Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Political Obligation

First published Tue Apr 17, 2007

To have a political obligation is to have a moral duty to obey the laws of one's country or state. On that point there is almost complete agreement among political philosophers. But how does one acquire such an obligation, and how many people have really done what is necessary to acquire it? Or is political obligation more a matter of being than of doing — that is, of simply being a member of the country or state in question? To those questions many answers have been given, and none now commands widespread assent. Indeed, a number of contemporary political philosophers deny that a satisfactory theory of political obligation either has been or can be devised. Others, however, continue to believe that there is a solution to what is commonly called “the problem of political obligation,” and they are presently engaged in lively debate not only with the skeptics but also with one another on the question of which theory, if any, provides the solution to the problem.

Whether political obligation is the central or fundamental problem of political philosophy, as some have maintained (e.g., McPherson), may well be doubted. There is no doubt, however, that the history of political thought is replete with attempts to provide a satisfactory account of political obligation, from the time of Socrates to the present. These attempts have become increasingly sophisticated in recent years, but they have brought us no closer to agreement on a solution to the problem of political obligation than the efforts of, say, Thomas Hobbes and John Locke in the seventeenth century. Nor have these sophisticated attempts made it unnecessary to look back to earlier efforts to resolve the problem. On the contrary, an appreciation of the troublesome nature of political obligation seems to require an examination of its place in the history of political thought.

This essay begins, therefore, with a brief history of the problem of political obligation. It then turns, in Part II, to the conceptual questions raised by political obligation, such as what it means for an obligation to be political. In Part III the focus is on the skeptics, with particular attention to the self-proclaimed philosophical anarchists, who deny that political obligations exist yet do not want to abolish the state. Part IV surveys the leading contenders among the various theories of political obligation now on offer, and Part V concludes the essay with a consideration of recent proposals for pluralistic or “multiple principle” approaches.

1. Political Obligation in Historical Perspective

The phrase “political obligation” is apparently no older than T. H. Green's Lectures on the Principles of Political Obligation, delivered at Oxford University in 1879-80 (D'Entrèves, p. 3). The two words from which Green formed the phrase are much older, of course, and he apparently thought that combining them required no elaborate explanation or defense. In any case, there was nothing novel about the problem Green addressed in his lectures: “to discover the true ground or justification for obedience to law” (Green 1986, p. 13). Sophocles raised this problem in his play Antigone, first performed around 440 BCE, and Plato's Crito recounts Socrates' philosophical response to the problem, in the face of his own death, some forty years later.

1.1 Socrates on Obeying the Law

In 399 BCE an Athenian jury found Socrates guilty of impiety and corrupting the morals of the youth, for which crimes the jury condemned him to death. According to Plato's account, Socrates' friends arranged his escape, but he chose to stay and drink the fatal hemlock, arguing that to defy the judgment against him would be to break his “agreements and commitments” and to “mistreat” his friends, his country, and the laws of Athens (Crito, 54c; Trial and Death, p. 54). Socrates' arguments are sketchy, and Crito, his interlocutor, does little to challenge them, but they are nevertheless suggestive of the theories of political obligation that have emerged in the two and a half millennia since his death.

These arguments fall into four categories. First, Socrates maintains that his long residence in Athens shows that he has entered into an agreement with its laws and committed himself to obey them — an argument that anticipates the social contract or consent theory of political obligation. Second, he acknowledges that he owes his birth, nurture, and education, among other goods, to the laws of Athens, and he hints at the gratitude theory of obligation when he concludes that it would be wrong of him to disobey its laws now. Third, he appeals to what is now known as the argument from fairness or fair play when he suggests that disobedience would be a kind of mistreatment of his fellow citizens. As he asks Crito, “if we leave here without the city's permission, are we mistreating people whom we should least mistreat?” (50a) There is, finally, a trace of utilitarian reasoning, as when Socrates imagines “the laws and the state” confronting him with this challenge: “‘do you think it possible for a city not to be destroyed if the verdicts of its courts have no force but are nullified and set at naught by private individuals?’” (50b). None of these arguments is fully developed, but their presence in the Crito is testimony to the staying power of intuitions and concepts — commitment and agreement, gratitude, fair play, and utility — that continue to figure in discussions of obligation and obedience.

Plato's Crito is noteworthy not only as the first philosophical exploration of political obligation but also as the last to appear for centuries. The Cynics and others did question the value of political life, and indirectly the existence of an obligation to obey the law, but they left no record of a discussion of the subject as sustained as even the five or six pages in the Crito. When the morality of obedience and disobedience next became a much discussed issue, it was a religious as much as a philosophical discussion.

1.2 Divine Command

Throughout history, the belief that political society and its rules are divinely ordained has been so strong as to keep many people, and probably most, from considering the possibility that disobeying those rules might ever be justified. With the advent of Christianity, however, that possibility had to be taken seriously. For the Christian, the distinction Jesus draws (Matthew 22:15-22) between the tribute owed to Caesar and that owed to God makes it clear that what the rulers command may be at odds with what God wants done. That point became even clearer when the rulers tried to suppress Christianity. Nevertheless, Christian doctrine held that there is an obligation to obey the law grounded in divine command, with the most important text being Paul's Epistle to the Romans (13:1-2): “For there is no authority except from God, and those that exist have been instituted by God. Therefore he who resists the authorities resists what God has appointed, and those who resist will incur judgment.”

As a theory of political obligation, divine command faces two general problems. First, it presupposes the existence of divinity of some sort; and second, the commands of the divine being(s) are not always clear. It is one thing to know that we should give to Caesar what is Caesar's and to God what is God's, for example, and quite another to know what exactly is Caesar's due. For Christians, however, the main challenge was to reconcile Paul's text with the uncomfortable fact that rulers were often hostile to Christianity — or, with the rise of Protestantism in the sixteenth century, hostile to what one took to be true Christianity. To this challenge, one response was simply to hold that hostile or vicious rulers must be endured, for God must have given them power as a sign of His displeasure with a wicked people. Other responses, though, made room for disobedience.

One such response was to distinguish the divinely ordained office from the officer who occupied it. That is, God ordains that political authority must exist, because the condition of human life since the fall from grace requires such authority; but God does not ordain that this or that particular person hold a position of authority, and He certainly does not want rulers to abuse their authority by ruling tyrannically. This distinction, employed as early as the fourth century by St. John Chrysostom, was invoked throughout the middle ages (McIlwain, pp. 152-53). A second response to the problem Romans 13 posed was to distinguish disobedience from resistance. According to Martin Luther and others who drew this distinction, Christians may not actively resist their rulers, but they must disobey them when the rulers' commands are contrary to God's. Yet a third response was to note the possibility of conflict between two or more of one's rulers. In other words, if more than one person holds political authority over you, and if they issue conflicting commands, then you may satisfy Paul's injunction by obeying the authority whose commands are more congenial to your understanding of true Christianity, even when such obedience entails resisting the commands of others in authority.

These last two responses played an especially important part in the political disputes that accompanied the Protestant Reformation. Under the pressure of those disputes, however, another theory of political obligation became increasingly prominent, as Protestants came to rely on the belief that political authority derives from the consent of the governed (Skinner, vol. 2, chaps. 7-9).

