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Modal Interpretations of Quantum Mechanics

First published Tue Nov 12, 2002; substantive revision Thu Dec 6, 2007

The original ‘modal interpretation’ of quantum theory was born in the early 1970s, and at that time the phrase referred to a single interpretation, due to van Fraassen. The phrase now encompasses a class of interpretations, and is better taken to refer to a general approach to the interpretation of quantum theory. We shall describe the history of modal interpretations, how the phrase has come to be used in this way, and the general program of (at least some of) those who advocate this approach.

1. The Copenhagen Variant

By the early 1970s, researchers in philosophy of physics had become painfully aware of the nonlocality inherent in standard quantum theory. It arises most dramatically in the context of the projection postulate, which asserts that upon measurement of a physical system, its state will ‘collapse’ (or be ‘projected’) to a state corresponding to the value found in the measurement. This postulate is difficult to accept in any case (what effects this discontinuous change in the physical state of a system? what exactly is a ‘measurement’ as opposed to an ordinary physical interaction?), but it is especially worrying when applied to entangled compound systems whose components are well-separated in space. The classic example is the Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen experiment, in which two particles which have interacted in the past are separated. Their quantum-mechanical state is ‘entangled’, which means, for our purposes, that there exist strict correlations between the two systems, in spite of the fact that the correlated quantities are not sharply defined in the individual systems. This correlation has the effect that the collapse resulting from a measurement on one of the systems simultaneously (and instantaneously) affects the other.

A possible way clear of this problem was noticed by van Fraassen (1972, 1974, 1991), who proposed to eliminate the projection postulate from the theory. Of course, others had made this proposal before. Bohm's (1952) theory (itself preceded by de Broglie's proposals from the 1920s) eliminates the projection postulate, as do the various many-worlds (and relative-state) interpretations. Van Fraassen's elaboration of the proposal to do without the projection postulate was, however, different from these other approaches. It relied, in particular, on a distinction between what van Fraassen called the ‘value state’ of a system, and the ‘dynamical state’ of a system. The value state at any instant represents the system's physical properties at that instant, in the sense that it specifies the values of all physical quantities that are sharply defined for the system at the point in time in question. By contrast, the dynamical state determines the evolution of the system. It determines which properties the system might have at later times. In other words, the dynamical state is what we need to make predictions about future value states.

The dynamical state is just the quantum state of the ordinary textbook approach (a vector or density matrix in Hilbert space). For an isolated system (which may consist of many component systems) this state is subject to the Schrödinger equation (in non-relativistic quantum mechanics). The important point added by the modal approach is that this dynamical state is stipulated never to collapse during its evolution.

The value state is (typically) different from the dynamical state. More precisely, the value state of a system (usually a component of a bigger system) differs from the dynamical state of this same system (found by restricting the dynamical state of the total system to the subsystem in question) exactly when this dynamical state is not pure. In these cases (i.e., when the dynamical state of a system is mixed), the dynamical state does not fix the value state, but it determines the set of possible value states.

The general idea of van Fraassen's proposal, and of modal interpretations in general, is that physical systems at all times possess a number of well-defined physical properties, i.e. definite values of physical quantities, and that these properties are represented by the system's value state. Which physical quantities are sharply defined, and which values they take, may change in time. The dynamical state determines the set of possible value states and their possible time evolutions. Further, empirical adequacy requires that the dynamical state generate the correct quantum mechanical frequencies for those properties that are observable.

It is part of this proposal that a system may have a sharp value of an observable even if the dynamical state is not an eigenstate of that same observable. The proposal thus violates the so-called ‘eigenstate-eigenvalue link’, which says that a system can only have a sharp value of an observable (namely, one of its eigenvalues) if its quantum state is the corresponding eigenstate. In the value state terminology, the eigenstate-eigenvalue link would say that a system has the value state corresponding to a given eigenvalue (of a given observable) if and only if its dynamical state is an eigenstate of the observable corresponding to that eigenvalue. Van Fraassen accepts the ‘if’ part, but denies the ‘only if’ part.

What are the possible ‘value states’ for a given system at a given time? Van Fraassen stipulates the following restriction: propositions about a physical system cannot be jointly true unless they can be jointly certain according to the standard quantum rules (i.e., generally speaking, unless they are represented by commuting observables). It follows that the non-commutativity of observables imposes limits on the possibilities of joint existence of properties. This non-commutativity does therefore not so much restrict our knowledge about the properties of a system, but rather restricts the possibility of joint existence of properties themselves, independently of our knowledge. Non-commuting quantities, like position and momentum, cannot jointly be well-defined quantities of a physical system. This motivates van Fraassen to term his interpretation the ‘Copenhagen Variant’ of the modal interpretation. Other variants (for example, van Fraassen identifies an ‘Anti-Copenhagen’ variant, which he attributes to Arthur Fine) would impose less restrictive conditions on the form of the value states.

