inference.

Stumpf did not work out a logic of parts and wholes, or mereology; however, the theory of psychological parts that he elaborated in his Raumbuch was the basis for subsequent development in formal ontology, namely in Husserl's third Logical Investigations, which, in turn, was influential in the development of this part of logic. The theory he develops in Section 5 of this work, in fact, forms the core of his position on the empiricism-nativism controversy regarding space perception. Stumpf advocates a moderate form of nativism and claims that the visual (and tactile) space is a unitary content, as immediately and directly perceptible perceptible as sensory qualities. Hence, space and color belong to the one and the same content of which they are partial contents [Theilinhalte]. By “partial contents,” or what he later refers to as attributes, Stumpf means dependent contents, in which the elements of a complex of presentation cannot be presented separately according to their nature. Stumpf differentiates two classes of relations between the contents of presentation: the class of independent contents such as color and sound, which are specific qualities of different senses; and the class of relations of dependency, whose terms, such as quality and extension, cannot be presented separately. The relata of a relation of dependency cannot exist separately from one another, they cannot be presented separately. In other words, it is not possible to perceive purely qualitative (color, sound) or quantitative (intensity) content, or a substance without attributes. These relations of dependency are neither associative, nor summative; they are necessary relations, that obey the laws of structure. These are neither concepts, categories nor Denkformen a priori imposed from the outside, rather they are properties inherent to sensory phenomena. Yet, this class of relation is not limited to phenomena, even less so to mental states; rather its field of application is much broader, as evidenced by Stumpf's general theory of relations, although Stumpf did not developed a formal theory of these relations as did Husserl.

6. Further Contributions to Philosophy

6.1 Theory of Knowledge

In an article published in 1891 under the title “Psychology und Erkenntnistheorie” Stumpf criticized both the Kantians, who tried to liberate the theory of knowledge from psychology, and psychologists who claim in general to reduce the theory of knowledge and philosophy to psychology. Remember that this was the first article that addressed the issue of psychologism directly, and we know the influence this paper exerted on Husserl's arguments against the logical psychologism in his Prolegomena. Kant's position, which served as a starting point for Stumpf in this article, was that of the neo-Kantian W. Windelband who had been using the term psychologism since 1877 in a pejorative sense to denounce opponents of Kant or those who, like Fries and Beneke, advocated a psychological interpretation of his philosophy. According to Stumpf's diagnosis, the neo-Kantian argument against psychologism was that psychology can never lead to the knowledge of “general and necessary truths” and that we can even ignore it altogether since, as Kant argued in the first Critique, the sources of knowledge lie in a priori forms of intuition and thought. This form of antipsychologism can therefore be described as metaphysical in the same sense as the postulate of an empty space. Stumpf recognized the value of the Kantian's objections directed against psychologism, including the normative nature of laws, but he argued that it was wrong to deny any contribution made by psychology to the theory of knowledge. Excluding psychology altogether in the theory of knowledge amounts to refusing the important and indispensable resources which we need to account for the origin of those categories and synthetic judgments for which Kantianism has no explanation.

Although psychology is essential to a theory of knowledge, its field of study differs significantly from the latter. By psychology, Stumpf understands the science of psychical functions; for example acts of judgment whose contents are states of affairs, which is the main topic of logic. Descriptive psychology differs from genetic or physiological psychology, which studies the physiological processes underlying psychical acts. Yet the kind of psychologism that Stumpf criticizes does not take this distinction into account when it assigns to a theory of knowledge the task of accounting for the physiological processes and causal connections underlying mental acts (judgments). In his posthumous work Erkenntnislehre, Stumpf claims that the task of descriptive psychology differs from that of the theory of knowledge in that it studies the origin of concepts while the theory of knowledge's main task is questioning the origin and justification of knowledge, not the physiological causes, but the contents of acts (of judgment) and their relations to thought. Stumpf's position on justification is akin to that of Brentano, and it is based on the evidence of inner perception, a position that was severely criticized by M. Schlick in his Allgemeine Erkenntnislehre.

