Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Mon May 4, 2009

Numenius, a Platonist philosopher of the 2nd century CE, had considerable impact on later Platonism, most notably on Plotinus (3rd c.). His work survives only in fragments, either as excerpts or in reports in later sources, mostly Platonists, both Christian and pagan (e.g. Origen, Eusebius, Porphyry, Proclus, Calcidius). Numenius' work is important both historically and philosophically. Its historical significance lies mainly in that it shows how much of Plotinus' philosophy was inspired by earlier Platonists such as Numenius, who was one of the authors read in Plotinus' seminar (Porphyry, Life of Plotinus 14.12). Plotinus' debt to Numenius' philosophy was much debated already by Platonists of Plotinus' generation (ibid. 18.2–3, 17.1–23). This discussion shows that Plotinus was not considered in his own time to have initiated a new and distinct movement in Platonism—what we today call Neoplatonism. He was rather seen as simply continuing and critically developing the philosophy of previous Platonists, Numenius prominent among them, just as they themselves had developed in similar fashion the work of their own Platonist predecessors. Philosophically, Numenius' work is important because he, like Eudorus and Moderatus (1st c. CE), tried to construct a hierarchical system of intelligible principles (archai) of reality, but unlike them he held that intelligible principles are responsible only for the order of the world, wherein its goodness lies, while matter has an existence independent of these principles and accounts for disorder and badness. Numenius' system of three principles of reality, similar to Plotinus' hypostases of One, Intellect and Soul, was constructed on the basis of accounts of the intelligible world and its primacy, and of the soul as a spiritual substance essentially related to that world, in Plato. More specifically, it results from reflection on the Form of the Good in the Republic, the demiurge and the world-soul of the Timaeus, and the One of the Parmenides. The hierarchical order of these principles of reality is determined by the degree of unity and simplicity of each; the highest principle is the simplest and most completely a unity.

1. Life and Work

Very little is known about Numenius' life. The existing evidence associates Numenius with two cities, Apamea in Syria and Rome. Plotinus' student, Amelius, who was an enthusiastic admirer of Numenius (Porphyry, Life of Plotinus 3.44–5), calls him “Apamean” (ibid. 17.18) and himself moved from Rome to Apamea (ibid. 2.32–33). John Lydus (6th c. CE), however, refers to Numenius as “the Roman” (De mensibus ΙV.80, p. 132.11–12 Wünsch). The strong interest that both Amelius and Porphyry take in Numenius makes the evidence in Porphyry's Life of Plotinus quite significant, but the testimony of John Lydus may also hold some truth. One possible way of reconciling the two is that Numenius was born in Apamea but taught both there and in Rome (Dodds 1960, 6–7).

Several indications point to a date around the middle of the 2nd century CE for Numenius' philosophical activity. There is good evidence to suggest that Numenius antedates Atticus, whose floruit is set around 176 (Eusebius, Chronicle, p. 207 Helm): Proclus in his 5th-c. CE Commentary on the Timaeus outlines in chronological order the views of ancient Platonists on the relation of the demiurge (the creator god of the Timaeus myth) to the Forms, presenting first those of Numenius, then of Harpocration and Atticus, then of Plotinus, Amelius, Porphyry and Iamblichus (In Timaeum I.303.27–307.19). The chronological order is disturbed only by the place of Harpocration (a pupil of Atticus) in the list, but this is because the latter follows Numenius rather than Atticus in his interpretation of the way the demiurge relates to the Forms (Proclus, In Timaeum I.304.22–305.16). Furthermore, a number of indications suggest Atticus' own dependence on Numenius. Atticus' work targeting those who profess to teach Plato's philosophy using the writings of Aristotle (Atticus frs. 1–9 Des Places) may well be inspired from Numenius' plea for a purification of Plato's philosophy from alien elements, Aristotelian and Stoic included. Numenius argues for this in his work On the Dissension of the Academics from Plato (Numenius fr. 24–28 Des Places). The resemblance between the relevant works of Atticus and Numenius extends to details: the analogy of Plato's philosophy with the body of Pentheus torn apart by the Bacchai, found in Atticus (fr. 1.19–23 Des Places) goes back to Numenius (fr. 24.71–73), and so does the comparison of the 3rd c. BCE Academic skeptic Arcesilaus' suspension of judgment (epochê) to the cuttle fish spreading ink (Numenius fr. 25.81; Atticus fr. 7.80). Atticus however presents Plato as the one who unifies philosophy by putting together its parts, while he also makes Aristotle, rather than Arcesilaus, resemble the cuttle fish, in order to highlight the former's obscurity and hence dismiss Aristotle's philosophy. Numenius' dating in the middle 2nd century is compatible with two further facts, namely that the first surviving author who mentions him is Clement of Alexandria (ca. 150–215) in his Stromata (I.150.4), and that the latest author that our fragments of Numenius mention is Mnaseas (fr. 25.17), the “methodist” doctor of the 1st c. CE.