Finally, value states are taken to be maximal with respect to the restriction just noted, in the sense that they are representable as pure states in Hilbert space (this requirement is relaxed in other versions of the modal interpretation, as we shall see). Now, which pure states are the possible value states at a given moment? Van Fraassen formulates a very permissive criterion, which other authors have found too permissive, the reason stemming from his ‘constructive empiricist’ philosophy of science. He is concerned with giving an interpretation of the theory that is only restricted by the requirement that the theory be empirically adequate, i.e. compatible with all observable phenomena (in the sense used by van Fraassen). In particular, the interpretation should guarantee that measurements possess results. Van Fraassen is not striving for an interpretation that tells us the exact truth about what goes on behind the scenes of observation, by exactly describing the properties of physical systems even if not measured. In other words, the main problem to be solved for van Fraassen is that if we apply the standard eigenstate-eigenvalue link to quantum mechanics without the projection postulate, the result is that measurements do not have results: in general, after a measurement interaction a measuring device plus object system will end up in a superposition of eigenstates of the measured observable. Given only this task, the account given by van Fraassen can be relatively modest. According to van Fraassen, the just-mentioned problem can be solved by introducing value states (and therefore well-defined properties of physical systems, among them pointer states of measuring devices) and by adding only that the possible value states are all pure states that lie in the support of the (generally mixed) dynamical state of the system. In other words, these are all states that appear in the various possible decompositions (not only the diagonal ones) of the density matrices.

Of course, empirical adequacy requires that in cases of measurement the actual value state of the apparatus be one describing a definite measurement result. Observation tells us also that, in these cases, the dynamical state generates a probability measure over exactly the set of possible measurement results (which is a smaller set than the set of properties deemed possible by van Fraassen), thus enabling us to make predictions. In the end, van Fraassen therefore faces the task of giving a detailed account of measurements, and according to many this has not been satisfactorily done in his approach.

Van Fraassen's account is ‘modal’ because it leads to a modal logic of quantum propositions. Indeed, the dynamical state in general only tells us what is possible. An important point is that one should not consider this modality to arise from an incompleteness of the description, which it is the aim of science to remove. The dynamical state provides us with possible value states for all physical systems (i.e. possible stories about the world) that are compatible with all the observable data; and this is all an interpretation has to do, according to van Fraassen. On the other hand, it is quite easy to see how van Fraassen's approach gave rise to a program that is concerned with providing a further-going ‘realistic’ interpretation of quantum theory, a program to which we now turn.

2. Kochen-Dieks-Healey Interpretations

The basic outlines of that program are already apparent in van Fraassen's work (or in what may be considered its limitations). The main idea is to precisely define a set of possible properties, or value states, for a physical system that is adequate in measurement situations and then to assert that the dynamical (i.e., quantum-mechanical) state generates an ignorance-interpretable probability measure over this set. More precisely, one defines an ignorance-interpretable probability measure over value states, which themselves assign ‘possessed’ or ‘not possessed’ to each possible property. One uses the quantum-mechanical probability measure, which makes it plausible to expect empirical adequacy.

In the late 1980s, various researchers — typically, as noted above, with a more realistic bent than van Fraassen — realized the possibilities offered by a modal approach. Here we shall consider three cases, albeit briefly and largely without reference to their background philosophical motivations: Kochen, Dieks, and Healey.

Kochen's (1985) modal interpretation is based on the polar decomposition theorem (see Reed and Simon (1979, pp. 197-198) for a statement and proof), but is somewhat easier to understand in terms of the so-called ‘biorthogonal decomposition theorem’:

Biorthogonal Decomposition Theorem:
Given a vector, |v>, in a tensor-product Hilbert space, H1H2, there exist bases {|ei>} and {|fj>} for H1 and H2 respectively such that |v> can be written as a linear combination of terms of the form |ei> ⊗ |fi>. If the absolute values (modulus) of the coefficients in this linear combination are all unequal then the bases are unique.

In other words, the state of a two-particle system picks out (in many cases, uniquely) a basis for each of the component systems. (See, for example, Schrödinger (1935) for a proof of this theorem.)

Recall from the previous section that van Fraassen refrained from providing a restrictive specification of the possible value states for a given system. We now see in the biorthogonal decomposition theorem a way to provide a rule that is restrictive: define as the possible value states (for each component system of a composite system) the elements of the basis picked out by the theorem. The set of possible properties is thus directly fixed by the dynamical state; this set is much smaller than the set considered by van Fraassen. It is also manifest that the dynamical state generates a probability measure over the set of possible value states, namely the standard quantum mechanical measure.

In this way, the interpretation focuses essentially on compound systems. In one sense, this feature is not really a departure from van Fraassen's view, because for van Fraassen, only systems that are in mixed dynamical states (indeed, ‘improperly’ mixed: i.e., states represented by a density operator that is derived by partial tracing from the pure state of a bigger system, as opposed to ‘proper’ mixtures that represent ignorance about the true state) have value states that differ from their dynamical states. This situation will typically occur for systems that are components of a compound system. This similarity between Kochen and van Fraassen should not mask a significant philosophical difference, however. Kochen's account is meant to be perspectival or relational, meaning that a system has a property only in relation to other systems (see also below).

It is illuminating to see how in a typical measurement situation Kochen's prescription differs from van Fraassen's. Consider a typical measurement in which a ‘pointer’ becomes correlated with the value that some ‘measured’ system has for a given observable. Letting the |ei> represent the possible ‘indicator states’ of the pointer, and |fj> the eigenstates corresponding to the possible values that the system might have for the measured observable, the final state of the compound system will indeed take the form of a linear combination of terms of the form |ei> ⊗ |fi>, so that by Kochen's prescription, the pointer has exactly its indicator states as the only possible value states. By contrast, for van Fraassen it only followed that the pointer's indicator states are among the potential value states; as discussed above, van Fraassen is concerned only to establish this fact, and not the fact that they are the value states even when they are unobservable.

