Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Privacy and Medicine

First published Wed May 13, 2009

Individuals, institutions and governments practice and value medical privacy (Beauchamp and Childress 2008; Humber and Almeder 2001; Englehardt 2000b). They try to limit access to health information, respect medical autonomy, and honor expectations of modesty, intimacy, bodily integrity, and self-ownership (Allen 2004; Winslade 2004).

First, individuals commonly keep health concerns to themselves, whether out of personal taste, reserve, etiquette, fear or shame (Rosenberg 2000; Buss 1980; Westin 1967). When they share sensitive health concerns with others, most individuals employ culturally appropriate discretion and reserve (Nissenbaum 2004; Goffman 1959, 1963 ). Because of such privacy practices, families, friends, employers, researchers and government may not acquire all the medical information they want, when they want it (Currie 2005; Allen 2003b; Etzioni 2000). The practical ability of individuals to control and protect their own health privacy is partly a function of their social-economic position (Marx 2007). Children, along with adults who are mentally incompetent, dependent on government entitlement programs or incarcerated, lack substantial control over medical privacy.

Second, many medical professionals, hospitals, insurers and other entities with access to health information regard maintaining the confidentiality of medical communications and the security of medical records as paramount professional responsibilities (IOM 1994, 2000; Lowrance 1997). This sensibility extends to mental health and pharmacy records. Moreover, health care providers and medical researchers generally seek to accommodate patients' reasonable expectations of privacy (Allen 2004).

Third, societies impose major privacy and private choice-related legal obligations on their members (Solove 2004, 2008; Westin 1967). Legal obligations of privacy bind citizens to one another and also bind health care providers, insurers, health-data processors, health researchers, public health officials and government (CDT 2009, in Other Internet Resources; DHHS 2009; GAO 2001). Thus in a number of legal systems, disclosing a private medical fact or breaching medical confidentiality can result in civil liability (Solove 2007; EPIC 2006; Rotenberg 2004). The law imposes obligations to respect informational privacy (e.g., confidentiality, anonymity, secrecy and data security); physical privacy (e.g., modesty and bodily integrity); associational privacy (e.g. intimate sharing of death, illness and recovery); proprietary privacy (e.g., self-ownership and control over personal identifiers, genetic data, and body tissues); and decisional privacy (e.g., autonomy and choice in medical decision-making) (Allen 2003a; 2007).

1. Informational Privacy

This section will highlight philosophical issues relating to informational privacy and medicine. In medical contexts, the “privacy” at issue is very often “confidentiality” (DeCew 2000). Health care professionals acknowledge ethical duties to keep medical information private (APA 2002; AAMFT 2001; APhA 1994). Physicians, nurses, hospitals, pharmacists, and insurers are required by law and professional codes to practice confidentiality. Since the 1990's, in policy discussions of health policy and reform, concerns about confidentiality have often been prominent (Sharpe 2005; Schwartz 1990).

1.1 Confidentiality

“Privacy” in medicine often denotes the confidentiality of patient-provider encounters, along with the secrecy and security of data contained in records created as a consequence of patient-provider encounters (DeCew 2000). Confidentiality is defined as restricting information to persons belonging to a set of specifically authorized recipients (Allen 1997, 1988; Kenny 1982). Confidentiality can be achieved through professional silence and secure data management (Sharpe 2005; Baer 2002). Hence Sissela Bok characterized confidentiality as referring “to the boundaries surrounding shared secrets and to the process of guarding these boundaries” (Bok 1982, p. 119).

Philosophers tend to agree that health is a vital component of human flourishing (Moore 2005; Roessler 2004; Rosenberg 2000; Schoeman 1984; Boone 1983). They also tend to agree that a just society will be committed to securing the material and political bases of public health (Powers and Faden 2008). Philosophers of medicine, ethicists and bioethicists tend to agree that, with a handful of exceptions, respecting patient confidentiality benefits both individual and public health (Kamoie and Hodge 2004). They defend the practice of confidentiality, by diverse appeals to utility, dignity and virtue (Easter et al. 2004).

Philosophers defend confidentiality on several utilitarian or other consequentialist grounds (Frey 2000; Hare 1993; Freedman 1978). They argue that preventive medicine, early diagnosis and treatment save human lives and money. Individuals will be more inclined to get medical attention if they believe they can do so privately. Policy experts maintain that the cost of health care and insurance would be considerably higher if people avoided routine check-ups and prompt medical attention because confidentiality was not credibly promised (Fairfield 2007). Confidentiality practices are believed to promote both seeking care and frank disclosures of health concerns in the context of care. Symptoms of illness and decline, such as incontinence, memory loss, or hallucinations can be embarrassing to talk about, even with sympathetic professional clinicians. Promises of confidentiality can make persons more willing to participate in health research (Easter 2004).

Medical confidentiality promotes medical autonomy, by sheltering those seeking morally controversial medical care from outside criticism and interference with decisions (Dworkin 2007; Englehardt 2000a; Feinberg 1983). Patients seeking abortion or fertility treatments might not wish others to know their plans. Members of the general public have from time to time attempted to influence choices strangers make relating to the care of disabled infants, kin in comas, and abortions. Spouses, parents and siblings have sought involvement, with arguably greater moral warrant. H. J. McCloskey suggested that loving personal relationships call for mutual accountability (McCloskey 1971). Of course some health problems—morbid obesity, scoliosis, paralysis — simply cannot be concealed from intimates. Bioethicists commonly argue that hidden contagious conditions should not be concealed from vulnerable associates and in extreme cases could justify non-voluntary public health quarantine.

Philosophers have also offered deontological grounds for respecting informational privacy (Benn 1988). Informational privacy promotes respect for human dignity, philosophers have said. Caregivers display concern for moral persons with rational interests and feelings of their own when they keep information about their health and health needs private (Freedman 1978).

