Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Thu Oct 1, 2009

“Neo-Daoism” (or “Neo-Taoism” in the “Wade-Giles” system of romanization) names the focal development in early “medieval” Chinese philosophy, from the third to the sixth century C.E. In Chinese sources, this development is called xuanxue (hsüan-hsüeh, in Wade-Giles), literally the “learning” or study (xue) of the “dark” or mysterious and profound (xuan).

The word xuan is defined in two ways in the Eastern Han dynasty (25­–220 C.E.) lexicon Shuowen jiezi by Xu Shen (fl. 100 C.E.), an important reference for the study of early Chinese texts. First, xuan denotes a shade of “black with dark red.” This appears to be the root meaning of the term. In the Shijing (Classic of Poetry), for example, xuan is sometimes used to depict the color of fabrics or robes (e.g., see the poems “Qiyue” [Mao no. 154] and “Hanyi” [Mao no. 261]). It is also used, notably in the Yijing (Classic of Changes), to describe the color of “heaven” (tian) (see, e.g., the “Wenyan” commentary to Hexagram 2). Stripped of all cosmological references, this may evoke simply an image of the approach of dawn. In any event, by extension xuan gains a richer meaning connoting what is “hidden and far” (youyuan), as Xu Shen reports in the Shuowen. This echoes the Laozi (also known as Daodejing), the premier classic of Daoism, in which xuan figures metaphorically to bring out one of its central tenets—namely, the profound depth and unfathomability of the Dao or “Way.” The Dao is “nameless” and “formless,” as the Laozi intimates, transcending language and sensory perception, and yet it is the author of “heaven and earth” and the myriad creatures. Thus, the Dao can only be described as mysteriously profound and in this sense, “dark” (see especially chapter 1).

Xuanxue aims at unlocking the mystery of Dao, but it is not a partisan “Daoist” school. As such, the label “Neo-Daoism,” though convenient, is ambiguous and must be treated with care. This will be explained more fully in the next section.

Xuanxue is also not monolithic. The concept of Dao provides a focus, a point of departure, but it invites diverse interpretation. Xuanxue arose during a time of turmoil and uncertainty after the fall of the Han dynasty (206 B.C.E.–220 C.E.), when leading intellectuals of the succeeding Wei (220–265) and Jin (265–420) dynasties sought to interrogate tradition afresh so as to arrive at a new blueprint for order, which occasioned intense debates and set new directions for the development of Chinese philosophy. In what follows, I will focus on some of its major figures and debates; but first, the meaning of xuanxue and the context in which it came into prominence in early medieval China require further attention.

1. What is Xuanxue?

As a proper term, xuanxue came into currency during the fifth century C.E., designating a branch of learning officially recognized by the central government, forming a part of the curriculum of the imperial academy, besides “Confucian” studies (Ru), “literature” (wen), and “history” (shi) (Song shu, chapter [juan] 93). In this technical sense, like “Ru,” perhaps the term should be transliterated as “Xuanxue,” i.e., capitalized and without italics, though it may be less confusing to stay with one convention—in this instance, “xuanxue”—consistently throughout.

The subject matter of xuanxue in this formal sense seems to have centered on the Yijing, Laozi, and Zhuangzi, and selected commentaries to them. According to the sixth-century work Yanshi jiaxun (Master Yan’s Family Instructions), the Yijing, Laozi, and Zhuangzi were then collectively referred to as the “Three [Treatises on the] Profound” (sanxuan) (chapter 8, “Mianxue”); that is to say, they were seen to be the three most important works that aimed at disclosing the deepest truth about the cosmos and human flourishing, a profound mystery that they sought to capture especially by the concept of Dao. The goal of xuanxue, then, is precisely to unlock that mystery, bringing to light the nature and function of Dao, which appears dark and impenetrable.

Proponents of this new discourse at that time and later historians traced its beginnings to the third century C.E. Specifically, they considered the leading intellectual figures of the Zhengshi era (240–249) of the Wei dynasty such as He Yan (ca. 207–249, “Ho Yen” in Wade-Giles) and Wang Bi (226–249, “Wang Pi”) to have been the architects of the xuanxue movement. Subsequently, xuanxue came to describe retrospectively the perceived dominant intellectual orientation of early medieval China as a whole, from the Wei through the Jin to the end of the Northern and Southern Dynasties period (420–589).

The north-south political division started as early as 317, when the Jin ruling house was forced to flee southward and established a new capital in the city of Jiankang (modern Nanjing). After the Jin came to an end in 420, China was ruled by a series of short-lived dynasties in the north and in the south, separated roughly by the Huai River. In simple terms, one could imagine how the reputation of He Yan, Wang Bi and other Wei-Jin scholars quickly grew among the educated elite. During the fifth century, then, those in a position to make national education policies in the south saw something profound in their writings and instituted a new branch of official learning. Later scholars then took the term xuanxue to describe the characteristic feature of the entire early medieval Chinese intellectual scene.

This is a broad stroke that privileges intellectual unity over diversity. As we shall see, however, significant differences mark individual xuanxue thinkers, although there are “family resemblances,” to borrow a phrase from modern Western philosophy, which set them apart from earlier traditions. In the pages that follow, the terms xuanxue and Neo-Daoism will be used in a general sense, as a broad, dynamic intellectual front that flourished during early medieval China, as opposed to a homogeneous “school” with set doctrines. In modern Chinese, xuanxue is also taken to refer to astrology, geomancy and other popular religious arts, which falls outside the scope of the present discussion.

From today’s critical historical perspective, the roots of xuanxue, as is to be expected of a general intellectual orientation, extend beyond any individual thinker. To understand Neo-Daoism, it is important to make clear the context in which it first arose, which goes back to the last years of the Han dynasty. By the last quarter of the second century C.E., the once mighty Han empire was already in a state of irreparable decline, with regional military commanders seizing control and vying for supremacy. Among them, Cao Cao (155–220) proved the strongest and in 220 C.E. his son, Cao Pi (187–226), formally ended the rule of Han and established the Wei dynasty.

The third century was a time of profound change. The end of the Han dynasty brought political turmoil and hardship, but it also forced open a space for intellectual renewal. During the early years of the Wei dynasty, although the state had to contend with two rival kingdoms—Shu to the southwest and Wu to the southeast—and despite perilous power struggles among different factions within the Wei court itself, there was an air of optimism that order could be restored. The economy revived. There were eager attempts to reform public administration, especially the process of appointment of officials, and law. Scholars debated on ways to realizing the ideal reign of “great peace” (taiping)—an ideal of long standing but which gained renewed potency from the twilight of the Han—based on their interpretation of the teachings of the ancient sages and philosophers preserved in classical writings. Any blueprint for lasting peace and order presupposes an understanding of the Dao, which as the Laozi discloses, signifies the creative beginning and teleological end of all things (e.g., chapters 1, 16 and 25). Obviously, what the Laozi means by this and how this relates to the “namelessness” and “formlessness” of Dao requires explication, which is the work of xuanxue, but generally it is in this context, guided by a keen “Dao-centered” consciousness, that Neo-Daoism came into play.

However, it has been suggested that xuanxue reflects certain “escapist” interest. This view seems to gain support especially from the close connection between xuanxue and “Pure Conversation” (qingtan).

Pure Conversation (or “Pure Talk,” as the term qingtan has also been translated) was one of the hallmarks of early medieval Chinese literati culture and flourished throughout the period. Early usage of the term indicates that it was understood at first as a kind of cutting assessment of individual character and ability, especially in terms of a person’s suitability for public office. Indeed, leaders of the late Han intellectual elite met regularly for this purpose and a favorable judgment from them could translate into significant political capital. Famously, for example, Cao Cao sought and received a judgment when he was yet relatively unknown that he would be a bane to the country in peace times but a great leader of intelligence and courage in times of disorder (Hou Han shu 68). The philosophical basis for this kind of character assessment will be discussed later when we consider the contribution of He Yan.

In its mature manifestation, however, qingtan refers more generally to an upper-class cultural phenomenon, perhaps not unlike the salons of early modern Europe in some respects, in which men of letters (mostly men, although some women were also known for their talent in this arena) gathered in pleasure and devoted their talent to music, philosophy, and other forms of cultured discourse. A formal Pure Conversation session requires a distinguished host who is of standing, means, and recognized intellectual caliber, and a cast of select guests. Leaving aside its social and aesthetic aspects, a typical session would involve a debate on a current philosophical topic, such as the relationship between “capacity” and “nature” in a person (to be discussed separately below), which later scholars classify as “Neo-Daoist” in nature. Reports of such gatherings would be circulated among the educated elite. For a young scholar, success at Pure Conversation could earn him a prestigious government post; indeed, brilliance at Pure Conversation could even become the stuff of legends. For present purposes, however, it is enough to note that xuanxue in the general sense defined above informs Pure Conversation.

The roots of Pure Conversation have been traced to a political protest movement that shook the Chinese world toward the end of the Han period. It has come to be known as “Pure Criticism” (qingyi), which reflects the judgment of later writers (mainly Confucian scholars) that the movement was motivated by pure intentions and aimed at purifying corrupt practices in the Han government. Led by eminent scholar-officials and students of the imperial academy, it was directed especially against the alleged abuses of powerful eunuchs at court. However, the movement was suppressed harshly. Consequently, many intellectuals seem to have become disillusioned with the political process. Fearing for their safety and disheartened by the apparent futility of political engagement in effecting meaningful change, they turned to, as it were, “purer” pursuits, channeling their creative and intellectual energy to art and philosophy, away from the treacherous waters of politics. Culturally, they indulged in wine, games, fashion and outlandish behavior that seemed to have been designed expressly to upset the status quo. Examples of these will be mentioned below. In short, according to this view, inasmuch as xuanxue forms a key ingredient of Pure Conversation, it gives voice to a spirit of escapism that finds refuge and takes delight in abstract philosophical Daoist discourse and certain counter-culture expressions.

No doubt, many literati in early medieval China found politics to be exceedingly corrupt. During this time, eremitic ideals also became entrenched in mainstream high culture. Nevertheless, the charge of escapism does not do justice to xuanxue or accord a full view of the intellectual landscape.

While some scholars had lost faith in the political process, others continued to harbor hope in revitalizing the rule of Dao, however it might be defined, and pushed for political reform. While some considered political involvement distasteful and trained their minds on alternative paths of fulfillment such as art and spirituality, others sought to reclaim what they understood as the true teachings of the sages so as to lay a strong foundation for a new sociopolitical awakening. While some deliberately refrained from commenting on their contemporaries or current affairs to avoid recrimination, many others continued the tradition of “Pure Criticism” in assessing the worth of individuals and fought for their ideals. It is not the case that only the former pursued xuanxue; rather, the view presented here is that both sides contributed to the unfolding of Neo-Daoism. At any rate, eremitism in early medieval China seldom translated into abandoning the sociopolitical world; in most cases, it signaled personal “purity” or integrity, a highly valued asset if not precondition for admission to officialdom. As a general intellectual orientation, xuanxue is united in its attempt to illuminate the “dark,” to lay bare the profound mystery of Dao, but it remains richly complex and encompasses a range of responses to the brave new world that was post-Han China.

During the heyday of the Han dynasty, the Confucian tradition as it was interpreted at that time towered over all other schools of thought. Confidently, it mapped out the structure of the universe and the ways in which the world under heaven ought to be governed. With the decline of the Han dynasty, critiques of Han Confucianism began to surface. When the Han imperial house finally lost its mandate to rule, Han Confucianism seemed lost and powerless in overcoming the forces of disorder that threatened to engulf the country. Indeed, to some scholars then, Han Confucianism was not only ineffective as a remedy but also part of the problem that led to the downfall of the Han dynasty. This provided a point of departure for Neo-Daoism.

The critique of Han Confucianism, it is important to emphasize, does not necessarily amount to a rejection of the teachings of Confucius. In fact, with few exceptions, Wei-Jin intellectuals agreed that Confucius was the highest sage. If it cannot be made clear that “Neo-Daoism” does not entail a kind of “anti-Confucius” campaign, then the label should be abandoned. For the majority of xuanxue scholars, the problem is not Confucius, who penetrated completely the mystery of Dao; rather, it is the perceived misunderstanding and misappropriation of Confucian teachings by Han scholars that fueled Neo-Daoist renovation.