For Kochen, the fact that the application of the interpretation is restricted to subsystems of a two-component compound system is not a problem. Indeed, he appears to adopt a metaphysics of properties in which systems do not have intrinsic properties: all properties are relational. Kochen calls the relation ‘witnessing’. Consider again the measurement described above. In this case, the pointer (at the end of the measurement) may be said to ‘indicate’ (or, as Kochen prefers, ‘witness’) the result, i.e., the value that the measured system has for the measured observable. Now, because Kochen intends his interpretation to apply in all circumstances (not only in measurements), we must abstract the idea of ‘indication’ or ‘witnessing’ away from the context of measurements, and whatever notion we end up with is supposed to apply to all cases of possession of properties. Kochen's interpretation is therefore ‘perspectival’: systems do not possess properties intrinsically, but relative to the ‘perspective’ of another system that ‘witnesses’ it to posses the property in question.

Other authors, e.g. Dieks, at least originally preferred a metaphysics of intrinsically possessed properties. Their proposals are therefore faced with consistency questions about the relations between properties assigned according to different ways of splitting up a system into components. To see how this question arises, note that a three-component compound system may be divided into pairs of subsystems in several ways. Consider, for example, the compound system A&B&C. We could arrive at properties for A by applying the biorthogonal decomposition theorem to the two-component system A&(B&C). We could also apply the theorem to (for example) B&(C&A) or C&(A&B). Now, how are the properties of A and B related to those of A&B?

Suppose, for example, that A has the property P and B has the property Q. Should one ascribe the property P&Q to A&B, or should A&B have some property that it gets from applying the biorthogonal decomposition to C&(A&B), or both?

Although in his early proposals Dieks (1988, 1989a, 1989b) did not focus on these questions, his later work, together with Vermaas (Vermaas and Dieks, 1995) explicitly addressed them. (The fullest account is in Vermaas (1999). See also Bacciagaluppi (1996).) Dieks first notes that the density operator (reduced state) of a single component of a two-component system has for its spectral resolution exactly the projections spanned by the basis elements picked out by the biorthogonal decomposition theorem, in the case when the decomposition is unique. One may then reformulate and generalize the original proposal by positing in general that the possible value states for any system are represented by the projection operators in its density operator's spectral decomposition (whose existence and uniqueness is guaranteed by the spectral theorem). This new proposal matches the old one in cases where the old one applies, and generalizes by fixing the definite-valued quantities in terms of multi-dimensional projectors when the biorthogonal decomposition is degenerate. In terms of value states the proposal says that definite properties need not always be represented by one-dimensional vector states — higher-dimensional subspaces of the Hilbert space can also occur. This idea also occurs in Healey's approach.

With this general recipe for assigning properties in hand, we may now address the question about the relations between different subdivisions of the total system. We can make the issue even more complicated than stated above by noting that a given tensor-product Hilbert space can be factored in many ways. In essence, the factorization of a given Hilbert space, H, into two factors, H1 and H2, can be ‘rotated’ to produce additional factorizations into H1 and H2. There is a continuous infinity of such possibilities. Are we to apply the proposal to each such factorization? How are the results related, if at all?

A theorem due to Bacciagaluppi (1995) shows, in essence, that if one applies Dieks' proposal to the ‘subsystems’ obtained in every factorization and insists that the results be comparable (i.e., that the subsystems thus obtained do not have their properties ‘relative to a factorization’ but instead have them absolutely), then one will be led to a mathematical contradiction of the Kochen-Specker variety. In response, one could adopt the view that subsystems have their properties ‘relative to a factorization’; some advocates of modal interpretations have instead adopted the view that there is a ‘preferred factorization’ of the universal Hilbert space into subsystems. This assumption amounts to the adoption of the existence of fixed ‘atomic’ degrees of freedom of the universe.

One is still faced, however, with the question of how properties of a composite system are related to those of its components. The answer to this question depends on whether Dieks' proposal for assigning properties is to be applied to the ‘atoms’ only, or to any subsystem whatever. For example, do we apply the proposal (from our schematic example above) to A&B&C as well as to A&B? Vermaas (1997) has shown that doing so has the consequence that one cannot define generally valid correlations between a composite system and its components. If one is willing to adopt perspectivalism — as Kochen was from the start, and Dieks has become in later work (Bene and Dieks, 2002, see also Berkovitz and Hemmo, 2005, and Hemmo and Berkovitz, 2005) — then one can perhaps justify the lack of such correlations. The choice is therefore between some form of perspectivalism and the atomic modal interpretation (see, for example, Bacciagaluppi and Dickson, 1999), according to which the basic proposal is applied only to the ‘atomic’ subsystems of the universe. The properties of all other (compound) systems are in this case inherited from their subsystems. There are connections here with discussions in metaphysics about the possibility of the existence of ‘non-supervenient’ properties. (Clifton (1995c) also offers an important theorem concerning this issue.)