Individuals concerned about discrimination, shame or stigma have an interest in controlling the flow of information about their health, and arguably the moral right to do so. Mental and other behavioral health-care consumers continue to face stigma and discrimination in a world in which getting what they need requires a virtual surrender of confidentiality to a bevy of other people, including family members, doctors, social workers, teachers, hospitals, insurers, and law enforcement (APA 2002; AAMFT 2001; Dickson 1998).

Notions of moral fairness play into arguments for confidentiality. Confidentiality is arguably required by fair relations with government and businesses (Workplace Fairness, 2009, Other Internet Resources). Since “knowledge is power,” special concerns have been raised about the manner in which government collects and manages personal medical information. Pervasive ideals of fair information practices require that personal data collected about individuals be accurate, secure and disclosed to third-parties only with consent. Some patients believe they own personal information about themselves, and that is it only fair that they, not others, control its release. They may believe they own medical information because they have purchased medical services (Martin 1981, pp. 624–25). Or they may believe they own medical information, especially genetic information, because it reveals information of a highly personal and unique sort (Laurie 2000; Rothstein 1997).

Philosophers have identified duties of welfare promotion, care, dignity and fairness to support the case for privacy and confidentiality (Schoeman 1984). Virtue ethics suggests its own set of grounds for informational privacy in health care. Jennifer Radden has argued that the special vulnerability of mental health patients and the stigma attached to their problems turns confidentiality into a particular brand of excellence for mental health care practitioners (Radden 2004). She has argued that the demand for confidentiality in psychiatric medicine is inadequately accounted for on theories that fail to take into account the virtues of trust and reserve that are hallmarks of mental health care.

In the context of health research, ethics committees and institutional review boards impose ethical obligations on researchers to protect the confidentiality of research subjects and the medical records (Fisher 2006; Hiatt 2003; IOM 2000 Dahl 1997;). The obligation of confidentiality may require the use of “identifiers” rather than names or “de-identification” procedures such as data aggregation (Fefferman 2005). Researchers may need to publish genomic data in ways calculated to obscure the identities of whole families. Patient confidentiality can be compromised in the setting of medical lectures and ground rounds, and in the publication and archiving of medical lectures, scholarly articles and personal papers. The question of whether there are privacy concerns when only statistical use is made of individuals' health data has arisen. It has been argued that individuals, have an interest in the uses to which data sets that include their data is put, even if they are not personally identified by researchers (Newcombe 1994).

Privacy theorists caution that deprivation of privacy can amount to injustice and inhumanity (Gandy 1993). Most privacy theorists focus on the harms that stem from invading the privacy people value. Theorists have begun also to consider the harms that stem from voluntary self-disclosure. Individuals freely disclose medical and other sensitive information about themselves. They do it in published memoirs, on social networking sites and on webpages devoted to illnesses, medical procedures, prescription medications, and alternative medicine. Women have webcast childbirth and mastectomy, citing public health education goals (Allen 2000).

Privacy is not typically defended as an absolute good (Hixson 1987; Boone 1983; Louch 1982; Pennock 1971; Negley 1966). Confidentiality, for example, is seldom described as an absolute good in health care (Bok 1982). Philosophers recommend major exceptions to the practice of confidentiality. First, all health care providers and responsible adults should be obligated to report evidence of child neglect and abuse, such as multiple unexplained fractures and malnutrition (Dixson 1998). Second, mental health providers and others have an ethical duty to warn police or potential victims of mentally disturbed patients' violent intentions (Gates 1999). These exceptions reflect a belief that avoiding physical injury to third parties is more important than invariably deferring to patients' preferences, sparing their feelings and preserving their trust in relationships. Important philosophical questions arise about the extent of “Good Samaritan duties ”duties, whistle-blowing obligations and the duty to warn in health care settings. Ascribing such duties potentially infringes the liberty persons otherwise enjoy to act and refrain from acting as they see fit so long as they do not affirmatively harm others. Arguably the person who declines to help or warn is not the responsible cause of the abuse and violence that befalls others.

Third, there may be situations in which medical confidentiality should not be protected because the public has a right to know or the media has a right to publish. Dramatic medical rescues of automobile accident victims are understandably newsworthy events. It has been argued that the public has a right to know about public officials' serious medical problems, perhaps more than authorities have typically disclosed (Robbins and Rothschild 1988). In the United States, lawyers and grand juries have the authority to subpoena medical information for use in legal proceedings and investigations, placing highly sensitive medical information at risk of public disclosure (Wolf 2006).

1.2 Secrecy

Sissela Bok defined secrecy as intentional concealment (Bok 1982). Secrecy practices loom large in health care. Some people do not share the knowledge of medical symptoms even with their closest friends and family members. A person may secretly know he or she is ill before he or she admits it to family members or consults a physician. Reluctance to share knowledge of medical symptoms with associates or kin and medical professionals may stem from fear of disability or death; avoidance of discrimination in insurance, employment and education; or dread of social stigma, shame, embarrassment or rejection. Questions have arisen about the obligations of dentists and other health care providers to refrain from secrecy and disclose their HIV positive status to patients. Fertility patients may want to conceal the fact of infertility or the use of donated sperm or eggs, due to the social and religious consequences of disclosure (Birenbaum-Carmeli et al. 2000).

Paternalistic secrecy is a major feature of medical practice, more prevalent in some countries, communities and families than others. Moral ideals of autonomy and agency argue for informing patients of their medical conditions, truthfully and fully. Yet, medical news is sometimes deliberately kept from patients. The adult children of a 95 year old woman might think it unduly cruel to reveal the diagnosis of operable bowel cancer when she would be better able to cope with the fib that she has benign diverticulitis. The parents of a young child might think it kind-hearted to conceal his terminal leukemia from him, on the ground that he is too young to understand death. Some moralists would agree. Yet if deception is categorically wrong, then secrecy about medical adversity would surely be unethical.