1.3 The Social Contract

Although the idea of the social contract long antedates the modern era (Gough 1967), its full development occurred in the seventeenth century, when Thomas Hobbes and John Locke used the theory to rather different ends. Jean-Jacques Rousseau, Immanuel Kant, and other philosophers have also relied on social contract theory, but the classic expressions of the contract theory of political obligation remain Hobbes's Leviathan (1651) and Locke's Second Treatise of Government (1690).

For Hobbes, social contract theory established the authority of anyone who was able to wield and hold power. If we imagine ourselves in a state of nature, he argued, with no government and no law to guide us but the law of nature, we will recognize that everyone is naturally equal and independent. But we should also recognize that this state of nature will also be a state of war, for the “restlesse desire for Power after power” that drives all of us will lead to “a warre of every man against every man” (Hobbes, chaps. 11, 13). To escape so dreadful a condition, people surrender their independence by entering into a covenant to obey a sovereign power that will have the authority to make, enforce, and interpret laws. This form of the social contract Hobbes called “sovereignty by institution.” But he also insisted that conquerors acquire authority over those they subject to their rule — “sovereignty by acquisition” — when they allow those subjects to go about their business. In either case, Hobbes said, the subjects consent to obey those who have effective power over them, whether the subject has a choice in who holds power or not. Because they consent, they therefore have an obligation to obey the sovereign, whether sovereignty be instituted or acquired.

Exactly how much Locke differs from Hobbes in his conclusions is a matter of scholarly dispute, but there is no doubt that he puts the same concepts to work for what seem to be more limited ends. According to Locke, the free and equal individuals in the state of nature establish government as a way of overcoming the “inconveniencies” of that state. Moreover, Locke's social contract appears to have two stages. In the first stage the naturally free and equal individuals agree to form themselves into a political society, under law, and in the second they establish the government. This move allows Locke to argue, contrary to Hobbes, for a right of revolution on the ground that overthrowing the government will not immediately return the people to the state of nature. Nor does he hold, with Hobbes, that mere submission to a conqueror constitutes a form of consent to the conqueror's rule.

Locke does agree with Hobbes, of course, in deriving obligations to obey the law from the consent of the governed. In developing his argument, however, he reveals three problems that have bedeviled social contract theory. One problem has to do with the nature of the contract: is it historical or hypothetical? If the former, then the problem is to show that most people truly have entered into such a contract. If the contract is meant to be a device that illustrates how people would have given their consent, on the other hand, then the difficulty is that a hypothetical contract “is no contract at all” (Dworkin, 1977, p. 151). The second problem has to do with the way Hobbes and Locke rely on tacit consent. If only express or explicit statements of agreement or commitment count as genuine consent, then it appears that relatively few people have consented to obey the laws of their country; but if tacit or implied consent is allowed, the concept of consent may be stretched too far. Hobbes does this when he counts submission to a conqueror as consent, but Locke also runs this risk when he states, in §119 of the Second Treatise, that the “very being of anyone within the territories” of a government amounts to tacit consent. Finally, it is not clear that consent is really the key to political obligation in these theories. The upshot of Hobbes's theory seems to be that we have an obligation to obey anyone who can maintain order, and in Locke's it seems that there are some things to which we cannot consent. In particular, we cannot consent to place ourselves under an absolute ruler, for doing so would defeat the very purposes for which we enter the social contract — to protect our lives, liberty, and property (Pitkin 1965).

One of the first to find fault with the argument from consent or contract was David Hume. In “Of the Original Contract,” published in 1752, Hume takes particular exception to the appeal to tacit consent. To say, he protests, that most people have given their consent to obey the laws simply by remaining in their country of birth is tantamount to saying that someone tacitly consents to obey a ship's captain “though he was carried on board while asleep and must leap into the ocean and perish the moment he leaves her” (1953, p. 51). For Hume, it seems, the obligation to obey the law derives not from consent or contract but from the straightforward utility of a system of laws that enables people to pursue their interests peacefully and conveniently.

1.4 Utility and Obligation

For all its influence in other areas of legal, moral, and political philosophy, utilitarianism has found few adherents among those who believe that there is a general obligation to obey the laws of one's country. Part of the reason for this situation may be the fact that Jeremy Bentham, John Stuart Mill, and others who followed Hume's path had little to say about political obligation. A more powerful reason, though, is that utilitarians have trouble accounting for obligations of any kind. If one's guiding principle is always to act to maximize expected utility, or promote the greatest happiness of the greatest number, then obligations seem to have little or no binding force. After all, if I can do more good by giving the money in my possession to charity than by paying my debts, then that is what I should do, notwithstanding my obligations to my creditors. By the same reasoning, whether I should obey or disobey the law is a matter to be settled by considering which will do more good, not by determining whether I have an obligation to obey.

Some utilitarian philosophers have struggled to overcome this problem, either by pointing to reasons to believe that respecting obligations serves to promote utility or by restricting calculations of utility to rules or norms rather than to individual acts (see the entry on utilitarianism for details). Whether their efforts have been successful remains a matter of debate. There seems to be a consensus, however, that the most sophisticated attempts to provide a utilitarian grounding for political obligation, such as those of Rolf Sartorius (1975, chaps. 5 and 6) and R. M. Hare (1976), have proved unsuccessful (e.g., Simmons 1979, pp. 45-54; Horton 1992, pp. 63-70). As a result, utilitarianism seldom figures in the debates of those contemporary political philosophers who continue to believe that there is, in some political societies, a general obligation to obey the law.

2. Conceptual Matters

In the twentieth century political philosophers devoted themselves at least as much to the analysis of the problem of political obligation, and to the concepts it involves, as to full-scale attempts to devise theories of the obligation to obey the law. As in the four historically significant theories surveyed in the previous section, however, the presumption has continued to be that the answer to the problem of political obligation must be stated in moral terms. When T. H. Green set out in 1879 “to discover the true ground or justification for obedience to law,” for example, he was looking for more than prudence alone can provide. “You ought to obey the law because you will suffer if you do not” may be a powerful reason for obedience, but it is not a reason that speaks to Green's concern with “the moral function or object served by law …” (Green 1986, p. 13). For Green, and for almost everyone else who has pondered it, the problem of political obligation is a moral problem, and the obligation in question is a kind of moral obligation. Anyone who has an obligation to obey the law thus has a moral duty to discharge, at least when there are no overriding moral considerations that justify disobedience.