In his treatise “On the Classification of Sciences,” Stumpf clearly indicates that issues pertaining to the origin of knowledge are related to the research fields of the three neutral sciences partly overlapping the theory of knowledge. In this perspective, the debate on psychologism takes a somewhat different meaning, since recognizing the merits of the principle of separation between psychology, understood as the foundation of human or social sciences, and the theory of knowledge, based on the three neutral sciences, the objection against Kant and his theory of knowledge is not only to have neglected psychology in the narrow sense of the term, but also to have underestimated the use of phenomenology, eidology, and relations theory to solve epistemological problems. On the other hand, considering Husserl's criticism against Mach's psychologism in the Prolegomena, he argues that the error of this kind of psychologism is to overestimate the domain of phenomenal experience, to which Mach reduces the objects and laws of the natural sciences.

6.2 Musicology and Aesthetics

In addition to his works in the field of physical and psychological acoustics, Stumpf wrote several philosophical papers on the topic of music. The first, which served as a preliminary work to his Tonpsychologie, was published in 1885 under the title “The Psychology of Music in England” where he critically discussed the research of Gurney, Spencer, and Darwin on the relation between music and language. In 1897, he also published two historical treatises on musicology: one on the concept of consonance in the Middle Ages and the second on the pseudo-Aristotelian problem of music. But Stumpf's classical work on this issue is Die Anfänge der Musik (1911) that is the culmination of more than 25 years of empirical and theoretical research in the field of music. In the first part of this book, he discusses the origin and forms of musical activity as well as various theories on the origin of music, including those of Darwin, Rousseau, Herder, and Spencer, which he rejected in favor of the theory introduced in Tonpsychologie based on the concept of fusion, in which he sees the essence of music (consonance). He also summarized his works on the historical development of instruments and music in the second part of the book, tstudied the music of primitive peoples in various countries around the world, and provided transcriptions of several primitive songs, including detailed musical analysis.

Although Stumpf published only one study on aesthetics (“Die Lust am Trauerspiel,” 1887), that topic figures among Stumpf's main theoretical interests, and we know that he planned to study that topic in the fourth volume of Tonpsychologie in relation to music. The three studies collected in his book Gefühl und Gefühlsempfindung (1928) partly fulfill the abandoned project. First is the distinction between emotions, which are intentional states and which, as judgments, are directed towards complex objects or states of affairs, and sense-feelings, which are phenomena essential to aesthetic enjoyment. In a paper on musical anhedonia (1916), Stumpf studies the psychopathological case of a musician suffering from the inability to feel pleasure while listening to music despite his auditory sense not being significantly affected, in order to show that anhedonia to musical notes would result in apathy or loss of emotion or pleasure regarding music in general. Sense-feeling is therefore a necessary though not sufficient condition for aesthetic sentiment. Stumpf, in fact, acknowledged two different sources of aesthetic enjoyment: the first lies in what he calls the fullness of formal relations that inhabit a true work of art among its parts; the second depends on the properties of the object or, more specifically, to the state of affairs presented. The first source is therefore phenomenological, and it lies in the formal relations that are given directly to consciousness. These relations can act aesthetically without the input of conceptual thought, but the aesthetic feeling as a whole can only prevail if feelings and combinations of feelings are entwined with an intentional act, in this case, with an emotion. The second source is more complicated because it presupposes the elaboration of phenomena and sensory data by the judgment and conceptual thought. But Stumpf claims that both sources are two essential conditions for the enjoyment and aesthetic feelings.

6.3 Ethics

In his second address as rector of the University of Berlin in 1908, Stumpf was opposed to formalism and moral skepticism and argued for an ethics based on an objective theory of values. It will be recalled that values are specific contents of acts belonging to the class of emotional functions or feelings and that they resemble the contents of judgment belonging to the class of intellectual functions. Ethics, as aesthetics, is grounded entirely on the class of feelings. Echoing Lotze's distinction between passive and active feelings, Stumpf argues that emotions are passive feelings as opposed to active feelings, which are directed toward a duty, a project, or an intention to be achieved through voluntary actions. Values or value feelings, which are essential for an ethics worthy of its name, refer to the specific contents of will or voluntary actions. Moral actions, as opposed to instinctive or mechanical behavior, presuppose knowledge since this class of acts is grounded on judgments that in turn are at the foundation of theoretical knowledge. Like true judgment, moral behavior differs from blind actions by the insight or self-evidence that is to the content of a feeling (value) what theoretical self-evidence is to a state of affairs. And like the truth in logic, what is good or worthy of being wanted or desired is based on intrinsic and objective values, which are immune to any external forces.