It is common –though much less common than it once was — to paternalistically withhold medical knowledge as a secret; but there is no guarantee that patients will believe medical truths or diagnoses squarely placed before them by qualified physicians. Denial of unpleasant truths is commonplace. Self-deception is a powerful phenomenon. Some people believe refusing to accept illness by maintaining a positive attitude will shield them from illness. Mental disorders can trick one into thinking one is happy and insightful, rather than the manic, delusional person the psychiatrist diagnoses.

Certain medical procedures are commonly shrouded in secrecy. People keep secret the fact of their elective vanity cosmetic procedures, medically indicated sex reassignment surgery, abortions, fertility treatments, and sterilizations. Another kind of secrecy practiced in medicine is the concealment of surgical wounds and scars. Cosmetic surgeons hide cars inside hairlines and in the creases behind the ears. Breast cancer is no longer the cause for secrecy it once was, yet reconstruction surgery following mastectomy is a kind of concealment. The lure of minimally invasive laparoscopic surgery is both that is may reduce the length of hospital stays and the risk of infection; but also that it leaves less prominent and visible scars.

Neuroimaging and advanced lie-detection raise critical questions about whether secrets should be available for discernment, and if so under what circumstances. The issue is one of coerced self-disclosure and, potentially, self-incrimination. The right against self-incrimination has been defended by philosophers since the dawn of modernity. Thomas Hobbes named it as one of the few rights a citizen has against his sovereign.

1.3 Data Protection and Security

The moral significance attached to medical privacy is reflected in data protection and security laws adopted by local and national authorities around the world. The point of these laws is to regulate the collection, quality, storing, sharing and retention of health data (CDT 2009, in Other Internet Resources). Health privacy statutes limit disclosure in the absence of informed consent; but typical statutes recognize numerous exceptions for routine uses, research, public health reporting, and legal process and law enforcement. The policy consensus seems to be that, while medical privacy is important, patients' medical information may be disclosed to third-parties for socially important purposes unrelated to their own care.

Some jurisdictions have special rules for management of certain health information. Data regarding HIV/AIDS, mental health and genetics are afforded special treatment in U.S. law, for example. Philosophers ponder whether particular conditions merit such exceptionalism. The argument for HIV/AIDS exceptionalism recalls the early days of the global epidemic when knowledge of the illness was poor, treatment was ineffective, and social stigma attached to affliction. The argument for mental health exceptionalism is that patients do and must “bare their souls” to mental and behavioral health providers, making disclosures socially costly (Radden 2004). A U.S. federal statute prohibits basing employment or health insurance decisions on information about a person's DNA or genetic predispositions (GINA 2008). The leading argument for genetic data exceptionalism appears to be that genetic data conveys detailed information about a person and her biological family. Genetic information foretells a person's future (Laurie 2002; Rothstein 1997).

The use of computer and electronic technology is described as a boon for health care delivery and administration (Burton 2004; National Research Council, 1991). Yet heightened concerns for privacy follow increased portability of health data (HIPAA 1996). The obligation to protect medical data held by the state or private companies has taken on a new urgency as more and more health data is being transmitted and stored electronically. It has been argued that information managers owe it to the public to prevent data breaches and to appropriately respond when a breach occurs. A data breach can result from the theft of a lap top; fraudulent or accidental access to data; sabotage by dishonest or disgruntled employees; or the loss of data storage devices. Major hospitals and health agencies have experienced highly publicized data breaches (Privacy Rights Clearing House, 2009, in Other Internet Resources). A philosophical question raised by data breaches is how to define and morally repair harm. Medical identity theft and public disclosure of private facts are generally regarded as “harms” (Biegelman 2009). But it has been argued that negligently causing increased risks of identity theft and public disclosure of private facts are harms, too. If risk amplification is harm, though, it is unclear what should count as fair compensation or moral repair.

1.4 Anonymity

Anonymity has value in a variety of public health and medical research contexts. Although a number of prominent scientists and lay people have made their genomes public, genetics research and scholarly publication standards call for protection of the identities of research subjects and their families. Concerns can arise about whether particular methods of anonymization adequately shield research subjects from invasion of privacy and breaches of confidentiality. The use of the anonymously deployed personal diary for learning about and assessing health-related behavior has become commonplace (Minichiello 2000). Research subjects are asked to record contraception use, condom use and other sexual practices in diaries which become research tools. Researchers must take care to warn research subjects about the dangers of disclosing information which could expose them to social or legal sanctions.

Anonymous HIV/AIDS testing has been controversial among ethicists. Anonymity has been defended on the ground that it encourages testing by individuals with concerns about when, whether and to whom to disclose their HIV/AIDS status (Fairchild 2007). Behavioral surveillance is recognized as a potentially useful component of protecting public health (Gallagher 2007); in some situations, anonymous testing could make tracking patterns of infection more difficult. Yet the case for individual privacy, confidentiality and anonymity in the context of a stigmatizing illness may be exceptionally strong, counterbalanced by a case for aggressive public health surveillance of severe illnesses without true cures (Burr 1999). It has been suggested that anonymous testing allows persons with AIDS to engage in dangerous, morally irresponsible behavior without accountability. Proponents of anonymous testing reply that policy-makers and ethicists should not assume that men and women who learn they are HIV positive on the basis of anonymous tests will egoistically conceal their status from sexual partners. Some individuals have knowingly imposed serious risks on others. But newly informed positive test-takers may responsibly notify past and future partners, refrain from risky behaviors, and seek medical care.

1.5 Accountability

Confidentiality thrives as a legal duty and institutional practice, despite the emergent trend towards voluntary openness about medical information. The specifics of health and medical care have become acceptable topics of ordinary conversation outside the family circle. In the U.S., public figures have taken the lead, speaking out about their AIDS, erectile dysfunction, dementia, Parkinson's disease, prostate enlargement and breast cancer. Disclosures that would have been considered indelicate or stigmatizing thirty years ago are made freely today, whether to pass the time, share concerns, educate the public, or endorse a pharmaceutical product.