2.1 Obligation and Duty

As the previous sentence suggests, obligations are also duties. That is true, at any rate, when the obligation in question is political obligation. To be sure, some philosophers have uncovered differences between obligations and duties, the most important of which is that obligations must be voluntarily undertaken or incurred, but duties need not be (e.g., Brandt 1964; Hart 1958). The obligation to keep a promise or fulfill a contract, for example, arises only when one has done something that generates the obligation — made a promise or signed a contract — but the duties of charity and truth telling supposedly fall on us regardless of what, if anything, we voluntarily commit to do. John Rawls relies on this distinction when he argues that most citizens of a reasonably just political society have no general obligation to obey its laws, even though they do have a “natural duty” to support just institutions — a duty that has the general effect of requiring them to obey (Rawls 1999, p. 97). For the most part, however, the distinction between obligation and duty has played no significant role in the debates over the supposed moral responsibility to obey the law. To invoke the distinction here would run counter to the tendency in both ordinary language and philosophical discussion to use the terms interchangeably, as when we speak of the “duty” to keep a promise or an “obligation” to tell the truth. It would also work against those who maintain that political obligations need not be acquired voluntarily, perhaps because they believe that the duty to obey the law is a “role obligation” akin to the “obligations” imposed by membership in a family (e.g., Hardimon 1994). Furthermore, those who follow the Rawlsian natural-duty approach typically argue that political obligation is grounded in a natural duty of some sort. In short, there seems to be nothing to gain from insisting on a sharp distinction between obligations and duties in this context. This essay will proceed, then, like almost everything written on either side of the question, on the understanding that a political obligation, if it exists, is a moral duty to obey the law.

To have an obligation is to be bound to do or not do something, as the etymological connection to the Latin ligare indicates; and to have a political obligation is to be bound to obey the law. But what is the force of this obligation? And why is it a political rather than a legal obligation? Both of these questions have proved troublesome.

2.2 Obligation and Morality

In the case of the first question, the problem is to determine whether the obligation to obey the law outweighs, overrides, or excludes competing moral consideration. If there is an obligation or duty to obey the law as such, simply because it is the law, then it is an obligation to obey no matter what the content of a particular law may be. Yet few people will say that someone who breaks the speed limit while driving a desperately ill person to the hospital is acting immorally; and many will say that some laws, such as those prohibiting consensual homosexual acts, are themselves immoral. We may grant that the law carries moral force, in other words, but we cannot grant that it holds a monopoly on that kind of force. Whether one ought to obey the law in a particular case is something that must be decided all things considered — that is, in light of other moral considerations that may arise. But what kind of an obligation is it that may be overridden or outweighed in this manner?

There are three responses to this question, broadly speaking. The first and most common is to hold that political obligations are morally binding, but not absolutely so. They are, instead, prima facie obligations. Like the obligation to keep a promise or meet the terms of a contract, the obligation to obey the law binds one to obedience, ceteris paribus, but it may be overridden in special circumstances, when other things are decidedly not equal. Nevertheless, the obligation is both presumptive and, at least on some accounts, quite strong. According to M. B. E. Smith's definition, for instance, “a person S has a prima facie obligation to do an act X if, and only if, there is a moral reason for S to do X which is such that, unless he has a moral reason not to do X at least as strong as his reason to do X, S's failure to do X is wrong” (in Edmundson 1999, p. 76). Others will allow that the overriding reason need not be strictly moral, as in the case of friends who break the law against gambling on their weekly poker night. On either account, though, there will be a presumption that one ought to obey the law. Someone who is under a political obligation thus should presume that she has a duty to obey the laws of her polity, and she should consider disobedience only when it seems that obeying a particular law may be, on balance, the wrong course of conduct. To have a political obligation, then, is not to have an obligation to obey laws a, b, and c, but perhaps not law d; it is to have a general obligation to obey the laws of one's polity as such. This general obligation, though, will not always require obedience to particular laws when all things are considered.

A second response is to maintain that political obligations may be overridden because they are not (fully) moral obligations. In her recent book on the subject, Margaret Gilbert argues that political obligations fall between “the dictates of morality,” on the one hand, and “one's inclinations and … self-interest,” on the other (2006, p. 293). A political obligation is thus a “genuine obligation,” in Gilbert's terms, but it is not necessarily a moral requirement, all things considered. Like all genuine obligations, a political obligation has binding force — in this case, binding the obligated person to obey lawful commands. “Yet it may be,” Gilbert says, “that one need not, all things considered, obey that command. One may, indeed, be morally required not to do so …” (2006, p. 293; emphasis in original).

The third response is to hold that a prima facie obligation is not really an obligation at all. As one writer tempted by this view says, with particular reference to political obligation, it “makes little sense to insist there is such an obligation if those who stand under it are entitled to exercise their own moral discretion regarding the propriety of their obedience to law” (Carr, p. 2). Either we have an obligation to do (or not do) X, in which case we are simply and absolutely bound to do (or not do) it, or we do not. Those who take this view must conclude, therefore, either that anyone who has a political obligation should always obey the law, being guilty of immoral conduct if he does not, or that no one ever has been or will be under a political obligation. Given the reasons already noted for believing disobedience to be morally justified in some circumstances, few of those who take obligations to be absolutely binding will be inclined to draw the first conclusion. To conceive of obligations as necessarily absolute is thus to slide toward the conviction that there is no duty to obey the law as such, at least not if this duty is understood as a general obligation to obey the law of one's polity.

What, then, is the force of a political obligation? Is it “merely” a prima facie obligation, or is it, if it exists at all, absolutely binding? Or is it a genuine but non-moral obligation, as Gilbert seems to think? The advantage of Gilbert's position is that it avoids the problem of resolving the question of whether the obligation is prima facie or absolute. That is, one may acknowledge that political obligations are truly binding, so that anyone who has such an obligation is bound to obey the law, but also acknowledge that this obligation must give way when it conflicts with moral obligations. The disadvantage, however, is that Gilbert's position appears to deny what seems to be the common belief — namely, that all genuine obligations carry some moral force. To be sure, it may be easy to think of cases in which morality requires us to break promises or vows, but this does not mean that the promise or vow is completely lacking in moral content — not unless we take a moral obligation to be an all-things-considered requirement. But if we allow that all genuine obligations carry some moral force, if not enough to be always dispositive, we are in effect accepting the distinction between prima facie and absolute obligations. Either that or we need to introduce a related distinction between genuine obligations, which are moral but subject to being overridden, and some other kind of moral requirement, responsibility, or “ought” that is capable of overriding moral obligations.

Or we could take the third route and insist that genuine obligations, including political obligations, must be absolutely binding. But this is to require more of political obligation than almost any obligation can bear. In fact, the usual candidates for absolutely binding moral requirements are highly abstract and truly fundamental — to do God's will in all of one's actions, to do good and avoid evil, to promote the greatest happiness of the greatest number, to submit only to laws that one makes for oneself, and the like. Unless one holds the implausible view that the obligation to obey the law is a fundamental requirement of this kind — that is, the moral duty from which all other moral duties derive — there is no good reason to deny that political obligations are as liable to be overridden as almost all of our other obligations, such as those that follow from promises, contracts, oaths, and vows.

We should not be troubled, then, by the charge that “it makes little sense to insist there is such an obligation [i.e., a political obligation] if those who stand under it are entitled to exercise their own moral discretion regarding the propriety of their obedience to law.” It is true that the law does not invite us to examine its content before deciding whether to obey, nor does it typically present us with a set of options from which to choose. As Joseph Raz (1979, pp. 22-27) and others have observed, the law claims exclusive or ultimate authority within its domain. From the standpoint of moral or political philosophy, however, there is no reason to cede such authority to “the law.” We may not want people to stop in their tracks so that they can ponder the moral implications of obedience every time the law directs them to do something, but neither should we want them to obey unquestioningly whatever is presented to them as a law. Political obligation resembles military duty in this respect. Anyone who believes that a military force is necessary will almost certainly accept the need for a chain of command, which entails a duty on the part of subordinates to obey the orders of those who outrank them. To undermine the requisite sense of duty is to weaken, and perhaps to destroy, the effectiveness of a military unit. Even so, we do not take “I was only following orders” to justify blind obedience. The soldier's or sailor's duty to obey orders is undoubtedly a genuine and powerful obligation, but there are still circumstances in which it may and should be overridden. In the same way, the obligation to obey the law can be genuine and powerful, if it exists at all, even though it is a prima facie or defeasible obligation.

