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Chinese Ethics

First published Thu Jan 10, 2008

The tradition of Chinese ethical thought is centrally concerned with questions about how one ought to live: what goes into a worthwhile life, how to weigh duties toward family versus duties toward strangers, whether human nature is predisposed to be morally good or bad, how one ought to relate to the non-human world, the extent to which one ought to become involved in reforming the larger social and political structures of one's society, and how one ought to conduct oneself when in a position of influence or power. The personal, social, and political are often intertwined in Chinese approaches to the subject. Anyone who wants to draw from the range of important traditions of thought on this subject needs to look seriously at the Chinese tradition. The canonical texts of that tradition have been memorized by schoolchildren in Asian societies for hundreds of years, and at the same time have served as objects of sophisticated and rigorous analysis by scholars and theoreticians rooted in widely variant traditions and approaches. This article will introduce ethical issues raised by some of the most influential texts in Confucianism, Mohism, Daoism, Legalism, and Chinese Buddhism.

1. Characteristics of Chinese Ethics: Practical Focus and Closeness to Pre-theoretical Experience

In the Analects 13.18, the Governor of She tells Confucius of a Straight Body who reported his father to the authorities for stealing a sheep. Confucius (Kongzi, best known in the West under his latinized name, lived in the 6th and 5th century B.C.E) replies that in his village, uprightness lies in fathers and sons covering up for each other. In the Euthyphro, Socrates encounters Euthyphro (whose name can be translated as “Straight thinker”), reputed for his religious knowledge and on his way to bring charges against his father for murder. The conversation between Socrates and Euthyphro leads to a theoretical inquiry in which various proposed answers as to piety's ousia (essence) are probed and ultimately found unsatisfactory, but in which no answer to the piety or impiety of Euthyphro's action is given. The contrast between these two stories highlights one of the distinctive features of Chinese ethics in general: its respect for the practical problem. The practical problem discussed by Confucius and Socrates is arguably a universal one: the conflict between loyalty owed to a family member and duty to uphold public justice within the larger community. Confucius's response is one dimension of a characteristically Chinese respect for the practical problem. The nature of the problem demands a practical response. However, another dimension of a reflective respect for the practical problem is to maintain a certain humility in the face of a really hard problem. It is to be skeptical that highly abstract theories will provide a response that is true to the complexities of that problem. A tradition exemplifying such respect will contain influential works that will not pretend to have resolved recurring tensions within the moral life such as those identified in the Analects and the Euthyphro.

Confucius gives an immediate practical answer in 13.18, but the reader and commentators have been left to weave together the various remarks about filial piety so as to present a rationale for that answer. These remarks quite often concern rather particular matters, as is the matter of turning in one's father for stealing a sheep, and the implications for more general issues are ambiguous. Do fathers and sons cover up for each other on all occasions, no matter how serious, and if there is a cover-up, is there also an attempt to compensate the victim of the wrongdoing? The particularity of these passages is tied up with the emphasis on praxis. What is sought and what is discussed is often the answer to a particular practical problem, and the resulting particularity of the remarks invites multiple interpretations. The sayings often are presented as emerging from conversations between Confucius and his students or various personages with official positions, or among Confucius's students. One passage (11.22) portrays Confucius as having tailored his advice according to the character of the particular student: he urges one student to ask father and elder brother for advice before practicing something he has learnt, while he urges the other to immediately practice; the reason is that the first has so much energy that he needs to be kept back, while the second is retiring and needs to be urged forward. With this passage in mind, we might then wonder whether the apparent tension between remarks made in connection with a concept is to be understood in terms of the differences between the individuals addressed or the context of the conversation.

All texts that have become canonical within a tradition, of course, are subject to multiple interpretations, but Chinese texts invite them. They invite them by articulating themes that stay relatively close to the pre-theoretical experience that gives rise to the practical problems of moral life (see Kupperman, 1999 on the role of experience in Chinese philosophy). The pre-theoretical is not experience that is a pure given or unconceptualized, nor is it necessarily experience that is universal in its significance and intelligibility across different traditions of thought and culture. This attention to pre-theoretical experience also leads to differences in format and discursive form: dialogues and stories are more suited for appealing to and evoking the kind of pre-theoretical experience that inspires parts of the text. By contrast, much Western philosophy has gone with Plato in taking the route of increasing abstraction from pre-theoretical experience.

The contrast is not meant to imply that Chinese philosophy fails to give rise to theoretical reflection. Theoretical reflection of great significance arises in the Mozi, Mencius, Hanfeizi, Xunzi, and Zhuangzi, but there is more frequent interplay between the theorizing and references to pre-theoretical experience. In Chinese texts there are suggestions for theorizing about this experience, but the suggestions often indicate several different and fruitful directions for theorizing to go further. These directions may seem incompatible, and they may or may not be so in the end, but the tensions between these directions are real. The result is a fruitful ambiguity that poses a problematic. Pre-theoretical experience poses a practical problem. Apparently incompatible solutions to problems are partially theorized in the text, but the apparent incompatibility is not removed. Much of the value of these texts lies in their leaving the tensions in place with enough theory given to stimulate thinking within a certain broadly defined approach. There is more than enough for the sophisticated theorist to try to interpret or to reconstruct a more defined position as an extension of that broadly defined approach. At the same time, the problematic is partly framed with the language of pre-theoretical experience in the form of dialogue and story, making the texts accessible to a much broader range of readers than is usually the case with philosophy texts. The following sections present some of the major kinds of problematic that appear in the major schools of Chinese ethical thought.

2. Confucian Ethics

2.1 Virtue ethics: the dao, the junzi, and ren

Confucian ethics is focused around ideals of character and the constituting traits or virtues. The most frequently discussed ideal is that of the junzi. The Chinese word originally meant “prince's son,” but in the Analects it refers to ethical nobility. The usual English translation is “gentleman.” Among the traits connected to ethical nobility are filial piety, a respect for and dedication to the performance of traditional ritual forms of conduct, and the ability to judge what the right thing to do is in the given situation. These traits are virtues in the sense that they are necessary for following the dao, the way human beings ought to live their lives. As Yu (2007) points out, the dao plays the kind of role in ancient Chinese ethics that is analogous to the role played by eudaimonia or flourishing, in ancient Greek ethics. The junzi is the ethical exemplar with the virtues making it possible to follow the dao.

Besides the concepts of dao and junzi, the concept of ren is a unifying theme in the Analects. Before Confucius's time, the concept of ren referred to the aristocracy of bloodlines, meaning something like the strong and handsome appearance of an aristocrat. But in the Analects the concept is of a moral excellence that anyone has the potential to achieve. Various translations have been given of ren. Many translations attempt to convey the idea of complete ethical virtue, connoting a comprehensive state of ethical excellence. In a number of places in the Analects the ren person is treated as equivalent to the junzi, indicating that ren has the meaning of complete or comprehensive moral excellence, lacking no particular virtue but having them all. However, ren in some places in the Analects is treated as one virtue among others such as wisdom and courage. In the narrower sense of being one virtue among others, it is explained in 12.22 in terms of caring for others. It is in light of these passages that other translators, such as D.C. Lau, use ‘benevolence’ to translate ren. However, others have tried to more explicitly convey the sense of ‘ren’ in the comprehensive sense of all-encompassing moral virtue through use of the translation ‘Good’ or ‘Goodness’ (see Waley, 1938, 1989; Slingerland, 2000), and this translation will be used for ren here.

2.2 The centrality of li or ritual

Analects 1.15 likens the project of cultivating one's character to crafting something fine from raw material: cutting bone, carving a piece of horn, polishing or grinding a piece of jade. The chapter also stresses the importance of li (the rites, ritual) in this project. In the Analects ritual includes ceremonies of ancestor worship, the burial of parents, and the rules governing respectful and appropriate behavior between parents and children. Later the word came to cover a broad range of customs and practices that spelled out courteous and respectful behavior of many different kinds. Engaging in ritual, learning to perform it properly and with the right attitudes of respect while performing it, is to engage in a kind of cutting and carving and polishing and grinding of the self. One of the most distinctive marks of Confucian ethics is the centrality of ritual performance in the ethical cultivation of character. For example, while Aristotelian habituation generally corresponds to the Confucian cultivation of character, there is no comparable emphasis in Aristotle on the role of ritual performance in this process of character transformation. Yet Confucians will say that any complete description of self-cultivation must include a role for the culturally established customs that spell out what it means to express respect for another person in various social contexts. Just how that role is conceived in the Analects is one of the central interpretive puzzles concerning the Analects. The interpretive question of how li is central to self-cultivation is posed in particular about its relation to the chief virtue of ren or Goodness.

In the Analects 3.3 the Master said, “A man who is not Good—what has he to do with ritual?” The implication is that ritual is a means of cultivating and expressing a Goodness that is already there, at least in a raw or unrefined state. This implication about the role of ritual is consistent with passages of the Analects in which Confucius shows flexibility on the question of whether to follow established ritual practice. 9.3 shows him accepting the contemporary practice of wearing a cheaper silk ceremonial cap rather than the traditional linen cap. 9.3 also shows Confucius rejecting the contemporary practice of bowing after one ascends the stairs leading up to the ruler's dais, and maintaining the traditional practice of bowing before one ascends the stairs. The implication is that the contemporary practice expresses the wrong attitude toward the ruler—presumptuousness in assuming permission to ascend. 9.3 suggests that it is something like the right attitude that is cultivated and expressed by ritual. Kwong-loi Shun (1993) has called this kind of understanding of ritual the “instrumental” interpretation.

However, in other places of the Analects, ritual seems to take on a more central role in the achievement of goodness. Indeed, it seems to be presented as the key. A very common translation of 12.1 has Confucius telling his favorite student Yan Hui that “Restraining yourself and returning to the rites constitutes Goodness. If for one day you managed to restrain yourself and return to the rites, in this way you could lead the entire world back to Goodness. The key to achieving Goodness lies within yourself—how could it come from others?” (translation from Slingerland, 2003, though see Li, 2007, for a different translation of the word wei usually translated as ‘constitutes’, with different implications for the question of the relation between li and ren). Such passages have given rise to the “constitutive” interpretation, as Shun calls it, which makes li somehow the whole of ren. Obviously the instrumental and constitutive interpretations cannot both be true.

Shun's approach to this problem is to produce an interpretation of the relation between ren and li that reconciles the two sets of passages that are in tension with one another. On the one hand, a particular set of ritual forms are the conventions that a community has evolved, and without such forms attitudes such as respect or reverence cannot be made intelligible or expressed (the truth behind the constitutive interpretation). On the other hand, different communities may have different conventions that express respect or reverence, and moreover any given community may revise its conventions in piecemeal though not wholesale fashion (the truth behind the instrumentalist interpretation).

Others have employed a very different interpretive strategy and argued that such conflicts constitute reasons for thinking that the Analects is an accretive text, i.e., composed of layers added at different times by different people with conflicting views. To some extent, viewing the Analects as accretive is nothing new, but Bruce and A. Takeo Brooks (1998, 2000) recently have taken that view very far by identifying Book 4 (and only part of it, for that matter) as the most reflective of the historical Kongzi's views, and the other books as stemming from Confucius's students and members of his family. The different books, and, sometimes, individual passages within the books, represent different time periods, people, with different agendas who are responding to different conditions, and often putting forward incompatible strands of Confucianism. The Brooks suggest that the parts of the Analects most directly associated with the historical Confucius and his disciples are the parts that feature ren as the pre-eminent virtue and that de-emphasize the role of ritual. The parts that are due to another trend in Confucianism, headed by Confucius's descendants, are the parts that elevate ritual as the key to goodness. The Brooks's theory of the Analects has drawn appreciation and disagreement (e.g., see Slingerland, 2000 for both). It threatens to dislodge the assumption that underlies the dominant mode of interpreting the Analects, which is that the text, or most of it, reflects the coherent thought of one person.