Richard Healey (1989) was also among the first to make use of the biorthogonal decomposition theorem, taking Kochen's ideas in a somewhat different direction. Healey's main concern was the apparent nonlocality of quantum theory. Healey's intuition about the way a modal interpretation based on the biorthogonal decomposition theorem would be applied to, say, an EPR experiment is to implement the idea that an EPR pair possesses a 'holistic' property; this can then explain why the apparatus on one side of the experiment acquires a property that is correlated to the result on the other side.

Irrespective of whether this picture is general enough for its intended purpose, it shows that Healey does not subscribe to an ‘atomic’ modal interpretation, since it is crucial for him that the EPR pair as a whole be assigned a (non-product) property. On the other hand, Healey's proposal begins with the atomic interpretation, making use of the biorthogonal decomposition theorem, but the set of possible properties is then expanded (and subsequently restricted) by a number of conditions. Healey's aim is apparently to walk a thin line amongst a variety of desiderata. The first is consistency. As shown by (for example) the theorems of Bacciagaluppi and Vermaas, mentioned above — not to mention the Kochen-Specker theorem itself — given certain conditions on the set of possibly-possessed properties, one cannot add properties to this set willy-nilly. A second is to maintain a plausible theory of the relationship between composite systems and their subsystems. A third is to maintain a plausible account of the relations among possessed properties at a given time. A fourth is to maintain a plausible account of the relations among possessed properties at different times. The structure of possibly-possessed properties that emerges from Healey's conditions is extremely complicated. Some progress has been made since Healey's book was published (see for example Reeder and Clifton, 1995), but in general, it remains difficult to see what the set of possibly-possessed properties is according to Healey's approach.

3. Motivating Modal Interpretations

One might well ask: Why begin with the biorthogonal decomposition (or more generally, the spectral decomposition) in the first place? What is the physical motivation of interpretations that determine the set of possibly-possessed properties on the basis of this decomposition?

A series of theorems proposes to answer (or to begin to answer) this question. The first of these theorems was due to Clifton (1995a), the title of the paper indicating the project: “Independently motivating the Kochen-Dieks Modal Interpretation of Quantum Mechanics”. A series of related results followed, including those by Clifton (1995b), Dickson (1995a, 1995b), Bub and Clifton (1996), Bub, Clifton and Goldstein (2000) and Dieks (1995, 2005, 2007). Here we shall discuss Clifton's original paper, and Bub and Clifton's theorem, the former to indicate the general thrust of these arguments, and the latter as a way to introduce Bub's own modal proposals.

The theorem discussed here is not quite Clifton's, which is slightly stronger (because its assumptions are slightly weaker), but it will be sufficient to make the reader grasp the general idea of this group of theorems. These take the following general form, for some mathematically-stated (but hopefully physically motivated) conditions A, B, C, etc.: If one wants a set of possibly-possessed properties to obey conditions A, B, C, etc., then the set must take the form asserted by a spectral-decomposition-like version of the modal interpretation. In Clifton's and Bub's work that form is the following. (Dieks' theorem (2005, 2007) gives a justification for a set of properties that exactly coincides with the one given by the spectral decomposition.) Consider a system in the (improper) mixed state, W. Let {Pi} be the set of W's spectral projections, and let B<Pi> be the Boolean algebra generated by the Pi, which is in this case just the set of all sums of elements of {Pi}. Finally, let Q be the null space of W, that is, orthogonal to each Pi. Then the set of all possibly-valued projections, P, for our system is the set

{P | P = Pj + Q′, where Pi is in B<Pi> and Q′ is contained in Q}.

This set differs from that given by the spectral decomposition by the inclusion of individual projections from the null-space — the original Dieks-Vermaas spectral decomposition proposal only includes the projection on the null-space as one whole.

So theorems of the sort proven by Clifton and others take the form: sets of the form like that given above are the only sets that fulfill conditions A, B, C, etc.

In one such theorem, roughly the one proven originally by Clifton, the conditions are:

  1. Closure: the set of all possibly-possessed properties is closed under conjunction, disjunction, and negation (suitably understood in quantum-logical terms).
  2. Classicality: the quantum-mechanical probability measure (generated by the reduced state W) over the set of all possibly-possessed properties obeys all of the laws of classical probability, and — crucially — it is ‘ignorance-interpretable’.
  3. Certainty: for any property R, if the reduced state W assigns probability 1 or probability 0 to R, then R is in the set of all possibly-possessed properties.
  4. Ignorance: each member of the spectral resolution of W is in the set of all possibly-possessed properties.

The justification of the final condition depends on an analysis of the measuring process, described in the way first proposed by von Neumann. One may note that Clifton's theorem actually relies on a considerably weaker condition. (But in conjunction with the other conditions, it implies the condition given here).

The theorem of Bub and Clifton (1996) (in the improved version of Bub, Clifton, and Goldstein (2000)) concerns a set of possibly-possessed properties that is characterized somewhat differently. Specifically, it is characterized in terms of (in the simplest case) a pure state, |v> and a privileged observable, R. The pure state is the quantum-mechanical state of the system, while the observable is privileged in the sense that it is always ‘definitely-valued’; i.e., whatever else gets a definite value, the spectral projections of R certainly must.

The conditions of the Bub-Clifton theorem are the following:

  1. Closure: as above.
  2. Truth and Probability: essentially the same condition as ‘classicality’, above.
  3. R-preferred: the eigenspaces of R are among the set of possibly-possessed properties.
  4. |v>, R-definability: the set of possibly-possessed properties are definable solely in terms of the pure state |v> and the observable R.
  5. Maximality: the set of possibly-possessed properties is maximal with respect to the conditions above.