2.3 Obligation, Political and Legal

What does this prima facie or defeasible nature of political obligation imply by way of an answer to the second question, which concerns the distinction between political and legal obligation? If those who have a political obligation have a duty to obey the law, ceteris paribus, then why not call it a legal obligation? Or why not conclude, with Bhiku Parekh (1993, p. 240), that the question of whether we have a duty to obey the law is really a matter of civil obligation — that is, “the obligation to respect and uphold the legitimately constituted civil authority” — that entails legal obligations “to obey the laws enacted by the civil authority” rather than political obligation? “Political” is the broader term, according to Parekh, and someone who has a truly political obligation will owe her polity more than mere obedience to its laws. Such a person will have a positive duty to take steps to secure the safety and advance the interests of her country. Following Parekh's distinction, then, we may say that someone who pays taxes discharges a legal obligation, no matter how grudgingly she pays them, but someone who pays taxes and contributes voluntarily to public projects fulfills a truly political obligation.

Other philosophers also distinguish political from legal obligations, but not in the far-reaching way that Parekh does. Indeed, it seems that we already have a term, “civic duty,” that does the work he wants to assign to “political obligation.” Exhortations to do our civic duty typically urge us to do more than merely obey the law. These exhortations would have us vote in elections and be well-informed voters; buy government bonds; limit our use of water and other scarce resources; donate blood, service, or money (beyond what we owe in taxes) in times of crisis; and generally contribute in an active way to the common good. Whether we really have a civic duty to do any or all of these things may be a matter of dispute, but appeals to civic duty are certainly quite common, and it is hardly clear that there is something to be gained by reclassifying them as appeals to political obligation.

How, then, do others draw the distinction? In general, the idea seems to be that political obligations are systemic and legal obligations specific. Among political philosophers, as previously noted, the problem of political obligation is the problem of determining whether there is a ground or justification for obedience to the law — not this or that law in particular but the law as such. This is the sense in which it is a systemic obligation, and that is why political philosophers have worried less about whether this or that law is binding than about the conditions under which one has an obligation to obey the laws in general. They look upon the system of laws as an aspect of the polity, albeit a vital one, and their question is what kind of polity can rightly claim that its members have a moral duty to obey its laws. Their answers have varied, of course, from Hobbes at one extreme, insisting that there is an obligation to obey the dictates of anyone who can maintain order, to anarchists at the other. Yet their concern has been the general or systemic one of establishing the grounds for obeying the laws as such.

For legal philosophers, however, the binding nature of laws in general is something to be assumed. The law claims ultimate or exclusive authority within its domain, and anyone who acknowledges that a legal system is in place must also acknowledge that its laws are binding. The obligation, though, is a legal obligation, or an obligation from the law's point of view. It need not be a moral obligation. According to legal positivists, in fact, a law will be morally binding only when it requires those subject to it to do what morality independently requires. Thus the laws that prohibit robbery, murder, and other acts that are mala in se — that is, inherently evil — are laws that people have both a moral and a legal obligation to obey; while laws that prohibit acts that are otherwise morally indifferent, such as driving on the left-hand side of the road, are merely legal obligations. Legal obligations are specific rather than systemic, then, because legal philosophers are concerned with the question of what counts as a law (or a valid law) with binding force, not with the moral justification of political systems that claim a right to be obeyed.

For political philosophers, the value of this distinction is that it allows one to hold that a person may be subject to a legal obligation even though she has no political obligation to obey the laws of the regime in power. There are at least two kinds of cases in which doing so can prove helpful. In the first, the regime is tyrannical, inept, or simply so unjust that only a Hobbesian would maintain that those subject to its commands have a moral obligation to obey. Nevertheless, people in this unhappy country manage to drive cars on roads that the regime maintains and marry according to its rules. In this situation we can acknowledge that people have legal obligations to obey certain laws — those that govern traffic and marriage — despite the absence of a political obligation to obey the laws as such. In the second, happier kind of case, we can acknowledge that the citizen of one country, to which she owes a political obligation, has a legal obligation to obey the laws of another country that she is visiting. This legal obligation lapses, however, when she returns to her own country, whereas the political obligation to her country is something she carries with her. If she is truly under a political obligation, she may be morally bound to pay taxes to her polity while abroad, and perhaps even to be recalled to perform military or some other kind of duty.

Political and legal obligations are related, in short, but they are not the same thing. A political obligation is a moral duty that only a citizen or perhaps a permanent resident can have, for it is an obligation that attaches only to members of a polity. Legal obligations, by contrast, attach themselves to anyone who is subject to the pertinent law or laws, including tourists who owe no allegiance to the country they happen to be visiting.

To appreciate the value of this distinction, and of this way of drawing it, it may help to reconsider §119 of Locke's Second Treatise of Government. There Locke insists that the obligation to obey the laws of a political society extends not only to those who have expressly consented to obey but also to anyone who owns property in that society, lodges within it for a week, or travels freely on its highways — indeed, “it reaches as far as the very being of any one within the territories of that government.” If the obligation in question is a political obligation, then Locke would find himself in the embarrassing position of holding that the person who sneaks into a country with the aim of subverting it nevertheless has a moral duty to obey its laws. Such a position may not be absurd, but it is difficult to see how the “very being” of someone within the boundaries of a country can place him under a political obligation to obey the laws of a regime that he abhors. If Locke were to distinguish political from legal obligation, however, he could say that the subversive is under a legal but not a political obligation while within the territory of the regime he seeks to destroy. While he is there, in other words, he will be subject to its laws, at least in the eyes of those who enforce them, and thus under a legal obligation to obey the laws that apply to him. But he will not be under a political obligation, for he will have no moral duty to obey the laws of the political system he seeks to subvert. Indeed, Locke may have had something of this sort in mind when he distinguished “perfect members” of a political society, who expressly consent to place themselves under an obligation, from those whose tacit consent made them merely temporary subjects (§§119-22).

3. Anarchist Challenges to Political Obligation

According to the foregoing analysis, a political obligation, if it exists at all, is a systemic, prima-facie moral duty to obey the laws of one's polity. But does such an obligation exist or obtain in any general or widespread sense? Most political philosophers have assumed that the answer is yes, and they have devoted their efforts to discovering what Green called “the true ground or justification for obedience to law.” Some philosophers in the middle years of the twentieth century even asserted, on conceptual grounds, that political obligation needs no justification. As one of them said, “to ask why I should obey any laws is to ask whether there might be a political society without political obligations, which is absurd. For we mean by political society, groups of people organized according to rules enforced by some of their number” (Macdonald, p. 192; also McPherson, p. 64, and, more subtly, Pitkin 1966; but cf. Pateman 1973, and Horton 1992, pp. 137-45). This view did not long prevail, but it testifies to the strength of the tendency to believe that citizens surely have an obligation to obey the laws of their country, at least if it is reasonably just.