A third way of approaching the Analects allows for the possibility that different sets of passages are the products of different thinkers, but these different people, even if they have different pragmatic and political agendas (a factor that the Brooks tend to emphasize), might also have had different and philosophically substantial perspectives on common problems. One of those problems might indeed have been the relation between ren and li, and at least part of the explanation of why different and potentially conflicting things are said about that relation is that the relation is a difficult one to figure out and that different thinkers addressing that common problem might reasonably have arrived at different things to say. Whether these different things are ultimately irreconcilable remains an open question. One might take a constructive attitude to these differences, ask what good philosophical reasons could motivate the different approaches, and ask whether there is a way of reconciling what all the good reasons entail.

There are good philosophical reasons for resisting the reduction of ren to li. As indicated above, 9.3 suggests that the attitudes of respect and reverence that are expressed by ritual forms are not reducible to any particular set of such forms, and Shun has a point in arguing that such attitudes could be expressed by different sets of such forms as established by different communities. In studying the cultures of other communities, we recognize that certain customs are meant to signify respect, even if we do not share these customs, just as we recognize that something that does not signify disrespect in our culture does indeed so signify in another culture. The fact that we can distinguish the attitude from the ritual forms that we use to express them allows us to consider alternative ritual forms that could express the same attitude. Ceremonial caps that are made of more economical material are acceptable, perhaps, because wearing such caps rather than the material ones need not affect the spirit of the ceremony. By contrast, bowing after one ascends the stairs constitutes an unacceptable change in attitude. To maintain that particular ritual forms do not constitute the respect and reverence they are intended to express is not to underestimate their importance for cultivating and strengthening these attitudes. Acting in ways that express respect given the conventionally established meanings of accepted ritual forms helps to strengthen the agent's disposition to have respect. The ethical development of character does involve strengthening some emotional dispositions over others. We strengthen dispositions by acting on them. By providing conventionally established, symbolic ways to express respect for others, ritual forms give participants ways to act on and therefore to strengthen the right dispositions.

On the other hand, there is good reason to resist the reduction of li simply to the role of expressing and cultivating a set of attitudes and emotional dispositions. In his influential interpretation (1972) of the Analects, Herbert Fingarette construes ritual performance as an end in itself, as beautiful and dignified, open and shared participation in ceremonies that celebrate human community. Ritual performance, internalized so that it becomes second nature, such that it is gracefully and spontaneously performed, is a crucial constituent of a fully realized human life. There are nonconventional dimensions of what it is to show respect, such as providing food for one's parents (see Analects 2.7), but the particular way the agent does this will be deeply influenced by custom. Indeed, custom specifies what is a respectful way of serving food. On the Confucian view, doing so in a graceful and whole-hearted fashion as spelled out by the customs of one's community is part of what it is to live a fully human life.

Ritual constitutes an important part of what Goodness is, and hence it is not merely an instrument for refining the substance of goodness. At the same time it is not the whole of Goodness. Consider that part of Goodness that involves attitudinal dispositions. Attitude is not reducible to ritual form even if acting on that form can cultivate and sustain attitude. Moreover, 7.30 emphasizes the connection between desire for goodness and its achievement (“If I simply desire Goodness, I find that it is already there”). The achievement of goodness is of course a difficult and long journey, and so 7.30 implies that coming to truly desire it lies at the heart of that achievement. The multifaceted nature of goodness emerges in Book 12, where Confucius is portrayed as giving different descriptions of goodness. In 12.1, as we already noted, he says that ritual makes up goodness. But then in 12.2, he says that goodness involves comporting oneself in public as if one were receiving an important guest and in the management of the common people behaving as if one were overseeing a great sacrifice (the duty to be respectful toward others). 12.2 also associates goodness with shu or “sympathetic understanding,” not imposing on others what you yourself do not desire. Here the emphasis is not so much on ritual or not exclusively anyway, but on the attitudes one displays toward others, and on the ability to understand what others want or do not want based on projecting oneself into their situation. In 12.3, when asked about goodness, Confucius says that the good person is hesitant to speak (suggesting that good people take extreme care not to have their words exceed their actions). And then in 12.22, when asked about goodness, Confucius says that it is to care for people.

There are philosophical reasons, then, for ending up somewhere between the instrumentalist and constitutive interpretations. If we take the relevant passages as forming a whole in which one coherent view is embedded, there is a pretty good case for this as an interpretation of the relation between ren and li in the Analects. If the text is as radically accretive as the Brooks maintain, then the proposed construal of the relation is more of a reconstruction of what the best philosophical position might be on the nature of the relation. The reconstructive possibility should not be disturbing as long as we recognize it for what it is. Thinkers within a complex and vigorous tradition frequently re-interpret, expand, develop, revise, and even reject some of what one has inherited from the past. The fact that the Analects itself might be a product of this kind of engagement might usefully be taken as encouragement for its present students to engage with the text in the same way.

The Confucian position on the importance of li in ethical cultivation is interesting and distinctive in its own right, and this is partly because Confucianism hews close to a kind of pre-theoretical experience of the moral life that might otherwise get obscured by a more purely theoretical approach to ethics. If we look at everyday experience of the moral life, we see that much of the substance of ethically significant attitudes such as respect is in fact given by cultural norms and practices, and learning a morality must involve learning these norms and practices. Children learn what their behavior means to others, and what it should mean, by learning how to greet each other, make requests, and answer requests, all in a respectful manner. Much of our everyday experience of moral socialization lies in the absorption of or teaching to others of customs that are conventionally established to mean respect, gratitude, and other ethically significant attitudes. So construed, Confucian ethics provides an alternative to understanding the nature of the moral life that is different from an understanding that is primarily based on abstract principles, even abstract principles that require respect for each person. This is why there is significant resonance between Confucianism and communitarian philosophies such as those defended by Alasdair MacIntyre (1984, 1989) and Michael Walzer (1983). One of the distinctive marks of communitarianism is the theme that much of the substance of a morality is given not in abstract principles of the sort typically defended in modern Western philosophy but in a society's specific customs and practices. In the Analects, the ambiguous relation between ren and li poses the problematic of how we are to understand the relation between cultural norms and practices on the one hand and that part of morality that appears to transcend any particular set of norms and practices. The Analects suggests a large role for culture, but on the reading suggested here, not a constitutive role. There is much room for theoretical elaboration on the nature of that role.

Furthermore, in understanding why Confucians take a life of ritual practice to be partly constitutive of a fully human life, one must understand the aesthetic dimension of their notion of a fully human life. Such a life is lived as a beautiful and graceful coordinated interaction with others according to conventionally established forms that express mutual respect. A good of the value attached to the fully human life lies in the aesthetic dimensions of a “dance” (Ihara, 2004) one performs with others. Both these themes—the importance of contextualized moral judgment and aesthetic value of human interaction according to custom and tradition—offer opportunities for practitioners of, say, Anglo-American moral philosophy to reflect on what their approaches to the moral life might miss.

2.3 Ren and li as relational values in contrast to values of individual autonomy

Consider ren in its meaning as the particular virtue of caring for others and li in its aspect as the valued human dance. These values are the basis for characterizing Confucian ethics as a relational ethic, meaning that it is in part distinguished by its placement of relationships at the center of a well-lived life. Confucian ethics are often taken to stand in contrast to ethics that place individual autonomy and freedom to choose how to live. While there is much that is true about this contrast, it must be carefully described so as to differentiate it from some other contrasts. For example, the value of individual autonomy usually includes several different dimensions that do not necessarily accompany one another: (1) prioritizing of individual interests over group or collective interests when these conflict; (2) giving moral permission to the individual to choose from a significantly wide range (within certain moral boundaries) of ways to live; and (3) emphasizing the importance of living according to one's own understanding of what is right and good even if others do not see it the same way.

Confucian ethics in significant part, though not in all parts, accepts autonomy in the sense of (3) (see Shun, 2004). Confucius is often depicted in the Analects as emphasizing the importance of cultivating one's own character even when others do not recognize or appreciate one's efforts (e.g., 4.14) and of acting independently of what is conventionally approved or disapproved (e.g., 5.1). The texts associated with Mencius (Mengzi, best known in the West under his Latinized name, lived in the 4th century B.C.E.) and Xunzi (4th and 3rd centuries B.C.E.), the most pivotal thinkers in the classical Confucian tradition after Confucius, both articulate the necessity to speak up when one believes the ruler one is serving is on a wrong course of action (e.g., Mencius 1A3 and Xunzi 29.2). On the other hand, none of these classical thinkers argue for the necessity of protecting a frank subordinate from a ruler who is made angry by criticism, and it could be argued that Confucianism does not fully endorse autonomy in sense (3) without endorsing such protection for those who wish to engage in moral criticism of the powerful.

Most interpretations present Confucian ethics as rejecting (2). There is a way for human beings to live, a comprehensive human good to be realized, and there can be no choosing between significantly different ways of life that are equally acceptable from a moral perspective (an important exception to this kind of interpretation is provided by Hall and Ames, 1987, who interpret Confucius's dao as a human invention, collective and individual). On the other hand, Confucian ethics de-emphasizes legal coercion as a method for guiding people along the way and instead an puts the emphasis on moral exhortation and inspiration by way of example (see, most famously, 2.3 of the Analects, which emphasizes the necessity a ruler's guiding his people by instilling in them a sense of shame rather than by the threat of external punishment). While a Confucian might believe in a single correct way for human beings, she might endorse a significant degree of latitude for people to learn from their own mistakes and by way of example from others (see Chan, 1999).

Confucian ethics does not accept (1), but not because it subordinates individual interests to group or collective interests (for criticism of the rather common interpretation of Confucianism as prioritizing the group over the individual, see Hall and Ames 1998). Rather, there is a different conception of the relationship between individual and group interests. The best illustration of this different conception is a story to be found in the Mencius that concerns sage-king Shun. When Shun wanted to marry, he knew that his father, influenced by his stepmother, would not allow him to marry. In this difficult situation, Shun decided to marry without telling his father, even though he is renowned for his filial piety. Mencius in fact defends the filiality of Shun's act in 5A2. He observes that Shun knew that he would not have been allowed to marry if he told his father. This would have resulted in bitterness toward his parents, and that is why he did not tell them. The implication of this version of Shun's reason is that filiality means preserving an emotionally viable relationship with one's parents, and in the case at hand Shun judged that it would have been worse for the relationship to have asked permission to marry. The conception of the relation between individual and group interests embodied in this story is not one of subordination of one to the other but about the mutual dependence between the individual and the group. The individual depends on the group and must make the group's interests part of his or her own interests, but, on the other side of the equation, the group depends on the individual and must make that individual's interests part of the group's interests. Shun's welfare depends on his family and therefore must make his family's interests part of his own (he resolves to do what is necessary to preserve his relationship to his parents), but his family's welfare depends on Shun, and therefore it must recognize his interests to constitute part of its welfare (the family must recognize that it is damaging itself in requiring Shun to deny himself the most part important of human relationships).