To a noteworthy degree, openness is also compelled by morals and law. Medical accountability is a feature of modern life. In the wake of the AIDS epidemic, new levels of accountability among sexual partners gained public acceptance. World-wide, people are coming to think of minor and major contagious illnesses as conditions giving rise to public accountability. In Japan, it is now expected that people with cold and flu will wear surgical face masks to protect others from the spread of cold and flu viruses. International travelers entering Tokyo are politely invited to report symptoms of illness to officials. International visitors to Taipei have their body temperatures scanned for fever automatically as they proceed to customs. In the U.S., where hand-shaking is a common greeting, people with colds and flu are begging off from the custom out of regard for others' health.

Many people speak openly about health matters with strangers as a condition of receiving and paying for health care. For example, a family needing the assistance of a regional mental health/mental retardation agency unavoidably places reams of sensitive information in the hands of government. The same is true of a family which needs to apply for government benefits for aging or disabled kin. The more disclosures a family must make, the wider the circle of confidentiality and the lesser the medical privacy. Questions of distributive justice are raised by mandatory disclosures to government made as a condition of access to care. Poor and disabled persons dependent upon medical assistance from government have substantially less informational privacy vis-à-vis government than wealthy and healthy persons. The risks and burdens of state knowledge of the individual are disproportionately borne by the least well off segments of society.

1.6 Professional Norms

The duty of confidentiality is a core consensus norm within health care (Currie 2005). One important manifestation of this consensus in the U.S. has been the development to the “certificate of confidentiality” whereby researchers declare that confidentiality is of especial interest to their subjects. (Wolf 2006, 2004). The technological age has given rise to the call for health care providers, even those who work alone or in small groups, to be aggressive in the adoption of responsible information practices. All would agree that office practices can and should be designed to protect the identity of clients and the privacy of conversations. Common understandings are that practitioners should be judicious in the collection of information; they should store treatment notes and records in a secure manner; they should share information only with consent or as required by law; and they should protect sensitive information in its online and off-line forms using locks, passwords, encryption and other appropriate devices. Sensitive information that is no longer needed should not be retained indefinitely.

Health-care providers are ascribed ethical obligations to avoid casually discussing confidential client matters in e-mail that may not be entirely private or secure. They must avoid discussing client matters on cell phones in public places, such as in office corridors, hospital lobbies and on trains. Videotaping has come to play a routine role in family therapy and is not considered unethical by typical practitioners (AAMFT 2001). Many clinicians believe the therapeutic and training benefits of videotaping outweigh the risks of unauthorized use or disclosure. Even if unauthorized use or disclosure were not a concern, an ethically question would remain. Should behavioral health clients be called upon to create recordings which inherently sacrifice the privacy of their homes, communications and expressions of emotions?

Physicians are debating whether to increase the use of video and audio-taping in routine clinical practice, and bioethicists are weighing in. Should office visits be recorded as part of the standard medical record? On the one hand, recordings would address the problem of faulty memory and incomplete encounter notes. Recordings could document informed consent procedures and provide evidence to avert or support malpractice suits. On the other hand, recordings could inhibit patients and increase their discomfort. Recording practices might encourage physicians to be less attentive to the patients in front of them on the theory that they can always “go back to the tape” for details.

2. Physical Privacy

There has been relatively little attention paid by philosophers to physical privacy concerns in medicine compared to informational concerns. Yet, typical patients bring a bevy of strong expectations of modesty, solitude and bodily integrity to doctors' offices, hospitals and other health care settings. These expectations that they will not be needlessly touched, crowded or gawked at relate to the need for psychological comfort, dignity and security. In the future, the use of telecommunications may make certain routine primary health care possible without patients having to venture from home and be touched by providers (Chepesiuk 1999). In the meantime, health care typically involves physical contact with others.

2.1 Solitude

Solitude is a form of physical privacy of special interest to medical ethics (Storr 2005; Barbour 2004). The sick do not want to be lonely and abandoned, but they may want personal space and time alone. Solitude has value as a context for quiet reflection about the significance of illness and injury. A period of solitude after consultation and self-education is a useful condition in which to make up one's mind about treatment options.

The sickest patients may both crave and fear solitude. When alone they come face-to-face with the potentially cruel reality of impending death. Yet in company they may feel patronized and guilty or the burdens they impose on family and friends. Whether the suffering is the agony of injury, childbirth, recovering from major surgery or dying, persons may feel that they should not have to deal with others while in such a state or at such a time. Implicit social norms validate deferring to wishes for seclusion and solitude (Post 1989; Nissenbaum 2004).

2.2 Bodily Modesty

Philosophers in the virtue ethics and Christian ethics traditions have identified modesty as a moral virtue (Schueler 1999). Modesty is a form of physical privacy of special interest to medical ethics. If patients are to receive the best care, they must be willing to expose their bodies to medical personnel and technicians. Removing one's clothing for purposes of examination and testing is routine for most health-care consumers. Busy emergency rooms and neighborhood clinics may be unable to cloak or seclude patients at all. Harried physicians may forget “bedside manners” and fail sufficiently to honor patients' modesty expectations. In-patients in teaching hospitals are expected to adapt to diminished physical privacy, since medical students and researchers accompany attending physicians on rounds and participate in care.

Yet feelings of modesty and felt obligations of bodily modesty are commonplace. Many individuals understand bodily modesty as a moral virtue, and act accordingly. Under some religious traditions, such as those of Moslems, Orthodox Jews and the Amish, bodily modesty is a requirement of faith. Being asked to disrobe, even for a good reason, may impose the cost of going against principle or desire. (Kato and Mann 1996)

Health care providers respond to the modesty values of their patients in a number of ways. They provide special modesty garments and sheeting to minimize nudity. They ask patients to uncover only those portions of the body which must be exposed, and then only for the period of time necessary. While hospitals cannot offer every in-patient a private room, shared rooms are generally dividable by curtains that enable patients some degree of physical seclusion (and associational intimacy with visiting family and friends). Male gynecologists and obstetricians help patients cope with sex-specific modesty norms and sexual abuse concerns by working with female assistants. Some health-care providers maintain medical procedures staffing policies sensitive to modesty and harassment concerns. Indeed, mammograms on women are generally performed by female technicians. Patients may encounter health institutions and providers who are unwilling to honor what they may regard as illiberal, bigoted preferences for same-sex or same race caregivers, preferences sometimes motivated rightly or wrongly by modesty concerns. .

