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Nicole Oresme

First published Thu Jul 23, 2009; substantive revision Thu Sep 10, 2009

Without a doubt Oresme is one of the most eminent scholastic philosophers, famous for his original ideas, his independent thinking and his critique of several Aristotelian tenets. His work provided some basis for the development of modern mathematics and science. Furthermore he is generally considered the greatest medieval economist. By translating, at the behest of King Charles V of France, Aristotle's Ethics, Politics, and On the Heavens, as well as the pseudo-Aristotelian Economics, from Latin into French, he exerted a considerable influence on the development of French prose, particularly its scientific and philosophical vocabulary.

1. Life

Nicole Oresme was born around 1320 in the diocese of Bayeux in Normandy, possibly in the village of Allemagne (now Fleury-sur-Orne) on the outskirts of the Norman city of Caen (Burton 2007, 6). By 1341/42 he had obtained his master of arts at the University of Paris and was probably teaching philosophy there (Courtenay 2000, 544; Burton 2007, 7). In 1348 his name appears on a list of graduate scholarship holders in theology at the College of Navarre at the University of Paris. Oresme became Grand Master of the College in 1356, so he must have completed his doctorate in theology before this date. Oresme held this position till 1362 and was teaching master in the faculty of theology during that time (Burton 2007, 10).

From 1362, when he left the university, until his death in 1382, Oresme served Charles, the dauphin of France, who was regent during his father's captivity (1356–1364) and was crowned King Charles V on his father's death (1364) (Burton 2007, 10). Oresme was appointed canon (1362) and later dean (1364) of the Cathedral of Rouen and also canon at Sainte-Chapelle in Paris (1363) (Clagett 1974, 223). Oresme was elected bishop of Lisieux in 1377 and was consecrated in 1378. He died on July 11, 1382.

2. Teachings

2.1 Ontological Status of Accidents

One of the most interesting features in Oresme's Commentary on Aristotle's Physics is his view on the ontological status of accidents. Characteristic of Oresme's view on accidents is that he does not consider them accidental forms, but only so-called condiciones or modi (se habendi) of the substance. But this does not mean that Oresme identifies accidents with the substance in the way that Ockham had identified the quantity of a substance with the substance itself. Rather, Oresme regards accidents as distinct from the substance, but he assigns them a lower ontological status than the commonly accepted accidental forms. For Oresme motion, being-in-a-place (esse in loco), the quantity of a substance, its esse tantam, and qualities (such as the esse album of a substance) are such condiciones or modi (Celeyrette/Mazet 1998; Caroti 2000; Caroti 2001; Caroti 2004; Mazet 2000; Kirschner 1997, 52–61, 73–76, 121, 141–142; Kirschner, 2000b, pp. 263–272).

To a certain degree Oresme's theory of the ontological status of accidents is reminiscent of Adam Wodeham's (c. 1298–1358) and Gregory of Rimini's (c. 1300–1358) theory of complexly signifiables (complexe significabilia) (Adam de Wodeham 1990, dist. 1, qu. 1, 180–208; Gregory of Rimini 1981, Prologus, qu. 1, artic. 1–3, 1–40; Nuchelmans 1973, 227–242; Biard 2004; Conti 2004; Gaskin 2004). On some occasions Oresme explicitly uses the expression ‘complexe significabile’ in the framework of his ontology of accidents. However, despite these similarities between Oresme's ontology of accidents and the theory of complexly signifiables it seems that this connection is of a secondary nature. For Oresme the determination of the ontological status of accidents is in the foreground, while Adam Wodeham and Gregory of Rimini had quite another aim. They wanted to determine what the object of knowledge is. Their solution that the significatum totale or significatum adaequatum of a conclusion or proposition is the object of knowledge is not confined to conclusions or propositions concerning accidents, such as ‘homo est albus’, whose significatum totale is hominem esse album (which itself is a significabile per complexum). Rather, their solution applies to any kind of conclusion or proposition: for instance, ‘Deus est’ or ‘homo est animal’. Neither Adam Wodeham nor Gregory of Rimini made any attempt to identify accidents with the correspondent complexly signifiables such as ‘hominem esse album’. Oresme does not derive the ontological status of accidents from their being complexly signifiables. Instead, the converse is true: given that Oresme rejects the traditional view that accidents are accidental forms, he must avoid the use of substantives in denominating the ontological status of accidents and thus quasi-automatically arrives at formulations that are characteristic of the theory of complexly signifiables.