The ways in which Confucianism values autonomy and the ways in which it does not has implications for the increasingly discussed issue as to whether contemporary Confucianism can recognize individual rights. Given the way that individual and group interest are conceived as mutually dependent and interwoven, Confucianism cannot recognize rights that are based on the idea that rights defend the interests of the individual against group interests (though something like this conception of rights might be compatible with Confucianism in case relationships irretrievably break down and individuals need to be protected; see Chan, 1999). The way that Confucianism values living according to one's understanding of the right and the good does provide a basis for the idea that individuals should receive protection when they express their convictions about these matters, particularly when they are expressing convictions about the wrongful or misconceived conduct of their political leaders (Wong, 2004). Furthermore, Chinese thinkers from the 19th century onwards have adapted the concept of rights received in interaction with the West, and these adaptations often articulate the idea that the individual ought to have a range of freedom of expression and action so that they can contribute more richly and originally to the welfare of Chinese society. Chinese thinkers such as Liang Qichao and Japanese thinkers such as Kato affirmed both the legitimacy of the individual's desires and the necessity to harmonize individual and group desires (see Angle and Svensson, 2001; Angle, 2002). Emphasis on the former would be the relatively new element in a contemporary Confucianism, but 1B6 of the Mencius provides a striking anticipation of this element. Here King Xuan tells Mencius that his ability to be a true king for his people is thwarted by his desires for wealth and for sex. Mencius replies that if the King accords the common people the same privileges for wealth and sex, there would be no problem in becoming a true king. Rosemont (1991, 2004) has argued that “second-generation” “positive” rights to education and economic security are better grounded in the Chinese tradition than they have been in the West.

2.4 The centrality of filial piety in Confucian ethics and the doctrine of love with distinctions

Along with the emphasis on li, the centrality of filial piety is one of the most distinctive characteristics of Confucian ethics. The Analects 2.6 says to give parents no cause for anxiety other than illness, whereas 2.7, as mentioned earlier, emphasizes the need for the material support of parents to be carried out in a respectful manner. 2.8 emphasizes that it is the expression on one's face that is filial and not just taking on the burden of work or letting elders partake of the wine and food before others.

Is obedience to parents always required of the filial child? What if the child believes that parents are wrong and their wishes run contrary to what is right or to Goodness? In those cases where one thinks them wrong, what is one to do? The Analects 2.5 portrays Confucius as saying, “Do not disobey,” but when queried further as to his meaning, he explains obedience in terms of conformance to the rites for burying and sacrificing to deceased parents. In 4.18 Confucius says that when one disagrees with one's parents, one should remonstrate with them gently. Most translations of what follows have Confucius concluding that if parents are not persuaded, one should not oppose them (e.g., Lau, 1979; Slingerland, 2003; Waley, 1938), but it is possible to read the spare and ambiguously worded passage as requiring instead that one not abandon one's purpose in respectfully trying to change one's parents' minds (Legge, 1971). In other Confucian texts, the question of whether obedience is required has received different answers in the Confucian tradition. Chapters 1 and 2 of the Record of Ritual (Legge, 1967, vol. 1) say that one must obey if one fails to persuade one's parent. On the other hand, Xunzi declares that following the requirements of morality rather than the wishes of one's father is part of the highest standard of conduct (29.1 of the Xunzi; for a translation see Knoblock, 1988–94) and moreover that if following the course of action mandated by one's father would bring disgrace to the family and not following it would bring honor, then not following is to act morally (29.2 of the Xunzi). Xunzi's position is supported in part by the distinction between service to parents and obedience to them. It might very well fail to be of service to parents if following their wishes is to bring moral disgrace to them and the family.

Another ethical issue arising from the strong Confucian emphasis on filial piety concerns possible conflicts between loyalty to parents and loyalty to the ruler or public justice. Consider again Analects 13.18, in which Confucius says that uprightness is found in sons and fathers covering up for each other. In this case, at least, loyalty to parents or to children takes precedence over loyalty to ruler or to public justice. This precedence is one implication of the Confucian doctrine of love with distinctions (“love with distinctions” is the usual translation, but perhaps “care with distinctions” is less misleading because it covers both the emotionally freighted attitude toward kin and a more distanced attitude toward strangers). Though all people are owed moral concern, some are owed more than others, according to the agent's relationship to them.

To introduce other kinds of problematic treated by Confucian thinkers, it is necessary to identify a pivotal critic of Confucianism in the classical period. Mozi (probably 5th century B.C.E), who possibly was once a student of Confucianism, came to reject that teaching, partly on the grounds that the Confucian emphasis on ritual was a wasteful expenditure of resources that could otherwise be used to meet the basic needs of the many (Mozi, chapters 25, 32; see Watson, 1967 for a translation). A related criticism in the text of the Mozi is that tradition does not hold normative authority simply because it is tradition, for there was a time when the practice in question was not tradition but new (chapter 39). If a practice has no authority when it is new, it has no authority at any subsequent time simply because it is getting older. Mozi also rejected Confucianism on the grounds that partiality toward one's own (oneself, one's family, one's state) is at the root of all destructive conflict (chapter 16). Partiality toward the self causes the strong to rob the weak. Partiality toward one's family causes great families wreak havoc with lesser families (it is not difficult to see how this thought might apply to the idea of protecting one's own, even if they have committed serious crimes against others outside the family). Partiality toward one's state causes great states attack small states. Mozi advocated the doctrine of universal love or impartial concern.

2.5 Mencius's defense of love with distinctions and his theory of the roots of moral knowledge and motivation in human nature

The substantial following that Mohism gained in the classical period forced a response from Confucians (see Hansen, 1992, and Van Norden 2007, for a discussion of Mozi's pivotal impact on the Chinese tradition). They responded on two subjects: first, they had to address what is required by way of concern for all people and how to reconcile such concern with the greater concern for some that the Confucian doctrine of love with distinctions requires; second, they had to address the question of what kinds of concern are motivationally possible for human beings, partly in response to the Mohist argument that it is not difficult to act on impartial concern, and partly in response to others who were skeptical about the possibility of acting on any kind of genuinely other-regarding concern. Mencius, in the text purporting to be a record of his teachings, explicitly sets himself to the task of defending Confucianism not only against Mohism but the teachings of Yang Zhu. Yang's teachings seemed to Mencius to sit on the opposite end of the spectrum from Mohism (there is no surviving text purporting to articulate and defend Yangism). According to Mencius's characterization, Yang Zhu criticized both Mohism and Confucianism for asking people to sacrifice themselves for others. Yang Zhu on this view was an ethical egoist: i.e., one who holds that it is always right to promote one's own welfare. Mencius positioned Confucianism as the occupying the correct mean between the extremes of having concern only for oneself on the one hand and having an equal degree of concern for everyone.

Mencius 1A7 purports to be an account of a conversation between Mencius and King Xuan, the ruler of a Chinese state. Mencius is attempting to persuade the king to adopt the Confucian dao or way of ruling. The king wonders whether he really can be the kind of king Mencius is advocating, and Mencius replies by asking whether the following story he has heard about the king is true. The story is that the king saw an ox being led to slaughter for a ritual sacrifice. The king decided to spare the ox and substituted a lamb for the ritual sacrifice. Thinking back on that occasion, the king recalls that it was the look in the ox's eyes, like that of an innocent man being led to execution, that led him to substitute the lamb. Mencius then comments that this story demonstrates the king's capability to become a true king, and that all he has to do is to extend the sort of compassion he showed the ox to his own people. If he can care for an ox, he can care for his subjects. To say that he can care for an ox but not for his people is like saying “my strength is sufficient to lift heavy weight, but not enough to lift a feather” (translation adapted from Lau, 1970) His failure to act on behalf of his people is due simply to his not acting, not to an inability to act. What the king has to do, suggests Mencius, is to treat the aged in his family as aged, and then extend it to the aged in other families; treat his young ones as young ones, and extend it to the young ones of others; then you can turn the whole world in the palm of his hand.

The passage demonstrates one characteristic of the text that is pertinent to Mencius's response to Mohism. In contrast to the Analects, the ruler's duties to care for his people are more frequently discussed and play a more prominent role in the conception of a ruler's moral excellence. Mencius is portrayed in this text as very much engaged in getting the kings of Chinese states to stop mistreating their subjects, to stop drafting their subjects into their wars of territorial expansion, and to avoid overtaxing them to finance their wars and lavish projects. At the same time, Mencius's assertion that the king is able to extend the kind of concern he showed the ox toward his own people is a reply to those who advocate Yangism on the grounds that acting for one's own sake is natural. Mencius holds that natural compassion is a part of human nature. The task of moral self-cultivation is the task of “extending” what is natural. What is natural, or at least more so, is properly acting toward the aged and the young in one's family and then extending that to the aged and the young in other families.

Extension is necessary because natural compassion is uneven compared to where it ought to extend. King Xuan may find it natural to have compassion for an innocent man about to be executed or a terrified ox about to be slaughtered, but not toward all his subjects when he is focusing on the benefits that a war of territorial expansion might bring him. This story of Mencius, the King, and the ox is rich material for reflection on the nature of moral development. It seems plausible that development must begin with something that is of the right nature to be shaped into the moral virtues, and also plausible that what we begin with is not as it fully should be. The questions posed by the story is what the natural basis of morality is and how further development occurs. Mencius's theory of the “four beginnings” addresses these questions. In 2A6 human nature (ren xing) it is said that no person is devoid of a heart (the word for heart in Chinese stands for the seat of thinking and feeling, hence often translated as “the mind”) sensitive to the suffering of others, and to illustrate this beginning, Mencius asks us to suppose that a man were suddenly to see a young child about to fall into a well. Such a man would certainly be moved to compassion, not because he wanted to get in the good graces of the parents, nor because he wished to win the praise of his fellow villagers or friends, nor yet because he disliked the cry of the child. This natural compassion can develop into the virtue of ren (in Mencius, ren is more often a particular virtue that concerns caring and hence is often translated as “benevolence”).

A second beginning is the heart that feels shame in certain situations, e.g., in 6A10, Mencius says that if rice and soup are offered after being trampled upon, even a beggar would disdain them. Under the right conditions, innate shame develops into the virtue of yi or righteousness—being able to do the right thing. The third beginning is the heart that feels courtesy,e.g., the younger sometimes instinctively knows to respect and be courteous to the older. Under the right conditions, courtesy develops into li, which as a virtue consists in the observance of the rites or the virtue of ritual propriety. And finally, there is the heart that has a sense of right and wrong (shi/fei, the thing to do or not to do). Under the right conditions, this sense of approval and disapproval develops into wisdom, which includes having a grasp of the spirit behind moral rules so that one knows how to be flexible in applying them.

It is important to note that Mencian beginnings of morality are not just blind feelings or primitive urges to act in certain ways, but contain within them certain intuitive judgments about what is right and wrong, what is to be disdained and what is deferential, respectful behavior. In the example of the beggar who does not accept food that has been trampled upon, it seems that Mencius is suggesting we have an innate sense that allows us to judge the sort of respect that is due to ourselves as human beings. Similarly, in suggesting that we have an innate sense of deference, Mencius is suggesting that we have an innate sense of what is due to others such as elders and our parents. Mencius's theory tallies with some of the more recent theories of emotion that point toward the intertwining of cognitive and affective dimensions (the theory does not necessarily imply, however, that the affective amounts to nothing more than the cognitive, as shall be discussed later).