2.3 Bodily Integrity

Another aspect of physical privacy is bodily integrity. Mandatory testing and health evaluation offend bodily integrity by forcing persons to submit their bodies to unwanted touching and visual inspection (Allen 2004). Policy makers and the courts have generally permitted a great deal of nonconsensual urine testing of school children and people in jobs tied to public safety and crime control. Drivers can be subjected to alcohol intoxication screening at road blocks or in hospital emergency rooms after accidents to promote highway safety. The philosophical issue here whether there is some limit to the right of government to sidestep persons' preferences about the handling of their bodies, body fluids and tissue samples. The concerns about neuroimaging and lie detection raised earlier in this article under the rubric of secrecy could as easily be raised here in connection with bodily integrity. Nonconsensual uses of imaging and lie-detection to assess honesty or character arguably demeans ands disrespects autonomous moral agents and assaults bodily integrity.

3. Associational Privacy

Respect for the intimacy of the experiences of suffering, childbirth, recovery and dying is required by sound ethics. People who are in pain or grieving have an interest in including some people and excluding others. People commonly want to reserve sharing the joys of medical experience with friends and family, no less than the agonies. They have what can be thought of as an associational privacy interest in selective intimacy.

Injured, suffering, and dying adults may badly desire intimacy, even sexual intimacy. A patient may wish to exclude strangers or inessential medical personnel at times when the presence of loved ones is welcome. Parents of newborns may regard strangers photographing their babies as violations of family intimacy. A dying man may object to being photographed by a physician anxious to take photographs of the man's surgical wounds for scientific purposes. If associational privacy is important, a bored visitor strolling the halls of a hospital should not maneuver to watch a randomly selected patient give birth; and if he does, he merits criticism as a morally offensive intruder.

Hospitals and hospital patients have clashed over who should be allowed visitation and a role in decision-making or hands-on care. Some institutions have kept extended family, paramours, gay or lesbian partners and children away from in-patients. On the other hand, children's hospitals commonly encourage parents to spend as much time as possible with sick minors, and may have sleeping sofas near children's beds or sleeping rooms inside the hospital for attentive guardians.

4. Proprietary Privacy

Moral and legal theorists have offered accounts of the relationship between “property” and “privacy”, “property rights” and “privacy rights” (May 1988; Radin 1987; Thomson 1975). John Locke characterized the relationship between a person and her body as self-ownership. In medical contexts, under rubrics of privacy, individuals are sometimes ascribed rights of self-ownership and the ownership of parts and products of their bodies (Moore 2005). In this vein, a philosophically interesting invasion of privacy argument was advanced in the landmark California case Moore v. Regents of the University of California (1990). Without his knowledge or consent, University of Southern California research physicians developed a commercial cell line from tissue removed from leukemia patient John Moore. Moore and an appellate court argued that in taking his DNA-laden tissue for unrevealed research and development purposes unrelated to Moore's cancer care, UCLA doctors had appropriated Moore's identity in a manner analogous to advertisers using a person's photograph without consent for commercial gain. Moore's privacy claim was novel at the time, but the claims of celebrities and others to control the attributes of their personal identities — likenesses, voices, names, monikers, trademarks, and Social Security numbers—are commonly styled as privacy rights and have been since the early 20th century. John Moore's privacy claim was not successful in court. The California court held that Moore's doctors ought to have obtained his informed consent; but the court was unwilling to commodify human tissue or DNA as private property (Radin 1987). Parts of the human body are not to be bought and sold. Nor did the court think Moore's injury fit the mold of traditional invasions of privacy recognized in the law.

But proprietary understandings of privacy continue to find expression in health-care and health research contexts. Scholars suggest individuals have privacy interests in their genes, genomes and banked tissue. These are sources of health information that reflect what individuals and their biological families are like, and what will become of them. Since most people have only one set of DNA (the rare exception is the genetic chimera), a person's DNA is virtually a unique personal identifier.

Infertility medicine is a growing field, one dependent upon gamete donation and cyropreservation of embryos. Individuals have asserted what they describe as “privacy” interests in controlling the fate of gametes, zygotes, and frozen embryos. The privacy interests debated in the context of infertility medicine are twofold: a decisional privacy interest in the decision to bear a child with the help of reproductive technologies, and a proprietary privacy interest in controlling the fate of the building blocks of human life and the earliest beginnings of human life, created as a consequence of one's intentions or the use of one's genetic materials. While many courts have rejecting viewing frozen embryos as property, they have struggled over how to allocate rights over embryos in cases of separation, divorce, death, moves and changes of heart.

In an entirely different vein, government regulators and the general public characterize identity theft as a “privacy” problem (Allen 2007). In recent years identify theft has become a privacy problem in the delivery of health care. Because of the high price of health care, medical identity theft—receiving medical care using others' personal data for billing purposes — has become a serious problem. Consumers must worry both about the confidentiality of their medical records and physician encounters, and about the possibility that someone will appropriate their personal identifiers and then use them to defraud health care providers and insurers.

5. Decisional Privacy

In medical contexts, “privacy” is commonly used to denote autonomy, liberty or choice in health-related decision-making (Allen 2004; DeCew 1997; Feinberg 1983). Women are often ascribed a “privacy right” to use birth control and to elect medically safe abortions. Men and woman are ascribed a “privacy right” to utilize in vitro fertilization, surrogate gestators, and other reproductive technologies. Men and women with terminal illnesses or in vegetative comas are ascribed a “privacy right” to refuse life-sustaining nutrition, respirators, and medical care (Beauchamp 2000).