There have been dissenters, however, and in recent years they have come to occupy a prominent place among political philosophers. As they see it, there is no general obligation to obey the law, not even on the part of the citizens of a reasonably just polity. The most thorough-going of these dissenters have been anarchists proper — that is, those persons who insist that states and governments are wickedly coercive institutions that ought to be abolished. Yet other skeptics or dissenters have concluded that the anarchist proper is wrong about the need for the state but right about the obligation to obey the law. Like the anarchist proper, these “philosophical anarchists” hold that the state is illegitimate, but they deny that its illegitimacy entails “a strong moral imperative to oppose or eliminate states; rather they typically take state illegitimacy simply to remove any strong moral presumption in favor of obedience to, compliance with, or support for our own or other existing states” (Simmons 2001, p. 104).

3.1 Philosophical Anarchism

The arguments of these philosophical anarchists take either an “a priori” or an “a posteriori” form (Simmons 2001, pp. 104-106). Arguments of the first kind maintain that it is impossible to provide a satisfactory account of a general obligation to obey the law. According to Robert Paul Wolff, the principal advocate of this view, there can be no general obligation to obey the law because any such obligation would violate the “primary obligation” of autonomy, which is “the refusal to be ruled” (1998 [1970], p. 18). As Wolff defines it, autonomy combines freedom with responsibility. To be autonomous, someone must have the capacity for choice, and therefore for freedom; but the person who has this capacity also has the responsibility to exercise it — to act autonomously. Failing to do so is to fail to fulfill this “primary obligation” of autonomy.

This primary obligation dooms any attempt to develop a theory of political obligation, Wolff argues, except in the highly unlikely case of a direct democracy in which every law has the unanimous approval of the citizenry. Under any other form of government, autonomy and authority are simply incompatible. Authority is “the right to command, and correlatively, the right to be obeyed” (p. 4), which entails that anyone subject to authority has an obligation to obey those who have the right to be obeyed. But if we acknowledge such an authority, we allow someone else to rule us, thereby violating our fundamental obligation to act autonomously. We must therefore reject the claim that we have an obligation to obey the orders of those who purport to hold authority over us and conclude that there can be no general obligation to obey the laws of any polity that falls short of a unanimous direct democracy.

Arguments of the second, a posteriori form are more modest in their aims but no less devastating in their conclusions. In this case the aim is not to show that a satisfactory defense of political obligation is impossible but that no defense has proven satisfactory, despite the efforts of some of the best minds in the history of philosophy. All such attempts have failed, according to those who take this line, so we must conclude that only those relatively few people who have explicitly committed themselves to obey the law, perhaps by swearing allegiance as part of an oath of citizenship, have anything like a general obligation to obey the laws under which they live (e.g., Smith 1973; Raz 1979, chap. 12; Simmons 1979 and 2001, chap. 6; Green 1988, pp. 220-47, and 1996).

3.2 Against Philosophical Anarchism

Whether a priori or a posteriori, the arguments of the philosophical anarchists pose a serious challenge to those who continue to believe in a general obligation to obey the law. This challenge is made especially difficult by the powerful objections that Simmons and other a posteriori anarchists have brought against the existing theories of political obligation. The most effective response, of course, would be to demonstrate that one's favored theory does not succumb to these objections, and we shall briefly consider attempts to respond in this fashion in the following section. Some general attempts to refute philosophical anarchism ought to be noted first, however.

Some of these attempts apply specifically to Wolff's a priori attack on political authority and obligation, while others apply to philosophical anarchism in general. The arguments against Wolff usually concentrate on his conception of autonomy and its relation to authority. In brief, Wolff's critics argue that he is wrong to insist that moral autonomy is our “primary” or “fundamental obligation,” for this would require us “to think that autonomy will always over-ride values such as not harming other people, supporting loved ones, doing a favour for a friend or even more mundane desires, such as that for a quiet life, with which this ideal of moral autonomy will from time to time conflict” (Horton 1992, p. 129). Moreover, there is no reason to accept Wolff's claim that autonomy and authority are necessarily incompatible. Insofar as autonomy is a capacity, as Wolff says, it will need to be developed before it can be exercised, and various kinds of authority — including political authority — will foster its development and make its continued exercise possible (Dagger 1997, pp. 66-68). Nor is it clear how Wolff can reject political authority without also rejecting promises and contracts as illegitimate constraints on one's autonomy — a problem that leads even Simmons to judge Wolff's a priori philosophical anarchism a “failed attempt” (2001, p. 111).

Critics have responded to philosophical anarchism in general in various ways, including the disparate complaints that it is a kind of false or hypocritical radicalism (Gans) and that it is all too genuine a threat to political order (Senor; Horton 2006/07, “Part Two”). The latter complaint has both an ontological and a conceptual aspect. That is, the critics argue that philosophical anarchists fail to appreciate the social or embedded nature of human beings, which leads the anarchists to conceive of obligation in excessively individualistic or voluntaristic terms — which leads, in turn, to their denial of a general obligation to obey the law. The problem, however, is that it is a mistake to think “that political life is left more or less unchanged by dispensing with some conception of political obligation and adopting the perspective of philosophical anarchism. Unless it can be shown that we can continue to talk intelligibly and credibly of our government or our state, then a radical rethinking of our political relations is an unavoidable consequence” (Horton 1992, p. 135). Whether the philosophical anarchists are willing to accept that consequence — and perhaps to become anarchists proper — or whether they can find a way to stop short of it thus becomes a major point of contention.

In the end, of course, the best response to philosophical anarchists, especially those of the a posteriori kind, will be to produce or defend a theory of political obligation that proves to be immune to their objections. At present, though, no single theory has the support of all of those who continue to believe in political obligation, let alone the assent of philosophical anarchists. Several theories remain in contention, however, as the next section will attest.

4. Contemporary Theories of Political Obligation

Although the lines that separate one theory from another are not always distinct, philosophical justifications of political obligation nowadays usually take the form of arguments from consent, gratitude, fair play, membership, or natural duty. Some philosophers advance a hybrid of two or more of these approaches, and others hold, as the concluding section shows, that a pluralistic theory is necessary. For the most part, though, those who believe that it is possible to justify a general obligation to obey the law will rely on one of these five lines of argument.

4.1 Consent

Most people who believe they have an obligation to obey the law probably think that this putative obligation is grounded in their consent. Political philosophers are less inclined to think this way, however, in light of the withering criticism to which Hume and more recent writers — notably A. John Simmons (1979, chaps. 3 and 4) — have subjected consent theory. The critics' claim is not that consent cannot be a source of obligations, for they typically believe it can. The claim, instead, is that too few people have given the kind of express or actual consent that can ground a general obligation to obey the law, and neither hypothetical nor tacit consent will supply the defect, for reasons already canvassed.