Mencius calls these beginnings of morality “duan,” which literally means the tip of something. Sometimes the word is translated as “sprout,” and this translation arguably captures the meaning in the text that the beginnings must be nurtured with the right care and under the right conditions in order to extend where they ought to go. Analogous to the sun and water and the right soil that a sprout needs to grow, human beings need a constant means of livelihood (1A7) that enables them to support parents and nurture wife and children, the appropriate moral education about filial piety, about the duties that rulers and subjects owe to each other and about respect for the elder. To say that human nature is originally good, as Mencius sometimes did (6A6), is not to say that human beings have complete moral excellence at birth or they will inevitably develop such excellence no matter what the circumstances. Nor does it mean that other predispositions exist in human nature that could potentially lead human beings astray. Mencius mentions the desires of the senses in this regard (6A15). By saying that human nature is originally good, he seems to mean that it contains predispositions to feel and act in morally appropriate ways and to make intuitive normative judgments that can with the right nurturing conditions give human beings guidance as to the proper emphasis to be given to the desires of the senses (see Shun, 1997; Van Norden, 2004, 2007).

Consider now in combination the theme that the cognitive and affective go into the constitution of emotion and the theme that the emotional beginnings of morality can be extended through provision of the right kind of nurture. What is necessary for extension? Is cognitive extension, i.e., more moral knowledge, sufficient? The answer to this question depends on the nature of the intertwining between the cognitive and affective in emotions. Consider again the story of King Xuan and the ox. Mencius expresses confidence in King Xuan's ability to have compassion for his people, based on his act of compassion for the ox. Here the question of whether cognitive extension is sufficient emerges in the concrete. Was it sufficient for Mencius to have reminded the king that he has even more of a reason to spare his people from suffering than he had to spare the ox from suffering (more reason because Mencius clearly ranks the interests of animals below those of human beings, and because for him there is a good moral reason for the performance of ritual sacrifices)? Logical consistency alone cannot be expected to provide motivation, as David Nivison has pointed out (1996), but then what is Mencius trying to do with the King if not move him through logic? Nowhere in the Mencius is there enough said to point to a definitive interpretation on this matter, but various reconstructions of possible positions can be given. Perhaps the King's innate nature contains all the motivation he needs, and all that Mencius is doing is reminding him that he has the motivation to spare his people. Perhaps the King's nature needs some degree of transformation that starts with the sort of compassion he can feel for a terrified ox or an innocent man about to be executed and then expands the scope of that compassion to more of its appropriate objects (see Im, 1999, Ivanhoe, 2002, Shun, 1997, Wong, 2002, and Van Norden, 2007, for different possible positions that could be attributed to Mencius). What seems philosophically fruitful about the Xuan and ox story is that it portrays an attempt at moral teaching of the kind that actually occurs in the moral life, and the ambiguity that it presents to the reader is fruitful precisely because it is not a completely theorized story. We are not told exactly what Mencius is trying to do with the King in terms of a theory of the nature of emotions and the relation between the cognitive and affective. Rather, we are led to reflect on the most plausible possibilities in trying to arrive at a reconstruction of what might have been meant by the text, as well as what might be the most illuminating position on its own merits. The story is particularly intriguing for those philosophers who believe in the possibility that learning can influence emotion.

What about the priority of filial loyalty over loyalty to the larger community? How does Mencius's theory of human nature address this point of contention between the Mohists and the Confucians? Mencius's response to the Mohists draws from his theory of human nature as containing not only the beginnings of affective motivations for being moral but also intuitive judgments about what is right and about what deserves the feeling of shame. His question to a Mohist, Yizi, is how Yizi can justify providing his deceased parents a special burial when the Mohist prescriptions are for a plain burial for anyone. Yizi's reply is to quote from the Book of History: the sage-kings treated all their subjects as if they were their new-born children. Yizi's interpretation of this saying is that there should be no distinctions in one's concern for people, though the practice of it may begin with one's parents (this may be an expression of the distinction between having equal concern and accepting practice that allow unequal treatment as long as the total system of practices can be justified on the basis of equal concern for all). Mencius's counter-reply is to ask whether Yizi really holds that a person loves his elder brother's son no more than his neighbor's baby. This is not just an assertion about what people tend to feel but also an assertion about what people intuitively hold to be right to feel and to do. Then Mencius makes a puzzling remark to the effect that Yizi is singling out a special feature in a certain case: “when a new-born babe creeps toward a well, it is not its fault.” This last part of Mencius's response is puzzling because Yizi did not say anything about a baby and a well. One possibility is that Yizi may have obliquely referred to Mencius's claim that all have the innate feeling of distress at seeing a child about to fall into a well. In other words, Yizi might have been challenging Mencius by asking, “Does not your own postulated innate compassion require us to treat that child the same way, regardless of whose child it is?” This way of taking Yizi helps makes sense of Mencius's reply. First, he points out what he takes to be the indisputably greater affection one feels for elder brother's son over one's neighbor's baby. Mencius grants that we all respond to a child about to fall into the well with alarm and distress, and it doesn't matter whose child it is. However, one cannot infer from this one special situation that we ought to have equal concern for everyone in all situations. The case of the child about to fall into the well has a special feature that makes it relevant to treat it as one would any child. That special feature seems to be innocence.

The Mencian position is premised on the principle that it is right to treat all people alike only when the ways they are alike are the most ethically relevant features of the situation. We should do the same thing only when the similarities between two cases are the most ethically relevant features of the situation. Mencius believes that in many instances, the presence or absence of a family relationship to a person is the most relevant feature (in deciding which children to give gifts, the fact that one child is one's elder brother's son and the other child is one's neighbor's child may be the most relevant feature). In other types of situations, such as a child about to fall into a well, it is the innocence that children share that is the most relevant feature. That is why it is proper to feel alarm or distress toward any child in that situation. The implied application of this idea to the sage-kings' treatment of the people is that these kings treated all people alike insofar as they did not deserve the harm about to befall them.

Two issues arise from this response to Mohism. One issue is whether Mencius has sufficient warrant to trust the kinds of intuitive judgments he attributes to human nature. Mencius holds that the beginnings of morality are sent by Heaven, but in the absence of such a metaphysical warrant, can these intuitive judgments be accepted, particularly the ones that underwrite love with distinctions? Doubt about the metaphysical warrant may not doom Mencius's response to Mohism, however, if one holds that all normative theories ultimately depend on intuitive judgments and if one has no good reason to be skeptical about these judgments. Thus one might hold that whether or not there is a metaphysical warrant, there is a great deal of plausibility to the intuitive judgment about owing parents more concern because they are the source of one's life and nurturance. Of course one might also hold, as Mencius appears to hold, that people are owed concern in virtue of their being human, and the possibility for conflict of duties arises from these different sources of concern. The second issue is how the Mencius text deals with conflicts of the sort exemplified by the sheep-stealing case in the Analects.

The text contains themes embodying the theme of filial loyalty, and as in the Analects, such loyalty takes precedence over public justice. 7A35 tells a story about the sage-emperor Shun that illustrates this theme. Because Shun was renowned for his filial piety, Mencius is asked what Shun would have done if his father killed a man. Mencius replies that Shun could not stop the judge from apprehending his father because the judge had the legal authority to act. But then, Mencius says, Shun would have abdicated and fled with his father to the edge of the sea. 5A2 and 5A3 describe the way that Shun dealt with his half-brother Xiang's conspiring with his father and stepmother to kill him. He enfeoffed Xiang because all he could do as a brother is to love him. At the same time, Shun appointed officials to administer the fief and to collect taxes and tributes, to protect the people of Youbi from Xiang's potentially abusive ruling. That is why some called Shun's act a banishment of Xiang. However, the Shun stories exhibit a complexity that differentiates them from the story of the sheep-stealing coverup in the Analects. Though filial loyalty is clearly given a priority in each story, there is in Shun's actions an acknowledgment of the other value that comes into conflict with filial loyalty. Though Shun ultimately gives priority to filial loyalty in the case of his father, his first action acknowledges the value of public justice by declining to interfere with the judge while he is king. While Shun declines to punish his half-brother, he protects the people of Xiang's new fiefdom.

These Shun stories illustrate that an agent's response to a situation in which important values come into conflict need not be a strict choice between honoring one value and wholly denying the other. While some sort of priority might have to be set in the end, there are also ways to acknowledge the value that is subordinated, but how exactly that is to be done seems very much a matter of judgment in the particular situation at hand. The Shun stories are an expression of the Confucian theme that rightness cannot be judged on the basis of exceptionless general principles but a matter of judgment in the particular situation. It is difficult to see how this theme can be taught except by the way it is done in the Mencius: through exemplars of how it is done, and where the situation is presented through some kind of narrative.

The characteristic form of reasoning in Mencius is analogical reasoning. Starting from what seems true in one case and “extending” similar conclusions to another case that has similar conclusions. The trick in doing analogical reasoning correctly, as suggested earlier, is to extend the similar conclusions only when the two cases share ethically relevant and decisive features. The Mencius 4A17 shows a similar concern for treating like cases alike. Mencius grants that to save the life of one's drowning sister-in-law, one of course suspends the customary rule of propriety prohibiting the touching of man and woman when they are giving and receiving. Another philosopher proposes to apply this idea of suspending the usual rules of propriety to save something else from drowning—the entire Empire! Mencius replies that one saves one's sister-in-law with one's hand but cannot save the Empire from drowning in chaos and corruption with one's hand. The Empire can only be pulled out by the Way. Mencius is rejecting the analogy between compromising on ritual propriety to save the country and compromising on propriety to save one's sister-in-law. There is a relevant dissimilarity between the case of the drowning sister-in-law and saving the country: one cannot save the Empire through compromises of ritual propriety, but instead by following the Way, which itself involves following ritual propriety.

So what do we do when we confront a problematic case in the present and we do not automatically know what the right thing to do is? Mencius believes we can rely on past cases in which we have made reliable judgments about, for example, what is right and shameful. These reliable judgments made in past cases serve as paradigms or exemplars of correct ethical judgment. In encountering new problem situations, we determine what sort of ethical reaction to the new situation is correct by asking which of the cases in which we've had paradigm judgments are relevantly similar. We then determine what reactions to the new situations would be sufficiently similar to the relevant paradigm judgments. Analogical reasoning is careful attention and comparing to a concrete paradigm. The pool of paradigm ethical judgments we have not only includes cases from our own personal experience, but also include the experience of others, especially those who serve as models of wise judgment. The stories of sage-king Shun in the Mencius text seem to give us such paradigms. Shun's judgments on what to do about conflicts between filial loyalty and public justice are perhaps meant to serve as paradigm judgments. The conception of moral reasoning found in the Mencius offers important material for reflection on the process of moral judgment, especially for those who have come to reject the simple model of judgment as deduction from premises including a general moral principle and a description of the conditions that make the principle applicable to the situation at hand. The Mencian picture includes general moral considerations or values that bear on the situation at hand, such as the importance of family loyalty and public justice, but the picture also suggests that judgment in difficult situations includes finding a way to adequate recognize and realize the values in play. “Finding a way” seems much more a matter of imagination and ingenuity rather than deduction, but the Mencian picture also suggests that we can be guided by exemplars of wise judgment. Identifying the relevant similarities and dissimilarities between these exemplars and one's present situation seems a matter of perception and close attention rather than deduction from principle.