We are fortunate to know the titles of some of Numenius' treatises. One was On the Good, which comprised at least 6 books (Eusebius, Preparatio Evangelica XI.18.22). Apparently, this was one of Numenius' most important works. In it Numenius set out to outline his ontology and theology and, more specifically, to investigate the nature of the first principle, which is divine and the source of goodness (hence the title On the Good). Also important must have been Numenius' work On the indestructibility of the soul (Origen, Against Celsus V.57; fr. 29), in at least two books. We know of only one certain fragment of this work, but it is probable that many of the testimonies of later Platonists regarding Numenius' views on the soul reflect claims made in it (Dillon 1977, 364) (see below, Psychology). Quite unclear, however, remains the content of Numenius' treatise On Plato's secret doctrines (Eusebius, Prep. Ev. XIII.4.4; fr. 23). In the sole surviving fragment (fr. 23) Numenius discusses Plato's use of the character Euthyphro in the Euthyphro as representative of Athenian popular religion. Dillon (1977, 364) has speculated that in this work Numenius proposed allegorical interpretations of aspects of Platonic dialogues. This seems plausible since Numenius appears to have indulged in allegorical interpretation of the cultic practices of various nations, taking them to be philosophically significant (fr. 1a; see below, Numenius' Platonism). But given Numenius' attachment to Pythagoreanism (on which see below, Numenius' Platonism) it may also be the case that in this work Numenius presented doctrines that Pythagoreans traditionally ascribed to Pythagoras, such as the immortality of the soul, as Plato's own (see Dillon 1988, 121).

Numenius' best attested work is his treatise On the dissension of the Academics from Plato (frs. 24–28). The Christian writer Eusebius in his Preparatio Evangelica (Preparation for the Gospel) has excerpted five long pieces from it. Eusebius quotes so extensively from this work in order to substantiate his claim that ancient philosophers were in disagreement with each other. He takes that to indicate the inability of pagan Greek philosophical methods and assumptions to enable us to find the truth. In this work Numenius criticizes the departure of the skeptical Academics from what he considers to be Plato's doctrine, namely, the doctrine of first principles of reality that Numenius proposes and finds adumbrated in the 2nd Letter attributed to Plato (fr. 24.51–6). These fragments indicate Numenius' strong concern with the history of Platonism and are quite telling as to the tendencies of Platonism at his time. Numenius' reaction against a skeptical interpretation of Plato may have been triggered by attempts chronologically close to him, such as those by Anonymus in Theaetetum (1st c. CE?), Plutarch, and Favorinus (1st-2nd c. CE), to revive a form of academic skepticism (see Opsomer 1998). Three other works of Numenius, namely Epops, On Numbers, On place (Origen, Against Celsus IV.51; fr. 1c), were consulted by Origen but are only titles to us.

2. Numenius' Platonism

The remains of Numenius' work leave no doubt that he relied primarily on texts of Plato in constructing his own system of principles. Ancient testimonies are, however, divided between those that classify him as a Platonist philosopher (Porphyry, Life of Plot. 14.12, Eusebius, Prep. Ev. XI.21.7) and those that consider him a Pythagorean (Origen, Against Celsus frs. 1–3, 53, Porphyry, Ad Gaurum 34.20–35.2; fr. 36, Calcidius, In Timaeum 297.8 Waszink; fr. 52.2). We should not see any contradiction or even tension in this double classification. Numenius is a Pythagorean Platonist like Moderatus half a century earlier or Eudorus around the turn of the millenium. That is, Numenius accepted Pythagoras and Plato both as the two authorities one should follow in philosophy, but he regarded Plato's authority as subordinate to that of Pythagoras, whom he considered to be the source of all true philosophy—including Plato's own. For Numenius it is just that Plato wrote so many philosophical works, whereas Pythagoras' views were originally passed on only orally.