One key concern was that scholarship had become an avenue for emolument, as a result of which self-interest came to outweigh the concern for truth. This in part explains the emphasis on purity in early medieval Chinese literati culture. Furthermore, Han Confucianism attempted to forge an “orthodox” front, to explain and put into practice its teachings, and to silence dissent and opposition. The extent of Confucian orthodox control may be open to debate—orthodoxies are dynamic and never quite finished—but there is little question that it exacted compliance, which set limits to thought. The classics were restricted to a particular mode of interpretation, and non-canonical literature, including Daoist works, were often viewed with suspicion or dismissed outright. In the interest of unity, orthodoxy prescribed closure; but in an age of disunity, the quest for order charged through intellectual barriers with emancipatory fervor.

During the Han period, commentaries emerged as the principal medium of philosophic expression. Framed methodologically in what has been termed “section and sentence” (zhangju) interpretation, Han commentaries emphasize detailed explanation of individual words and phrases of the classics. The attention to textual and extra-textual detail was at times so overwhelming, as the historian Ban Gu (32–92) observes, that a discussion of a text of five words could take up to twenty or thirty thousand words (Han shu 30). This necessitated heavy specialization, which heightened virtuosity but also opened the door for vain scholastic display and fragmentation of learning. One of the most important debates in xuanxue confronts directly the question of interpretation, which brought hermeneutics to the forefront of Chinese philosophy. More will be said about this debate later.

In this context, a first wave of xuanxue philosophers arrived on the scene. They were the brightest of their age, many of whom hailed from distinguished families who had held high office for generations. They were concerned with restoring unity and harmony to the land, not by repudiating the teachings of the sages but by interpreting them anew. They discerned that the great teachers of old shared a profound understanding of Dao as the source of being and harmony. For this reason, the approach of Han Confucianism could not but lead to misunderstanding of the sage enterprise. In response, they devised new commentarial strategies and fashioned new genres of philosophical discourse, especially the lun, essays that focus on particular topics, which invited refutations and in turn, rejoinders. Some examples of this will be discussed in the sections that follow.

On this view, Confucius and Laozi were both “Daoists,” in the non-partisan sense of the term. To the intellectual elite of third-century China, the Laozi and the Yijing especially afforded a wealth of insight into the cosmos and the human condition. As the xuanxue movement took hold, the value of the Zhuangzi also came to be increasingly recognized. The Laozi and Zhuangzi are Daoist classics. The Yijing is associated closely with Confucius. Xuanxue scholars also privileged the Lunyu (Analects) of Confucius. Convinced of the unity of the classics, each attempted to provide an integral account of the one “Daoist” tradition.

Critics, past and present, are adamant that xuanxue scholars had distorted the teaching of Confucius, or worse, misused the authority of Confucius to give credence to their own agenda. There were even suggestions in traditional sources that Pure Conversation was to be blamed for the political frailty that pervaded the early medieval period. I do not share this view. Politics does form an important part of the xuanxue story, but a fuller understanding rests on a reconstruction of the extant writings of Wei-Jin scholars themselves. Neo-Daoist philosophers set forth the truth of Dao as they understood it in a broad synthesis, bringing together ontology, cosmology, ethics, and political philosophy, and breaking down partisan divides along the way. Crossing swords in debate, competing in offering new readings of the classics, reacting against and influenced by one another—in this crisscrossing of ideas, xuanxue flourished.

Translating the term xuanxue remains a problem. In view of the ambiguity of “Neo-Daoism,” “Dark Learning” has been proposed as an alternative. This is also not entirely satisfactory. Even if it is clear that “dark” does not connote something sinister, it is still problematic because while the subject of the inquiry may appear dark or inaccessible to understanding, there is nothing mysterious about the study or interpretation of it. Innovative and abstract in some respects, xuanxue is nonetheless committed to analytic rigor and clarity in explicating the meaning of Dao, employing a new language that was de rigueur of the age. Critics sometimes condemn it as “dark,” because they judge it obfuscating and detrimental to the flourishing of the Way. They would use phrases like “dark words” (xuanyan) or “dark discourse” (xuanlun) in a pejorative sense, indicating that to them xuanxue was nothing but empty talk, convoluted, mystifying and misguided. In these contexts, “xuan” may be translated as “abstruse” or “arcane.” In a positive sense, I have previously suggested translating xuanxue as “Profound Learning.” Though I still think “profound” is more appropriate than “dark,” this is no less ambiguous. Grammatically the word xuan functions as a noun in “xuanxue.” Perhaps “Learning in the Profound,” “Learning of the Mysterious Dao,” “Investigation of the Dark,” “Inquiry into the Profound” or similar renderings may be considered; but these seem rather bulky. It may be best to retain xuanxue, to avoid misunderstanding. In any case, it should not be assumed that xuan means the same thing in different sources and therefore can be translated uniformly without regard of context.

2. He Yan and Wang Bi

Among the first wave of Neo-Daoist philosophers, He Yan and Wang Bi were remembered by later scholars as having laid the foundation of the new Learning in the Profound. According to the Jin shu (History of the Jin Dynasty), during the Zhengshi reign period of the Wei dynasty, He Yan, Wang Bi, and others set forth the meaning of the Laozi and the Zhuangzi, and established the view that all beings “have their roots in nothingness (wu),” which not only “originates things” but also “completes affairs.” As the Jin shu goes on to relate, wu is that which the yin and yang qi-energies depend on in their creative transformation, that which all beings depend on in acquiring their form, and that which the morally worthy depend on in acquiring their virtuous character (chapter 43, biography of Wang Yan). This offers a helpful starting point for a reconstruction of xuanxue philosophy.

He Yan was one of the leading intellectual figures of the early third century, a trend setter on the cultural front, and during the Zhengshi period from 240 to 249, one of the most influential in government, serving as chief personnel secretary for all non-military political appointments. Wang Bi was very much a protégé of He Yan. It was the latter who recognized Wang’s philosophical genius and recommended him to an official post. A widely reported story has He Yan declaring that Wang Bi was one with whom one could discuss the most profound truths about the cosmos and human affairs (e.g., see Sanguo zhi [Records of the Three Kingdoms] 28).

Both He Yan and Wang Bi were known for their expertise in the Yijing. Both were deeply interested in the Laozi. The fifth-century work Shishuo xinyu (New Accounts of Tales of the World), which is indispensable to understanding early medieval Chinese literati culture, relates that He Yan was working on or had just completed a commentary to the Laozi, but when he saw Wang Bi’s Laozi commentary, he recognized the superiority of the latter and reworked his own into two essays on the Dao and “Virtue” (de) instead (4.7 and 4.10). Wang Bi’s Laozi and Yijing commentaries occupied a privileged place in the formal xuanxue curriculum later, and arguably they remain the most important philosophical treatment of the two classics today. However, it should be noted that both He Yan and Wang Bi wrote on the Confucian Lunyu as well. Through their extant writings, we gain a good view of the central concerns of Neo-Daoist philosophy.

From the Jin shu account cited above, He Yan was credited with having introduced the concept of wu into mainstream Chinese philosophical discourse. Whether that was historically the case is unimportant; what is certain is that the concept of wu plays a pivotal role in xuanxue philosophy. The question is what does it mean?

The concept of wu gains prominence from the Laozi and has been variously translated as “nonbeing,” “nothing,” “nothingness,” or “negativity.” In classical Chinese, wu generally conveys the sense of “not having” something—e.g., “not having a name” (wu ming)—and functions as the opposite of the common word you, “having” something. In the Laozi, it seems to have been used as an abstract noun as well. Specifically, the Laozi declares that wu is the source of all beings (chapter 40) and the basis of all functions (chapter 11). To He Yan and his contemporaries, there is little doubt that the meaning of Dao is to be sought in the concept of wu; but, it does not follow that they all understood the latter in the same way.

He Yan’s writings exist only in fragments today. The most important are (1) his commentary to the Lunyu, which was, however, a collective effort jointly submitted to the throne with several other scholars, and (2) quotations from two of his essays entitled Wuming lun (Discourse on the Nameless) and Dao lun (Discourse on Dao) preserved in later sources. In the former, He Yan explicitly defines the Dao as “that which does not have anything” (wu suo you zhe ye). In what is left of the Dao lun, He Yan writes:

Beings depend on wu in coming into existence, in becoming what they are. Affairs on account of wu come to fruition and become what they are. Now, one tries to speak about wu, but no words could describe it; name it, but it has no name; look at it, but it does not have any form; listen to it, but it does not give any sound. Then, indeed, it is clear that the Dao is complete. Thus, it can bring forth sounds and echoes; generate qi-energies and things; establish form and spirit; and illuminate light and shadows. What is dark obtains its blackness from it; what is plain obtains its whiteness from it. The carpenter’s square is able to make a square because of it; the compass is able to make a circle because of it. The round and the square obtain their form, but that which gives them their form itself does not have any form. The white and the black obtain their name, but that which gives them their name itself does not have any name.

Few scholars in early medieval China would question the general assertion that the Dao is the “beginning” and “mother” of all things, as the Laozi phrases it (chapter 1). There was also widespread acknowledgement of the namelessness and formlessness of Dao. “The Dao that can be spoken of is not the constant Dao,” after all, as the opening words of the Laozi famously declare. The real issue is how can that which transcends language and perception be said to be the creative source of all beings?

According to He Yan, the solution to the mystery of Dao lies in recognizing its “completeness” or undifferentiated wholeness (quan). Precisely because the Dao is whole and complete, it is able to bring forth heaven and earth and the myriad creatures. For the same reason, in its undifferentiated fullness the Dao does not have any particular form, and as such cannot be pinned down conceptually and named. Even the term “Dao,” as the Laozi makes clear, is but a metaphor, a “forced” effort to reference that which is ultimately ineffable (chapter 25), a point which He Yan also emphasizes in his “Discourse on the Nameless”: “The Dao fundamentally does not have a name (dao ben wu ming) [i.e., what the word “Dao” stands for cannot be named]. Thus, Master Lao [i.e., Laozi] said he could only force a name on it.”

Put differently, indeed the Dao can only be described as wu, in the sense that it does not have any distinguishable feature or property characteristic of things. On this reading, wu does not signify ontological absence but on the contrary attests to the fullness and fecundity of Dao. More precisely, through a process of differentiation, the Dao generates the yin and yang qi-energies that constitute all phenomena. The Laozi has also made the point that the Dao is “undifferentiated and complete” (chapter 25). This is now shown to be the source of the yin and yang qi—vital forces, pneumas, or loosely, “energies”—that engender, shape and sustain life. In this respect, He Yan adhered generally to the yin-yang cosmological theory established since the Han dynasty. Properly understood, the nothingness of Dao has important implications for ethics and political philosophy.

Under the qi theory, all things are constituted by a particular measure, both quantitative and qualitative, of the yin and yang qi-energies. For example, heaven is constituted by a particularly clear and refined form of qi, whereas the solidity of earth reflects its “heavier” qi composition. For human beings, each person has been endowed with an allotment of qi from birth, which informs his or her inborn “nature” (xing). Whether this may be considered a kind of “proto-science” or “pseudo-science” need not concern us; here, it is enough to note that the concept of qi pervades Chinese culture and helps shape the course of philosophy. In traditional Chinese terms, the qi endowment of an individual may be “thick” or “thin.” How this is understood bears directly on the conception of the ideal ethical and spiritual life and political community.

He Yan affirms in his Lunyu commentary that “xing-nature is that which human beings have been endowed with and which enables them to live” (5.13). This is to be understood in terms of qi, which also accounts for a person’s “capacity” (cai) (commentary to Lunyu 15.29). In this context, the concept of cai is given a wide remit, encompassing the full range of talent and ability such as physical endowment, intelligence, and emotional and moral capacity. Xuanxue scholars debated hotly on the relationship between a person’s nature and capacity, of which more will be said later.

The height of ethical and spiritual attainment is, of course, represented by the figure of the sage. To He Yan, the sage is precisely one who is gifted with an exceptionally fine and rich qi endowment, which enables him to “merge with the virtue of heaven and earth” (commentary to Lunyu 14.35 and 16.8). This follows the language of the Yijing and introduces a political dimension, for the virtue of heaven and earth brings about communal flourishing, but the underlying assumption remains that “sagehood” rests on a special inborn sage nature that finds expression in optimal capacity on all fronts. This also means that sageness cannot be acquired through learning and effort; in other words, sages are born, not made.