2.6 Xunzi versus Mencius on human nature and the origins of morality

Xunzi explicitly opposes his position on human nature to Mencius's. Rather than being originally good, human beings must become good by remaking their natures, turning them into something very different from what they started out to be. They start out with a love of profit, with feelings of envy and hatred, and desires of the senses. Their natures must be transformed by the instructions of a teacher and guided by ritual principles. Chapter 23 of the Xunzi summarizes this view with the saying that human nature is evil, and that human goodness is the result of conscious activity. In ancient times, says Xunzi, the sage kings recognized the evil in human nature and created ritual principles and precepts of moral duty to reform human nature and guide it in the proper channels so as to be consistent with the dao.

Xunzi misleadingly characterizes the issue between him and Mencius, focusing attention on what follows from what he take to be the correct conception of what is inborn nature. What is inborn is spontaneous, he says, and cannot be learned or needs no effort to acquire. His examples of what is inborn are clear seeing and keen hearing. If the disagreement between these two thinkers comes down to different definitions of the innate, it wouldn't be very interesting. A Mencian could grant that if “inborn nature” is to be defined in Xunzi's way, then goodness cannot be inborn. But that admission is consistent with claiming that human beings have predispositions to develop in certain ways. In fact, the traits we tend to construe as being innate are more like Mencian predispositions than Xunian fixed traits. Even something as biologically based as a human being's maximum height is realized only with adequate nutrition, and clear sight and keen hearing are more developmental and dependent on the right environmental conditions than Xunzi apparently thought. The real issue is whether anything like Mencian moral predispositions exist in human nature. It might be thought that the locus of the disagreement over the existence of moral predispositions is Xunzi's belief that human beings only have self regarding innate motivations: the desire for profit, unlovely feeling such as envy and hatred, and desires of the senses. However, while such traits are highlighted in arguments against Mencius, the chapter 19 on ritual in the Xunzi recognizes the existence of natural concern for others. In that chapter it is strikingly claimed that all creatures of blood and breath love their own kind, and human beings having the greatest awareness of all such creatures, love their parents even after their deaths. The Confucian rituals of mourning for periods, contra the Mohists, are fitting because they express such natural feeling. Xunzi, then, seems at times to grant the existence of genuinely other-regarding, innate predispositions. The genuine locus of disagreement is whether there are innate predispositions that have specifically moral content. Love of one's own kind need not be specifically moral in content, as illustrated by the fact that one might love another beyond reason and morality.

This disagreement over the existence of specifically moral predispositions is connected with the difference between Xunzi's claim that the sage kings invented ritual principles and precepts of moral duty, on the one hand, and Mencius's claim that we are innately predisposed to make intuitive judgments about what is shameful and what is right and wrong. Xunzi denies the existence of natural predispositions with moral content, ones guided by normative judgments, and that is consistent with his also holding that the content of such judgments is not naturally given but invented by human beings. On one plausible interpretation of Mencius, morality is part of the order imparted to the world by heaven. The contrast between Mencius and Xunzi exemplifies the contrast between a robust moral realism that has moral properties such as rightness existing independently of human invention and a constructivist position that makes moral properties dependent on human invention. A closer look at Xunzi's position, however, shows that the contrast between a robust realism and a constructivist position is not the same as the contrast between the view that morality can be objectively correct and the denial of such a possibility. Xunzi believes in the objective correctness of Confucian morality every bit as much as Mencius does (Nivison, 1991). He presents a functional conception of morality, according to which it is invented to harmonize the interests of individuals and to constrain and transform the heedless pursuit of short-term gratification for the sake of promoting the long-term interests of the individual and the group. Ritual principles and moral precepts are invented to accomplish such a function, and human nature constrains which of the possible principles and precepts are better or worse for accomplishing that function. Xunzi's point about the mourning rituals prescribed by Confucians being suited to the nature of human love for one's parents is a case in point.

Xunzi's functional theory of morality bears added interest for those exploring the possibilities of a naturalistic approach to morality. His conception of tian or heaven is of an order-giving force in the cosmos that seems neutral to whatever human beings have come to regard as right and good. In fact, a translation that better conveys the meaning of ‘tian’ for Xunzi is “nature.” Xunzi stresses that tian operates according to patterns that remain constant no matter what human beings do or whether they appeal to it for good fortune (chapter 17). It is the proper task of human beings to understand what these patterns are in order to take advantage of them (e.g., so that they may know to plow in the spring, weed in the summer, harvest in the fall, and store in the winter). Xunzi explicitly rejects an older view of tian as a kind of personal deity who responds to human prayer and sacrifice. By contrast, traces of a view of heaven as having a will and purpose are certainly found in the Analects and in the Mencius (e.g., Analects 2.4, 3.24, and Mencius 1B16, 5A6). Xunzi's view of heaven renders unavailable a conception of morality as part of the natural grain of things imparted by heaven.

Even some of the theoretical difficulties that Xunzi has are instructive. In pressing his case against Mencius for the badness of human nature, he stresses the self-serving drives of human nature. Unlike Hobbes, he does not accept that human beings are inevitably motivated by self-interest, and he does not try to base adherence to moral norms on the basis of self-interest alone. This arguably is a promising move, given the heavy criticism that can be directed against the Hobbesian project and subsequent attempts to carry it out its basic idea (see Gauthier, 1986 for such an attempt; see Vallentyne, 1991 for criticism). Xunzi rather argues that the problems created by unrestrained self-interest point to the need to transform human motivation. People can come to love moral virtue and the rites for their own sakes, and this is necessary, on Xunzi's view, for a stable solution to the problem of conflict between self-interested individuals. At times, Xunzi suggests that the intellect can override the desires arising from the natural emotions, but it remains unclear as to how self-regarding motivations can become a love of virtue and the rites simply because the intellect approves of them. The parts of Xunzi asserting a more complex picture of human motivation suggest a solution. If human beings are capable of genuine compassion and concern for others, as the chapter on rites suggests, then the ritual principles and moral precepts invented by the sage kings have some motivational leverage for the birth of a love of virtue and rites. Such a solution preserves Xunzi's naturalistic position that morality is invented but draws from what are arguably some of the most plausible positions of Mencius: that human beings are capable of altruism and compassion even if they are motivated much of the time by self-interest; and that moral transformation is a matter of cultivating and extending a motivational substance that is congenial to morality.

Mencius and Xunzi, then, offer sophisticated theories that expand the range of possible ways of understanding moral knowledge, motivation, and the nature of morality itself. Mencius presents an interesting conception of the way that we reason by analogy from intuitive judgments and also a plausible conception of innate predispositions that are compatible with a major role for learning and upbringing in the development of character and virtue. Those who are more naturalistically inclined in their approach to morality (at least insofar as this involves resisting the idea of a transcendent source of moral properties) may find Xunzi's functional conception of morality appealing, especially if it allows for a degree of objectivity regarding the content of morality.

2.7 Neo-Confucian theories of morality and their grounding in a cosmology

Zhu Xi (1130–1200) reinterpreted ethical themes inherited from the classical thinkers and grounded them in a cosmology and metaphysics that had absorbed the influence of Buddhism, particularly as it transformed in its interaction with Daoism when entering China (see the chapters on Zhu Xi and Wang Yang Ming in Ivanhoe, 1993 for the neo-Confucian reaction Buddhism and Daoism). Zhu established the Confucian canon that served as a basis for the Chinese civil service examination, including the Analects and Mencius, along with the Great Learning (Da Xue) and Doctrine of the Mean (Zhong Yong). In fact, he had his greatest influence through the commentaries he wrote on these texts (see Gardner, 2003 for a discussion of the influence of Zhu Xi's reading of the Analects). Zhu affirmed the Mencian theme that human nature is good, but also held that individuals differed with respect to their native endowment and their family and social circumstances in ways that affected the development of their good natures. Much of Zhu's metaphysics centers on the relation between li (in this case not ritual but principle or pattern) and qi (the material force or energy stuff from which objects emerge and return at the end of their existence). How Zhu Xi conceived this relation is a matter of interpretive debate. Some view him as holding a dualistic metaphysics in analogy to the way that Plato's distinction between the Forms and the sensible world is often taken to embody a metaphysical dualism (Fung, 1948, chapter 25). However, others interpret Zhu's li not as ontologically prior to qi but rather as being a pattern or deep structure that is immanent within and expressed by qi and delineates the range and possibilities of qi's transformations (Graham, 1986; Thompson, 1988).

Zhu Xi saw one's self-cultivation as a matter of apprehending the li of one's own mind, largely through meditation practice, and, at the same time, investigating the li or patterns of things not only as revealed in texts such as the Analects but as embodied in concrete situations, including the patterns in relationships between persons. Both kinds of activities must be conducted with jing, which in Zhu's thought means respectful attention. Zhu is sometimes characterized as a kind of scholastic, but he emphasized study of the texts in conjunction with acting, with observing li in external situations and relationships, and realizing the correspondence between the li of one's own mind and the li of texts and of situations and relationships. Apprehending li in a concrete situation in order to respond appropriately to it was not a simple matter of absorbing generalizations from texts and applying it to the situation, but rather a matter of bringing to bear a mind that has been cultivated by meditation and by study of the texts and by observing and acting in previous situations. Such a mind can take into account relevant ethical considerations and is disciplined in attending to the situation (see the chapter on Zhu Xi in Ivanhoe, 1993; and Gardner, 1990).

The other Neo-Confucian whose influence rivals that of Zhu Xi is Wang Yang Ming (1472–1529). Wang saw Zhu's emphasis on the investigation of patterns in external things as overly scholastic and leading to abstract speculation rather than practical guidance. He rejected what he saw to be the intellectualization of personal realization, and identified the mind with li (xin ji li or mind is pattern or principle). This means that the dispositions to judge properly the appropriate action in various situations constitute the mind's original pure state. Li is not to be sought as a pattern residing in an independently existing external world but embodied in judgments of the mind (this seems to commit Wang to an identification of the world with the experienced world and to a denial of a mind-independent world). Wang's version of the Mencian theme that human nature is good is therefore a more radically innatist version than Zhu Xi's (see Ivanhoe, 1990, for a comparison of Mencius and Wang Yang Ming). Original goodness does not need completion through learning about the external world. Then why aren't all people fully good? Why are some very bad? Wang's answer is that selfish desires cloud the sun of the complete and perfect moral mind, and that the task of human beings is to eliminate selfish desires and recover that mind (Chan, 1963, sections 21, 62).

One of Wang's better-known themes is the unity of knowledge and action. There can be no gap between knowing what to do and doing it. Genuine knowledge is necessarily practical. Selfish desires and emotions get in the way of achieving genuine knowledge. One way of understanding this identification is to take knowledge as a knowing how to act that is expressed in acting. One expresses one's knowing how to ride a bicycle by riding, not by articulating propositions about how to ride a bicycle that one might not be able to act upon. Furthermore, knowledge is particularist and context-sensitive in nature and is expressed in intuitive reactions to the present moment. Knowing how to ride a bicycle is continually reacting by shifting one's body first this way and then that way to the changing center of gravity of one's body in tandem with the bicycle. The moral life, on Wang's view, is like that rather than applying a static set of generalizations one learns before encountering the situations in which one needs to act. Notice also that the kinesthetic sensations blend seamlessly with the bodily responses to those sensations that help one to go forward and keep one's balance on a bicycle. In genuine moral knowledge, perception of the situation at hand blends seamlessly with the right response to it.