5.1 Birth Control

Birth control and abortion are common practices the world over. They were once criminalized on moral and medical grounds, but are generally available today. Laws categorically criminalizing contraception and abortion, were struck down in the U.S., Canada, most of Europe, Japan and Taiwan by the final third of the 20th century.

Feminist philosophers have widely debated the significance of the use of the concepts of privacy and a “right to privacy” to win women the capacity to control their fertility (Rössler 2004; Allen 1998; Boling 1996). The concept of “privacy” played a role in confining women to traditional roles of wife and mother under the authority of male heads of households. While Catherine MacKinnon argued that rights of privacy are palliative detractions from the more basic quest for gender equality, other feminists have argued that privacy rights play a major role in achieving reproductive autonomy and pave the road to greater education and employment equality (Allen 1988; MacKinnon 1984).

Influenced by their religions, some people believe it is morally wrong to use any medication, device or procedure to prevent and or to terminate pregnancy. Some regard human sexuality as having an essentially reproductive purpose and artificial birth control as unethically unnatural. One argument is that human life begins “at the moment of conception” when a sperm fertilizes an egg. Therefore, forms of birth control that may prevent the development of a fertilized egg to grow into a baby — such as “emergency contraceptive pills” or “menstrual extraction” following unplanned sex or rape — are considered “abortion”, even if no pregnancy has been confirmed. Those who oppose abortion on personal moral grounds, sometimes also oppose public law and public policies that permit abortion.

5.2 Abortion

Philosophers differ on the question of the morality of abortion (Jonsen 1998, p. 294ff). Advocates of abortion freedom maintain that government should not take sides in what is irreducibly a moral debate, and that individuals should be free to make up their own minds about the moral status of the unborn (Richards 1986). Judith Thomson employed the concept of a right to control the use of one's own body in a famous defense of abortion rights (Thomson 1971). Some philosophers have denied that fetuses are moral persons, stressing that they are not self-conscious subjects of experience. Those who oppose abortion freedom argue that it should not be left to private choice because the unborn are equal members of the moral community, along with newborn infants. Membership in the moral community is conferred by human status or potential personhood, these philosophers argue. Religious ethicists sometimes characterize the unborn as having souls. Some moralists maintain that women's decisional privacy must yield if science establishes that a totally unique human life comes into being immediately at fertilization of an ovum. Peter Singer has argued that science proves that unique human lives do not begin at conception. Instead, fertilization begins a process of initially pluripotent cell development that may result in several human lives, due, e.g., to twinning and other divisions, or in no human life, due, e.g., to defects that result in spontaneous abortion.

The trend in public policy, dating back to the 1970s in the U.S. and most of Europe seems to be moral compromise (McDonagh 1996; Sher 1981). The law tends to permit women to obtain abortions freely in the first trimester and then to limit access to second and third trimester abortions. Philosophical differences in how societies think about abortion ethics are reflected in the four major models of abortion regulation found around the world. The models of abortion regulation are (1) the model of prohibition; (2) the model of permission; (3) the model of prescription; and (4) the model of privacy.

In countries characterized by the model of prohibition, most or all abortions are prohibited by criminal laws. In the West, Ireland has been an example of the model of prohibition. In countries characterized by the model of permission, abortions are available to women who meet government eligibility criteria and adhere to official procedures. Germany and Japan are examples. In countries characterized by the model of prescription, abortions were not only permitted, but encouraged or required to avoid government penalties. China is the signature contemporary example of the troubling model of prescription. Finally, in countries characterized by the model of privacy, abortions are freely available to women who wish to obtain them, without having to meet eligibility criteria or adhere to detailed government procedures designed to limit access. Canada is an example of the model of privacy. While the U.S. used to be a nation in which the model of privacy prevailed, has taken on some of the features of a model of permission regime since 1989 when the Supreme Court announced it would begin allowing restrictions.

5.3 Conscience Clauses

In most countries, the public relies on licensed physicians and hospitals for medical care. The medicines physicians recommend are available only from professionally trained, licensed pharmacists. In the U.S., state and federal laws have been enacted to relieve health care providers of the obligation to perform medical services that offend their philosophical, moral, or religious beliefs. Some policy-makers have argued that healthcare practitioners should be free to decline to provide services for which they are professionally trained if doing so genuinely violates personal conscience (Dresser 2005). Defenders of what have been called “conscience clauses” and “refusal laws” see themselves as defending the “privacy” of pharmacists and health care providers, privacy akin to freedom of thought and religion (White 1999). But opponents of such laws see themselves as the true defenders of privacy, standing up for the “right to privacy.” They stress that the call for refusal laws has been tied to larger “pro life” strategies to limit access to contraceptives, medical abortifacients and surgical abortions. They say pharmacists who decline to dispense medication are placing their personal values and autonomy above the values and autonomy of patients. Furthermore, pharmacists, like physicians and nurses, enjoy the benefits of regulation and have chosen their professions voluntarily. Private reproductive choices can be exercised only if health-care professionals are willing to perform lawful services.

Should health care workers be required to dispense medications and perform procedures that violate their personal scruples? Most bioethicists agree that in the context of emergency medicine, conscientious refusal has no place. A physician should not refuse to terminate an ectopic (tubal) pregnancy threatening the life of the mother, for example. There is significant disagreement, however, about whether morally-based refusal is warranted by retail pharmacists. Whether pharmacists can ethically refuse may depend upon the proximity of other pharmacists willing to serve in their places. Ethicists also disagree about whether physicians may use their scruples as rationales for refusing to answer medical questions or refer patients to abortion providers. A further, related, question is whether physicians in countries where abortion is safe and legal may ethically follow their public or private employers' orders to refrain from providing information about abortion services to patients.