7. Stumpf's Legacy

At the very end of his autobiography, Stumpf confesses that he never sought to found a school and that he is grateful to those of his students who pursued their research based on their own plans in the same scientific spirit. Stumpf's word is confirmed by the testimonies of many of his students who shared the same scientific spirit. They describe Stumpf as a model of precision and clarity in thought and observation, with a keen sense for analysis and a critical attitude towards his own philosophical thought. If he did not found a school, he was responsible for producing outstanding students and contributing directly to the development of two of the most important movements in Germany at the beginning of the twentieth century: gestalt psychology and phenomenology. But Stumpf is also one of the most severe critics of these two movements as evidenced in his Erkenntnislehre, a posthumous work in which he presents the essential elements of his Weltanschauung and in a sense his philosophical testament. Remember that this book is dedicated to Brentano and can be considered as a contribution - the last in importance in the school of Brentano - to the philosophical program of Stumpf's mentor. It is not surprising, therefore, that the criticism Stumpf addresses to his own students in this work is mainly motivated by this program.

In this work, he offers a penetrating analysis of the philosophical project that guided Husserl in the first book of Ideas. From Stumpf's perspective, the originality of this new version of phenomenology proposed by Husserl in his book is less on the aspects with which Husserl breaks with the doctrine of the Logical Investigations, in which phenomenology is defined as descriptive psychology, than on those with which Husserl opens up new perspectives to descriptive psychology and phenomenology in the sense of Stumpf. This is the case, in the first part of the book, of phenomenology understood as a doctrine of essence, in which he aims at founding the empirical sciences on the so-called regional ontologies. This undertaking belongs to a more general theory of science that Husserl worked out in this book. Stumpf understands this project as a widening of the initial program on psychognosie by Lotze and Brentano, a program that according to Stumpf, is nothing more than a regional phenomenology or ontology in the sense of Husserl. However, he does not see any progress in the idea of a “pure” or transcendental phenomenology, nor in the postulate of a pure ego to which something like a “rein Ichblick” is supposed to give access. For, if this purity is acquired by virtue of the method of the reduction used, more precisely the eidetic reduction, than by bracketing the existence of objects, it rules out eo ipso the possible contribution made by the empirical sciences. Stumpf also questions the status of sense perception and the domain of phenomena in this perspective, given that Husserl's Wesenschau can only be exercised on what Stumpf calls mere presentations or second order phenomena. In his comments on Stumpf in Section 86 of Ideas I, Husserl points out that the study of phenomena belongs to what he calls in the introduction to this work “eidetic psychology.” But as a science of facts and of realities, this psychology is subject to reduction and does not seem to contribute significantly to the version of transcendental phenomenology found in Ideas I. Stumpf concludes that this version of phenomenology is a phenomenology without phenomena, both by the status of phenomena in this work and by the peculiar conception of (transcendental) phenomenology.

The criticism Stumpf addressed to the gestalt psychology of the Berlin school is also motivated by the principles of descriptive psychology and focuses on the perception of forms and some philosophical presuppositions. The first assumption that Stumpf challenges is a form of sensualistic naturalism. The second is the metaphysical question of the psychophysical relations and the attempt by Köhler to introduce the concept of form into the field of physics. Stumpf believes that the theory of isomorphism that postulates an identity between the structural laws of the mental and physical worlds, presupposes the theory of parallelism, which Stumpf rejects. As to the perception of gestalts, Stumpf argues that the Berlin school went too far in its criticism of classical psychology in assimilating the parts (founding contents) within the whole (founded contents) of the gestalt. In other words from this perspective, the forest hides the trees. Stumpf claims that when we perceive a triangular figure or a melody, for example, we always have a complex of sensations organized and structured by the relations between the various parts or partial contents, and these relations are themselves perceived. A gestalt, accordingly, is conceived as a complex of structural relations, and this presupposes, among other things, the perception of relations, the possibility of phenomenal content that is unnoticed, and the distinction between phenomena and mental functions. The members of this school reject these three presuppositions linked to what W. Köhler called the constancy hypothesis. Stumpf wonders whether, considering the difficulties associated with this conception of the perception of forms, it is not premature to abandon the basic principles of his descriptive psychology on behalf of this hypothesis.


Primary Sources

Stumpf's Works in English and other Languages

Secondary Sources

Special Issues

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Brentano, Franz | Brentano, Franz: theory of judgement | Husserl, Edmund | James, William | Lotze | Mally, Ernst | Marty, Anton | Meinong, Alexius | phenomenology | sounds