This view of Numenius is part of a general view about the history of philosophy that we can reconstruct from his fragments. Numenius believes that the truths given to us by philosophy have a status like that claimed for their scriptures by revealed religions: they are the revelation of logos (reason) in which all nations have a share (frs. 1a, 1b), but which only certain inspired geniuses could articulate properly and explain for the first time. Numenius appears to believe that the religious practices of the various nations are philosophically significant, because they contain some lore or “wisdom” that reflects this philosophical truth. This view occurs first in Posidonius (1st c. BCE) (Seneca, Epist. 65) and then appears in variations in several authors of the first two centuries CE. Celsus, for instance, wrote a work entitled True Account, in which he criticizes Christianity for deviating from the fundamental original wisdom that he takes to lie behind the religions of many nations (Origen, Against Celsus 1.14, 16; see Frede 1994, 5193–5198). A similar view is maintained by Plutarch (fr. 157.16–25 Sandbach; cf. his On Isis and Osiris) but also by the 1st c. CE Stoic Cornutus in his Introduction to Greek Theology (see Boys-Stones 2001, 105–114). Numenius maintains that in the Greek tradition the relevation coming from reason was first grasped and articulated in properly philosophical terms by Pythagoras, the source of true philosophy; it then found its way into the philosophy of Plato. Numenius argues that Plato appropriated Pythagoras' doctrine and outlined it in his own work (fr. 24.56–62). He suggests that Plato accessed Pythagorean philosophy directly, presumably through his own acquaintance with Pythagoreans, but also indirectly through Socrates, who, according to Numenius, was also philosophically a Pythagorean and was communicating to his pupils Pythagorean doctrines (fr 24.57–59), most especially the doctrine of the three gods, that is, the One, Intellect, and the creator-demiurge (see below, Metaphysics), which is allegedly outlined in the pseudo-Platonic 2nd Letter (312e). Numenius suggests that Plato was in a position to recognize Socrates' Pythagoreanism because, before meeting him, Plato had already familiarized himself with Pythagorean philosophy (fr. 24.57). On Numenius' view, then, Plato speaks with authority in his many and extensive published works precisely because he communicates Pythagorean doctrines. But to the extent that Plato's philosophy is derivative from the Pythagorean one, the authority of Plato's written work is inferior to that of Pythagoras (frs. 7.5–7, 26.12–22). Numenius appears to claim even that Plato was not faultless. Plato, Numenius suggests, did not present his doctrines sufficiently clearly. This is why Numenius holds Plato partly responsible for the departure of later Platonists (i.e., the Academic skeptics) from Plato's actual Pythagorean philosophy (fr. 24.60–66; Karamanolis 2006, 130–131). Here Numenius seems to refer to Plato's writing of dialogues, which allegedly obscures what the underlying doctrine is. As a result, it fosters confusion about Plato's intellectual debts.

In this, Numenius continues the line of Eudorus and especially Moderatus of Gadeira (1st c. CE), who also considered Plato to be a Pythagorean in his philosophical commitments. But unlike Moderatus (Porphyry, Life of Pythagoras 53) and other Pythagoreans (see e.g. Photius, Bibliotheca cod. 249, 438b14–19) who considered also later philosophers, such as Aristotle, as Pythagoreans, Numenius maintains that nobody after Plato had access to the Pythagorean wisdom. This tension is indicative of a vivid debate among Pythagoreans about the sources on which one can base the reconstruction of Pythagorean philosophy, and this debate in turn is characterestic of a strong revival of the Pythagorean philosophy in the first two centuries CE. This revival can be seen in a series of Pythagorean pseudepigrapha of the same age. These are treatises which pass themselves off as written in ancient times and as communicating Pythagorean lore (see Centrone 1989). It can also be seen in the attempt of Moderatus to present Pythagorean doctrines systematically in his Pythagorean teachings (Pythagorikai scholai; Stephanus of Byzantius s.v. Gadeira, and Porphyry, Life of Pythagoras 48; Karamanolis 2006, 132–134).

The stress on Plato's Pythagoreanism on the part of Pythagoreans revives and extends connections between Plato's metaphysics and Pythagorean ideas noted already by Plato's younger associates. Already Aristotle saw these connections (e.g. Metaphysics A.6, M.3, N.3). That early Academics like Xenocrates show strong interest in Pythagoras' doctrines is presumably because they take them to be present in, or close to, Plato’s. They even wrote treatises on them (e.g. Diogenes Laertius 4.13). We hear that Plato was accused of having copied the Timaeus from Philolaus' book (Diogenes Laertius 8.85) and in the 3rd c. BCE Timon of Phlius parodied Plato for this (Aulus Gellius, Noctes Atticae 3.17.4). The renewed emphasis on the Timaeus in the work of Platonists of the first centuries CE, which we can attribute already to Eudorus (see Dillon 1977, 117–121), is closely associated with this revival of Pythagorean Platonism. Platonists considered the Timaeus to communicate Pythagorean doctrine and even argued that it was inspired by the work of “Timaeus Locrus”, a late forgery in pseudo-Doric dialect (Proclus, In Timaeum I.7.17-8.29). Numenius is following ample precedent in assigning a central role to the Timaeus for deriving a system of first principles on the basis of Plato's metaphysics (Baltes 1975, 241–242).

3. Metaphysics

The existing evidence about Numenius suggests that he was strongly concerned with metaphysics. His metaphysical views can be distinguished into ontological and theological ones. The remains of his treatise On the Good show that these were closely linked together. Numenius defines the subject matter of this treatise as an investigation of the question what is being (fr. 3.1, fr. 5.5, fr. 7.12–13), which is reminiscent of Aristotle's definition of first philosophy, or metaphysics, in Metaphysics Gamma. Yet the Good and the other principles of reality introduced by Numenius are treated as gods. Quite notably, Numenius declares that he will be guided in his investigation by the Timaeus (referring to Timaeus 27d-28a; fr. 7.8-12).