He Yan is noted for his view that the sage “does not experience pleasure and anger, or sorrow and joy” (Sanguo zhi 28, commentary). This suggests that the sage “does not have emotions” (wuqing), as the theory has come to be known in later writings. However, this should not be taken to mean that the sage lacks the capacity to generate cognitive and affective responses. In He Yan’s interpretation, the nature of the sage is ultimately modeled on that of the Dao. Given that the Dao harbors the fullness of qi, conceptually it should be evident that the sage cannot be lacking in any way. The exceptional qi constitution of the sage means that his nature, like that of the Dao, is also undifferentiated and complete. As such, the sage is never partial; his mind is always clear and tranquil, free from doubt and emotional disturbances. Consequently on the political level, he is able to govern with impartiality, provide for the people with his profound virtue, establish lasting order and usher in the reign of great peace.

This is an ideal construct. It may be logically coherent or even compelling, a mark of philosophical distinction prized by Pure-conversation connoisseurs, but what real bearing does it have on politics and government? Sages are obviously rare. Is it the case that only sages could realize great peace? This attracted much debate in early medieval China. He Yan would be committed to defending the unique status of the sage; otherwise, the extraordinary nature of the sage would be irrelevant. Those who hold the opposite view argue that exemplary worthies like Confucius’ disciple Yan Hui could also bring about the ideal political community, provided that their policies were continued for several generations (Sanguo zhi 15).

He Yan would agree that political leadership should rest with worthy individuals like Yan Hui, who is “close to the way of the sage” (commentary to Lunyu 11.19). This is not only because of the rarity of sages but also stems directly from He Yan’s understanding of nature and capacity. Once it is shown that sagehood is not a genuine ethical option, a new ideal becomes necessary. However, Yan Hui is also a special case, whose accomplishments are themselves quite extraordinary (e.g., commentary to Lunyu 6.3) and reflect a superior qi endowment. Only a select few, in other words, can hope to match the attainment of Yan Hui. This in effect marks out a separate class of exceptional individuals, the true elite, so to speak, whose inborn capacity far surpasses that of the common people and therefore should be entrusted with the task of government. There is evidence that He Yan thought highly of himself (Sanguo zhi 9, commentary). In any case, one of the key indicators of superior capacity is the ability to identify talent for public office, which would ensure the proper functioning of sociopolitical processes. Capacity is a function of qi, and just as one grows hot under the collar when angry or turns pale in a moment of fear, the idea is that one’s qi constitution can be discerned by the expert, especially by looking into the person’s eyes.

Together with He Yan, Wang Bi helped set the course of Neo-Daoist philosophy. Although they shared similar philosophical concerns and were close socially and politically, it should not be assumed that they approached the mystery of Dao in the same way. According to the Shishuo xinyu (4.6), when Wang Bi was still in his teens, he sought an audience with He Yan. The latter was aware of Wang’s reputation as a rising philosophical star and put forward what he considered his strongest argument to test him. Not only was Wang able to refute He Yan’s thesis, but just as everyone present thought the issue was resolved, he went on to raise fresh objections to his own argument. This offers a snapshot of Pure Conversation, but more important it shows how intellectual openness and independence is valued in xuanxue.

Wang Bi was a prolific scholar. Before his untimely death at the age of twenty-three, he had already completed a major commentary each on the Yijing and the Laozi, two shorter interpretive essays on them, and a work on the Lunyu. This last, unfortunately, has not survived except for about fifty quotations, cited chiefly in Huang Kan’s (488–545) comprehensive Lunyu commentary, a valuable resource for the study of early medieval China.

Like He Yan, Wang Bi focuses on the concept of “nothingness” (wu) in his explication of Dao. Indeed, as Wang states explicitly, “Dao” is but “the designation of wu,” a symbol of the basis of all beings and functions (commentary to Lunyu 7.6). Contrary to He Yan, however, Wang Bi does not regard the argument from Dao’s completeness to be able to explain fully the mystery of Dao. This is because it fails to resolve the problem of infinite regress. If the chain of beings were to be traced to a specific agent or entity, the origin of the latter must itself be questioned. What gives rise to the category of beings thus cannot be a being, no matter how powerful or fecund, with or without differentiated features. This does not necessarily invalidate the yin-yang cosmological theory, which does yield important insight into the workings of nature and society. Nevertheless, it cannot lay bare the highest Daoist truth, with which the sages of old were principally concerned. To bring to light the mysterious and profound, reflection must venture beyond what may be called the ontology of substance to discern the logic of wu.

The Laozi asserts that “Dao gives birth to [sheng] one,” which produces “two,” and in turn the myriad beings (chapter 42). Whereas Han commentators generally identified the “one” with the original qi that generated the yin and yang vital forces—the “two”—at the beginning of time, i.e., taking the verb “sheng,” to give birth, bring to life, quite literally in terms of a mode of production, Wang Bi may be said to have effected a “paradigm shift” in redirecting attention to the logical ground of the multiplicity and diversity of beings.

The genesis of the cosmos certainly cannot be understood apart from Dao, but the Laozi is not saying that it is the work of a primordial being or substance. As Wang Bi understands it, “beginning” is not a temporal reference but signifies logical priority. “Two” would be inconceivable without “one,” but this is a conceptual relation not to be reduced to a hierarchy of substances or vital forces (commentary to Laozi 42, drawing from Zhuangzi, chapter 2). Dao constitutes the absolute beginning in that all beings have causes and conditions which in the end must logically derive from a single source; but, like “Dao,” “one” remains a symbol and does not reference any original being or substance. Significantly, as Wang Bi makes the point in both his Yijing and Laozi commentaries, in this sense “one” is not a number but that which makes possible all numbers and functions. In the latter (commentary to Laozi 39), Wang defines “one” as “the beginning of numbers and the ultimate of things.” In the former (commentary to Appended Remarks, Part I), he writes, “In the amplification of the numbers of heaven and earth [in Yijing divination] … ‘one’ is not used. Because it is not used, use [of the others] is made possible; because it is not a number, numbers are made complete. This indeed is the great ultimate of change.”

“All things in the world are born of something (you); something is born of nothing (wu),” according to the Laozi (chapter 40). How this is interpreted defines the approach to Dao by individual xuanxue scholars. The view presented here is that for Wang Bi, Dao is not a nameless and formless something of which nothing can be said. This does not deny the existence of an undifferentiated original qi—probably no one in premodern China would deny that; rather, the point is that wu is a higher-order concept that accounts for the coming to be of qi and all qi-constituted phenomena. On He Yan’s reading, it would be appropriate to speak of “the Dao,” with the definite article; but in Wang Bi’s interpretation, Dao as a symbol of wu signals what is not of the category of things. This affirms the radical transcendence of Dao. At the same time, by means of the concept of “one,” Wang is able to affirm also the unity of the Daoist world (that is to say, the world of people, objects and affairs as understood from Wang Bi’s Neo-Daoist perspective), that all beings are rooted in a conceptually necessary ontological foundation, without having to resort to the language of time and being. The idea of a single “root” of existence holds important practical implications.

If Dao is by definition what being is not, how is it related to the world? The concept of “one” points in the general direction, but it requires amplification. The concept of li, pattern or principle, plays an important role in helping to bridge the conceptual divide between transcendence and immanence in Wang Bi’s philosophy. Dao has its “great constancy,” as Wang observes, which finds expression in li (commentary to Laozi 47). What this means is that the Daoist origin and structure of the world, established by the concepts of wu and “one,” is seen to entail an inherent order. The plenitude of nature and the regularity of the seasons, for example, both attest to the presence of Dao in the world, not as primary substance, and still less a supreme deity, but as pristine order marked by intelligible patterns of change and principles of operation. This is the philosophical basis of the claim that Dao not only originates things but also nurtures and completes them, and that Dao is not only the beginning but also the “mother” of all beings (commentary to Laozi 1, 51 and 52).

The world is characterized by ceaseless change and transformation, which at first glance may appear haphazard; but as the Yijing has shown, change conforms to basic principles—not static metaphysical “forms,” but dynamic modes of operation—that can be described generally in terms of the interplay between the yin and yang vital energies. In this sense, the Laozi remarks that human beings are “modeled” after heaven and earth, and ultimately after Dao (commentary to Laozi 25).

Of course, Dao properly understood as wu is not a something that can be modeled after, but as li, it points to an intrinsic order that constitutes and regulates all beings and functions. To Wang Bi, in short, both the Yijing and the Laozi realize that things and affairs follow certain li such as the cycle of growth and decay, and more importantly that the manifold patterns and principles governing the universe, like the branches of a tree, all stem from a single, unified “root.” For this reason, in interpreting the Yijing, Wang emphasizes that the meaning of a hexagram is to be sought in one line, as opposed to all the six lines that make up the hexagram. The technical detail of Wang Bi’s Yijing learning cannot be pursued here, but we will come back to the metaphor of “root and branches” shortly.

Li-principle, “one,” and wu thus combine to engage the mystery of Dao. They inform not only the conception of the order of nature but also that of the self and society. Human beings are of course formed by qi, which may entail different capacity—like his contemporaries, Wang Bi recognizes that a person’s qi endowment may be “thick” or “thin” (commentary to Lunyu 17.2)—but the more important point is that all are equally endowed with a Dao-centered nature, an internal order and harmony that tends toward stillness at its innermost depth. This follows from the analysis of Dao as wu and “one,” which strips away the many disquieting layers of human artificiality and desire to arrive at a tranquil core. This is a key assumption. “One,” according to Wang, as the logical basis of the “many,” signifies also what is of the barest minimum (commentary to Laozi 22), which in this context translates into a view of human nature that has basic needs but little desire in its original, pristine condition. The language here is novel, though the general idea is already captured in the Confucian Liji (Record of Rites): “When human beings are born, they are tranquil; this is the nature of [human beings endowed by] heaven.”

From Wang Bi’s perspective, heaven forms a part of the Daoist world and therefore cannot be identified as the ultimate source of human nature. Further, because Dao has no external referent, it cannot be said that human nature is made in the image of a “creator,” but only that it is “so of itself” (ziran). The concept of ziran is critical to Neo-Daoist philosophy and is usually translated as “naturalness” or “spontaneity.” Commenting on the well-known statement in the Laozi that “Dao models after ziran,” Wang Bi is careful not to reify what is properly conceptual: “Ziran is a term [that we use] to speak of that which has no designation; it is an expression that seeks to lay bare [the meaning of] the ultimate” (commentary to Laozi 25). Human nature so conceived may be described metaphorically as being like a plain block of wood that has not been carved into an ornamental object (pu), or self-referentially as what is “genuine” or “authentic” (zhen) of the person (e.g., commentary to Laozi 16 and 28); but these remain expedient markers pointing to the truth of ziran, of what is “self-so,” understood as being rooted in a conceptually necessary ontological foundation that the ancient sages aptly described as Dao.

The analysis of human nature bears directly on ethics and political philosophy. At the ethical level, Wang Bi could not but disagree with He Yan on the issue of the nature of the sage. Rather than seeing the sage as an exceptional individual blessed with an extraordinary qi endowment that effectively renders him a different kind of being, who consequently is not affected by any differentiated emotions such as pleasure and anger that are inherently partial, as He Yan does, Wang Bi argues that the sage is the same as ordinary men and women in experiencing the full range of emotions. However, there is one decisive difference. While the sage responds to phenomena intellectually and emotionally like everyone else, he is not burdened or enslaved by them because of his “spirit-like perspicacity” (shenming).

If there is a fundamental unity to all beings, it cannot be maintained that a select few are nevertheless exempted from the rule. Given the premise that all are endowed with a Dao-centered nature, the difference between the sage and the average person cannot be one of kind but only of degree and attainment. Moreover, He Yan’s thesis would rule out the possibility of becoming a sage; indeed, even becoming a “near sage” like Yan Hui would be beyond the reach of most people. As such, how can the sage serve as a source of inspiration and motivation? This may be the main point of contention that sets He Yan and Wang Bi apart.

The sage is not without sorrow and joy, according to Wang; even Confucius, the highest sage, could not but be pleased when he met Yan Hui or be saddened by his untimely passing. Yet, the sage realizes that human emotions are ultimately driven by self-interest. Precisely because of his affective responsiveness, the sage is able to understand and empathize with the needs of the people; but because of his “spirit-like perspicacity,” i.e., his heightened spirituality and profound understanding of the nature of things, his heart—or “heart-mind,” as the heart (xin) is seen to be the seat of cognition as well as affects in Chinese thought—remains clear and unburdened by emotional attachments. It is logically invalid, as Wang astutely observes, to conclude from the absence of attachments to the absence of emotions (Sanguo zhi 28, commentary).