3. Mohist Ethics

Mozi, as indicated earlier, advocated the doctrine of impartial concern. The Mozi text does not make clear what this doctrine amounts to in practice. Mozi criticizes partial-minded people who do nothing positive for others if these others are not related to them in the right way. Does this mean that to have impartial concern is to have equal concern for others no matter what one's relationship to them? Mozi's opposition to Confucianism might be taken to imply a positive answer to this question. However, some of Mozi's argumentation also presupposes that it is one's duty to see that the needs of one's family are provided for. He discusses filial piety as a virtue. This might suggest that one has special responsibility for one's family and parents.

One way to reconcile these comments is to distinguish the requirement that one have equal concern from the requirement that one treat others equally. We might reasonably attribute the former to Mozi but not the latter, so as to leave open the permissibility of individual agents treating people unequally (this seems to have been the position adopted by later Mohists in the so-called Mohist Canons; see Fraser, 2007). This might be permissible if agents are acting within a system of practices that can be justified as a whole on the basis of equal concern for all people. For example, suppose we have a system in which families have the resources to satisfy the needs of their own members, or, if families or individuals lack such resources on their own, they are given aid from some common pool of resources. Chapter 19 makes explicit reference to the need to provide for those without family to care for them. This arrangement might seem morally acceptable from the standpoint of equal concern for each person and at the same time allow for individual agents to make extra efforts on behalf of their own family members. Thus construed, Mozi's ethics is a kind of consequentialism that measures rightness in terms of consequences, where each person's welfare is to be considered equally, and where what is judged to be right might be a practice as well as particular actions.

Because Confucian care with distinctions requires the extension of care to non-kin, and because a reasonable interpretation or reconstruction of Mozi's impartial concern would allow special treatment of one's kin, there is not as dramatic a difference as one might first think between Confucian and Mohist ethics on the practical level. However, there might indeed be significant differences when loyalty to kin and commitment to public justice come into conflict, and certainly differences on the value of ritual performance (though many Confucians might be unhappy with the Mohist portrayal of their tradition as insisting on extravagantly expensive ritual with musical accompaniment). One source of that difference lies in the plurality of sources of duty in Confucianism, in contrast to monistic Mohist consequentialism, where value comes down to the promotion of benefit and avoidance of harm, where benefit and harm are specified in fairly narrow ways. By contrast, consider the kind of reasons given in the Analects for filial actions. One reason is the duty to reciprocate great benefits. This reason emerges in Analects 8.3, in which Zengzi is portrayed as near death. He bids his students to look at his hands and feet, and quotes lines from the Book of Odes to convey the idea that all his life he has been keeping his body intact as part of his duty to his parents. In 17.21, Confucius defends the traditional three-year mourning period for the death of parents, implying that a period shorter than three years is inappropriate given that a child is completely dependent on his parents for three years. For the Confucians, special relationships create special duties that necessarily differ in their source from duties to strangers outside the family and outside one's state.

The Mozi is quite explicit in its consequentialism. Chapter 35 names three fa or standards for judging the viability of beliefs and theories. One standard is of usefulness. In applying this standard, one assesses the viability of a belief or theory according to the beneficial or harmful consequences of acting on it. Another standard is that of consulting the origin, which is the historical record on the actions of the sage-kings. One determines whether the belief or theory being judged accords with those actions. The third standard is looking at evidence provided by the eyes and ears of the people. This seems to refer to observations that garner some degree of intersubjective consensus. Each standard is presented as if its validity might be independent from the others, but there are indications that the standard of usefulness is the most basic one. For one thing, consulting the record of the sage-kings' actions hardly seems to be a good idea in Mohist terms given the Mohist objection to valuing tradition for its own sake, unless these actions are good guides because they produced good results, a historical judgment that was commonly accepted by otherwise disputing philosophical schools. Furthermore, arguments given in the Mozi that are purportedly based on intersubjective observation seem extremely dubious, e.g., that ghosts exist because stories are told about them very often. At one point in chapter 31, in fact, the possibility that ghosts do not exist is explicitly admitted, but sacrifices to spirits are justified on the grounds that they produce good effects among the living. Ghosts in general are put to good use in the text: their primary activity is to avenge themselves upon the living persons who have done them wrong. The standard of usefulness guides application of the other standards. Even the attempted justification of the standard of usefulness by reference to the will of tian or Heaven (in chapter 26) has a suspect circularity to it. We are to promote benefits and avoid harms because that is the will of Heaven, and Heaven's will is to be relied upon because it is the wisest and noblest of all agents. But what could be the criterion for a being's being wise and noble exception the promotion of benefits and avoidance of harms? Furthermore, the will of Heaven is demonstrated by the fact that wrongdoers are punished and the virtuous rewarded. Again, the evidence seems highly selective and is guided by the very standard of usefulness that it is supposedly being justified.

Is Mohist consequentialism comparable to Western utilitarianism? They are alike in that both kinds of ethic stress impartial concern and judgment of what is right in terms of promoting benefit and avoiding harm. Disanalogies are important here also. There is no attempt to make explicit in the Mozi how exactly the consequences of alternative actions or practices are to be compared against each other in deciding what to do. This contrasts with contemporary forms of utilitarianism that explicitly make maximizing the net greatest sum total of good over bad the criterion of right action or practice (but neither Mill nor Bentham were very explicit about this matter either). Another difference is that Mozi's conception of benefit is very concrete and relatively narrow, lacking in any psychological dimension such as happiness. To promote benefits is to relieve poverty, increase the population, and promote stability and order.

For some philosophers, Confucian acceptance of the plural sources of moral duty is the right position, and they will see the Mohist position as implausibly reductive of the complexity of the moral life. However, one burden placed on such a position is to explain how conflicts between these different sources of moral duty can be dealt with, and it is not clear from the Analects how the Confucian junzi makes the right choices in the face of such conflicts. The Mohist position promises a foundational standard for dealing with such conflicts—promoting benefits and avoiding harms, with each person being counted equally. The standard is vague on how benefits and harms are to be aggregated in judging the rightness of actions and practices, and one might well raise questions as to how benefits and harms are ultimately to be distributed across persons, and whether a purely consequentialist distribution really provides morally acceptable results. On the other hand, Mohists may claim that they have at least provided some standard to work with.

Other important questions arose in the debate between the Confucians and the Mohists. Much of the debate that took place had to do with skepticism about the ability of human beings to act on the doctrine of impartial concern. Isn't partiality toward one's own natural and inevitable? One Mohist response (chapter 16) to this question is that there is no particular problem in getting people to act in this way once the facts are brought before them. One such alleged fact is that people respond in kind to the treatment they receive (curiously, reciprocity serves as a norm for Confucians, it serves as a generalization for Mohists). So, if one wishes others to confer benefits on oneself, one confers benefits on them. If one wishes good for one's family, one will confer benefits on other families so that they will confer benefits on one's own family. Another Mohist response is that the sage kings practiced impartial concern, so it must be possible. Still another response is that rulers can motivate their subjects to do even very difficult things. The Mohist theme that no transformation of human character is needed to act on the right values stands in striking contrast to the Confucian theme that intellectual and emotional self-transformation of character is required to follow the dao.

It may appear that the Mohist arguments for acting on impartial concern are rather superficial and invite quick refutation, but Confucians could also be accused of glossing over the difficulties of getting people to have concern for all (if not equal and impartial concern). As Analects 1.2 has it, the achievement of proper relationships within the family is the basis of the achievement of proper relationships to those outside the family, but this is not only to neglect the possibility that it is much easier to develop concern for those with whom one is interdependent but also to neglect conflicts of the sort illustrated by the story of Shun's father murdering a man. In circumstances where concern for family regularly comes into tension with concern for those outside the family it may be very difficult indeed for filial concern to develop into concern for all.

4. Daoist Ethics

4.1 Ethical perspectives drawn from the Daodejing: the “soft” style of action and social primitivism

In the Daodejing (the text is associated with Laozi and is thought to have originated sometime in the period of 6th-3rd century B.C.E.) and Zhuangzi (a text associated with the historical Zhuangzi who lived in the 4th century B.C.E.) the focus shifts from the human social world to the cosmos, in which that human world often appears to be tiny and insignificant or even comically and absurdly self-important. It may seem that such a distanced and detached perspective has no ethical content or implications, but that is to assume an overly narrow vision of the ethical. In its own way, Daoism addresses as much as Confucianism does questions as to how one ought to live one's life. Daoist ethics emphasizes appropriate responsiveness to the broader world that shapes and enfolds the human social world.

The nature of the vision of the broader world is open to dispute. A traditional interpretation of the Daodejing is that it conveys a metaphysical vision of the dao as the source of all things, and that this source is specially associated in nonbeing and emptiness as contrasted with being, perhaps suggesting that the dao is an indeterminate ontological ground in which the myriad individual things are incipient. Some contemporary commentators hold that the traditional interpretation is an imposition on the text of later metaphysical concerns (Hansen, 1992; LaFargue, 1992). Others hew closer to the traditional interpretation, citing passages such as those in chapter 4, where Dao is described as being empty, as seeming something like the ancestor of the myriad of things, as appearing to precede the Lord (di).

However that issue is resolved, it is apparent that a certain conception of the patterns of nature is embedded in the text and informs its ethical recommendations. Consider the characterizations of natural processes as falling into one or another of opposites: there is the active, aggressive, hard, and the male, on the one hand; and there is the passive, yielding, soft, and female, on the other hand (later these forces were much more explicitly associated with yang and yin). Conventional “knowledge” and “wisdom” dichotomizes processes into one or another of these categories and values the first over the second. The Daodejing extols the efficacy of the second. Whereas the first is associated with strength, the second, it is often said, possesses a deeper, underlying strength as demonstrated by water overcoming the hard and unyielding (chapter 78). Hence a “soft” style of action, wu wei (literally, “nonaction” but less misleadingly translated as effortless action) is recommended, even as a style of ruling. For example, chapter 66 says that one who desires to rule must in his words humble himself before the people, and that one who desires to lead the people must in his person follow them. Chapter 75 says that rulers eat up too much in taxes and therefore people are hungry. Rulers are too fond of action and therefore the people are difficult to govern. Setting too much store on life makes people treat death lightly. The last point brings out the related theme that striving after something often produces the opposite of the intended result. One of the more prominent themes in the Daodejing is the rejection of moralism: a preoccupation with and striving to become good or virtuous. Chapter 19 says to exterminate ren and discard yi (righteousness or rectitude), and the people will recover filial love.