Nevertheless, consent theory still has its adherents among political philosophers. Their versions of consent theory vary considerably, however, with two main approaches emerging in response to the criticisms. One, advanced by Harry Beran ( 1987), accepts the claim that only express consent can generate a political obligation, but calls for political societies to establish formal procedures for evoking such consent. That is, states should require their members openly to undertake an obligation to obey the law or to refuse to do so. Those who decline the obligation will then have the options of leaving the state, seceding to form a new state with like-minded people, or taking residence in a territory within the state reserved for dissenters. In the absence of such procedures, it seems that Beran's position is roughly the same as that of the a posteriori philosophical anarchist. Were these procedures in place, though, it is far from clear that the options available to the members will make their “consent” truly voluntary (Horton 1992, pp. 33-36; Klosko 2005, pp. 123-29).

Other philosophers who adhere to consent theory argue in one way or another that the critics construe “consent” too narrowly. Thus John Plamenatz (1968, Postscript) and Peter Steinberger (2004, p. 218) have maintained that voting or otherwise participating in elections should count as consent; and Steinberger produces a lengthy list of fairly ordinary activities — calling the police or fire department for help, sending children to a public school, using a public library, and more — that constitute “active participation in the institutions of the state” (2004, pp. 219-20). Mark Murphy and Margaret Gilbert have sounded variations on this theme by arguing, in Murphy's case, that “surrender of judgment is a kind of consent” (in Edmundson 1999, p. 320), or, in Gilbert's, that “joint commitment” is an important source of obligations, including political obligations (1993, 2006). For Murphy, surrender of judgment is consent in the usual sense of voluntary agreement or acceptance. As he says, “One consents to another in a certain sphere of conduct in the acceptance sense of consent when one allows the other's practical judgments to take the place of his or her own with regard to that sphere of conduct. (This consent may be either to a person or to a set of rules: both of these can be authoritative)” (1999, p. 330). Gilbert differs from Murphy and others in taking a joint commitment to be something that need not arise voluntarily. According to her theory, “an understanding of joint commitment and a readiness to be jointly committed are necessary if one is to accrue political obligations, as is common knowledge of these in the population in question. One can, however, fulfil these conditions without prior deliberation or decision, and if one has deliberated, one may have had little choice but to incur them” (2006, p. 290). Indeed, membership in a “plural subject” formed through nonvoluntary joint commitments plays such a large part in Gilbert's theory that it may be better to place her with those who advocate an “associative” theory of political obligation than with the adherents of consent theory.

At this time there is little reason to believe that the critics of consent theory will be won over by these attempts to revive the theory by broadening our understanding of what counts as consent. There is even less reason, however, to believe that appeals to consent will simply wither away, at least among those who continue to believe in the existence of a general obligation to obey the law.

4.2 Gratitude

To move from consent to gratitude is to move from the most to the least popular foundation for a theory of political obligation. That is not to say that those who believe in political obligations seldom appeal to gratitude. To the contrary, the appeal is both long-standing — appearing some 2500 years ago in Plato's Crito, as we have seen — and widespread. The point is that it is rarely the sole or even primary basis for an attempt to justify the obligation to obey the law. Plato's account of Socrates' reasoning is typical in this regard, with gratitude but one of at least four considerations that Socrates relies on in explaining why he will not disobey the ruling of the jury that sentenced him to death. (For more recent examples, see Simmons 1979, pp. 162-63.) When Simmons included a chapter on the weakness of gratitude as a foundation for political obligation in his influential Moral Principles and Political Obligations (1979), in fact, there was no gratitude theory on which to concentrate his criticism.

That situation changed within a decade when A. D. M. Walker sketched such a theory in “Political Obligation and the Argument from Gratitude.” Walker's argument takes the following form (1988, p. 205):

  1. The person who benefits from X has an obligation of gratitude not to act contrary to X's interests.
  2. Every citizen has received benefits from the state.
  3. Every citizen has an obligation of gratitude not to act in ways that are contrary to the state's interests.
  4. Noncompliance with the law is contrary to the state's interests.
  5. Every citizen has an obligation of gratitude to comply with the law.

Whether this argument does indeed provide the basis for a satisfactory theory of political obligation seems to turn on two points. First, are obligations of gratitude at all pertinent where political institutions are concerned? Walker holds that one may have an obligation of gratitude not only to other persons but also to institutions, including the state or polity; but critics such as Simmons disagree (1979, pp. 187-88; Wellman and Simmons, pp. 119-20). Gratitude is owed only to those who intentionally and at significant cost to themselves provide us with benefits, according to Simmons, and institutions cannot satisfy these conditions. The second point concerns the strength of obligations of gratitude. That is, one may grant that we can have obligations to institutions, including the state, yet hold that these obligations are “too weak to function as prima facie political obligations in the usual sense,” for they “would be overridden frequently, not just in unusual circumstances” (Klosko 1989, p. 355). Walker, in response, points to Socrates as someone who obviously thought his obligation of gratitude was very strong indeed, and concludes that we “can afford to acknowledge that the extent of our indebtedness to the state is less than his, while still insisting that it grounds a strong, though not absolute, obligation of gratitude to comply with the law” (1989, p. 364).

4.3 Fair Play

Although earlier philosophers, including Socrates, appealed to something resembling the principle of fairness (or fair play), the classic formulation of the principle is the one H. L. A. Hart gave it in “Are There Any Natural Rights?” As Hart there says, “when a number of persons conduct any joint enterprise according to rules and thus restrict their liberty, those who have submitted to these restrictions when required have a right to a similar submission from those who have benefited by their submission” (1955, p. 185). John Rawls subsequently adopted this principle in an influential essay of his own, referring to the duty derived from the principle as the “duty of fair play” (1964). What the principle of fair play holds, then, is that everyone who participates in a reasonably just, mutually beneficial cooperative practice — Hart's “joint enterprise according to rules” — has an obligation to bear a fair share of the burdens of the practice. This obligation is owed to the others who cooperate in the enterprise, for cooperation is what makes it possible for any individual to enjoy the benefits of the practice. Anyone who acts as a free rider is acting wrongly, then, even if his or her shirking does not directly threaten the existence or success of the endeavor. Those who participate in the practice thus have rights against as well as obligations to one another: a right to require others to bear their share of the burdens and an obligation to bear one's share in turn.

The principle of fair play applies to a political society only if that society can reasonably be regarded as a cooperative enterprise. If it can, the members of the polity have an obligation of fair play to do their part in maintaining the enterprise. Because the rule of law is necessary to the maintenance of such a polity — and perhaps even constitutive of it — the principal form of cooperation is abiding by the law. In the absence of overriding considerations, then, the members of the polity qua cooperative practice must honor their obligation to one another to obey the laws. In this way the principle of fair play provides the grounding for a general obligation to obey the law, at least on the part of those whose polity is reasonably regarded as a cooperative enterprise.

The argument from fair play has met with serious criticism, however, including that of Rawls, who abandoned fair play as an account of political obligation for citizens generally in A Theory of Justice (p. 97, p. 308). The critics have brought forward three particular criticisms. The most sweeping is that of Robert Nozick, who objects that the principle of fair play would allow others to place us under an obligation to them simply by conferring benefits on us (1974, pp. 90-95). To make his point, Nozick imagines a group of neighbors creating a public entertainment system and assigning every adult in the neighborhood a day on which he or she is responsible for planning and broadcasting the program. As a resident of the neighborhood, you occasionally hear and enjoy the programs, but you never consent to take part in this scheme. When your assigned day arrives, are you obligated to take a turn? The principle of fair play says yes, according to Nozick, but the correct answer is “surely not.”