The way to sagehood and spirit-like understanding does not lie in suppressing one’s emotions or in any artificial means, but in abiding by the order of ziran, in staying true to one’s “root,” one’s Dao-centered nature. The “authenticity” of the sage entails that he is naturally simple like “uncarved wood,” which is also to say that he is free from the dictates of desire. In this sense, Wang Bi speaks of the sage as embracing “emptiness and quiescence” (e.g., commentary to Laozi 16), or as having returned to a state of “emptiness and nothingness” (commentary to Laozi 48). In this same sense, Wang asserts in a celebrated dialogue with Pei Hui, another senior intellectual figure at that time, that although Confucius did not speak about wu explicitly, he nonetheless embodied it in his every word and action (Sanguo zhi 28, commentary). The crucial hermeneutical point here is that “it”—nothingness—does not refer to any object or substance; once the nature of Dao is understood, the embodiment of wu can only mean the realization of ziran.

This is also how Wang Bi understands the concept of wuwei, often translated as “nonaction,” which figures centrally in the Laozi and appears also in the Lunyu, where it is associated with no less a personage than the sage-king Shun (15.5). Like other central philosophical concepts in the Chinese tradition, the meaning of wuwei is contested and requires careful contextual delineation. In the case of Wang Bi, wuwei serves to bring out the meaning of ziran in practice. Thus, commenting on the claim in Laozi 37 that “Dao is constantly wuwei,” Wang simply states, “This means following ziran.”

As applied to the sage, who is “one” with Dao in the sense that he is always true to his calm and tranquil nature, wuwei manifests itself in a life of guileless simplicity and a profound understanding of the principles governing the Daoist universe. Naturally, the sage dwells in quietude and does not engage in superfluous activity, for which reason the term “wuwei,” which conveys the sense of “not taking action,” is used. It would be inconceivable, for example, to have a true sage indulging in gossip or slander. Moreover, there is a qualitative dimension to wuwei, in that every action of the sage will be in full accord with the principles of nature, without any trace of artificiality or arbitrariness. As applied to the common people, wuwei poses an ethical challenge, which demands doing less of the many needless activities that cloud the heart-mind and corrupt one’s nature, and in the end only serve to perpetuate the tyranny of desire. To those who aspire to walk in the footsteps of the sages, then, wuwei should be understood as a process of “returning” to one’s “root,” that is to say, a spiritual and ethical journey to recovering one’s pristine Dao-centered nature.

The order of ziran pervades all spheres of life and activity. Ethics and political philosophy, in other words, proceed from the same logical ground. At the sociopolitical level, both the family and the state are seen to have a basis in the natural order of things. Furthermore, just as the heart-mind commands the body, ideally the family and the state should be led by a single sovereign. Given the analysis of Dao as “one” and principle, Wang Bi is thus committed to defending not only the institution of the family and the state but also the hierarchical structure of sociopolitical relations. In this way, Confucian concerns merge with Daoist insights. Applied to politics, this suggests that the restoration of order and harmony, the realization of great peace, hinges on sage leadership at the top and a strong central government.

The appeal to strong government does not imply the application of overwhelming force. On the contrary, in the Daoist sense, true strength is found in what the mundane world may regard as “weakness,” in following the ways of nature, based on a deep understanding of their constant patterns and principles, without artificial interference or aggressive control. This is but another way of saying that political renewal is also to be sought in ziran and wuwei (see especially commentary to Laozi 17 and 29).

In theory, wuwei aims at preserving the order of ziran so that the myriad things and affairs can flourish and attain their proper end. In practice, the politics of wuwei may be contrasted with Legalist policies that emphasize thorough political control through reward and especially punishment. However, “nonaction” should not be taken to mean the absence of political leadership; the issue is how leadership should be understood from the perspective of Daoist naturalness. The role of the ruler, like that of the father, entails great responsibility. While wuwei naturally has no room for, say, heavy taxation or excessive conscript labor for war or palace construction, it should not exclude appropriate public works like irrigation or services like caring for the sick. The Daoist contribution to this argument is that such action is not performed deliberately to enhance the ruler’s standing or even to promote the “good,” for this would presuppose a view of excellence as resting on external standards and concomitantly a misguided belief in the efficacy of action imposed on the people to alter their nature, thereby making them “better.” The ruler who governs with wuwei may appear to be doing nothing, but in guiding the people to return to their original nature he establishes a firm foundation for great peace. According to He Yan, the key to wuwei lies in appointing the right people for political office (commentary to Lunyu 15.5), which explains why the ruler himself need not be concerned with the operational details of administration. Wang Bi would probably agree with this, provided that the centrality of naturalness in the political process is properly understood. In the final analysis, the precise policies that need to be implemented are secondary. The state would prosper of its accord, if only the ruler could remain steadfast in following the way of “emptiness and quiescence.”

Wang Bi argues in his shorter essay on the Laozi that its teachings could be summed up in one phrase—“honoring the root and calming the branches” (chongben ximo) (also see commentary to Laozi 38, 57 and 58). Indeed, this to Wang Bi is the one thread that runs through the teachings of all the ancient sages. The idea of “honoring the root” should be clear, in the light of the analysis given above; but there are two senses to “calming the branches” that should be distinguished. At the political level, the branches (mo), that is, the people, first of all, must be allowed to live and work in peace—the primary meaning of the word “xi,” translated here as “calm,” is “rest.” However, mo, “branches,” or more precisely “branch tips,” also calls to mind the image of superfluous growth, of alienation from the roots of one’s being. Thus, there is a sense in which what is contrary to naturalness should be calmed and put to rest, i.e., brought to an end. Ideally, of course, the way to do this would be through “nonaction” in the sense outlined earlier; but I suspect this is also Wang Bi’s way of saying that the idealism of wuwei and ziran does not preclude decisive intervention on the part of the sage ruler. Although Wang Bi died too young to have made any real impact on the political scene, his biography reports that during the Zhengshi era, he was granted a private audience with the chief minister, Cao Shuang, at the end of which, however, we are told, the latter merely laughed at him.

3. Ji Kang and Ruan Ji

The Zhengshi period came to a close in 249, when the Wei general Sima Yi (179–251) wrested control of the government from the ruling Cao family. Cao Shuang, He Yan, and others close to them were executed. Wang Bi died later in the same year of a sudden illness. Historians thus refer to “Zhengshi xuanxue” to mark the first phase of Neo-Daoism. In the years that followed, the two sons of Sima Yi, Sima Shi (208–255) and Sima Zhao (211–265), consolidated their hold on power. In 265, the latter’s son, Sima Yan (236–290) formally ended the reign of Wei and established the Jin dynasty. During the Wei-Jin transition, a group of intellectuals, remembered fondly in Chinese sources as the “Seven Worthies of the Bamboo Grove” (zhulin qixian), came to represent the voice of the Learning in the Profound. They are: Ji Kang (223–262, or 224–263), Ruan Ji (210–263), Xiang Xiu (ca. 227–280), Shan Tao (205–283), Liu Ling (ca. 221–300), Wang Rong (234–305), and Ruan Xian (nephew of Ruan Ji, dates unknown but perhaps slightly older than Wang Rong).

Although the term “bamboo grove” appears in Buddhist sources, it probably refers to bamboo fields in and near Ji Kang’s estate in Shanyang (modern Henan province), where the group and their associates gathered in pleasure and friendship. Of the seven, Ji Kang, Ruan Ji, and Xiang Xiu are of particular interest to students of philosophy. The first two will be introduced in this section. Technically, the Seven Worthies were of the same generation as Wang Bi, except Shan Tao who was older and closer to He Yan in age. As such, they do not represent a “second generation” of xuanxue scholars. However, they faced a vastly different political landscape, which sparked new concerns. A series of bloody but futile revolts against the Sima family followed the coup of 249, and political turbulence continued even after the founding of the Jin. In the words of a later historian, this was a time when few intellectuals of note (mingshi) were spared a violent end (Jin shu 49).

Ji Kang—Or Xi Kang (Hsi Kang, in Wade-Giles), as the surname Ji was pronounced Xi in classical Chinese—cuts a striking figure in the history of Chinese philosophy. A brilliant musician and poet, a master of Pure Conversation, an iconoclast, a model of integrity, and a tall, handsome man by all accounts, Ji was the undisputed leader of the Seven Worthies and one of the most influential intellectuals of his age. Ji was related to the Wei imperial house by marriage. Not once did he bow to the dictates of the Sima government. Likened to a “sleeping dragon” of great potential threat to the regime, he was eventually imprisoned and sentenced to death. Several thousand students of the imperial academy reportedly petitioned for his release. Before the execution, as traditional sources further relate, Ji remained calm and perfectly composed; as the final hour approached, he asked for a qin (zither, or lute according to some translators) and gave a final performance, lamenting only that the tune he played would now die with him (e.g., see Jin shu 49). Later scholars throughout Chinese history who saw themselves as victims of injustice would often draw inspiration from Ji Kang’s courage and integrity.

Ji Kang’s extant writings include a collection of sixty poems, an influential “Rhapsody on the Zither” (Qin fu) and fourteen other essays. These last provide a good introduction to Ji Kang’s Neo-Daoist philosophy. It is worth noting that Ji did not leave behind any commentary on the “Three Treatises on the Profound” and other classics, although he openly acknowledged Laozi and Zhuangzi to be his “teachers.” As xuanxue developed, as mentioned, discursive essays, criticisms, and replies to criticisms began to gain favor as a more direct medium of philosophical discourse. Ji’s corpus also includes a “biographical” work, or rather an anthology of legends, entitled Shengxian gaoshi zhuan (Biographies of Sages and High-minded Men), which survives in a Qing dynasty reconstructed edition. Though this work is of greater historical than philosophical interest, it should not be overlooked for it bears indirectly on Ji’s famous discourse on “nourishing life.”

The key to Ji Kang’s version of Neo-Daoism lies in the concept of ziran. In agreement with He Yan and Wang Bi, Ji sees an inherent order in the universe that is “so of itself” and rooted in Dao. The origin of the Daoist world is to be understood in terms of the transformation of qi. The “original qi,” brimming with creative energy but completely undifferentiated, gave rise to yin and yang, from which heaven and earth, the five dynamic elemental forces (wuxing), and the myriad beings in turn ensued. Boundless but not reducible to any shape or form, the Dao can be described as wu, but in this interpretation, the nothingness of Dao gains meaning from the original oneness of qi. In this respect, Ji Kang seems closer to He Yan than Wang Bi in drawing from the yin-yang cosmological theory, though there is perhaps a stronger religious sensibility that distinguishes Ji’s approach to the profound mystery of Dao.

On the premise that the order of nature issues from the transformation of qi, Ji Kang recognizes that individuals are allotted a qi endowment of varying abundance and purity, which defines their nature and capacity. This explains why some people are blessed with long life or exceptional talents, while others must endure certain natural disadvantages. The fact that one may be gifted in some ways but deficient in others testifies to the presence of different configurations of vital powers informing each person. In an essay titled “On Intelligence and Courage” (Mingdan lun), Ji Kang thus disputed the assertion that those who possess intelligence or brilliant understanding are sure to have courage. Arising from different determination of qi, Ji says, the two “cannot produce each other.”

While most people are born with a mix of strengths and weaknesses, the logic of ziran allows the possibility of perfect endowment. Viewed in this light, sages must be regarded as extraordinary beings energized by the finest qi-essence. For the same reason, Ji Kang defended the existence of “immortals” (xian), a popular ideal in religious Daoism. Nevertheless, while perfect “destiny” (ming) cannot be ruled out, it is not the handiwork of an omnipotent divine being. Rather, the order of nature should be understood as encompassing the world of spirits and immortals. Put another way, the distinction between “natural” and “supernatural” collapses in the realm of the Dao, for both the sacred and the mundane spring from the transformation of ziran.