5.4 Assisted Reproductive Technology

Some legal commentators and philosophers have argued that infertile men and women have a right to procreative privacy, and a right to use technology to bear children. Assisted reproductive technology services (“ART”) include medicines to balance hormones, regulate ovulation, and stimulate the production of viable eggs; and surgery to unblock fallopian tubes or undo the damage of endometriosis, miscarriages, ectopic pregnancies and pelvic inflammatory disease. Reproductive services also include sperm and egg harvesting and donation, in vitro fertilization, zygote and embryo transplant, reproductive organ transplant, cyropreservation (“freezing”) of pre-embryos, and surrogate pregnancies.

Choice of ART, like choice regarding sterilization, abortion and birth control, may be called for by the right to privacy. But ART use raises moral concerns. One concern is the false hopes ART creates in a world in which the technology is expensive and the success rate low. The availability of affordable treatments can cause conflict within families. Women report feeling pressured by their families to undergo repeated painful attempts to get pregnant. It may argued that adoption is a more satisfying, affordable and socially commendable option for becoming a parent. The use of reproductive technology has led to bioethical concerns about the handling of the earliest beginnings of human life. Ethical concerns surround exposing otherwise healthy women to the uncertain health risks of repeated rounds of fertility drugs and high-risk multiple pregnancies with twins and triplets. In a few tragic cases children created using ART have been unwanted, raising questions of responsibility and the just role of family law. What should happen if the people who contract with a surrogate mother to carry a child for them using donated egg and sperm change their minds after a child is conceived? Should the mind-changers be deemed the parents? Should the gestator be deemed the parent; the gamete donors? Should parentage be assigned by a judge based on the best interest of the child?

The realm of reproductive technology is surprisingly laissez faire in the U.S., more regulated in the United Kingdom. Some U.S. constitutional lawyers argue that the right to bear and beget children enshrined by the Supreme Court in Fourteenth Amendment jurisprudence is a right to bear and begat by virtually any consensual means necessary. There is a right to reproduce, they argue, and a right to use other people and social resources to help one reproduce. Some have even agued that the right to procreative privacy is a reason for government or employers to pay for fertility services. In Israel,Germany and Taiwan, government subsidizes ART for infertile couples. Great Britain has enacted a special statute and created a special governing body to deal with policy and ethical questions raised by the growing popularity of artificial reproductive technologies. The Human Fertilisation and Embryology Act 1990 created the HFEA, an agency charged to license and monitor IVF, donor insemination, human embryo research, and the storage of gametes and embryos.

It is now possible to select the sex of one's offspring. Some bioethicists have argued that a “right to privacy” countermands government placing bans on sex selection. Supporters of sex selection sometimes argue that choosing a child's sex is a future parent's moral and legal right. Some methods of sex selection include: (1) Amniocentesis testing to determine sex, followed by abortion if the fetus has the undesired sex; (2) Sperm sorting to produce X rich or Y rich batches of sperm, followed by in vitro fertilization or insemination to increase chances of having a child of the desired sex; (3) preimplantation genetic diagnosis (“PGD”) to determine the sex of a pre-embryo, followed by implantation of one or more pre-embryos of the desired sex. Amniocentesis and PGD were techniques developed originally to determine whether a fetus or embryo was affected by a genetic disorder such as Down's syndrome or cystic fibrosis. In some jurisdictions abortion or PGD solely for sex-selection other than to avoid sex-linked disorders is illegal.

Adults who want children often prefer children of a particular sex, or a “balance” of male and female children, perhaps born in a particular order. Medically-assisted high-tech sex selection raises large ethical issues. PGD involves creating human embryos, some of which will not be used. Freezing, destroying and giving away human embryos can seem inconsistent with respect for human dignity. Sex selection is arguably a kind of gender discrimination and could heighten problems of pernicious gender discrimination. Sex selection plays into gender stereotypes and could someday throw off the societal, even global balance of males and females. Sex-selection is controversial as a first step on a slippery slop toward “designer babies.”

Men and women in developed countries are “designing” their babies (Parens 2003). In the context of fertility medicine, patient's select donated egg and sperm based on the race, IQ, SAT scores, and detailed physical profiles of the donors. The capacity to select the traits of offspring is likely to expand in the coming years. It has been argued that a “right to privacy” countermands government placing bans on trait selection through genetic selection and manipulation. If women and their partners have a right to reproductive autonomy, it arguably follows that they have a right to use technologies that enable them to choose the precise traits of their children. Yet using technology to achieve “perfect” or “superior” humans may be unethical, even if using technology to screen out tragic abnormalities and diseases representing extremes of suffering is not.

Michael Sandel has argued that the quest for genetic enhancements and other god-like mastery over the human body reflects a failure to appreciate fully the “giftedness” of life and the ethical value of “humility, responsibility, and solidarity.” (Sandel 2007, p. 12, 86) Ronald Green has cautioned against a status quo bias that leads us to the irrational conclusion that human beings should remain as they are (Green 2008, p. 9). John Harris has moved several steps beyond Ronald Green in building a case against preserving the status quo. Offering what he calls “the ethical case for making people better,” Harris has argued that society ought to leap on opportunities to create “healthier, longer lived, and altogether ‘better’ individuals.” (Harris 2007) In the future, the notion of decisional privacy may play a major role in building a case for allowing individuals and families to use or refuse genetic, pharmaceutical and other forms of enhancements.

5.5 Medically Unhealthy Life-Styles

Should the state enact health and safety rules designed to save people from poor private choices such as eating sugary, high fat foods, smoking and refusing to wear motorcycle helmets? Are individuals entitled to unfettered enjoyment of drinking, using addictive drugs and a medication-free existence? The answer John Stuart Mill gave to such questions in his famous essay On Liberty (1869) was “yes” to the extent that these are self-regarding behaviors that do not harm others. Mill defended liberal tolerance of intoxicants and narcotic drugs on the ground that liberty nets society benefits that are lost when government tells us what to do. A libertarian perspective condemns the “nanny state” that fails to treat citizens like conscientious adults (Harsanyi 2007, p. 41).