Numenius maintains a sharp distinction between the sensible and the intelligible world—the realms of becoming and (true or pure) being respectively (fr. 16.8–10). In his On the Good he proceeds in an ontologically ascending order, starting with sensible (physical) entities, moving to the intelligible ones (including Platonic Forms), and finally to the first principle, God (that is, the first and highest god). Arriving at this divine first principle is the final aim of the treatise. According to Numenius, everything that exists in the world as it is, depends on God, which Numenius takes to be identical with the Platonic Form of the Good in the Republic (508e). Numenius begins his investigation from natural elements, such as fire, earth, water, arguing that no such element can possibly qualify as a being (as having being), first because elements, like syllables, cannot exist by themselves but only in combination, secondly because no bodily entity whatever can qualify as a being (as having being), because bodies are subject to change (fr. 3.1–8). This means that all bodies have, at best, being-and-not-being (cf. Republic 479c). What is more, for a body to exist there must be something to keep it together and account for its unity, and this cannot be a further body but rather must be an intelligible entity, for instance a soul, which is necessary to account for the unity of bodies, as we see it does for living things (fr. 4b).

Such an argument shows that Numenius has strong views about the ontological status of matter, the basis, he supposes, of all bodies. In his 4th c. CE Latin commentary on the Timaeus Calcidius presents a long discussion about the status of matter, saying that this is based on Numenius (fr. 52.2). If Numenius did elaborate on the status of matter along the lines suggested in Calcidius, that must be because it was crucial to do so for his argument about what qualifies as being and also how the world has come into existence. Interpreting the Timaeus literally, Numenius maintains that matter has never come into existence but is co-eternal with, and distinct from God (fr. 52.7–14; cf. Alcinous, Didascalicus ch. 12, 166.15–30 Hermann), unlimited (apeiros), indefinite (aoristos), without form and quality (fr. 52.6–14,, 44–45) and, considered on its own, without any share in reason (alogos; fr. 4a.1–4). As a result, matter in itself is disordered (ataktos) and cannot be known (fr. 4.4–5). Since disorder and division are essential characteristics of matter, matter had often, in the earlier Platonist tradition, been identified with the indefinite “dyad” referred to in Aristotle's account of Plato's metaphysics (cf. Plato, Parmenides 149d2; see Baltes 1975, 255–6). This was widely maintained among the Pythagorean Platonists (Sextus Empiricus, Against the Mathematicians 10.261), including Eudorus (Simpicius, In Physica 181.7–30, 281.5) and Moderatus (ibid. 231.8–9; see Frede 1987, 1052). Numenius follows precisely this line (frs. 11.15, 52.6). And since order is taken to amount to goodness and disorder to badness, Numenius considers matter to be bad and indeed the source of all badness and disorder (fr. 52.37–9, 63–64). Numenius might appear to maintain that disordered matter (cf. Timaeus 30a) is animated by an evil world soul (fr. 52.64–5), as might be suggested in Laws 10 (896e) (cf. Plutarch, De animae procreatione in Timaeo 1014D). However, Calcidius' text, which preserves this, suggests instead that matter is not animated by, but somehow simply is the evil world soul, that is, matter has life of its own (fr. 52.44–47, 66–67; see Baltes 1975, 247–248 but also Deuse, 1983, 68–73, Phillips 2002, 237). This is presumably because a soul, if it animates anything, cannot be really evil in doing so, as it is the principle of life. And life is one kind of order and thus good (see Waszink 1966, 68–9, Baltes 1975, 250–251, Frede 1987, 1053). The fact that for Numenius matter is bad, however, does not mean that the material world is also bad, as Dillon (1977, 369) suggests, associating Numenius with the Gnostic idea of an evil world. Quite the opposite is the case: for Numenius the world is good because it is ordered.

Now, for Platonists only intelligible entities can account for order which amounts to goodness. A Platonic Form, for instance, is responsible for the ordered existence of the physical things it is the Form of. A soul too accounts for the existence of living things, such as animals. Since the world has an order of its own as a single well-ordered whole, there must be such an intelligible entity that accounts for the world's order, wherein its goodness lies (kosmos). Being the source of this comprehensive goodness, this must itself be surpassingly good (frs. 16.14–15, 19, 20). Platonists tended to identify this principle with the Form of the Good in the Republic (508e), which is the source of all being. It was also traditional among them to think of this principle as a divine one or unit—God.