So defined, neither sagehood nor immortality can be attained through learning or effort. However, the doctrine of ziran does not necessarily entail a strong “fatalism” that dismisses all human effort. Immortality may be beyond reach, but as Ji Kang explains in his essay “On Nourishing Life” (Yangsheng lun), self-cultivation can enhance one’s physical and spiritual well-being substantially. Specifically, breathing exercises, special diets and the use of drugs can help maximize the limits of one’s natural endowment, and bring about rejuvenation and long life. Drug use, incidentally, was widespread among the literati in early medieval China. He Yan, for example, is known to have championed a certain drug for its ability to “lift one’s spirit,” and Ji Kang is also reputed to have been a connoisseur in this field. In any case, knowledge of Dao and practice in the art of nourishing life can make a significant difference, even though they may fall short in transforming the person into an immortal, as some religious Daoist sources maintain. This same insight underlies Ji Kang’s debate with his friend Ruan Kan on whether good or bad fortune is associated with one’s place of residence. The debate arose when Ji objected to Ruan’s thesis that fortune or misfortune has nothing to do with one’s dwelling (zhai wu jixiong). A total of four exchanges (probably out of six) between the two are preserved in Ji’s collected writings.

Ji Kang did not set out to defend geomancy. The debate is not about whether houses can be built in certain ways to attract good fortune or ward off harmful influences. In rejecting any link between fortune (i.e., destiny conceived as a function of qi endowment) and one’s residence (i.e., environmental factors), Ruan Kan was in effect saying that destiny is entirely predetermined. In contrast, reflecting a more dynamic view of ziran, Ji argues first of all that since the world is constituted by qi, naturally some places would be better endowed than others, e.g., in terms of air or water quality, which would create a favorable environment for the residents. Moreover, environmental conditions can be made more conducive to personal and social development. At least, effort is required to ensure that they do not deteriorate, e.g., due to pollution or exploitation of natural resources. In this way, Ji Kang sought to articulate an ethics of ziran that leaves room for appropriate human intervention.

It is important to note, however, that effort directed at nourishing life should always accord with ziran and must not be confused with action that violates the principles of nature. This brings into view Ji Kang’s critique of Confucian norms and rituals, which he considered artificial and restrictive. Ji devoted an essay to refuting the widely held view that people “naturally take to learning” (ziran haoxue). Learning in the Confucian sense presupposes discipline and does not come naturally to people, whose need to preserve energy predisposes them toward repose. From this essay, it also becomes clear that the concept of ziran is closely tied to a Daoist philosophy of history, which envisions a process of decline from a pristine beginning of simplicity and wholesome goodness. Echoing the Laozi (chapter 18), Ji Kang asserts that it is only when the “great Dao” fell into disuse—that is, when selfishness and strife rendered natural, prereflective kindness out of the ordinary—that benevolence and righteousness came to be treasured as acquired, remedial virtues. In this sense, Confucian learning reflects but the loss of naturalness in a world dominated by self-interest. In another essay, “On Dispelling Self-interest” (Shisi lun), Ji brings out further the ethical implications of ziran.

Without self-interest means at the very least that one is completely open about one’s feelings and intentions. This does not guarantee moral purity, of course—truthfulness may be accompanied by arrogance, for example—but it reflects a heart-mind no longer burdened by praise or blame, approval or censure, and other self-regarding concerns. Conversely, veiled motives and hidden feelings invariably involve calculations of cost and benefit that corrupt the heart-mind, even if they are invested in moral ventures. Ideally, in the case of a sage endowed with perfect nature, complete openness and purity coincide. For the majority, however, self-interest poses an obstacle to realizing ziran. From this perspective, nourishing life thus takes on a deeper ethical meaning. Although breathing exercises and the use of qi-enhancing drugs may be useful, ultimately all such effort must be directed at dispelling self-interest. To dispel self-interest and in this sense attain utmost “emptiness,” it is necessary to confront the root problem of desire.

Desires are harmful to both body and mind, as Ji Kang emphasizes in “On Nourishing Life.” Purity of being, in contrast, entails the absence of desire or any form of emotional disturbance. Are all desires, then, unnatural? The essay drew a sharp response from Xiang Xiu, for whom desire arises naturally from the heart-mind. As such, it cannot be eradicated but only regulated by rules of propriety and ritual action. In reply, Ji Kang points out that although pleasure and anger, and the desire for fame and beauty may stem from the self, like a tumor they only serve to deplete one’s qi-energy. Basic needs are of course not to be denied, but desires are shaped by objects and reflect cognitive distortions that consume the self. To quench one’s thirst, one does not desire to drink the whole river. This is fundamentally different from the desire for power and wealth, which knows no rest. Further, the suppression of desire by artificial means may remove certain symptoms, but it does not cure the disease. It is only by recognizing the harmful influences of desire that one begins to seek calmness and emptiness of mind. Ultimately, nourishing life is not only about health and longevity but sets its sight on a higher, and to Ji Kang, more authentic, mode of being characterized by dispassion.

In this connection, Ji Kang’s famous thesis that emotions are foreign to music—or literally, that “sounds do not have [in them] sorrow or joy” (sheng wu ai le)—becomes readily understandable. If desire and emotions are not intrinsic to nature, and since sounds are naturally produced by the vibration of qi-energies, it cannot be the case that music embodies sorrow or joy, as classical Confucian musical theory generally assumes. Subjective and cognitive reactions, in other words, should be distinguished from what is natural and objective; otherwise, Ji argues, one can hardly account for the fact that the same piece of music may invoke different responses in different audiences. At the ethical and spiritual level, music can be a powerful aid to nourishing life. This is because music can articulate harmony that would render conditions more favorable for the heart-mind to dispel self-interest. If it is intrinsically tied to desire and emotion, it cannot be of much therapeutic value to Ji Kang’s conception of the ethical life. Ji Kang’s work on nourishing life and the nature of music wielded considerable influence among xuanxue scholars. Together with the debate on the relationship between “words and meaning,” which will be discussed later, they ranked as three of the most important topics in Neo-Daoist philosophy (see Shishuo xinyu 4.21).

Ji Kang is often depicted as a radical iconoclast, who openly challenged the authority of classical models of moral attainment, including Confucius. Compared with He Yan and Wang Bi, he certainly seems less inclined to accommodate Confucian learning and ritual practice in his vision of ziran. It is also true that he was politically frustrated and marginalized. Yet, the emphasis on nourishing life need not imply abandoning the sociopolitical world for a life of reclusive exile. Like Wang Bi, Ji recognizes that the order of ziran encompasses basic social institutions like the family and the state. In his “Family Admonitions” (Jiajie), he instructed his children to uphold integrity in both private and public life. In an essay devoted to the teachings of government (Taishi zhen), Ji affirmed that rulership has a basis in the principles of nature. Respect for elders and kindness are not contrary to ziran, so long as they do not become deliberate acts with a view to self-gain. Ji Kang might have preferred a life of “carefree wandering,” to borrow a phrase from the Zhuangzi, and historical sources also report that he sought the company of recluses; but this does not mean that he was unconcerned about the politics of his day.

In another essay (Guan Cai lun), Ji attempted to rehabilitate the two nobles of the Zhou dynasty—Lords Guan and Cai—who had been condemned by later historians for their opposition to the Duke of Zhou. Commentators generally agree that the historical discussion serves as a pretext and the real criticism is directed at the Sima regime. This is not the work of a man who rejected politics as a matter of principle, but points instead to an engaged intellectual who would stop at nothing to make known the truth as he saw it. In the end, if the order of ziran were allowed to flourish, if desire and self-interest were pacified, and if careful nourishing were applied to remove interference especially of the Confucian and Legalist variety, society would attain peace and harmony of its own accord. Despite the tragic circumstances of his life, Ji Kang proves rather sanguine in his faith in the power of ziran.

Together with Ji Kang, Ruan Ji (Juan Chi, in Wade-Giles) came to represent the xuanxue movement after the coup of 249. An outstanding poet and musician, he is also remembered for his daring defiance of the Confucian orthodoxy, at a time when deviation from the norms of tradition could easily be deemed seditious. To his admirers, Ruan Ji was a tragic hero. Well versed in both Confucian and Daoist learning, he was evidently a man of principle who took seriously the calling of an intellectual to bring peace and harmony to the state. Hailing from a distinguished family, he was in a strong position to make a difference in public affairs. The unforgiving realities of third-century Chinese politics, however, soon took its toll on Ruan, who found himself trapped in a world of violence and duplicity. Ruan was commissioned under the Sima government; cherished, in fact, at the highest level for his talent and influence among the educated elite. Unlike Ji Kang, whose refusal to submit to the new government cost him his life, Ruan reluctantly took his place along the corridors of power and avoided a violent end. This does not mean that he had betrayed his ideals out of fear, or that survival did not come with a price. Proud and uncompromising, never a consenting partner in the intercourse of power, Ruan had to endure repeated slander and escaped censure only by finding refuge in an almost constant intoxicated stupor.

Drinking was an important aspect of literati culture. In Ruan’s case, wine became a means to self-expression as well as a lifeline to preserving his integrity. According to his biography, he avoided a marriage proposal from the Sima house itself by staying drunk for sixty days (Jin shu 49). Whether this actually happened, or whether he was an alcoholic is not the issue; what emerges from this and other reports is a portrait of a frustrated but sensitive and ardent thinker, whose outrage at an immoral world finds precise expression in “outrageous” opinions and behavior challenging the legitimacy of established practice. Even at his mother’s funeral, Ruan did not stop drinking, an act that patently disregarded the requirement of ritual and resulted in a call for his banishment from the realm. The full significance of the story comes to light when the reader realizes that Ruan was in fact famous for his filial piety. When his mother died, his grief was so intense that he “coughed up blood” and “wasted away” for a long time.

Although Ruan was unable to escape from the world of power, he took every opportunity to assert his free and indomitable spirit. Rituals and convention were not meant for him, as he announced boldly in response to a charge that he had contravened the rules of propriety in seeing his sister-in-law off on a journey. So disgusted with and disdainful of the shallow men of high society, Ruan would literally “eye” his visitors in different ways—gleaming with adoration and pleasure when they were to his taste, or rolling his eyes superciliously when the company was deemed foul. This did not earn him too many friends at court, but certainly enhanced his reputation as a leader of the Seven Worthies of the Bamboo Grove. Despite his unyielding distaste for hypocrisy, Ruan never allowed himself to criticize individuals openly by name, an aloofness that no doubt saved his neck and earned the admiration of Ji Kang, whose more fiery temperament proved less amenable to the wise counsel of silence.

Ruan Ji left behind a large number of poems and several essays. An early work is entitled “Discourse on Music” (Yue lun), in which he discusses along Confucian lines the function of music in bringing about harmony. Like most Neo-Daoists, Ruan believed that the teaching of Confucius had been distorted by later scholars who under the banner of Confucianism sought merely to further their own gain. Confucius was only concerned with the Dao. The writings of Confucius and other sages sought to bring to light but one Daoist truth. In particular, as discussed previously, the Yijing, Laozi, and Zhuangzi were seen to have penetrated fully the mystery of Dao, and Ruan devoted an essay to each of them. While the essay on the Yijing (Tong Yi lun) dates probably to his youth, and that on the Laozi (Tong Lao lun) survives only in fragments, the Da Zhuang lun (On Reaching Fully [the Essential Meaning of] the Zhuangzi) reflects Ruan’s mature thinking. Equally important is his famous poetic essay, the “Biography of Master Great Man” (Daren xiansheng zhuan), in which he takes aims at the corrupt ways of the world and evokes an image of Daoist transcendence, a biting contrast that is rendered all the more powerful in the light of his own predicament.

Like Ji Kang, Ruan Ji focuses on the concept of ziran, naturalness, in his reformulation of Daoist philosophy. Commenting on the Laozi, Ruan makes clear that the concept of Dao should be understood as the “self-so” source of the processes of change and transformation. Whereas the Laozi calls it Dao, the Yijing describes it as the “Great Ultimate” (taiji) and the Spring and Autumn Annals, the “Origin” (yuan). Or, as Ruan writes in his essay on the Zhuangzi, “heaven and earth are born of ziran, and the myriad beings are born of heaven and earth.” There is “nothing outside” (wuwai) the world of ziran, Ruan adds, which is to say that the Dao should not be mistaken for any metaphysical agent or entity. Rather, the theory of naturalness suggests that heaven and earth and everything within it originate from one vital qi-energy. All phenomena are constituted by qi; as such, according to Ruan, Zhuangzi is surely right when he declares that “the myriad beings are but one body” (Zhuangzi chapter 5).