The second objection, raised by M. B. E. Smith, is that “the obligation of fair play governs a man's actions only when some benefit or harm turns on whether he obeys” (in Edmundson 1999, p. 81). This implies that the principle of fair play will generate an obligation to cooperate only when the cooperative enterprise is small enough that any participant's failure to obey the rules could reasonably be expected to damage the enterprise. Political societies are not small, cooperative enterprises, however, and we can readily think of cases in which someone's disobedience neither deprives anyone of any benefits nor harms the polity in any noticeable way. It follows, then, that the principle of fair play cannot ground a general obligation to obey the law, however useful it may be in other circumstances.

Those who raise the third objection agree that considerations of fairness sometimes do generate obligations, but they insist, like Smith, that these considerations do not obtain in the political context. In this case, however, the complaint is that fair play considerations apply only to cooperative schemes that produce benefits one may refuse. If it produces nonexcludable goods, which everyone receives regardless of whether she contributed to their production or even wants them, then there can be no fair-play obligation to bear a share of the burdens of the enterprise. But this is typically the case in political societies, which produce goods such as public order and national defense that one cannot meaningfully refuse to accept. As Simmons puts it (1979, p. 129), there is a difference between receiving and accepting benefits, and receiving them is not enough to place someone under an obligation. If there is a political obligation, then, it cannot follow from the kind of nonexcludable goods that states provide.

As one might expect, advocates of the fair-play account have not remained silent in the face of these criticisms. The leading advocate, George Klosko, has written two books elaborating and defending the principle of fairness as the foundation of political obligation (1992, 2005), and it sometimes seems that every fresh attack on fair play provokes a swift response (e.g., Carr 2002 and Lefkowitz 2004). And the attacks have certainly continued (e.g., Simmons 2001, chap. 2; McDermott 2004). Perhaps the best that can be done to convey the present state of the debate is to indicate how fair-play advocates have responded to the three criticisms sketched above.

With regard to Nozick's objection, the response is usually to hold that his example of the neighborhood entertainment system is beside the point (Bell 1978). That is, Nozick is probably right to say that one would have no obligation to operate the system on his or her assigned day, but he is wrong to think fair play would require one to do so. There is no fair play obligation in cases such as this, either because the passive receipt of benefits is not enough to show that one is a participant in a cooperative practice (Dagger 1997, pp. 69-70) or because the benefits are “of relatively little value” (Klosko 1992, pp. 38-39). To Smith's objection, the response is that fairness is not a consideration only when harm or benefit to some person or practice is involved. To fail to do one's part in a cooperative enterprise is to wrong those who cooperate even when it does not clearly harm either them or the enterprise as such (Dagger 1997, p. 71). Finally, responses to Simmons' objection have taken two directions. One is to say that Simmons has drawn too sharp a distinction between the acceptance and receipt of benefits. Between the person who passively receives the benefits of a cooperative practice and the one who knowingly and willingly accepts them is the person — very many people, in fact — who actively participates in the practice without being fully aware, in the ordinary course of life, that he or she is undertaking an obligation to do his or her part by participating in a cooperative practice (Dagger 1997, pp. 73-78). Others respond to Simmons' criticism by denying that obligations must be incurred voluntarily (Arneson 1982; Klosko 1992, 39-57). What matters is not that one accepts the benefits of the practice, according to Klosko's influential account, but that three conditions are met: “Goods supplied must be (i) worth the recipients' effort in providing them; (ii) ‘presumptively beneficial’; and (iii) have benefits and burdens that are fairly distributed” (1992, p. 39). If, in sum, a state may be reasonably regarded as a cooperative enterprise, and if it provides its members with goods that are presumptively beneficial — or “indispensable for satisfactory lives” (Klosko 2005, p. 6) — then its members have an obligation grounded in fairness to obey its laws.

4.4 Membership or Association

A fourth attempt to ground a general obligation to obey the law has emerged in the last twenty years or so in the form of the “membership” or “associative” theory. According to the proponents of this theory, political obligation is best understood as an associative obligation grounded in membership. If we are members of a group, then we are under an obligation, ceteris paribus, to comply with the norms that govern it. Nor does this obligation follow from our consenting to become members, for it holds even in the case of groups or associations, such as families and polities, that people typically do not consent to join. Voluntary or not, membership entails obligation. Anyone who acknowledges membership in a particular polity must therefore acknowledge that he or she has a general obligation to obey its laws.

At the core of the associative approach is the idea is that political obligation is a form of non-voluntary obligation on a par with familial obligations. In Ronald Dworkin's words, “Political association, like family and friendship and other forms of association more local and intimate, is in itself pregnant of obligation” (1986, p. 206). The same idea, with an explicit analogy between family and polity, is at work in John Horton's account of political obligation:

My claim is that a polity is, like the family, a relationship into which we are mostly born: and that the obligations which are constitutive of the relationship do not stand in need of moral justification in terms of a set of basic moral principles or some comprehensive moral theory. Furthermore, both the family and the political community figure prominently in our sense of who we are: our self-identity and our understanding of our place in the world (1992, pp. 150-51).

As members of families and political communities, on this view, we are subject to what Michael Hardimon calls “noncontractual role obligations” — that is, obligations that simply flow from “roles into which we are born” (1994, p. 347).

The associative account of political obligation has at least three attractive features. The first is the refusal of its proponents to treat ‘voluntary’ and ‘involuntary’ as two parts of a dichotomy. It is true, they say, that most people do not voluntarily undertake to become members of a polity, but that hardly means that membership has been forced or imposed on them. There is a middle ground, and it is fertile soil for a theory of political obligation, just as it is for those who believe that being a member of a family entails obligations that we have neither chosen, on the one hand, nor incurred against our will, on the other. A second attraction of the associative account is that it squares with a common intuition, as a great many people apparently do think of themselves as members of political societies who have an obligation to obey their polities' laws. This intuition, moreover, points to the third attractive feature, which is the way in which the obligation to obey the laws grows out of the sense of identity that members of a polity commonly share. If this is my polity, and I find myself thinking of its concerns as something that we members share, and its government as our government, then it will be easy to think also that I have an obligation to obey its laws. For Yael Tamir, in fact, “the true essence of associative obligations” is that they “are not grounded on consent, reciprocity, or gratitude, but rather on a feeling of belonging or connectedness” (Tamir, p, 137).

Like the other theories of political obligation, however, the membership account has met with considerable criticism, with three main objections being raised (Simmons 1996; Wellman 1997; Dagger 2000). First, the critics maintain that the analogy between the polity and the family is neither persuasive nor attractive. It is unpersuasive because the members of the modern polity lack the close and intimate relationships with one another that family members typically share; and it is unattractive because it raises the possibility that the paternalism appropriate within the family may be extended to the polity. Second, the critics object that the associative account conflates the sense of obligation with obligation itself. As Wolff and other philosophical anarchists have argued, the fact that many people feel a sense of identity with and obligation to their countries does not mean that they really have such an obligation; nor need one be a philosophical anarchist to share this conclusion. Finally, there is the problem of what may be called group character. All groups have members, including groups that are not decent, fair, or morally praiseworthy; but if membership is sufficient to generate an obligation to obey, then the members of unjust and exploitative groups will have an obligation to obey the rules. In the case of the polity, this leads to the unpalatable and counter-intuitive conclusion that the routinely exploited and oppressed “members” of an unjust polity are under an obligation to obey its laws.