The idea, then, is to determine a maximal set (in fact, a lattice) of possibly-possessed properties that admits an empirically adequate and ignorance-interpretable probability measure, makes R definite-valued, and is fixed by the state of the system, |v>, and R. Again, these conditions are supposed to be intuitively clear, if not compelling. The condition ‘R-preferred’ may look controversial, for it is unclear why there should be any ‘preferred’ observable in this sense, and how it might be picked out. One would not like the observable to be picked out by fiat, for example. If we were willing to choose an observable and stipulate in an ad hoc manner that it must have a value, then it is unclear why we would be concerned about the definition of definite-valued observables in the first place. However, it turns out that there are several well-known interpretations of quantum theory that become analysable as modal interpretations once the existence of a preferred observable is allowed. The earlier case, without a fixed preferred observable R, can be recovered by taking the system's density matrix for R — see Bub (1997), Dieks (2007).

Bub and Clifton prove the remarkable result that the conditions above give rise to a unique lattice of possibly-possessed properties, defined as follows. Let {Pi} be the set of projections onto the vectors, |vi>, which are the projections of |v> onto the eigenspaces of R. Then the set is as defined above for Clifton's theorem concerning spectral-decomposition modal interpretations.

Dieks's variation on the theorem (2005, 2007) differs by requiring not definability of the set of possibly-possessed properties, but rather definability of the individual elements of the set. This stronger requirement has the consequence that the lattice of possible properties becomes smaller: only the projector on the full null-space is part of it, not the individual one-dimensional projectors on the null-space.

Bub suggests that a number of traditional interpretations of quantum theory can be characterized as modal interpretations if the existence of a preferred observable is allowed. Notable among them are the Dirac-von Neumann interpretation, (what Bub takes to be) Bohr's interpretation, and Bohm's theory. In the last case, Bub argues that Bohm's theory can be recovered as a modal interpretation in which the R is the position observable. In addition, Bub argues (especially in his 1997) that R could be picked out by the physical process of decoherence. We shall have to leave this suggestion as a tantalizing possibility. As already noted, proofs similar to the ones mentioned can be given if there is no preferred observable, and in that case the spectral-decomposition-like sets of possibly-possessed properties, definable from the dynamical state alone, are recovered.

4. Reality Sets in: The Problem of Imperfect Measurement

Earlier we suggested that the spectral-decomposition (and the biorthogonal-decomposition) modal interpretations solve the measurement problem in a particularly direct way: at the end of a von Neumann measurement, the compound system (apparatus plus measured system) is in a state such that the possible properties picked out by these modal interpretations are exactly the pointer states of the apparatus. Hence these interpretations assign the right state to apparatuses.

There is a problem with this claim, however, in spite of the fact that by itself it is true. Measurements in the real world do not satisfy the ideal von Neumann model that we described earlier. In particular, they do not effect a perfect correlation between the apparatus and the measured system — measuring apparatuses are imperfect. But then it is not so clear that the biorthogonal (or spectral) decomposition picks out the right properties for the apparatus. A related, more general problem surfaces if one attempts to invoke decoherence as a mechanism that is responsible for the emergence of classical observables as definite-valued: does decoherence always pick out appropriate observables as definite-valued?

This problem was first raised by Albert and Loewer (1990, 1991), later developed by Elby (1993), and it sparked considerable discussion. Before we turn to the reply, we note that in fact the problem is unavoidable in the context of quantum theory. It is not due merely to the fact that measuring apparatuses are inaccurate. Rather, the quantum-mechanical formalism itself stands in the way of the formation of perfect correlations. Consider, for example, a standard Stern-Gerlach measurement of the spin of a particle. After the interaction between the particle and the magnets, the wavefunction for the particle emerging from the magnets does not have a perfect correlation between mutually orthogonal spin and spatial parts. As a consequence, on measurement the particle will necessarily have a non-zero probability of turning up in the ‘wrong’ region (see Dickson (1994) for a longer discussion of this point). Only in the limiting situation of infinite times will a perfect correlation develop. So the problem we are facing here is not a problem of engineering alone; it is intrinsic to quantum theory. (For this reason, we might expect to learn something by examining it, whether modal interpretations survive the problem or not.)

The response of modal interpretations to this problem of intrinsic ‘inaccuracy’ in measurements comes in three stages. First, we may notice that the ‘error terms’ in the state of the compound (apparatus plus measured) system would typically be very small, so that the true final state would be extremely close to the ideal state (in the sense that their inner product would be very close to one). In that case, one might expect that the spectral decompositions (of the reduced states for the apparatus and measured system) would pick out states for the two systems that are extremely close to the ideal states. Specifically, the real possibly possessed properties of the apparatus would be very close (in Hilbert space) to the ideal possibly possessed properties. One interesting issue that arises here is whether close is good enough. Whatever one's answer, it is crucial to realize that modal interpretations are not here proposing a FAPP (‘for all practical purposes’) solution to the measurement problem. No, they assert that the real state of the apparatus is ‘close’ to the ideally expected state, and that there is no empirical problem with making this assertion.