The plenitude of nature reflects the inexhaustible resourcefulness of the Dao. Moreover, phenomena conform to constant principles and function in harmony. In his Zhuangzi essay, Ruan details in traditional cosmological terms how the original qi differentiates into yin and yang, the two basic forms of vital energy that not only shape but continue to govern the phenomenal world. Male and female, the hot and the cold, light and darkness, and other yin-yang correlates underpin the structural order of the Daoist universe. The movement of the sun and the moon, the regularity of the seasons, the operation of wind and rain, and other natural processes disclose further a dynamic regime of self-regulating change and renewal. In this way, an inherent order is shown to lie at the heart of ziran. As in Ji Kang’s analysis, this forms the basis of an ethics of naturalness.

The ideal sage, of course, embodies naturalness in his entire being. This presupposes a profound understanding of what the Zhuangzi calls the “equality of things,” now explained by Ruan Ji in terms of the oneness of qi. Life and death, fortune and misfortune, and other seemingly unbridgeable divides form but moments in the same continuum of natural transformation. The sage, accordingly, regards them as one. Distinctions, in the sense of value discrimination, can thus no longer be maintained. Whether this entails a mystical union with nature remains a question. Ruan’s poetic eloquence, especially in the “Biography of Master Great Man,” often appears to rise to mystical heights. Nevertheless, the more important point seems to be that the sage recognizes the centrality of emptiness and quiescence in a life of ziran.

Devoid of self-interest, unmoved by riches and power, completely at ease with his own nature and the natural order of things at large, the sage attains freedom and in this sense, “transcendence.” In contrast, as “Master Great Man” denounces, the learned “gentlemen” of polite society are no better than the lice that dwell in one’s pants. Hiding deep in the recesses of tradition, they dare not move against ritual and dread any threat to the status quo. When hungry, they feast parasitically on the people. There is little question that Ruan Ji regarded the teachings of the Confucian tradition at that time to be deficient and detrimental to the project of naturalness.

More precisely, Ruan’s theory of ziran envisages an inner spirituality that must be protected from the corrupting influence of power and desire. There is a wholesome sincerity and innocence to natural affective expressions. When desire for gain is allowed to dominate, however, what is spontaneous mutates into hidden designs and false appearances. For this reason, complete openness ranks high on Ruan’s ethical agenda. In a world dominated by small-minded “gentlemen,” where sincerity of feeling is judged a threat to the establishment, an ethics of naturalness inevitably finds itself engaged in a struggle for freedom. Later xuanxue scholars took great pleasure in recounting how despite venomous opposition, Ruan Ji had persisted in his unorthodox ways. For example, we are told that he frequented a neighbor’s place for wine and the company of the latter’s beautiful wife. When he got drunk, he would fall asleep next to her. Understandably suspicious at first, the husband nonetheless found Ruan completely innocent, honorable and above reproach in both intention and act. In this, we see how moral character is traced to naturalness. Another neighbor had a talented and beautiful daughter who unfortunately died young. Although Ruan did not know the family, he went all the same to her funeral and cried with total abandon. Whether in these or other accounts, the point is always that whereas rituals and taboos stifle and corrupt the self, naturalness promises liberation and a return to authenticity.

Does not the open display of emotions contradict the emphasis on “emptiness”? He Yan, for example, had argued that sages do not experience pleasure and anger, or sorrow and joy. One way of resolving this difficulty is to regard the sages as rare, exceptional beings, ontologically distinct from the rest of humanity and akin to the “immortals” of religious Daoism, whereas mere mortals can only aspire to stay true to their natural affectivity. However, not all Neo-Daoists subscribed to this view, which implies that sagehood is an inborn quality beyond the reach of self-cultivation. As Wang Bi sees it, for example, “emptiness” need not suggest the absence of emotion, but rather a realized mode of being that is not bound by emotional and other attachments. Since Ruan Ji considers the emotions as giving voice to authenticity, he probably would side with this position.

Genuine affective responses, of course, should not be confused with selfish desire. In the Da Zhuang lun, Ruan Ji describes the sage as a “person of ultimate attainment” (zhiren), whose profound understanding of the “equality” of things in the order of ziran naturally expresses itself in a life of simplicity and quietude. Yet, if nature yielded an originally pristine order, how did it come to be infested with an army of “lice”? Ruan Ji provides a startling response in his “Biography of Master Great Man.”

At the “beginning,” when yin and yang naturally took their course, when domination and deceit were yet unknown, all under heaven indeed lived in perfect harmony. There were neither rulers nor ministers, and yet order prevailed of its own accord. When rulership was established, Ruan goes on to say, domination arose; when ministers were appointed, conflict and deceit also came into the world. It is not entirely clear why or how kingship came to be established, but judging from Ruan’s essay on the Zhuangzi, much of the blame lies with subjective discrimination. When natural distinctions (e.g., differences in size) became value markers (e.g., that big is “better” than small), in other words, desire and domination already began to cloud the true picture.

In elevating naturalness above all manmade institutions, Ruan Ji thus found a place for anarchism, which is rarely entertained in the whole of Chinese philosophy. In the fourth century, Bao Jingyan took up the same theme in his “Treatise on Not Having Rulers” (Wu jun lun). Little is known about Bao, whose views have been preserved in part by Ge Hong (ca. 283–363) in his Baopuzi (The Master Who Embraces Simplicity); but the main thesis is clearly that rulership is but a form of domination that violates naturalness. In comparison, the majority of Neo-Daoists may be said to have espoused fairly “conservative” political ideals. He Yan and Wang Bi, for example, had little difficulty justifying absolute monarchical rule, provided that it coincides with ziran and “nonaction.”

The critique of government does not mean that Ruan was actively plotting to overthrow it. The majority opinion in this regard is that Ruan yearned for a life of quiet simplicity untainted by power relations. Indeed, one suggestion is that whereas Ruan in his early writings had accorded a positive place to ritual and music as the work of the ancient sages to maintain harmony in the world, in his later years he became totally disillusioned and turned to escapism. This view is unhelpful, because it undermines the possibility of renewal in the philosophy of ziran. The ethics of naturalness is not about renunciation. The sages of old were all concerned with diminishing the power of desire, so as to enable the people to dwell in quietude and simplicity. From this perspective, the Daoist recluse furnishes a powerful symbol because he abides by ziran and not because he refuses to have anything to do with the world. Similarly, the “Great Man” does not aspire to a life of freedom to realize his own ambition, but rather to initiate a process of healing that would revitalize the rule of the Dao, envisioned as a kind of wholesome cooperative community. If naturalness has any restorative power at all, escapism should have little role to play in Neo-Daoist ethics.

4. Guo Xiang

A generation or so after He Yan, Wang Bi and the Seven Worthies of the Bamboo Grove, Guo Xiang (Kuo Hsiang, d. 312) arrived on the xuanxue scene. Adept in philosophical debate and other forms of cultured discourse, he was highly regarded by his contemporaries as a new xuanxue champion “second only to Wang Bi,” whose philosophical prowess had by then acquired legendary proportions. Guo Xiang is by far the most important interpreter of the Zhuangzi in Chinese history. Through his effort, indeed, the Zhuangzi has come down to us in its present form, divided into thirty-three chapters. Yet, Guo Xiang has also been accused of no less an intellectual offense than plagiarism.

As early as the fifth century, the charge was made that Guo had plagiarized the work of Xiang Xiu (Hsiang Hsiu), a close friend of Ji Kang and fellow member of the Seven Worthies of the Bamboo Grove. As we have seen, Xiang Xiu challenged Ji Kang on the question of “nourishing life.” He is also known to have written a commentary to the Yijing, though he is primarily noted for his work on the Zhuangzi. According to the Shishuo xinyu (4.17), “Initially, there were scores of Zhuangzi commentators, but none could grasp its meaning and essential teachings. Xiang Xiu then went beyond the old commentaries to interpret the Zhuangzi [afresh]. His explanation was subtle and penetrating, which greatly advanced the cause of the [Learning in the] Profound.” Xiang Xiu’s commentary was incomplete, as the text goes on to relate, and Guo Xiang later “stole” it as his own.

This is a harsh judgment on Guo Xiang. The biography of Xiang Xiu in the Jin shu (chapter 49) recounts only that Guo Xiang had “extended” the former’s work. Although Guo was undoubtedly influenced by Xiang Xiu, whose work survives only in the form of quotations preserved in later sources, recent scholarship generally agrees that he had drawn his own conclusions. Seeking to reconcile the yearning for freedom and transcendence with sociopolitical engagement, Guo fuses together in his Zhuangzi commentary ontological and ethical insights. It is worth noting that despite the extremely unstable political conditions that plagued the early Jin dynasty, and the fact that Guo had come from a relatively humble background, he enjoyed a long and distinguished public career. Besides the Zhuangzi, Guo also wrote on the Laozi and the Lunyu, although these are no longer extant except for a few fragments cited in other sources.

Like Wang Bi, Guo Xiang recognizes the ontological import of Daoist philosophy. There is no disagreement that all beings originate from Dao. However, Guo takes issue with the view that the key to unlocking the mystery of Dao lies in the concept of wu, nothingness. This is because nothingness remains an abstraction, a negation signifying “nonbeing” or what being is not in Wang Bi’s interpretation, and as such cannot bring about creation. So defined, wu and the category of beings (you) are mutually exclusive; as Guo plainly states, “It is not only that wu cannot change into being but also that being cannot change into nonbeing [in this abstract sense] (commentary to Zhuangzi 22). The appeal to a divine creator should indeed be rejected, but this does not entail a nihilistic absence. Having disposed of these options, what does Guo Xiang have to offer in their place? He writes, “Because wu [by definition] is not being, it cannot produce being. Prior to the coming to be of being, it cannot produce other beings. In that case, then, who or what brought about the birth of being? [The answer can only be that] beings are spontaneously self-generated” (commentary to Zhuangzi 2).

Xuanxue studies are fond of contrasting Wang Bi’s emphasis on wu with Guo Xiang’s focus on being. What is more important, however, is how Guo Xiang arrives at his conclusion. Certainly, the mystery of creation cannot be resolved by positing an objectified, transcendent Dao. But, this does not warrant a flight to nothingness, which as a conceptual device cannot be an agent of real production and change. To Guo Xiang, then, the only logical alternative would be to recognize the reality of spontaneous “self-production” (zi sheng) and “self-transformation” (zi hua or du hua). These ideas are already present in Xiang Xiu’s commentary to the Zhuangzi, but in the hands of Guo Xiang, there is now fuller disclosure of the perceived deeper philosophical meaning of ziran.

At the most basic ontological level, prior to the birth of the myriad beings, being is “so of itself,” which implies that being exists eternally. In Guo’s own words, “Generally, we may know the causes of certain things and affairs near to us. But tracing their origin to the ultimate end, we find that without any cause, they of themselves come to be what they are. Being so of themselves, we can no longer question the reason or cause of their being, but should accept them as they are” (commentary to Zhuangzi 14). In this sense, “self-production” or “self-transformation” does not quite explain “how” being came into existence; instead, it offers a logical alternative, which bypasses the philosophical problems associated with both a pure negation and the positing of a particular causal agent. At the epistemological level, the further implication is that self-transformation remains a mystery. Far from being a source of perplexities, to Guo Xiang, this frees and reorients the mind to realize the nature of Dao and a life of ziran.

The doctrine of self-transformation, for which Guo is particularly remembered, affirms that the Dao is everywhere and in all things. The logic of immanence takes full effect, once nothingness is removed from view. Even in the most base and lowly, as the Zhuangzi emphasizes, the presence of Dao can be detected (chapter 22). To Guo Xiang, the Zhuangzi can only be alluding to the pervasiveness of qi. All beings are endowed with a “share” or allotment (fen) of qi, the inexhaustible power of the Dao, which gives them life and determines their nature and capacity. Moreover, the order of nature depicts not a state of random disorder, but an organized regime in which all parts have a role to play. With respect to human beings, for example, the body functions harmoniously as a unified whole in accordance with specific principles (li). Without undermining the interdependence of the multitude of organs, there is a hierarchical structure to the workings of the body, where the heart-mind assumes sovereign control. In these respects, guided by the concepts of qi and principle, Guo Xiang follows the mainstream Neo-Daoist analysis of ziran.