Can the proponents of the associative theory meet or overcome these objections? That, of course, remains a matter of debate, with the latest round being Horton's vigorous response to the critics in his two-part “In Defence of Associative Political Obligations” (Horton 2006/07).

4.5 Natural Duty

The final contender in the political obligation debates is an approach that follows John Rawls in distinguishing obligations from natural duties. As noted earlier, Rawls believes that a person must do something to acquire an obligation, such as make a promise or sign a contract, whereas natural duties “apply to us without regard to our voluntary acts” (1999, p. 98). One implication of this distinction is that most people have no general obligation to obey the laws of their polity, for they have not done what is necessary to incur such an obligation. Everyone, however, is subject to the natural duty of justice, which “requires us to support and to comply with just institutions that exist and apply to us” (1999, p. 99), and this duty takes the place, for Rawls, of political obligation. As he says, “there are several ways in which one may be bound to political institutions. For the most part the natural duty of justice is the more fundamental, since it binds citizens generally and requires no voluntary acts in order to apply” (1999, p. 100).

To find the Rawlsian natural-duty approach to political obedience (if not obligation) persuasive, one will have to agree that there is a natural duty of justice that entails a duty to support and comply with just institutions that apply to us. Agreeing to that does not require acceptance of the contractual reasoning through which Rawls defines the natural duties, but such acceptance will certainly help. A difficult problem remains, however, even if we grant the existence of a natural duty to support and comply with just institutions. This problem is that the natural-duty approach runs afoul of what Simmons calls “the particularity requirement” that any attempt to solve the problem of political obligation must satisfy: “that we are only interested in those moral requirements [including obligations and duties] which bind an individual to one particular political community, set of political institutions, etc.” (1979, p. 31; emphasis in original). We may have a natural duty to support and comply with just institutions, in other words, but that duty does not confine us to supporting and complying with any particular just institution. If I, a citizen of the United States, find that my country and Canada are both just polities, then I have a natural duty to support Canadian institutions that is apparently as strong as my duty to support those of the U.S. But in that case there seems to be no special bond between me and the institutions of my country (Dworkin 1986, 193). Yet it is that kind of special bond, as Simmons points out (1979, pp. 155-56), that theories of political obligation are supposed to provide.

Defenders of the natural-duty approach have tried to show, in response, that there is something about the relationship between a person and her country that establishes a special political bond — some sense in which its institutions “apply” to her in a way that the institutions of other political societies, no matter how just, do not. Thus Jeremy Waldron draws a distinction between “insiders” and “outsiders” that “explains much of the specialness of an individual's relation to the institutions of his own country, at least so far as moral requirement is concerned” (in Edmundson 1999, p. 284). A New Zealander, to use his example, has the special insider relation to the laws of New Zealand because those laws “have been set up precisely to address the question of the rights and duties of someone in his position vis-à-vis his fellow New Zealanders” (ibid., p. 284). Because they “apply” to him in a way they cannot apply to a citizen of another country, the example shows how the appeal to natural duty can handle the problem of particularity or special allegiance.

Christopher Heath Wellman makes a similar move in his attempt to derive political obligation from “samaritanism.” The duty to be a good samaritan is a natural duty, on his account, because it “does not depend upon a previous transaction or preexisting association between the rescuer and the rescuee; if a person is sufficiently imperiled and one can save her at no unreasonable cost, one cannot justify one's failure to rescue by pointing out that one never agreed to do so or that one had no morally significant relationship with her …” (2005, p. 36) Wellman then goes on to argue that “legal obedience is required as one's fair share of helping to rescue others from peril” (2005, p. 45), including the “political peril … [that] is fundamentally a coordination problem” (2005, p. 38; emphasis in original). Wellman admits that samaritanism by itself cannot explain how a person may have special ties to his compatriots or country, but he does claim that it leads to an obligation to obey the laws of the particular state in which one resides. In that respect, at least, his theory aims to overcome the particularity problem.

Once again, however, the critics are proving stubborn, as Simmons' recent lengthy critique of natural-duty arguments attests (Wellman and Simmons 2005, pp. 121-88). Even a sympathetic critic may wonder whether the natural-duty approach relies implicitly, and especially where the particularity requirement is concerned, on arguments borrowed from other theories. Both Waldron and Wellman draw on the fair-play approach, for example, as when Wellman suggests “that we understand our political obligations as our fair share of the communal samaritan chore of rescuing others from the perils of the state of nature” (2005, p. 33). Which, in the end, is doing the argumentative work here, natural duty or fair play?

5. Conclusion: A Plurality of Principles?

One response to this question might be to say that both concepts are at work, and a good thing that they are, for no one concept or principle by itself can ground a satisfactory theory of political obligation. In fact, that is a response that a number of philosophers have made, either implicitly or explicitly, in recent years. Gilbert (2006) and Steinberger (2004), for example, seem to have developed hybrid theories without ever advertising them as such. Gilbert's theory fuses the consent and associative approaches through her reliance on joint commitments to a plural subject, or group. For his part, Steinberger combines the consent and natural-duty approaches, arguing that any “generalized attempt to divorce obligations from natural duties, to find justifications for the former that are entirely independent of the latter, is … doomed to fail” (2004, p. 211).

Others, notably Klosko (2006) and Jonathan Wolff (1995, 2000), have explicitly called for a pluralistic or multiple-principle approach to political obligation. There is no single answer to the problem of political obligation, as they see it, because the problem has more than one aspect. Not every “member” of a polity will stand in the same relation to its laws, for instance, which means that it is a mistake to think that everyone must have the same general obligation to obey. Nor is every obligation of equal force. Some are weak, such as the notorious obligation to stop at a traffic signal when no one else is around, and others are quite strong. Klosko thus thinks it necessary to rely on the principle of fairness to supply the core of a justification, but to supplement it with appeals to natural duty and the common good (2006, chap. 5).

As yet there has been little reaction to these attempts to fuse approaches and draw on multiple principles in the attempt to provide a satisfactory theory of political obligation. Those who doubt that such a theory can be constructed, however, are likely to say that combining principles, whether in hybrid or pluralist fashion, will not help, for putting together a set of principles that are weak and unsatisfactory individually will hardly produce a strong and satisfying theory. On the other hand, those who believe that political obligation is fundamentally a problem of showing that those who live in a polity governed by the rule of law do indeed have a general obligation to obey its laws (Mapel, 2005), are likely to see no need for a plurality of principles to make their case. Whether a plurality of principles is necessary, in sum, remains one of many open questions about political obligation.


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authority | autonomy: in moral and political philosophy | civil disobedience | consequentialism | Hobbes, Thomas | Hume, David | legal obligation and authority | Locke, John | Rawls, John | social contract: contemporary approaches to