There are two other important problems relating to imperfect measurements. First, when the final state of the compound system of measuring device and object system is very nearly degenerate (when written in the basis given by the measured observable and the apparatus's ‘pointer’ observable — i.e., when the probabilities for the various results are nearly equal), the spectral decomposition does not, in general, choose a basis that is even close to the ideally expected result. This point was discussed in greatest detail by Bacciagaluppi and Hemmo (1996). This seems to pose a severe problem for the modal interpretation based on the spectral decomposition. However, relying on the (near) ubiquity of decoherence in the macroscopic realm, Bacciagaluppi and Hemmo show that when the apparatus is considered as a finite-dimensional system (when the apparatus is modelled in a finite-dimensional Hilbert space), decoherence guarantees that the spectral decomposition of the (reduced) state of any macroscopic object will be very close to the ideally expected result. For example, pointers will be well-localized in position. In other words, in the case of finite dimensional Hilbert spaces the degeneracy problem can be dissolved by appealing to the fact that in real measurements, with macroscopic devices, there is a decohering environment (or even decohering processes within the devices themselves, see Castagnino and Lombardi, 2004); the latter is responsible for the emergence of the right definite-valued observables (Schlosshauer, 2004). So the modal approach based on the spectral decomposition seems safe here.

However, the case of infinitely many distinct states for the apparatus is perhaps more realistic. Bacciagaluppi (2000) has analyzed this situation, using a continuous model of the apparatus' interaction with the environment. He concludes that now the spectral decomposition of the reduced state of the apparatus does not pick out states that are highly localized. This result applies more generally to other cases where a macroscopic system (not idealized as finite-dimensional) experiences decoherence due to interaction with its environment (see Donald (1998)).

This problem is serious. Even standard non-relativistic quantum theory occurs in the arena of infinite-dimensional Hilbert spaces, not to mention quantum field theory. Several worries and suspicions result from the problem that in the case of an infinite number of degrees of freedom the expected observables are generally not picked out as definite-valued by the spectral decomposition. The first is that the modal interpretation, as stated thus far, was never in a position to deal with quantum mechanics in infinite-dimensional Hilbert spaces. The second (related to the first) is that the spectral decomposition is perhaps after all not the right tool to pick out the possibly possessed properties. Perhaps there is a more appropriate general scheme of which the spectral decomposition is a special case (Spekkens and Sipe, 2001a,b, Castagnino and Lombardi, 2006, Dieks, 2007). This suggestion might be combined with the earlier-mentioned idea that it may be more appropriate to think in terms of perspectival or relational properties than in terms of properties that are possessed in an absolute way. Indeed, Bene and Dieks (2002) have proposed a perspectival version of the modal interpretation that seems to be able to circumvent some of the problems connected with infinitely many degrees of freedom. Berkovitz and Hemmo (2006) have also put forward a perspectival (or relational) version of the modal interpretation. These proposals deserve further study. The most direct and general response, however, is to generalize the original modal scheme so that it naturally fits into a field-theoretic context, with infinitely many degrees of freedom. A plausible generalization of this type has been proposed by Clifton (2000); see below. Results by Earman and Ruetsche (2005) show however that this field-theoretical modal interpretation still faces the problem that the definite properties that are picked out are not always the expected ones — often only trivial observables are made definite — though it is unclear whether this actually constitutes a threat to the empirical adequacy of the interpretation.

5. The Algebraic Approach

The Algebraic approach to modal interpretations aims for a formalism that is significantly more general than that developed thus far — one that can apply to quantum theory in infinite-dimensional Hilbert space, and to quantum field theory — and, further, abstracts away from a particular choice for the possibly possessed properties.

The rudiments of an algebraic approach are already present in the work of those who, from the mid 1990s, aimed to provide a motivation for modal interpretations. We saw there that modal interpretations were described in more or less algebraic terms, namely, as a certain set closed under algebraic operations (the operations of meet, join, and orthocomplement on the lattice of projections on a Hilbert space, for example). Indeed, Bub defines his interpretation in these terms: his set of possible possessed properties is defined algebraically, as a lattice (definable from the state and a preferred observable R).

While it was recognized by early workers (Bub, Clifton, Dickson, and others) that the set of possibly possessed properties can be characterized in interesting algebraic ways, the first serious algebraic work on modal interpretations was done by Bell and Clifton (1995), who defined the notion of a ‘quasiBoolean algebra’. These algebras are ‘almost’ distributive, in a well-defined sense. It is their ‘near’ distributivity that permits the definition of classical probability measures over them, which in many interpreters' eyes is the precondition for adopting an ignorance interpretation of probabilities.

Following on this work, Zimba and Clifton (1998) changed tack a bit, and considered not algebras (or lattices) of projection operators, but algebras of observables. The advantages of this approach are many. First, there is a well-developed theory of operator algebras upon which one can draw. Second, it allows one, in principle, to deal with observables generally, including those that do not have (proper) eigenspaces. Third, it provides a possibly more compelling justification for the kinds of ‘closure’ condition that have been mentioned above.