Given that individuals enjoy a particular “share” of the Dao, differences in natural endowment should be recognized. For example, due to the different allotment of qi, some people are born with a high degree of intelligence or gifted in other ways. Because everything is what it is “so of itself,” Guo Xiang must admit that “what one is born with is not something that is undue or inappropriate” (commentary to Zhuangzi 5). Because one’s nature is determined by exact principles, one may also speak of destiny in this connection. Is Guo, then, committed to a kind of thoroughgoing fatalism? Does this entail a rigid system in which individuals merely conform to prescribed roles?

It is a matter of destiny or “fate” that one is born of sage character, average capacity, or disadvantaged. In all cases, Guo maintains that one ought to accept one’s natural endowment. Extending a naturalistic reading to an old religious concept, this is in Guo’s estimation what is meant by the “mandate of heaven” (tianming). The sage is blessed with an exceptionally rich qi endowment. In this regard, Guo agrees with He Yan and others who hold that sagehood is defined by an inborn sage nature. Yet, Guo is also concerned to distinguish destiny as fact from value, and to make room for change and development in human flourishing.

Fundamentally, differences based on endowment do not constitute any basis for value judgment. Rather, as the Zhuangzi repeatedly argues, what needs to be recognized is the “equality of things.” Equality is not to be confused with sameness. In this context, equality suggests that all beings are partners in the larger architecture of Dao. Being gifted does not necessarily make one “better”; even a physically or mentally handicapped person is “complete” in his or her own way. Differences among individuals are undeniable, but they do not legitimize prejudice or discrimination.

At the sociopolitical level, human relationships are also governed by constant principles; like different parts of the body, individuals have their proper place in the social and political assembly. From this perspective, as opposed to conventional arrangements that can be changed or discarded at will, both the family and the state should be understood as expressions of ziran. Further, in view of the hierarchical order of nature, Guo does not hesitate to say that the father should be the head of the family, and that the state should be ruled by the king. This would rule out anarchism. In this regard, while Guo Xiang and Ruan Ji agree on the centrality of naturalness, they come to very different conclusions on the ideal structure of the state. What needs to be made clear is that the necessary gradation of authority for different roles and responsibilities that comes with a hierarchical system does not warrant any form of authoritarian government that oppresses the people. The father may be the authoritative figure in the family, but he would not be in that position if not for his children. As “children” of the Dao, all beings are indispensable and occupy an equally important station in the order of ziran.

Unlike Wang Bi, who stresses unity over multiplicity, Guo Xiang thus takes into view the richness and diversity of the Daoist world. Individuality is not sacrificed for political interests, or dissolved into a sea of metaphysical oneness. On the contrary, as Guo forcefully argues, there is no greater calamity than the loss of individuality and authenticity, of one’s identity as endowed by nature (commentary to Zhuangzi 10). Conversely, the Daoist goal can be defined as the realization of one’s nature, and particularly the optimization of one’s inborn capacity. As nature blossoms, destiny is fulfilled.

While this may not be able to detract entirely from the charge of fatalism, Guo Xiang does aim to introduce a dynamic view of nature and destiny. The Daoist world is never static; it changes and renews itself constantly. The mountain or ocean may appear unchanging, but it is perpetually in flux. This is mirrored in human existence, where individuals grow with the passage of time (commentary to Zhuangzi 6). Although constituted by qi and regulated by principles, individuals and societies need not be viewed as fixed assets without possibility of change and development. Indeed, while the order of nature must be respected, the person of Dao recognizes the inevitability of change. The sage nourishes his nature and adapts constantly to changes in the social and natural environment. This, as Guo Xiang sees it, brings out the real meaning of Daoist nonaction (wuwei).

Nonaction “does not mean folding one’s arms and keeping quiet,” as Guo makes explicit what most xuanxue scholars implicitly acknowledge (commentary to Zhuangzi 11). It is also not a technical skill, requiring special training or discipline. In Guo Xiang’s interpretation, nonaction stems from a profound discernment of the way of naturalness, which entails not so much doing less of certain things, as a mode of being and spirit of action guided by the principles of nature, according to which one performs all functions.

There are two aspects to Guo’s understanding of wuwei. First, as things and affairs are informed by principles, there is a natural way of action and interaction. Like the fabulous Cook Ding (Zhuangzi 3) who could cut up an ox without having to rely on sensory perception or mental calculation, and just as a spontaneous affection characterizes the parent-child relation, the sage accomplishes all tasks by simply following the “grain” or nature of phenomena. Furthermore, in the light of the equality of things, nonaction ideally leads to a sense of freedom and equanimity. Instead of chasing after false ideals, trying to be like someone else, and ending up a prisoner of restless striving and deceit, one should stay true to oneself and develop one’s nature. If self-sufficiency is assumed, there is no point imitating others, including the sages; to do so, indeed, would be like a fish’s aspiring to become a bird, as Guo Xiang puts it (commentary to Zhuangzi 2). This is important and marks Guo’s originality. Nonaction cannot be divorced from naturalness or reserved for the sage alone. What is required of self-fulfillment has already been given; to clamor after what is foreign to one’s genuine “share” of the Dao is not only futile but also self-negating. This opens up a deeper dimension to the notion of sagehood. It is true that there are those who embody a special sage nature—like “pines and cypresses” that are the finest of trees (commentary to Zhuangzi 5)—but more fundamentally, as Guo Xiang explains, the term “sage” designates those who have realized their nature (commentary to Zhuangzi 1). This effectively removes any barrier to attaining sagehood. Thus, while Guo agrees with He Yan in recognizing the decisive difference of qi endowment, he is also able to address Wang Bi’s objection, discussed earlier, and offer an alternative avenue to realizing great peace.

Against helplessness and passive resignation, Guo Xiang calls for a constructive celebration of individuality and the plenitude of the Daoist world. Free from the hold of desire and the ceaseless undulation of discontent, one reaps an inner calm and grows at ease with the external world. Even death loses its fearsome grip, for one realizes that life and death are equally a part of the transformation of nature. The person of Dao does not need to live in reclusion or shun politics. In fact, any deliberate disavowal of communal life would violate the spirit of naturalness. The important point is that “although the sage [in the broad sense of someone who has realized his true nature] finds himself in the halls of ritual and government, his heart-mind is not different from when he is surrounded by mountains and trees” (commentary to Zhuangzi 1). Beyond the sway of the emotions, the sage roams the world without being moved or enslaved by it. This, to Guo Xiang, truly captures the essence of “carefree wandering,” which is now shown to have a place in mundane activities.

Politically, the ruler should also abide by naturalness and nonaction. This means, besides self-cultivation, allowing and encouraging the people to develop their nature and capacity to the fullest. Thus, artificial restrictions and interference should be minimized. Official appointments, moreover, must be made on the basis of capacity and not by family background, as was commonly the case in Guo’s China. In return, as Guo confidently predicts, ministers and subjects would naturally fulfill their duties, and all under heaven would live in peace and contentment. As needs and circumstances change, social and political practice should not be fossilized. Timely adjustments would help ensure renewal and harmony in a dynamic realm.

5. Capacity and Nature, Words and Meaning, and the Debate on Naturalness

From He Yan and Wang Bi to the Seven Worthies of the Bamboo Grove and Guo Xiang, the main contours of Neo-Daoism can be discerned. Sharing the same philosophical vocabulary and reacting to a common heritage, the proponents of the new Learning in the Profound may appear to be speaking with a single voice. On closer examination, it becomes apparent that they seek in their own way to make sense of the mystery of Dao. Friendship and patronage do play an important role in early medieval Chinese literati culture, but they do not diminish the premium placed on intellectual independence, rigor, and originality. This is best reflected in the many debates that populate the xuanxue landscape.

The view of He Yan that the sage is by nature absolutely impartial, above the fray of the emotions, attracted a great deal of attention at that time. The Sanguo zhi (chapter 28, commentary), for example, reports that Zhong Hui (225–264), who rivaled Wang Bi as one of the brightest intellectual stars of the age, and others all elaborated on it. Wang Bi, as we have seen, put forward a dissenting view, which on the basis of a particular logic of nothingness grounds the possibility of sagehood in an original nature untainted by cognitive distortions and affective disturbances. Later, Guo Xiang sought a new resolution by aligning sagehood with self-realization. The role of the emotions and the natural differences based on qi endowment may be admitted, but in the being of the sage the burden of value attachment that they bring has been totally “forgotten” or lifted in the light of the equality of things. Bearing directly on the question of sagehood is the larger debate on the relationship between a person’s capacity and nature.

Although it is generally agreed that nature is inborn and formed by qi energies, whether it is solely responsible for a person’s capacity, be it intellectual, physical or psychological, remains an issue. This is important not only because it concerns the nature of sagehood, whether it is an attainable goal or determined by an essential sage nature, but also because the right talent must be identified for public office. A late second-century or early third-century work by Liu Shao, the Renwu zhi (translated into English as The Study of Human Abilities) has already broached the question and attempted to map out the various types of talent and the signs by which they might be identified. This developed into a major debate, on which Zhong Hui composed a treatise called “On the Four Roots of Capacity and Nature” (Caixing siben lun).

Zhong’s scholastic labor has not survived, but it is widely reported that the debate involved four distinct positions—namely, that capacity and nature are “identical” (tong); that they are “different” (yi); that they “coincide” (he); and that they “diverge” (li) from each other. The first view is represented by Fu Jia (also pronounced Fu Gu, 209–255), who emerged as a major policy maker in the Sima administration after 249. On this view, both nature and capacity are determined by one’s qi endowment. Whereas nature is the inner substance, capacity reaches outward in functional ability and conduct. This view finds eloquent support in another third-century work, the “Discourse on Capacity and Nature” (Caixing lun) by Yuan Zhun, who was on good terms with Ruan Ji. According to Yuan, beings can be either excellent or of a poor quality. Whereas the former are endowed with “pure qi,” the latter are constituted by energies of a more “turbid” composition. It is like a piece of wood, Yuan adds; whether it is crooked or straight is a matter of nature, on the basis of which it has a certain capacity that can be made to serve particular ends.

The second is represented by Li Feng (d. 254), also a senior statesman, according to whom Fu Jia had misconstrued the relationship between capacity and nature. This is because whereas nature is inborn, capacity is shaped by learning. What nature provides is simply the biological apparatus or faculties that enable a person to grow and to learn; the person one becomes, in contrast, is the result of learning and putting into practice the teaching of the sages. Any accomplishment, including the attainment of sagehood, ultimately depends on effort. Yu Huan, a noted third-century historian, provides a helpful analogy to explain the point—the effect of learning on a person, he says, is like adding color to a piece of plain silk (Sanguo zhi 13, commentary).

Zhong Hui himself held the third view, which attempts to mediate between the first two positions. Although native endowment is necessary for realized capacity, it is not sufficient. What is endowed, in other words, marks a person’s potential, which must be carefully nurtured and brought to fruition. For sages and immortals, who are different in kind because of their exceptional qi constitution, innate capacity naturally manifests itself completely in extraordinary achievements. For ordinary human beings, however, nature does not amount to actual ability but only furnishes certain aptitude, dispositions or directions of development. Of course, if the native endowment is extremely poor, there is not much that can be done. Nevertheless, the real challenge to Fu Jia’s identity thesis is that an excellent endowment may go to waste because the person succumbs to desire and would not learn. Finally, Wang Guang (d. 251) argued for the last position, which is stronger than Li Feng’s and appears to be directed especially against Zhong Hui’s modified identity thesis. Inborn nature does not provide the necessary fertile ground for cultivation; rather, it needs to be rectified by learning. Human beings are inherently driven by desire and therefore must rely on rituals and instruction to become responsible individuals. In this sense, capacity and nature do not coincide but diverge from each other.

It has been suggested that the debate should be understood in the context of the power struggle between the imperial house of Cao and the Sima faction in Wei politics. Whereas Fu Jia and Zhong Hui sided with the Sima regime, Li Feng and Wang Guang were struck down by it. Political affiliation, like patronage, is certainly important, but it does not dictate philosophical opinion in Neo-Daoism. He Yan, for example, would favor Fu Jia’s identity thesis, given his understanding of human nature, despite the fact that the latter had criticized him openly during the Zhengshi period. Similarly, Ji Kang would find Zhong Hui’s attempt to accommodate learning and effort agreeable, even though he had rejected Zhong’s overtures to befriend him and in the end was put to death at Zhong’s instigation.