2.2 Non-Aristotelian Concepts of Place, and Space

There were only very few authors since late antiquity – that is, since Simplicius (b. c. 500, d. after 533) and his contemporary John Philoponus – who rejected Aristotle's definition of place as the innermost surface of the surrounding body. In his Commentary on Aristotle's Physics Oresme argued for the non-Aristotelian position that the (physical) place of a body is the space filled or occupied by the body (Kirschner 1997, 101, 116–123; Kirschner 2000a, 146–159). Prior to Oresme Geraldus Odonis (c. 1290–1349) held the same view (Bakker/de Boer 2009). Since Odonis's discussion is rather different from Oresme's, it is questionable whether Odonis's arguments exerted a direct influence on Oresme. Another anti-Aristotelian theory on place was propounded by Petrus Aureoli (c. 1280–1322). Aureoli held that, if one looks at place metaphysically, place is the determinate position of the located body in the universe (Schabel 2000, 126–138).

In stating that the place of a body is the space filled or occupied by it Oresme does not merely revive an opinion of Greek antiquity; he can also be regarded, together with philosophers like Gianfrancesco Pico della Mirandola (1469–1533) (Grant 1981, 275–276, n. 63), Francesco Patrizi (1529–1597) (Grant 1981, 201; Schmitt 1967, 143), and Giordano Bruno (1548–1600) (Grant 1981, 186–187; Schmitt 1967, 142–143), as a precursor of Newton (1643–1727) in the theory of place and absolute space. None the less, despite the close resemblance that Oresme's view of place and space bears to Newton's, there are characteristic differences concerning the ontological status of space.

For Oresme space is neither substance nor accident. It is nothing that can be signified by a noun or pronoun, but only by adverbs like ‘here’ and ‘there’. That means that space is not absolutely non-existent, but it has by no means the high ontological status accorded to it by Newton. While for Newton space approaches more nearly to the nature of substance than of accident, for Oresme it ranks on a far lower ontological level than an accident (Kirschner 1997, 103–104; Kirschner 2000a, 163–164).

Another central conclusion that Oresme draws in his Physics Commentary in his discussion of the nature of place is that beyond the world, that is, outside the last sphere, there exists an infinite void space. Oresme's conception of an extracosmic infinite void space is well known from other works by him (Le livre du ciel et du monde, Questiones super De celo) (Kirschner 2000a, 164–168). Besides Oresme there were few medieval philosophers who assumed the existence of an infinite void space beyond the world. The Jewish philosopher Hasdai Crescas (c. 1340–1410/11) (Crescas 1929, 189; Grant 1969, 50, footn. 50; Grant 1981, 271, n. 33, 321, n. 5), Thomas Bradwardine (c. 1290–1349) (Grant 1969, 44–47; Grant 1981, 135–144) and Robert Holkot (d. 1349) (Grant 1981, 350, n. 130) may be mentioned among them.

Oresme also speaks of the immensity which is outside the Heavens and identifies this immensity – by which he undoubtedly means the extracosmic void space – with God himself. This identification of the infinite void space with God is a characteristic feature of Oresme's natural philosophy or theology (Kirschner 1997, 105–106; Kirschner 2000a, 168). According to Wolfson (1929, 123), Crescas did not identify the infinite void outside the world with God's immensity; nor does Bradwardine seem to have held such a view (Maier 1966, 315, footn. 18; Grant 1981, 142). The same applies to Robert Holkot (Grant 1981, 350, n. 130).

2.3 Non-Aristotelian Concept of Time

What has just been said about Oresme's rejection of Aristotelian tenets on the nature of place is also true for his theory of time. Aristotle defines time as the number (that is, the measure) of motion with respect to before and after. Thus he deduces the existence of time from the existence of motion, which means that time is nothing independent of motion. In contrast to Aristotle, Oresme in his Physics Commentary defines time as the successive duration of things (duratio rerum successiva, also duratio successiva rerum or rerum duratio successiva), that is, the duration of the actual existence of things. By deducing his concept of time from the duration of things, which duration is prior to and independent of motion, Oresme clearly deviates from Aristotle's point of view and the conventional manner in which this topic was discussed among medieval scholastics (Kirschner 2000a, 171–176; Zanin 2000, 257–259; Caroti 2001).