Zimba and Clifton focus largely on this last issue, considering a number of closure conditions on the set of definite-valued observables. For example, should the set be closed under taking real linear combinations? (In this case, one assumes that a real linear combination of observables that are definite-valued is itself definite-valued.) Arbitrary algebraic combinations? Arbitrary (‘self-adjoint’) functions? Zimba and Clifton prove a number of interesting results concerning the algebra of observables picked out by modal interpretations. (Their results are not all applicable to the infinite-dimensional case, however). Somewhat more precisely, one begins with a quasiBoolean algebra of projections — not necessarily one picked out by any of the prescriptions we have discussed, but just any quasiBoolean algebra — and then considers the observables that are definite-valued in virtue of this quasiBoolean algebra's constituting an algebra of possibly-possessed properties. Following Zimba and Clifton, let us call such an algebra of observables D. Zimba and Clifton then consider whether there exist valuations on D (i.e., assignments of values to all observables in D) that respect arbitrary (self-adjoint) functional relationships among the observables in D. That is, letting v[A] represent the value of A (for A in D), and letting f be any (self-adjoint) function, we require that f(v[A]) = v[f(A)]. The answer is ‘yes’. More importantly, they show that there are sufficiently many such valuations that the quantum-mechanical probabilities over D can be recovered from a classical probability measure over all such valuations. In other words, one can understand quantum-mechanical probabilities as ignorance about which values the observables in D actually have.

A later installment of this line of reasoning is due to Halvorson and Clifton (1999). They extend results from Zimba and Clifton to the case of unbounded observables (though there remain open questions about this case).

6. Dynamics

As we have seen, modal interpretations propose to provide, for every moment in time, a set of possibly-possessed properties (or definite-valued observables) and probabilities for possession of these properties (or for values of these observables). Some advocates of modal interpretations may be willing to leave the matter, more or less, at that. Others take it to be crucial for any modal interpretation that it also answer questions of the form: Given that a system possesses property P at time s, what is the probability that it will possess property P′ at time t (t > s)? In other words, they want a dynamics of possessed properties. (It is clear for instance that Healey's account requires some such dynamics.)

There are arguments on both sides. Those who consider a dynamics of possessed properties to be superfluous wonder whether quantum mechanics could not get away with just single-time probabilities. Why can we not settle for an interpretation that supplements standard quantum mechanics only by providing in a systematic way a set (the set of possibly possessed properties) over which its single-time probabilities are defined? If we require of this set that it include all the everyday properties of macroscopic objects, including those relating to records and memories, then what more do we need? Arguably, van Fraassen has such a position, considering a dynamics of value states to be more than what an interpretation of quantum mechanics needs to provide.

Those who argue for the necessity of dynamics reply that we need an assurance that the trajectories of possessed properties really are, at least for macroscopic objects, like we see them to be, i.e., like records and memories indicate. For example, we should require not only that the book at rest on the desk have a definite location, but also that, if undisturbed, its location relative to the desk does not change in time. Hence one cannot get away with simply specifying the definite properties at each time. We need also to be shown that this specification is at least compatible with a reasonable dynamics. Even better, we would like to see the dynamics explicitly.

The issue comes down to what one considers to be ‘the phenomena that need saving’ by an interpretation. Those who believe that the phenomena in question include dynamical phenomena will search for a dynamics of possessed properties (or definite values). Others might doubt whether we really have empirical access to history: are instaneous properties, including records and memories, not the only things we observe? As pointed out by Ruetsche (2003), it is important in this context whether the modal interpretation is viewed as resulting in a hidden-variables theory, in which value states are added as hidden variables to the original formalism in order to obtain a full description of the physical situation, or rather as only equipping the original formalism with a new semantics. In the first approach one would expect a full dynamics of value states, in the second this is not so clear.

Of course, modal interpretations do admit — trivially — a dynamics, namely, one in which there is no correlation from one time to the next — however, this dynamics seems unreasonable. (In this case, probability of a transition from the property P at s to P′ at t is just the single-time probability for P′ at t.) In such a case, the book on the table might not remain at rest relative to the table, even if undisturbed. Such a dynamics is unlikely to interest those who feel the need for a dynamics at all.

Several researchers have contributed to the project of constructing a more interesting form of dynamics for modal interpretations. An important account is due to Bacciagaluppi and Dickson (1999). That work shows that most of the significant challenges facing the construction of a dynamics can be answered in principle, though there remain open questions.

The first challenge is posed by the fact that the set of possibly possessed properties — let us call it ‘S’ — can change over time. In other words, the ‘state space’ (S) over which we wish to define transition probabilities is itself time-dependent. One therefore has to define a family of maps, each one being a 1-1 map from S at one time to (a different!) S at another time. With such a family of maps, one can effectively define conditional probabilities within a single state space, then translate them into ‘transition’ probabilities. For this technique to work, S must have the same cardinality at each time. However, in general (for example, in those interpretations that rely on the spectral decomposition), it does not (the number of different projections appearing in the spectral decomposition of the density matrix may vary with time). A way out of this is to augment S at each time so that its cardinality matches the highest cardinality that S ever achieves.

Of course, one hopes to do so in a way that is not completely ad hoc. For example, in the context of the spectral decomposition version of the modal interpretation, Bacciagaluppi, Donald, and Vermaas (1995) show that the ‘trajectory’ (through Hilbert space) of the spectral components of the reduced state of a physical system will, under reasonable conditions, be continuous, or have only isolated discontinuities (so that the trajectory can be naturally extended to a continuous trajectory). This result suggests a natural family of maps as discussed above: map each spectral component at one time to its unique (continuous) evolute at later times.