A robust regard for liberty prompts adopting an extreme libertarian perspective on the law. Yet “[t]he notion of radical individualism focuses on individual health behavior and ignores the social preconditions of that behavior” (McGee 1999, p. 211). What, on the surface, appear to be inviolate personal choices may be straightforward products of social forces as diverse as “media, advertising, movies, literature and folklore” (McGee 1999, p. 212). Debates over managed care have stressed that individuals' unhealthy choices have externalities, including higher health care costs for fellow citizens. Unhealthy lifestyles can impose substantial costs on others. Smokers impose the costs of illnesses caused by exposure to second-hand smoke. Unhealthy diets and the lack of exercise can contribute to reduced worker productivity and increase health care spending. Unhealthy lifestyles divert societal resources from other areas of public need, such as education (McGee 1999).

5.6 The Right to Refuse Care

Whether persons with mental conditions are morally required to take medications that make them better able to live normal lives could be styled as a question of the limits of private choice. Some mental health patients are not competent to make their own treatment decisions, but the vast majority are competent most of the time. Some patients are offered medications by their physicians to curb distinctly anti-social impulses such as oppositionality, verbal aggression and violence. It could be argued that these patients have an ethical obligation to medicate themselves, as advised. Competent patients with cognitive and emotional problems (such as moderate depression or mild hallucinations) that affect mainly themselves may plausibly argue that the benefits of psychotropic medications are not outweighed by the risks of lethargy, sexual dysfunction, tremor, speech problems and organ damage. Questions of political philosophy are implicated in debates over the extent to which authorities may compel medication use by death row inmates, defendants awaiting trial, prisoners and in-patients in state hospitals.

The flowering of bioethics as an academic discipline and branch of philosophy was fed by religious, moral and ethical concerns raised by high profile legal cases about the right to die (Beauchamp 2000). These cases seemed to place the power to “play God” — make life and death decisions — in the hands of patients, families and physicians. The field was influenced, for example, by the famous Karen Quinlan decision, In the Matter of Quinlan (1976). This case transported the federal constitutional ideal of the right to decisional privacy into state law, and characterized the right of a comatose woman's family to refuse life-saving treatment on her behalf as a “right to privacy” (Jonsen 1998). After the Quinlan decision, hospitals began setting up ethics committees to help doctors, patients and families exercise decisional privacy rights in a lawful and responsible manner. In 1986, the U.S. Supreme court recognized a right of patients to refuse medical care such as artificial respiration and tube feeding, where the wishes of the patient to die could be established by clear and convincing evidence.

Moral philosophers have sought a greater role for ethics in shaping interpretations of constitutional law in life and death cases. On December 6, 1996, six prominent U.S. moral philosophers submitted an unprecedented brief to the U.S. Supreme Court in two cases, Washington v. Glucksberg (1997) and Vacco v. Quill (1997). The philosopher's were on the losing side. The U.S. Supreme Court refused to strike down laws banning assisted suicide, instead upholding state laws in New York and Washington that criminalized physician-assisted suicide. The Court argued that states have an interest in protecting life, protecting the poor and the disabled, and promoting physicians' ethical integrity. Patient's rights groups had argued that laws banning physician assisted suicide violated the privacy and equality rights of people with terminal illnesses.

According to what came to be known as “The Philosopher's Brief,” signed by Ronald Dworkin, Thomas Nagel, Robert Nozick, John Rawls, Thomas Scanlon, and Judith Jarvis Thomson, “A person's interest in following his own convictions at the end of life is so central a part of the more general right to make ‘intimate and personal choices’ for himself that a failure to protect that particular interest would undermine the general right altogether. Death is, for each of us, among the most significant events of life.” (Dworkin et al. 2007) The Brief went on to argue that there is little moral difference between allowing an authorized physician to administer a life-ending injection on behalf of a terminally ill patient and allowing an authorized physician to turn off the respirator or remove the feeding tube of a person in a vegetative coma.

The 2007 Theresa Schiavo case raised the philosophically important question of when it is ethical to exercise privacy rights. A Florida court allowed spouse Michael Schiavo to terminate life support on wife Terri's behalf, after the court found that Terri's autonomous choice would have been to refuse life-sustaining care if she were hopelessly comatose. Since the age of twenty-five, Terri had subsisted in a “persistent vegetative coma”. Autopsy established that Terri had massive and irreversible brain damage, as her husband believed. Terri's parents had doubted the diagnosis of hopeless coma and wanted their daughter alive. Assuming Michael Schiavo was justified in ignoring the pleas of strangers who wanted him to keep his wife alive, it is less clear that he was justified in turning down the pleas of his wife's own parents, who urged Schiavo to waive his wife's “privacy” and offered to assume complete responsibility for her care. What are the obligations of kin to honor the care and kinship wishes of fellow family members? What weight do privacy arguments on behalf of an incompetent spouse have in the face of parental claims?

6. Conclusion

Privacy is a broad concept. Philosophers have identified several forms of privacy. Respect for recognized forms of privacy —informational (Section 2), physical (Section 3), associational (Section 4), proprietary (Section 5) and decisional (Section 6) — is an ideal of biomedical ethics for the conduct of clinical, research and administrative practices relating to physical and behavioral health. Yet there is ample disagreement about the scope of the ideal. There is wide philosophical consensus about the importance of medical confidentiality, modesty and bodily integrity in all health settings; but substantial philosophical disagreement about the limits of personal autonomy or individual choice in fields relating to human reproduction and genetics. As the use of electronic data management technologies, health surveillance and brain imaging technologies expand, the range and complexity of important privacy questions in medicine are likely also to expand.


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abortion | decision-making capacity | feminist (topics): perspectives on reproduction and the family | health | human genome project | legal rights | parenthood and procreation | privacy | suicide