Another key debate in Neo-Daoist philosophy concerns the relationship between “words” (yan) and “meaning” (yi). The debate has its roots in the Yijing, where Confucius is made to ask whether words can fully disclose meaning. This goes beyond the interpretation of any one work, but probes the nature of understanding itself. Words, as common experience seems to suggest, often fail to express intense emotions or complex ideas. A minority view, represented by the late third-century thinker Ouyang Jian, defended the thesis that meaning is completely “exhausted” or expressed by words (yan jin yi). The majority of xuanxue scholars, however, regarded words as necessary but insufficient to understanding.

A spokesman for the position that “words cannot fully express meaning” (yan bu jin yi) was Xun Can (ca. 212–240), who gained considerable notoriety for his claim that the classics were but the “chaff” of the sages’ profound learning. The conclusion is inescapable, according to Xun, for meaning transcends the limiting confines of language. Wang Bi supplies a fuller and more nuanced argument. Although meaning is mediated by words and images, the means of interpretation must not be confused with the end itself. Words can in fact become an obstacle to understanding if they are made the focus of interpretation. Citing the Zhuangzi, Wang maintains that the words and images that make up a text must be “forgotten” before its meaning can be comprehended. To understand a poem, for example, it is not enough to assemble an exhaustive list of definitions. The words are “forgotten” or left behind in the sense that understanding reaches into the underlying world of ideas where a deeper meaning resides. Guo Xiang also makes clear that although ideas issue from words, they cannot be reduced to their literal, surface meaning. This is especially important to understanding the Zhuangzi, which employs a large number of parables and metaphors, often involving spiritual figures or supernatural exploits. Taken literally, they verge on the fantastic; understood properly, they intimate the wonder of the Dao and the order of ziran.

This diverges sharply from the Han hermeneutical model, which typically on the basis of a kind of correspondence theory assumes that words have fixed meanings located in external referents. Specifically, under the dominance of yin-yang theories, the classics were seen to refer to particular cosmological phenomena. For example, Han commentators commonly took the word “one” to mean the pole star. In contrast, Neo-Daoist writings show little interest in cosmological speculation. This does not mean that the authors had abandoned the yin-yang cosmology; rather, they took the classics to be concerned with issues more profound than naming the various components of the cosmos. A poem may depict actual objects or events; but sense is not limited to reference, and the meaning of the whole transcends the identity of its parts. From a new hermeneutical perspective, proponents of xuanxue thus endeavor to reverse an “outward” interpretive course to return to the “roots”; that is to say, to recapture the perceived core teachings of the sages. This may suggest direct illumination or intuition, a sudden apprehension of meaning. However, it should be remembered that all the major Neo-Daoists discussed here excelled in the art of argumentation, which is to say that there is no substitute for careful philosophical analysis. Once the chain of references is broken, once the hermeneutical perspective is altered, interpretation is free to pursue the deeper meaning of the “dark” and profound, which in the final analysis is what xuanxue is all about.

From a broader perspective, given the dissatisfaction with Han Confucianism, many of the debates in xuanxue revolve around the relationship between “orthodox teachings” (mingjiao)—the normative “naming” (ming) that determines standards and values—and ziran. Does the former, bound by doctrines of propriety, rituals, and government, oppose naturalness and thwart all aspiration toward a life of “carefree wandering”? The debate on “nourishing life,” for example, reflects this concern. Two main approaches may be distinguished, whose impact far exceeds the quiet preserves of the philosophers’ “bamboo grove,” to spark new trends in both politics and culture.

For Wang Bi, it is clear that government and society should ideally conform to the principles of ziran, as they stem from the same “root.” Guo Xiang is even more specific in arguing that the norms and rites that define civilization are not alien to ziran but in principle flow spontaneously from it. The natural bond between mother and child, for example, attests to the inherent harmony between ideal mingjiao and ziran. Although decay and corruption may have set in, the ethics of naturalness does not seek to escape from the roles and responsibilities of sociopolitical life.

To Wang Bi, it is imperative that the ruler and those in power “return” to “emptiness and quiescence,” in which state the right policies would naturally prevail, resulting in peace and abundance, and more importantly, simplicity, genuineness and contentment. To Guo Xiang, the hierarchical structure of society need not be oppressive, for each and every person is “equal” and self-sufficient, which enables an inner transcendence that is the mark of authenticity and the full realization of one’s nature and capacity.

Differences in interpretation notwithstanding, Wang Bi and Guo Xiang converge in recognizing the place of certain basic normative patterns and principles in the order of nature, and the need to ensure that they do not deviate from it. It is perhaps not incorrect to speak of their having brought together Confucian and Daoist concerns, inasmuch as Confucianism pays special attention to propriety and government, whereas Daoism focuses on naturalness. The same can be said for Xiang Xiu. In his youth, he wrote an essay entitled “On Confucianism and Daoism” (Ru Dao lun), although he apparently discarded it and we have no knowledge of its content. In the early fifth century, the famous poet Xie Lingyun (385–433) spoke of Xiang Xiu as having treated “Confucianism and Daoism as one.” Nevertheless, xuanxue is not a kind of scholasticism that pitches one school against another. Instead of seeing them as attempting to reconcile Confucianism with Daoism, it may be suggested that they were primarily concerned with the substantive issue of the relationship between mingjiao and ziran.

Ji Kang and Ruan Ji took the stronger view that the then prevalent orthodox teachings impinged on naturalness. The burden of worldly striving, ultimately driven by desire, has become so great that it would not be possible to maintain an inner purity and transcendence while following the norms and rites of society and tradition. Genuine freedom is possible only if one goes beyond the strictures of normative orthodox teachings and aligns oneself completely with ziran, as Ji Kang boldly declares in “On Dispelling Self-interest.” Going beyond mingjiao does not mean leaving the world behind in this context; again, the point is not renunciation, but radical change, by reorienting one’s sense of propriety and value. This not only invites philosophical debate but also gives impetus to an avant-garde counter-culture development, which adds a tinge of romanticism to the xuanxue movement.

As the idea of naturalness gained currency, many prominent men of letters came to appreciate strong emotions as a sign of authenticity. Thus, Wang Rong, the youngest member of the Seven Worthies of the Bamboo Grove, did not try to contain his grief in accordance with the requirement of ritual when his son died. The sage may be oblivious to the call of the emotions, he explains, and men of inferior nature are incapable of experiencing true affection; “it is precisely in people like us that the deepest and most intense emotions find their place” (Shishuo xinyu 17.4). Although there is some dispute whether these words should be attributed to Wang Rong or his cousin, Wang Yan, the point remains that naked emotions had come to be cherished as a Neo-Daoist ideal. In the same spirit, Xun Can was devastated by the death of his wife. In response to Fu Jia’s criticism that he was overreacting, Xun simply lamented that it would be difficult to find again a woman of true beauty. His grief was so intense, we are told, that he died shortly after at the age of twenty-eight (Sanguo zhi 10, commentary; cf. Shishuo xinyu 35.2).

The unaffected display of emotion often came into conflict with the code of conduct sanctioned by orthodox teachings. Ruan Ji, as we have seen, was criticized on several occasions for his unorthodox behavior. These accounts, more than a record of events, serve to underscore the vast divide that separates an idealized naturalness from the artificial and often hypocritical observance of orthodox customs in early medieval China. Once unconventional behavior is seen to express naturalness and authenticity, it is perhaps inevitable that more radical gestures would come to create a colorful but nonetheless extremely slippery slope. For example, Liu Ling, another member of the Seven Worthies, is well known for his fondness for wine. Never without a bottle in hand, when travelling he would ask an attendant to carry a shovel, so that he could be buried on the spot should he die from a bout of drunkenness (Jin shu 49). Answering his critics, who found him naked, drinking with abandon in his house, Liu said, “I take heaven and earth to be my dwelling, and my rooms are my coat and pants; so what are you gentlemen doing in my pants?” (Shishuo xinyu 23.6)

As Pure Conversation and xuanxue culture captivated high society, many literati were quick to imitate such behavior. It became fashionable to give free rein to one’s impulses, and many had hoped to acquire a reputation as a high-minded intellectual of pure character and lofty ideals by opposing established norms and rituals. Whether this represents a deterioration of Neo-Daoism need not concern us. The point to note is that serious implications follow from a philosophy of ziran. Of course, there were Neo-Daoists who objected to this trend. For example, Yue Guang (252–304)—whom Wang Rong, Wang Yan, and other leading scholars praised as a rare talent capable of taking xuanxue to new heights—was obviously unimpressed by the extent to which many of his contemporaries had gone in search of a “carefree” life. “In mingjiao itself there is a blissful abode,” he asks, “so why go to such extremes?” (Jin shu 43)

6. Concluding Remarks

In the early fourth century, the Jin dynasty was forced to flee its capital and to rebuild in south China. As the literati settled in a new land, they looked back to the time of He Yan and Wang Bi, to “the voice of [the] Zhengshi [period],” as the golden age of xuanxue. Although Pure Conversation continued with undiminished rigor, it did not introduce many new ideas. In the southern court, the senior statesman Wang Dao (276–339) is reported to have said that he would only talk about “nourishing life,” “words and meaning,” and Ji Kang’s theory of music (Shishuo xinyu 4.21). Throughout the Jin period and beyond, as another early source relates, whether “sounds do not have sorrow or joy” and the “four roots of capacity and nature” remained the stuff of philosophical discussion (Nan Qi shu 33).

As Neo-Daoism entered its last phase, another Daoist work, the Liezi, came to rival the “Three Treatises on the Profound.” Zhang Zhan (ca. 330–400) wrote an important commentary on the work—indeed, some would argue that Zhang had a hand in the formation of the Liezi itself—in which he recapitulated many of the ideas that spanned the entire spectrum of Neo-Daoist philosophy. What is of particular interest is that Zhang explicitly introduced Buddhist ideas into xuanxue.

Buddhism had entered China long before the Jin period. Given the similarity between the Daoist concept of wu and the Buddhist emphasis on “emptiness,” it has been suggested that Neo-Daoism was influenced by Buddhist philosophy from the start. Though possible, there is so far no strong evidence linking He Yan, Wang Bi and other early Neo-Daoists to Buddhism. On the contrary, it is clear that xuanxue had exerted considerable influence on the development of Chinese Buddhism. From the fourth century onward, Buddhist masters frequently engaged in Pure Conversation and challenged xuanxue scholars at their own game. For example, the Shishuo xinyu (4.32) reports that the monk Zhi Dun (314–366) challenged the “Xiang-Guo”—i.e., Xiang Xiu and Guo Xiang—interpretation of the Zhuangzi, arguing that only the enlightened sage could truly experience transcendental freedom. In another episode, we find Zhi Dun taking part in a debate on the “four roots of capacity and nature” (4.51). During the Northern and Southern Dynasties, xuanxue reached the pinnacle of its influence when it was admitted into the official curriculum of the imperial academy. At the same time, however, Neo-Daoism also began to lose its vitality. As the early medieval period drew to a close, it was Buddhism and religious Daoism that commanded the attention of the literati.

Xuanxue or Neo-Daoism occupies a key place in the history of Chinese philosophy. Arriving on the Chinese scene at a point of rupture, it redefined the classical tradition and brought into currency new ideas in metaphysics, ethics, hermeneutics, and other areas of philosophical concern, which facilitated the reception of Buddhist philosophy and laid the foundation for the Neo-Confucian movement later. To recapitulate, mainstream Neo-Daoism is not a partisan Daoist school. Properly understood, Confucius, Laozi, and Zhuangzi converge in their understanding of the mystery of Dao. Neo-Daoism is also not an escapist movement. On the contrary, xuanxue cannot be divorced from the goal of “great peace.” The philosophy of nothingness and naturalness does not give rise to pessimism or renunciation. Even Ji Kang and Ruan Ji did not abandon the promise of renewal. Although many scholars had found in the ancient recluse a source of inspiration, and despite the fact that it was common for the literati to refuse office, there was an optimism that naturalness and nonaction would in the end bring about harmony and peace. Finally, it should be emphasized that Neo-Daoism is not monolithic. The concept of nothingness, for example, may have been central to the xuanxue project, but it is subject to debate and interpretation. Toward the end of the third century, for example, Pei Wei (267–300) composed a treatise provocatively titled “Extolling [the virtue of] Being” (Chongyou lun). Whether or not he had intended to counter the influence of Wang Bi, this should give an indication of the vibrancy of the Learning in the Profound.


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Confucius | ethics: Chinese | Laozi | Taoism | Zhuangzi