Numenius, then, distinguishes two sources of reality, God and matter (inspired by Timaeus 47e-48a and Aristotle, Metaphysics 988a8–17).Yet the crucial question for Numenius was how one should think about this divine principle, what kind of God this is. Numenius' position on this has much to do with his view on matter. Numenius advocates a strong dualistic position. In this he is like Plutarch and later Atticus follows them. Numenius' dualism is different from that of most contemporary Pythagoreans we know of, like those referred to by Alexander Polyhistor (in Diogenes Laertius 8.25), by Sextus Empiricus (Against the Mathematicians 10.261–2), by Nicomachus of Gerasa (Theologia Arithmêtikê in Photius, Bibliotheca cod. 187, 143a24), by Eudorus (Simplicius, In Physica 181.10–30) and by Moderatus (Porphyry, On Matter in Simplicius, In Physica 231.6–24). Those Pythagoreans postulated God or One, on the one hand, and matter or indefinite dyad, on the other, but they maintained that God or One is the ultimate principle of everything (Simplicius, In Phys. 7–30); from this matter came into existence through the total privation of form (ibid. 231.7–9). Numenius appears to be reacting against this view, which is associated specifically with Moderatus (fr. 52.15–23; see Kahn 2001, 133). Numenius rejects Moderatus' view in favor of his own dualistic position, presumably because he wants to avoid the implication of the monistic position that God is the source of what is bad. This concern seems also to motivate Numenius to distance God from matter as much as possible. He distinguishes the divine demiurge, who creates the physical world by imposing order on matter, from the highest god. This highest god is metaphysically above the demiurge (frs. 16, 17, 19–21) in the sense that the highest god, which Numenius also calls the first intellect (fr. 20.12), is inert (fr. 12.13, 15.2) and utterly simple (fr. 11.11–14), qualifies as being itself (autoon; fr. 17.4) and the source of being (fr. 16.4–5, 9), while the demiurge is the source of generation (fr. 16.5); the highest god also is absolute goodness (frs. 16.4, 9–10, 20.12), identical with the Form of the Good (fr. 20.5, 11). This first god, being absolute goodness, remains “alone, isolated, abandoned” (fr. 2.9), which suggests that this god, like Plotinus' One, is ineffable and incomprehensible (see Whittaker, 1993). Numenius thus sets himself apart from those Platonists who identified the divine demiurge of the Timaeus with the Form of the Good of Republic 6 (508e), but he is in accord with the view of his contemporary, Alcinous (Didascalicus ch. 10, 164.27–165.16 Hermann).

Numenius faces two challenges. First, how can the first god be the ultimate cause of everything, as it appears it ought to be (fr. 16.1–2, 9), if it is inert? Second how can it be simple, as Numenius has claimed, if it is, as he has also claimed, an intellect that thinks? Numenius maintains that the first or highest god, or first intellect, brings about a second one (frs. 13, 21.7), in fact the divine demiurge, and uses this second intellect as an instrument of its thinking (fr. 22.1–2; cf. Timaeus 28a7). More specifically, the second intellect thinks of the Forms and creates by imposing them on matter (fr. 18; cf. Timaeus 39e9). To the extent that all other Forms exist by participating in the Form of the Good (frs. 16.2–5, 46b–c), which is identical with the first intellect, this intellect accounts also for the (other) Forms (Frede 1987, 1060–1063), while it is the second god who actually thinks of them. The first intellect thinks only itself, like the Aristotelian God of Metaphysics Lambda, and in this sense its being and its object of thought are identical. Hence the first god remains absolutely simple, pure goodness, is at rest and inert, while the second god is in motion (fr. 15.3–4), is not simple, because it contains the Forms of all entities, and is good only in its relation to the first god, the Form of the Good, a relation which Numenius describes as “imitation” (fr. 16.15), or as “participation” (frs. 19.9–11, 20.7–10). This, however, does not mean that Numenius considers the demiurge to be ignorant and a less than good creator, and in this sense like the demiurge of the Gnostics, as Dillon (1977, 369) has argued. Rather, for Numenius the demiurge is a recipient of the goodness of the highest good and in turn transmits this to the world which it brings into existence (frs. 14, 16, 19).

Yet creation is a process which, according to the Timaeus, can be divided into two stages, the demiurgic intellect's thinking of the Forms of all entities and its imposing them on matter. Numenius maintains that the demiurgic intellect, the second god in his hierarchy, splits into two when engaged in the creation in the world, because matter, which is required for and involved in creation, is such that it divides whatever has anything to do with it. One reason why matter divides is because it inspires desire in the demiurge (fr. 11.13–16). As a result, the demiurge is divided into one intellect which continues contemplating the Forms and another which imposes Forms on matter (frs. 11.16–20, 16.10–12, 21.4–5). This means that the demiurgic intellect engages in creation through a third god, a third intellect (frs. 21.3–5, 22.4), which is thinking in a discursive way (dianooumenon; fr. 22.4), not in the purely contemplative way that the demiurgic intellect thinks. In fact, this third god is conceived along the lines of the world-soul of the Timaeus; the god that actually engages in creation is in effect the world-soul of Plato's text (Baltes 1975, 267). Numenius uses very metaphorical language, inspired by the myth of Plato's Statesman, in order to present what the demiurge does and how it thinks in doing it. He argues that it is like a helmsman steering a ship using the Forms as instrument (fr. 18 with Statesman 272e; cf. Timaeus 39e). Despite the metaphorical language, two things become clear. First, this intellect, the world-soul, is also active in maintaining the world in existence (frs. 12.14–19, 18, 52.91–8). Secondly, it desires to create the world (fr. 11.16–20, 18.7–13), which amounts to saying that God, in the person of this third intellect, wants to impose order in the world because order is good (see Deuse 1983, 65–67). Since this third intellect is directly responsible for the existence of the world, it is ultimately not distinguishable from the world itself (fr. 21.3), because it is this which keeps the world together (see also Tarrant 1979).