Among the few who opposed Aristotle's doctrine of time was Petrus Johannis Olivi (b. c. 1248, d. 1298), who criticized Aristotle for regarding motion, rather than the actual existence of things, as the subject of time (Maier 1955, 110–111). The Franciscan Gerardus Odonis (c. 1290–1349) was also a proponent of the independence of time from motion (Maier 1955, 134–137). Oresme's theory of time foreshadows that of classical physics to a certain degree, but, as is true of place and space, there are certain differences concerning the ontological status of time (Kirschner 2000a, 176–178).

Oresme states that the duration of things without any succession is eternity, which he defines as duratio rerum tota simul. As with the relation between God and extramundane space, Oresme identifies eternity with God himself (Kirschner 2000a, 178–179).

2.4 Cosmology, Astronomy, and Opposition to Astrology

In his Livre du ciel et du monde and in other works (Questiones super De celo, Questiones de spera) Oresme brilliantly argues against any proof of the Aristotelian theory of a stationary Earth and a rotating sphere of the fixed stars. Although Oresme showed the possibility of a daily axial rotation of the Earth, he finished by affirming his belief in a stationary Earth (Clagett 1974, 225). Similarly, Oresme proves the possibility of a plurality of worlds, but ultimately keeps to the Aristotelian tenet of a single cosmos (Clagett 1974, 224–225).

Oresme was a determined opponent of astrology, which he attacked on religious and scientific grounds. In De proportionibus proportionum Oresme first examined raising rational numbers to rational powers before extending his work to include irrational powers. The results of both operations he termed irrational ratios, although he considered the first type commensurable with rational numbers, and the latter not. His motivation for this study was a suggestion of Thomas Bradwardine that the relationship between forces (F), resistances (R), and velocities (V) is exponential (Grant 1966, 24–40; Clagett 1974, 224). In modern terms:

F2/R2 = (F1/R1)(V2/V1)

Oresme then asserted that the ratio of any two celestial motions is probably incommensurable (Grant 1971, 67–77). This excludes precise predictions of successively repeating conjunctions, oppositions, and other astronomical aspects, and he subsequently claimed, in Ad pauca respicientes (its name derives from the opening sentence “Concerning some matters …”), that astrology was thereby refuted (Grant 1966, 83–111). In his Livre de divinacions and his Tractatus contra astronomos Oresme tries to show that astrology is “most dangerous to those of high estate, such as princes and lords to whom appertains the government of the commonwealth” (Coopland 1952, 51). As with astrology, he fought against the widespread belief in occult and “marvelous” phenomena by explaining them in terms of natural causes. Oresme's writings against astrology and magic were due to his concern over the king's and his court's addiction to these practices.

In his De visione stellarum Oresme departs from the standard view of earlier authors in optics such as Ptolemy (2nd century), Ibn al-Haytham (965 – c. 1040), Roger Bacon (c. 1214 – c. 1292), and Witelo (c. 1230/35 – after 1275), who all held that refraction can only occur at the interface of two media of differing densities and thus would not take place in a single medium of uniformly varying density. He states – more than 300 years before Robert Hooke (1635–1703) and Newton – that atmospheric refraction occurs along a curve and proposes to approximate the curved path of a ray of light in a medium of uniformly varying density, in this case the atmosphere, by an infinite series of line segments each representing a single refraction (Burton 2007, 33–64).

2.5 Mathematics

Oresme's main contributions to mathematics are contained in his Questiones super geometriam Euclidis and his Tractatus de configurationibus qualitatum et motuum. In these works Oresme conceived of the idea of using rectangular coordinates (latitudo and longitudo) and the resulting geometric figures (configurationes) to distinguish between uniform and nonuniform distributions of various quantities, such as the change of velocity in relation to time or the distribution of the intensities of a quality in relation to the extension of the subject. In the discussion of motions the base line (longitudo) is the time, while the perpendiculars raised on the base line (latitudines) represent the velocity from instant to instant in the motion. Thus uniform acceleration is represented by a right triangle. Oresme even extended his definition to include three-dimensional figures (Clagett 1974, 226–228). Thus, he helped lay the foundation that later led to the discovery of analytic geometry by René Descartes (1596–1650).