The second challenge to the construction of a dynamics arises from the fact that one wants to define transition probabilities over infinitesimal units of time, then derive the finite-time transition probabilities from them. Adapting results from the theory of stochastic processes, one can show that the procedure can, more or less, be carried out for modal interpretations of at least some varieties.

Finally, one must actually define infinitesimal transition probabilities that will give rise to the proper quantum-mechanical probabilities at a time. Following earlier work by Bell (1984) and Vink (1993) and others, Bacciagaluppi and Dickson define in fact an infinite class of such infinitesimal transition probabilities. Some of them might be considered more ‘quantum-mechanical’ than others, but all of them generate the correct single-time probabilities, which are, as we have seen, arguably all we can really test. However, Sudbery (2002) has contended that the form of the transition probabilities would be relevant to the precise form of spontaneous decay or the 'Dehmelt quantum jumps' (otherwise known as 'quantum telegraph' or 'intermittent fluorescence'); he independently develops the dynamics of Bacciagaluppi and Dickson and applies it in such a way that it leads to the correct predictions for these experiments (compare Shimony, 1990, about the idea that quantum dynamics may be tested in experiments). More recently, Gambetta et al. (2003, 2004) have developed a dynamical modal account in the form of a non-Markovian process with noise, also extending their approach to positive operator-valued measures (POVMs).

7. Open Problems and Projects

There are a number of open projects and problems in the modal program. Above we saw that the original version based on the spectral decomposition may be empirically inadequate. Will a perspectival or relational extension (Bene and Dieks, 2002, Berkovitz and Hemmo, 2006) be able to solve these problems? If so, a more detailed analysis than given hitherto of the ontology of such a relational interpretation is needed. There may be a connection here with Rovelli's (1996) relational interpretation; see also Pearle (2005) for possible relations between the modal interpretation and other no-collapse interpretations.

Other fundamental questions may be posed. For example, is it reasonable to attach direct physical meaning to the mathematical structure of quantum mechanics, in the way modal interpretations do? Some have argued that quantum theory should not be viewed primarily in terms of operators and quantum states; some even question the fundamentality of the Hilbert space formalism, which modal interpretations take quite seriously. For example, Daumer et al. (1996) contend that one should not naïvely take operators to represent physical quantities (it is controversial whether modal interpretations in fact do so, at least in the naïve sense that these authors dislike). On the other hand, Brown, Suárez, and Bacciagaluppi (1998) argue that there is more to quantum reality than what is described by operators and quantum states: they claim that gauges and coordinate systems are important to our description of physical reality as well, while modal interpretations have standardly not taken such things into consideration.

The algebraic approach initially abstracts away from specific choices about the set of definite-valued observables, but in the end one feels compelled to return to this issue. Indeed, at the very least one would like to know that some choice or other can at least capture what we believe to be true about the world. We have noted a number of theorems of the form ‘the largest set of observables that can be made simultaneously definite (subject to some conditions) is S’. But is it plausible to assume that nature prefers such maximal sets and makes all statements corresponding to one of them simultaneously true? One may also ask more fundamental questions about the algebraic approach itself. For example, what is the motivation for the algebraic closure conditions? Do the functional operations correspond to well-defined empirical operations? The algebraic work is also a source of several open technical questions. Halvorson and Clifton (1999) mention several of them.

A fundamental question that has only started to receive attention is the extension of the approach to algebraic quantum field theory (Clifton, 2000, Dieks, 2002, Kitajima, 2004, Earman and Ruetsche, 2005). Clifton has proposed a natural generalization of the non-relativistic modal scheme, but as Earman and Ruetsche show it is not yet clear whether it will be able to deal with measurement situations, and whether it can be empirically adequate. The field-theoretic approach may offer a promising answer to doubts that have been raised about the compatibility of the modal scheme with Lorentz-invariance, though. Dickson and Clifton (1998) have shown that a large class of modal interpretations of ordinary quantum mechanics cannot be made Lorentz-invariant in a straightforward way; these results were extended by Myrvold (2002). The problems revealed by these investigations seem related to the non-relativistic nature of the formalism of quantum mechanics, in particular to the fact that the concept of a state of an extended system at one instant is central. In a local field-theoretic context this becomes different, and this may avoid conflicts with relativity (Earman and Ruetsche, 2005). Berkovitz and Hemmo (2005) and Hemmo and Berkovitz (2005) propose a different way out: they argue that perspectivalism can come to the rescue here — see also Berkovitz and Hemmo (2006)

In the realm of dynamics, Bacciagaluppi and Dickson (1999) raise a number of open questions. In addition to these, the issue whether a dynamics is really needed at all is an important topic of discussion, also from a wider philosophical point of view. There is a relation here to issues in the philosophy of time, in particular to the question of whether it is possible to do without the concept of history and evolution in time at all — perhaps it is sufficient to consider only instantaneous states, including records and memories (Barbour, 1999)?

These and similar problems, and their proposed solutions, have arisen in the context of detailed technical investigations. This illustrates one of the advantages of the modal approach: it makes use of a precise set of rules that determine the set of definite-valued observables, and this makes it possible to derive rigorous results. It may well be that several of these results, e.g., no-go theorems, can be applied to other interpretations as well (e.g., to the many-worlds interpretation — Dieks, 2007). Whatever the merit of the modal ideas in the end, one can at least say that they have given rise to a serious and fruitful series of investigations into the nature of quantum theory.


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