There is a question of how to understand Numenius' hierarchy of three gods. Should we take seriously Proclus' testimonies that suggest there are in fact three (frs. 21–22), or the fragments of Numenius preserved by Eusebius which suggest that there are actually only two (frs. 15–16, 20)? The question becomes accentuated in view of Numenius' statement that the second and third gods are one, using the verb “to be” in the singular (estin; fr. 11.14–15) in referring to them together. Frede (1987, 1057–1059) has argued convincingly that the unity of the two does not mean their identity. The demiurge is split into two because of the effect of matter. The second god is divisible in the same way that some other intelligible entities, such as human and animal soul, are (fr. 41.6). Soul remains essentially the same in all animate beings and yet is divided, in the process of ensoulment of the things that it makes animate. This is the case with the demiurge as well. That Numenius proposed a hierarchy of three distinct gods, rather than two (thus Holzhausen 1992, 253–254), or three aspects of one god (Krämer 1964, 88), is strengthened by the fact that Christians like Origen and Eusebius, being Trinitarians, approve of his theology.

Numenius' three gods are the principles of being (first god) and generation (second and third god; fr. 16), and thus of everything that exists. And because the highest god is absolute goodness, the world of generation becomes good and beautiful (fr. 16.16–17). Numenius advanced the idea that goodness is transmitted from the highest god through the second, demiurgic intellect, which realizes creation through a third intellect, to the world without God actually doing anything (fr. 14.6–14), an idea further developed later by Plotinus.

4. Psychology

Like most Platonists, Numenius was much preoccupied with the status of soul and its relation to body. Some fragments from Numenius' treatise On the Good (frs. 2–4) show clearly that the treatment of the soul was quite extensive in this work. Secondly, Numenius' views on the soul are discussed by several later Platonists, including Porphyry, Iamblichus, Damascius, and Calcidius, while they can arguably be detected in Macrobius' In Somnium Scipionis. The main reason for Numenius' strong interest in the soul, especially the human soul, must have been one which can be detected also in Plotinus: the soul-body relation is paradigmatic for the relation between intelligible and sensible reality in general. Hence we cannot understand the latter, a crucial point for Platonism, unless we first grasp the former. Indeed Numenius' views on soul and its relation to body square well with his views on the relation between intelligible and sensible reality.

Porphyry reports that Numenius speaks of two souls, a rational and a non-rational one (Porphyry in Stobaeus I.49.25; fr. 44), while Philoponus (In de anima 9.35–38; fr. 47) suggests that Numenius may have distinguished also a third kind of soul. Porphyry's testimony is confusing because he does not make clear that Numenius distingushes two kinds of soul (not two souls in man, as Merlan 1967, 103 maintains), while he groups Numenius together with those Platonists who distinguish parts of the soul (reason, spirit, and appetite), presumably a quite different matter from distinguishing different kinds of soul for different kinds of living thing. Further evidence, though, corroborates the conclusion that Numenius did distinguish at least two kinds of soul, a rational one for humans and gods, and a nonrational one for animals—the distinction of a third kind of soul for plants is less well attested yet possible given the testimony of Timaeus 77b. Porphyry himself states that according to Numenius the rational soul has an “assenting faculty” which motivates all actions (fr. 45). This reference to assent suggests that Numenius operates with a notion of reason similar to that of the Stoics and that, like the Stoics, he considers souls of human adults to be nothing but reason. This view, though, does have Platonic credentials, arguably going back to Socrates as he appears in the Protagoras. This may explain why other contemporary Platonists, such as Celsus (Origen, Against Celsus 8.49), also endorse it. This picture is confirmed by Iamblichus' testimony, which suggests that there is a fundamental opposition between Numenius' two kinds of soul (fr. 43.4–5), namely that the human soul, being rational or intellectual, is in its essence that of gods (fr. 41.15–6; Kahn 2001, 130–1), while that of other animals, being essentially non rational, is not. For Numenius the human soul is of the kind of the divine soul, namely an immortal intellect (fr. 31.25–6), and in this sense human souls have divine origin (fr. 52.73–5).