One crucial ambiguity of the text is whether the “soft” wu wei style of action is meant consistently to be extolled over the “hard” style (as Lau claims in his introduction to his translation of the Daodejing, 1963), or whether the reversal of valuation is merely a heuristic device meant to correct a common human tendency to err in the direction of consistently valuing the hard style (LaFargue, 1992). The second alternative is consistent with a theme plausibly attributed to the text: that all dichotomies and all valuations based on them are unreliable in the end, even evaluations that are reversals of the conventionally accepted ones. Prescriptions to follow the “soft” style, taken as exceptionless generalizations, are no more reliable than the conventional wisdom to follow the “hard” style. On the other hand, many of the prescriptions in the Daodejing seem premised on the conception of there being genuine human needs that are simple and few in number, and that desires going beyond these needs are the source of trouble and conflict. Prescriptions for the ruler seem to be aimed at bringing about a reversion to a kind of primitivist state of society where no “improvements” are sought or desired. Carried to its logical limit, this primitivism implies the existence of a natural goodness with which human beings ought to become attuned. Indeed, the first of the three treasures of chapter 67 is ci or compassion. The ethics of the Daodejing is in these respects less radical and iconoclastic than some of its anti-moralistic language might suggest. If we are not to strive after goodness, it is there nevertheless as something that we must recover.

4.2 Ethical perspectives from Zhuangzi: skeptical questioning, attunement to the grain of things, inclusion and acceptance

On this point the Zhuangzi often sounds a much more skeptical note. In the second (“Equalizing All Things”) chapter of that text, the following questions go unanswered: “How do I know that to take pleasure in life is not a delusion? How do I know that we who hate death are not exiles since childhood who have forgotten the way home?” (translation from Graham, 1989, 59). The human pretension to know what is true and important is lampooned by comparing it to the pretension of the cicada and turtle dove to know by their own experiences of flight the possibilities of how high creatures can fly. There is no vision of a primitivist utopia here either. Rather, the dominant attitude towards the possibility of large-scale social change for the better is pessimism. It is a dangerous task for the idealist to undertake, and one that will probably end badly for the idealist because rulers don't like to be lectured on their failings.

Yet if there is no natural goodness that makes possible a social utopia, there still appears to be a grain of things to which human beings can become attuned. A pessimistic Confucius tells his idealistic student Yan Hui that he will probably get himself killed in trying to change the ways of a callous and violent ruler, but Confucius goes on to say that if he insists on trying, Yan Hui must refrain from formulating plans and goals. Such preconceptions will only interfere with seeing the ruler as he is and how he must be dealt with (there is a grain, then, unique to each human being to which one must become attuned to deal with him or her). So Yan Hui must prepare not with plans but by fasting and emptying his mind. Elsewhere in the text, there are happier references to activities that involve attunement to the grain of whatever is at hand. These forms of activity are presented as supremely satisfying. The most prominent example is that of Cook Ding, the cook who is able to wield his knife so skillfully in cutting up oxen that it flows without a nick through the spaces within the joints. Cook Ding has gotten past the stage where he sees with his eyes while cutting the ox; instead his qi or vital energies move freely to where they must go. The kind of phenomenology to which the Zhuangzi refers is one in which there is no self-conscious guiding of one's actions but rather a complete absorption with the matter of hand. The efficacy and effortlessness of such activities might appear to suggest privileged veridical access to the situation and material at hand.

Complete absorption in the matter at hand seems to involve the ability to keep one's desires from interfering with one's attention. The Daodejing contains epigrams about the desirability of being desireless, but chapter 1 of the Zhuangzi includes an entertaining story that conveys this lesson. Huizi tries to figure out what to do with the shells of some huge gourds he had grown. He tried using them as water dippers and water containers, but they are too large and heavy for those purposes. Not being able to discover a purpose for them, he smashes them to pieces. Zhuangzi chides his friend for having underbrush in his head and not realizing that he could have lashed the gourds together to make a raft for floating about on the lakes and the rivers. A recurrent theme throughout the first chapter is that we are ruled by our preconceptions of the uses of things, which keeps us from being able to recognize the usefulness of the “useless.” When performing skill activities such as Cook Ding's, preoccupation with the “uses” of these activities can interfere with our ability to perform them well. Woodcarver Qing (chapter 19 of the Zhuangzi) makes marvelous bellstands. When he goes to make one, he fasts in order to still his mind. As he fasts, the distracting thoughts of congratulation and reward melt away, honors and salary, blame and praise, skill and clumsiness, even his awareness of having a body and limbs. Only when he is able to focus does he go into the forest to observe the nature of the wood, and only then does he have a complete vision of the bellstand.

Interpretations of the Zhuangzi tend to give primacy either to the skeptical passages or to the passages suggesting special access to the grain of things. On the first option, Zhuangzi simply appreciates the many perspectives on the world one could have, the many ways of dividing the world up by sets of distinctions, none of which can be shown in a non-question-begging manner to be superior to the others (Hansen, 1992, 2003). On the second option, Zhuangzi is often taken to hold in a kind of ineffable and nonconceptual access to the world, an access that makes possible the efficacy of activities such as Cook Ding's (Ivanhoe, 1996; Roth 1999, 2000). A third possibility is that the text demonstrates a kind of continuing dialectic between skepticism and the conviction that one has genuine knowledge, and that the dialectic has no envisioned end. The dialectic includes a stage of skeptical questioning of whatever one's current beliefs are, but the aim is not merely to undermine but to reveal something about the way the world that is occluded by one's current beliefs. However, one is not allowed to rest content with the new beliefs but is led to question their comprehensiveness and adequacy precisely because they are suspected of occluding still something else about the world (Wong, 2005).

However one might try to reconcile the tension between the skeptical questioning and the claims to special knowledge, the stories about skill activities such as Cook Ding's arguably exemplify certain kinds of activities that human beings across cultures and historical periods have experienced to their great satisfaction. These activities involve the mastery of the many sub-activities that constitute a complex activity with goals that challenge abilities of the agent. The activities of master musicians (e.g., the technique of fingering on a flute), artistic performers (e.g., the placement of the toes in the pirouette of a dancer) and athletes (e.g., bringing the bat through the optimal plane while swinging it to hit a baseball) correspond rather closely to Cook Ding's mastery of the sub-activities of cutting through the ox. In all these activities the agent does not need to pay conscious attention to performance of the sub-activities, and this enables attention to be focused on matters that escape the apprentice. Just as Cook Ding's skill in the motor execution of the motions of cutting allows him to fully focus on where the joints and spaces are, the flutist is able to concentrate on the music as she is making it and not her fingering technique (see Csikszentmihalyi, 1990 for a study of such activities).

One interesting and realistic detail in the cook's story challenges the reading of the skill stories as extolling the possibility of nonconceptual access to the grain of things. The cook says that whenever he comes to a complicated place in the ox, he sizes up the difficulties, tell himself to watch out and be careful, keeps his eyes on what he's doing, works very slowly, and moves the knife with the greatest subtlety until the pieces fall away. Clearly there is conceptualization going on here, and in fact it is implausible to deny that the whole activity is being guided by a conceptualized goal! There is a difference between self-conscious conceptualization of experience and the application of concepts without awareness of applying them. One mustn't confuse the latter with nonconceptualized experience. While there may be some way of squaring this part of the story with the interpretation that nonconceptual experience is celebrated in the Zhuangzi, the virtue of the story is that it is realistic and captures aspects of supremely skilled activities that are part of the experience of many people. Insofar as the Zhuangzi recommends such activities as part of a good life, it very much presents an ethic.

It also presents an ethic in supporting the idea of inclusiveness and acceptance. Here skeptical questioning of what we think we know, especially what we think we know about people and who is good and has something to offer to us are questioned in the chapter featuring stigmatized individuals, often with feet amputated (a common criminal punishment of the time), who turn out to be masters drawing as many students as Confucius. The Zhuangzi also urges identification and acceptance of the whole and of any and all of the changes that its creatures undergo. We should not be so sure that life is great and death is evil, and accept everything that comes our way, marveling at the possibility that upon our death we might be made into a fly's foreleg the next time around. The Zhuangzi, like the Daodejing, calls upon human beings to identify with the whole of the cosmos and its transformations, and such identification involves acceptance, even celebration of death and loss, because in dying one participates in the next transformation of the cosmos and becomes something else to marvel at, such as a fly's foreleg. Such a call may hold deep appeal, especially for those who cannot see any form of monotheism as a viable object for belief and yet desire some sort of spiritual connection that stretches beyond the merely human community.

However, such a call also raises challenging questions about human possibility. Can human beings really accept the loss of their selves and their loved ones with the kind of equanimity that identification with the whole requires? The Zhuangzi presents stories that represent different possibilities for conceiving of the nature of this equanimity. In the stories of the four masters, death is accepted without the slightest shiver. In the story of the death of Zhuangzi's wife, a more complex emotional story is told, whereby Zhuangzi first feels her loss but comes to accept it as yet another transformation. This story suggests that one may retain one's attachments to particular people and yet maintain resilience in the face of their loss because of one's identification with the whole (see Becker, 1998 for an discussion of resilience in the face of loss in the context of developing a contemporary Stoicism). But how is such identification psychologically possible? In the Zhuangzi, it seems based on a spirit of restless and joyful exploration of the richness of the cosmos. In the end, it embodies the emotion that is perhaps most fundamental to philosophy, and that is wonder.

There is one more ethical implication of Daoism ethics that is more of an implication that could be drawn by contemporary philosophers than one that was drawn in the foundational texts. The Zhuangzi's lampooning of human pretension and arrogance, together with call to identify with the whole and with the nonhuman parts of nature, has appealed to those seeking philosophical perspectives within which to frame an environmental ethic (see Girardot, Miller, and Liu, 2001). A Daoist perspective offers both an alternative to an instrumentalist approach that would ground an environmental ethic solely in the idea that it defeats human beings' interests to foul their own environment and to an intrinsic value approach that would ground duties to nature solely in a value that it possesses apart from its relation to human beings. A Daoist approach might point to the way that the human traits are conditioned by and responses to the nonhuman environment, such that these traits cannot be specified independently of the environment. In other words the Daoist self is not a substantial independent existence but a relational one whose boundaries extend into the conventionally nonhuman, and from a Daoist perspective that is reconstructed to be oriented toward the problem of the environment, we would do well to acknowledge the ways in which whatever we value in ourselves is connected to the nonhuman (Hourdequin and Wong, 2005). Treating the environment correctly is not purely a matter of satisfying conventional human interests such as conserving resources for our future consumption, nor need it be a matter of recognizing a value that the environment has in complete independence of its impact on us. It can be a matter of recognizing that who we are cannot be cleanly separated from the nonhuman environment. Moreover, there is much to be gained from being open to the transformation of our interests if we remain open to new sources of satisfaction in the nonhuman environment that currently escape our conceptions of the “useful” (recall Huizi and the gourds).

5. Legalism

Legalism is perhaps best introduced as the opposite reaction to Analects 2.3, in which Confucius says that guiding the people by edicts and keeping them in line with punishments will keep them out of trouble but will give them no sense of shame; guiding them by virtue and keeping them in line with the rites will not only give them a sense of shame but enable them to reform themselves. In the most prominent Legalist text, the Hanfeizi (Hanfei lived during the 3rd century B.C.E.), the people are characterized as far too swayed by their material interests to be guided by a sense of shame. People must be guided by clear edicts and strong punishments. Furthermore, rulers must be wary of their ambitious ministers and take care not to reveal their own likes and dislikes so as not to be manipulated by their scheming subordinates. As to rulers themselves, it is a mistake to found government on the presumption that they are or can become virtuous. While exceptionally good and exceptionally evil rulers have existed, the vast majority of rulers have been mediocre. Governments must be structured so that it can run satisfactorily, because that is what rulers will be like almost always.