Furthermore, Oresme used his figures to give the first proof of the Merton theorem, discovered at Oxford in the 1330's: the distance traveled in any given period by a body moving under uniform acceleration is the same as if the body moved at a uniform speed equal to its speed at the midpoint of the period (Clagett 1974, 225–226). Some scholars believe that Oresme's graphical representation of velocities was of great influence in the further development of kinematics, affecting in particular the work of Galileo (1564–1642).

Further noteworthy achievements in the field of mathematics are Oresme's geometric proofs of the sums of certain converging series, particularly in his Questiones super geometriam Euclidis and his Tractatus de configurationibus qualitatum et motuum (Clagett 1974, 228).

Oresme's discussion of the infinite in his Physics Commentary is another fascinating testimony to the originality of this outstanding medieval philosopher. Oresme demonstrates by thought experiments that of two actual infinites neither is bigger or smaller than the other. Oresme's proof is somewhat reminiscent of Georg Cantor's (1845–1918) demonstration that certain infinite sets are equinumerous. Thus Oresme shows by the principle of one-to-one correspondence that the collection of odd natural numbers is not smaller than the collection of natural numbers, because it is possible to count the odd natural numbers by the natural numbers (Sesiano 1996; Kirschner 1997, 79–83, 88–92).

Oresme was not the first to use the principle of one-to-one correspondence in discussing the proporties of actual infinites. Bradwardine, whose main aim was to refute Aristotle's opinion that the world is eternal, applied the principle of one-to-one correspondence to show that two infinites would be equal or – in modern terms – that an infinite subset is equal to the set of which it is a part (Bradwardine 1618, 121C–124C). On the other hand Bradwardine takes it for granted that an infinite subset is smaller than the set of which it is a part. Thus he is of the opinion that under the assumption of an eternal world that has no beginning the multitude of all human souls, which until now have been created, must be greater than the multitude of the male or the female souls alone (Bradwardine 1618, 132E–133A). From this contradiction – an infinite subset cannot be both smaller than and equal to the set of which it is a part – Bradwardine draws the inference that the eternity of the world is impossible (Thakkar 2009, 626–629).

Unlike Bradwardine, Oresme shows that of two actual infinites neither is greater or smaller than the other. This result is different from Bradwardine's, because Oresme's result does not necessarily imply equality between actual infinites. Moreover Oresme shows that cases can be conceived in which two infinites can be regarded as unequal, but this unequality is not to be understood in the sense of ‘smaller’ or ‘greater’ (Oresme does not contradict himself), but rather in the sense of ‘different’. Since comparable quantities are either equal to one another or one is smaller or greater than the other, Oresme concludes that actual infinites are incomparable: that is, that notions like ‘smaller’, ‘bigger’, and ‘equal’ do not apply to infinites (Sesiano 1996; Kirschner 1997, 79–83, 88–92).

2.6 Economics

Oresme is generally considered the greatest medieval economist. He presented his economic ideas in commentaries on the Ethics, Politics, and Economics, as well as an earlier treatise, De origine, natura, jure et mutationibus monetarum, the first comprehensive work upon money. In his De origine, natura, jure et mutationibus monetarum, of which he himself made a French translation under the title Traictié de la premiere invention des monnoies, Oresme argued that coinage belongs to the public, not to the prince, who has no right to vary arbitrarily the content or weight. By clearly delineating the destructive effects on a nation's economy of a debasement of the currency, he influenced Charles V's monetary and tax policies.

Oresme also stated that in a society in which two currencies with the same designation but of different value circulate, the money of lower value drives out the money of higher value. This economic law was also discovered independently of Oresme by Nicolaus Copernicus (1473–1543), the famous astronomer, who wrote about a reform of the Prussian coinage, and by Thomas Gresham (1519–1597). Today it is called Gresham's Law, or sometimes the Law of Oresme, Copernicus, and Gresham, but its oldest version can be found in Aristophanes's poem ‘The Frogs’ (Balch 1908).


Primary Literature

Catalogues of works by Oresme

Secondary literature

Other Internet Resources

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Related Entries

Bacon, Roger | Bradwardine, Thomas | Bruno, Giordano | Cantor, Georg | Copernicus, Nicolaus | Crescas, Hasdai | Descartes, René | Galileo Galilei | Gregory of Rimini | Holkot [Holcot], Robert | Ibn al-Haytham | Newton, Isaac | Olivi, Peter John | Patrizi, Francesco | Wodeham, Adam