Apparently Numenius sides with those (notably the Stoics) who believe that possessing reason makes a soul fundamentally different from souls devoid of reason, and that this is crucial both for the status of the soul as such as well as for its relation to the body and perhaps also for the related bodily functions. For Numenius functions of this kind, such as perception, memory, and desire, are not essential to the soul and are later additions to it (fr. 43.7–9), coming into existence with its embodiment. Numenius apparently held that the human soul is an intellect that descended to human bodies through the planets (fr. 12.14–16), a view that also Celsus shared (Origen, Against Celsus VI.21; see Frede 1994, 5211) but we can find also in Hermetic treatises (Corpus Herm. I.25; Dodds 1960, 8). Numenius is guided here by the analogy of the Cave and the story of Er in Republic 7 and 10 respectively, but also by the description of the creation of the soul in the Timaeus (41e), according to which the demiurge mounts the souls on vehicles (ochêmata). Porphyry in his work The Cave of Nymphs makes clear that he relies on Numenius' exegesis of the soul's descent to bodies through the planets (frs. 30–33) and speaks of the honey offered by the astrologists in anticipation of the future pleasures of the souls in earth (fr. 32).

Further light is shed in Macrobius' long account about the descent of the soul from the sky to the earth (In Somnium Scipionis 1.12), which at least to some extent must be drawn from Numenius (thus Dodds 1960, 8–10 against Beutler 1940, 676–677; the extent of Macrobius' debt to Numenius is debated by Elferink 1968, Ley 1972, Baltes 1975, 252–3, Deuse 1983, 72–73). According to Macrobius' story of the soul's descent from heaven to earth, the soul acquires a number of capacities necessary for its functions in a body as it goes through the planets, such as the capacity of theoretical thinking (logistikon) in Saturn, that of practical thinking (praktikon) in Jupiter, the spirited aspect (thumos) in Mars, the perceptual capacity (aisthêtikon) and imagination (phantastikon) in the Sun, appetite (orektikon) in Venus, the linguistic capacity (hermeneutikon) in Mercury, and finally the vegetative functions (phutikon) in the Moon. As Frede (1987, 1072) has argued, the capacities acquired in the seven planetary spheres correspond to the seven parts of the soul according to the Stoics. It is crucial to stress that these acquired capacities neither are essential to soul nor do they change what the soul actually is, i.e. intellect (fr. 42). They rather are, as Iamblichus reports, causes of evil (In de anima in Stobaeus I.374.21–375.1; fr. 43.7–9), as the soul loses its simplicity and purity. Yet the evil is not due (or not only due) to the capacities themselves, but rather to the accumulation of astral matter while the soul descends through the planets. This is confirmed by the testimony of Iamblichus according to which Numenius, Cronius, and Harpocration consider all embodiments to be invariably bad (fr. 48.10–14) and is compatible with Numenius' view that matter is the source of all that is bad (see above, Metaphysics).

When the soul is released from the body at death, then it remains only what it is essentially, namely intellect (fr. 35.21–26). If this is so, then for Numenius only the intellect is immortal. This however conflicts with the report of Damascius (In Phaedonem I.177 Westerink; fr. 46 Des Places, wrongly attributed to Olympiodorus) according to which Numenius maintained that not only the essence of the soul, the intellect, is immortal, but also the sum of all other psychic capacities (the ones connected to bodily functions) survives death, and also with the report of Philoponus (In de anima 3.35–38; fr. 47), according to which Numenius follows Plato's Phaedrus (245c) in maintaining that “all soul is immortal” (Baltes 1975, 245–246, Deuse 1983, 77). The immortality of the entire soul though would be incompatible with the story of the soul's descent, according to which the rest of the psychic capacities is acquired and not originally present in the soul. Yet Numenius possibly distinguished between the immortality of the intellect, and the immortality for the rest of the psychic capacities in the sense that they survive death as they get dissolved gradually into the spheres again. This is also the view that Porphyry later takes (in Stobaeus 1.384.19–28, Porphyry fr. 453 Smith), who may well follow Numenius on this (see Smith 1974, 56–68, Karamanolis 2006, 292). For Numenius the soul is immortal strictly speaking only in its essence, that is as intellect, being free from body, even the astral body or matter accumulated during its descent.