The Confucians held that the remedy to China's turmoil and chaos lay in wise and morally excellent rulers—that moral excellence would ripple downwards from the top and create harmony and prosperity. The Daodejing upholds a vision of an original harmony that human beings once had, a way that consisted in living in accord with the natural grain of things, and that involves seeking only what one truly needs, not in multiplying useless desires that only agitate and ultimately make us unhappy. The Legalists rejected moral and spiritual transformation, of either the Confucian or Laoist kind, as the solution to China's troubles. Most human beings will remain unlovely beings to the end, and governmental structures must be designed for such beings. The sort of structure recommended is a highly centralized government in which the ruler retains firm control of the “two handles” of government: punishment and favor (chapter 7). By making sure he always has his own hands on these handles, the ruler remains in firm control of his ministers. If a minister proposes a way to get something done, measure his performance on whether he gets it done in the way he says he will. If not, punish him. The ruler is to hold his officials strictly to the definitions of their role responsibilities, so that they are punished not only when they fail to perform some of those assigned responsibilities but also when they do more than their assigned responsibilities.

Some of the most interesting parts of the text consist of arguments supporting the necessity of governmental structure and the folly of depending on the character of rulers. The “Five Vermin” chapter (49) presents an important and provocative argument that threatens to undermine the basis of virtue ethics. It is argued there that social harmony and prosperity is an achievement requiring fortuitous circumstances. The chapter does not dispute an assumption that is commonly held across Chinese philosophical schools—that the sage-kings of ancient times were virtuous and ruled over a harmonious and prosperous society. It is disputed, however, that their virtue was the primary cause of this golden age. What about those kings in more recent times who were ren and yi, benevolent and righteous, and who got wiped out for their trouble? Virtue is not the explanation of success or failure. The explanation has much more to do with the scarcity of goods in relation to the number of people. This argument has in fact been repeated in contemporary analytic moral philosophy by philosophers drawing from “situationist” psychology, which highlights the importance of situations rather than “global” character traits in causing behavior. Global traits involve dispositions to behave in certain ways regardless of the situation or at least across a wide range of situations. One of the most striking experiments marshaled in favor of situationism was conducted in a theological seminary, where students were set up to encounter a person slumped in an alleyway. The experiment was to see what factors influenced a student's decision whether to stop and offer aid. It was found that by far the most influential variable was whether students were in a hurry for the next appointment, rather than the nature of students' commitments to religion or the nature of the tasks in which they were engaged at the time, even if the task was preparing a sermon on the Good Samaritan (Darley and Batson, 1973)! Philosophers Gilbert Harman (1998–99, 1999–2000) and John Doris (2000) have used studies like this to argue that global character traits are a myth and that the type of situation has much more to do with how people behave than any supposed character or personality they possess. Hanfeizi, then was the first situationist. The way that Hanfeizi's situationism threatens Confucian virtue ethics is that it disputes the possibility of the junzi, noblepersons who possess firm and stable excellent characters.

Confucians can give replies to such arguments. The most obvious reply is that they never promised virtue would be easy. Indeed, the canonical texts all stress the difficulty of achieving full virtue. Mencius in particular conceives of moral development as extending the natural beginnings of virtue to situations where they ought to extend but do not currently extend. The experiments in psychology marshaled in favor of situationism, moreover, typically do point to a minority of subjects who show a more desirable consistency of behavior in the experimental situation. Confucians might also object that good results will follow from the kind of structure described in the Hanfeizi only if persons of good-enough character staff it. The Hanfeizi sometimes implicitly acknowledges this point and integrates it with a reasonable stress on structure and impersonal administration. In chapter 6 there is discussion of what is necessary to compensate for a mediocre ruler: getting able people with the right motives to serve that ruler. Institute laws and regulations specifying how these people are selected: not on the basis of reputation alone, since that will give people an incentive to curry favor with their associates and subordinates and disregard the ruler; not on the basis of cliques, since that will motivate people only to establish connections rather than acquire the qualifications to perform in office. Specify the qualifications clearly in laws and regulations, appoint, promote, and dismiss strictly according to these specifications. The law, not the ruler's personal views, must form the basis for these actions. In chapter 43, consideration is given to the suggestion that those who take heads in battle should be rewarded with desirable offices. This is rejected in cases where the office requires wisdom and ability rather than courage. In the end, one wonders whether a good number of such persons of right motive, competence, courage, wisdom and ability are enough, given the highly centralized nature of the government recommended in the Hanfeizi. A lot depends on the ruler who wields the “two handles” of government. Taken in moderate doses, Hanfeizi arguably provides a needed corrective to the Confucian emphasis on character. Structure can be designed with an eye to the realistic possibilities for mediocre and bad rulers. The Confucian emphasis on discretion in judgment is obviously subject to abuse that can be checked by structures that provide a degree of impersonal administration and consistent application of relatively clear laws and regulations. The American legal experience seems to show, however, that no set of laws can interpret itself with an eye to complex situations that are unforeseeable when laws are framed. Ultimately, stable character and wise discretion are needed.

The strongest challenge that Legalism raises to virtue ethics is not that stable virtues are impossible to achieve, but that they are not realistic possibilities for most persons, and that therefore lofty virtue ideals cannot provide the basis for a large-scale social ethic. Even if these ideals are directed only at an elite that is then expected to lead the rest of the people, the question arises as to what influence this elite can have on the rest if the majority do not have some attraction to virtue. It is dubious, however, that the solution lies in seeking to make character irrelevant.

6. Chinese Buddhist Ethics

Buddhism is not indigenous to China, and it has a long and rich tradition of thought and practice in India and in areas other than China. This brief section will focus on ethical aspects of the most distinctive form of Buddhism that developed once it was introduced to China: Chan Buddhism, or as it came to be known later in Japan, Zen. It should be noted, however, that prominent forms of Chinese Buddhism also include Tiantai and Huayan. All three forms of Chinese Buddhism developed in interaction with indigenous Chinese thought, especially Daoism. Chan developed partly as a response to the perception of some Chinese Buddhists that Tiantai and Huayan had developed in overly scholastic directions with proliferating metaphysical distinctions and doctrines that hinder rather than aid Enlightenment.

The immediate focus of Buddhist ethics is the problem of suffering, and a conception of the self is at the heart of the Buddhist response to that problem. The self is conceived as a floating collection of various psychophysical reactions and responses with no fixed center or unchanging ego entity. The usual human conception of self as a fixed and unchanging center is a delusion. Our bodily attributes, various feelings, perceptions, ideas, wishes, dreams, and in general a consciousness of the world display a constant interplay and interconnection that leads us to the belief that there is some definite ‘I’ that underlies and is independent of the ever-shifting series. But there is only the interacting and interconnected series. Human suffering ultimately stems from a concern for the existence and pleasures and pains of the kind of self that never existed in the first place. Recognition of the impermanence of the self can lead to release or mitigation of suffering, but the recognition cannot merely be intellectual. It must involve transformation of one's desires. The belief on some abstract level, for example, that there are no permanent selves is a belief that can co-exist with having and acting on intense desires to avoid death, as if death were some evil befalling some underlying ‘I’. Similarly, the intellectual recognition that none of the “things” of ordinary life are fixed and separate entities, anymore than the self is, can lead to recognition of all of life as an interdependent whole and to the practical attitude of compassion for all of life. But if the latter recognition is again merely intellectual, one can still have and act on intensely self-regarding desires at severe cost to others. In both cases a transformation of desire is what is required in order to go beyond the merely intellectual and to achieve true Enlightenment and meaningful recognition of one's true nature as impermanent and as interdependent with all other things.

Recall the practical focus and the closeness to pre-theoretical experience that are distinctive of indigenous Chinese philosophy. These traits interacted with Buddhism as it was introduced into China. The ‘Chan’ in “Chan Buddhism” comes from the Sanskrit ‘dhyana’ which means meditation. Though meditation practice is not the only practice employed in Chan, its central role does illustrate the focus on achieving transformation of one's desires through experience of the self and the world. This kind of transformation is different than reaching intellectual conviction through textual study and understanding of argumentation, and also different than escape from the world of suffering through obliteration of one's consciousness as an individual being. Chinese Buddhism in the form of Chan was especially influential in putting forward this conception of Enlightenment as lived in this world rather than escape from it.

Daoism in particular has themes that make it especially appropriate for interaction with Buddhism. Recall the theme that one must keep desires from interfering with one's attention to the matter at hand. Correspondingly, a major theme in Chan is that all forms of striving, especially the very striving for Enlightenment, interfere with attention to one's true nature (Hui Neng, 638–713, Platform Scripture). Hence the reason for the otherwise puzzlingly harsh reactions of Chan masters to the earnest strivings of their students to reach Enlightenment (Yi Xuan, d. 866, The Recorded Conversations of Linji Yi Xuan) especially if such strivings have any tinge of the academic or doctrinal about them (Huang Po, d. 850, The Transmission of Mind). Recall also the theme in Daodejing concerning the dao as the source of the myriad things. The Buddha's insight into the nature of the many things brought him to recognize the Many as also the One. Finally, recall the skeptical theme in Daoism about the limits of conceptualization. The Buddha's insight into the Many as also the One does not mean that the Many are really only One, but rather Many and Once at once, and if we have difficulty making sense of that, it is founded in the limits of our conceptualization. Finally, there is the same possibility for ambiguity as to whether there is some ineffable and nonconceptual access to an ultimate reality or whether there is skeptical question that goes all the way down (or all the way up?). In the Zhuangzi this ambiguity is quite apparent. And though Chan is usually taken to affirm a foundation in ineffable access (Kasulis, 1986), there are those who argue that a thoroughgoing skepticism is truer to its spirit (Wright, 1998).

Since the self is a bundle of changing psychological and physical attributes whose boundaries are conventionally established, and since its attributes exist only in relation to other things outside its conventionally established boundaries, it ought to dampen attachment its self-regarding cares and concerns and widen the boundaries of its concerns to embrace all life. This Buddhist reasoning certainly is an interesting way to ground impersonal concern, and it may appeal to those of us who see little plausibility in the idea of Cartesian substances as fixed ego entities. On the other hand, this reasoning may seem to drain all passion from life, and it requires that we dampen the attachment we have not only to our selves but also to particular others such as friends and family members. Buddhism is especially well known for its advocacy of detachment, not only from material possessions, worldly power and status, but also from particular people and communities. For example, in Ashvaghosha's poem on “Nanda the Fair,” the Buddha explains to Nanda that delusion alone ties one person to another (Conze, 1959, 110). The argument is that a family is like a group of travelers at an inn who come together for a while and then part. No one belongs to anyone else. A family is held together only as sand is held in a clenched fist. Issues as to the desirability and realistic possibility of such a detached attitude arise here, and not surprisingly, the issues are similar to ones raised by Daoist identification with the cosmos. As the discussion of Zhuangzi and wife made clear, it may be possible to distinguish as an alternative to the pure and complete detachment exemplified in Ashvagosha another kind that is consistent with emotional involvement with others for as long as they are given to us.


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comparative philosophy: Chinese and Western | Confucius | Laozi | Mencius | Mohism | Mohist Canons | Taoism | Xunzi | Zhuangzi