5. Influence

Numenius had a powerful influence on later Platonism, especially on Plotinus and many Platonists of Plotinus' generation. It is not clear how far back this influence goes. The suggestion that Numenius exercised some influence already on Ammonius Saccas, the teacher of Plotinus and the Christian Origen (see Nemesius, De natura hominis 69–72 Matthaei; fr. 4b) is possible, given that all of Ammonius' students about whom we know anything show respect for Numenius' thought despite their disagreements. The main issue which divides Ammonius and his followers from Numenius is the number of the intelligible principles. The pagan Origen, another student of Ammonius, is a monist, holding that the supreme god is also the creator of the universe (Porphyry, Life of Plotinus 3.32, Proclus, Platonic Theology II.4, p. 90; see Saffrey-Westerink, Proclus Théologie Platonicienne vol. II, X-XX). Longinus, who studied with both Ammonius and the Christian Origen (Porphyry, Life of Plotinus 20.36–37), apparently also committed himself to metaphysical monism (Proclus, In Timaeum I.322.18–26; Longinus fr. 60 Männlein-Robert, 538–540), possibly in reaction to Numenius, whose work he knew well (Porphyry, Life of Plotinus 20.74–76). Well acquainted with Numenius' philosophy was Cronius, Numenius' contemporary (frs. 46b 48), as well as Atticus (see Life and Work). Numenius' work was particularly well known and appreciated by the early Christians. The Christian Origen was a student of Numenius' work (Eusebius, Eccl. Hist. VI.19.7–8) and has an impressive knowledge of it. This becomes evident in that he often cites verbatim from it in his Against Celsus (I.15; fr. 1b, IV.51; fr. 1c, 10, V.57; fr. 29, V.38; fr. 53), which is remarkable given that Origen normally cites only from the Scripture (see Kritikos, 2007, 406–7). This practice is inherited by Eusebius who has preserved more fragments of Numenius than any other author.

There are three reasons accounting for such a strong approval of Numenius by the early Christians. First, Numenius shows respect for the Jewish tradition (frs. 1a-c, 8, 9); he speaks of the religion of the Jews claiming that their God is incorporeal (Against Celsus I.15; fr. 1b), he interprets allegorically the statements of Moses and the prophets (ibid. IV.51; fr. 1c), while he famously states that Plato is like Moses speaking Attic Greek (fr. 8), and even alludes to Jesus (fr. 10a). Such attention to the Jewish tradition is important for the early Christian theologians and apologists who want to establish the superiority of the Jewish-Christian tradition. Secondly, Numenius' doctrine of three gods can be read as analogous to the Christian doctrine of the Trinity. To the extent that Numenius is an exegete of Plato, Christians feel entitled to claim that Plato in the 2nd Letter foreshadows the doctrine of the Trinity, and use this argument to convince the pagans that Christianity is not something new but was anticipated in the best parts of the pagan philosophical tradition (Eusebius, Prep. Ev. XI.praef. 3, XI.20.1–3; see Kritikos 2007, 407–9). Origen in particular was inspired by Numenius' distinction between the first god and the immediate agent of creation, a second god, a distinction which preserves God's immutability (Origen, Against Celsus VII.42–44, Commentary on John I.6.35; Kritikos 2007, 409–416). Finally, Numenius is valuable for the argument which Eusebius makes in his Preparatio Evangelica that the pagan philosophers disagree with each other and do not stick to what Eusebius considers the best part of Greek philosophy, which is Plato's philosophy.

The extent of Numenius' influence on Plotinus was debated in antiquity. Plotinus' students, Amelius and Porphyry, were concerned to discredit the widespread charge of Plotinus' plagiarism of Numenius (Life of Plotinus 18.1–8, 21.1–9). Amelius, famous for his knowledge of Numenius' work (ibid. 3.44–5), devoted a special work on this, On the difference between the doctrines of Plotinus and those of Numenius (ibid. 17.1–6). Porphyry discusses the matter extensively in his biography of Plotinus (ibid. 17–18, 21.1–9), making reference to Amelius' work mentioned above and to Longinus' claim that Plotinus' works were far superior in terms of precision to Numenius', Cronius', Moderatus', and Thrasyllus' (ibid. 20.71–76, 21.5–9). Amelius and Porphyry themselves are very much influenced by Numenius' philosophy, as later Platonists point out. Amelius follows Numenius in maintaining that not only sensible entities but also intelligible ones participate in intelligibles (Syrianus, In Metaphysica 109.12–14; fr. 46b). Porphyry also relies much on Numenius (e.g.Ad Gaurum 34.20–35; fr. 36), to the extent that he is explicitly accused by Proclus of taking over Numenius' views (on demons, In Timaeum I.76.30–77.23; fr. 37; see Waszink 1966).

Numenius' influence goes beyond the contemporaries of Plotinus. Iamblichus, Proclus, Syrianus, Philoponus and Damascius also draw on his work (see frs. 46a-51). Numenius was also used by Calcidius in his commentary on the Timaeus (297.7–301.20 Waszink; fr. 52; see Phillips 2003) and by Macrobius in his In Somnium Scipionis (frs. 54–55), a work of considerable influence in the Middle Ages.


Primary Literature

Numenius' fragments




Aulus Gellius




Diogenes Laertius


Ioannes Lydus











Sextus Empiricus




Secondary Literature

Other Internet Sources

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Related Entries

metaphysics | Origen | Plato | Plato: Timaeus | Platonism: in metaphysics | Plotinus | Porphyry | Pythagoras | Pythagoreanism


The author is grateful to Christian Wildberg and, especially, to John Cooper for their comments and suggestions. The SEP editors would also like to thank John Cooper for the special effort he made in refereeing, editing, and preparing this entry for publication.