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The Role of Decoherence in Quantum Mechanics

First published Mon Nov 3, 2003; substantive revision Thu Aug 23, 2007

Interference phenomena are a well-known and crucial feature of quantum mechanics, the two-slit experiment providing a standard example. There are situations, however, in which interference effects are (artificially or spontaneously) suppressed. We shall need to make precise what this means, but the theory of decoherence is the study of (spontaneous) interactions between a system and its environment that lead to such suppression of interference. This study includes detailed modelling of system-environment interactions, derivation of equations (‘master equations’) for the (reduced) state of the system, discussion of time-scales etc. A discussion of the concept of suppression of interference and a simplified survey of the theory is given in Section 2, emphasising features that will be relevant to the following discussion (and restricted to standard non-relativistic particle quantum mechanics.[1] A partially overlapping field is that of decoherent histories, which proceeds from an abstract definition of loss of interference, but which we shall not be considering in any detail.

Decoherence is relevant (or is claimed to be relevant) to a variety of questions ranging from the measurement problem to the arrow of time, and in particular to the question of whether and how the ‘classical world’ may emerge from quantum mechanics. This entry mainly deals with the role of decoherence in relation to the main problems and approaches in the foundations of quantum mechanics. Section 3 analyses the claim that decoherence solves the measurement problem, as well as the broadening of the problem through the inclusion of environmental interactions, the idea of emergence of classicality, and the motivation for discussing decoherence together with approaches to the foundations of quantum mechanics. Section 4 then reviews the relation of decoherence with some of the main foundational approaches. Finally, in Section 5 we mention suggested applications that would push the role of decoherence even further.

Suppression of interference has of course featured in many papers since the beginning of quantum mechanics, such as Mott's (1929) analysis of alpha-particle tracks. The modern beginnings of decoherence as a subject in its own right are arguably the papers by H. D. Zeh of the early 1970s (Zeh 1970; 1973). Very well known are also the papers by W. Zurek from the early 1980s (Zurek 1981; 1982). Some of these earlier examples of decoherence (e.g., suppression of interference between left-handed and right-handed states of a molecule) are mathematically more accessible than more recent ones. A concise and readable introduction to the theory is provided by Zurek in Physics Today (1991). This article was followed by publication of several letters with Zurek's replies (1993), which highlight controversial issues. More recent surveys are Zeh 1995, which devotes much space to the interpretation of decoherence, and Zurek 2003. The textbook on decoherence by Giulini et al. (1996) and the very recent book by Schlosshauer (2007) are also highly recommended.[2]

2. Basics of Decoherence

2.1 Interference and suppression of interference

The two-slit experiment is a paradigm example of an interference experiment. One repeatedly sends electrons or other particles through a screen with two narrow slits, the electrons impinge upon a second screen, and we ask for the probability distribution of detections over the surface of the screen. In order to calculate this, one cannot just take the probabilities of passage through the slits, multiply with the probabilities of detection at the screen conditional on passage through either slit, and sum over the contributions of the two slits.[3] There is an additional so-called interference term in the correct expression for the probability, and this term depends on both wave components that pass through the slits.

Thus, the experiment shows that the correct description of the electron in terms of quantum wave functions is indeed one in which the wave passes through both slits. The quantum state of the electron is not given by a wave that passes through the upper slit or a wave that passes through the lower slit, not even with a probabilistic measure of ignorance.

There are, however, situations in which this interference term is not observed, i.e., in which the classical probability formula applies. This happens for instance when we perform a detection at the slits, whether or not we believe that measurements are related to a ‘true’ collapse of the wave function (i.e., that only one of the components survives the measurement and proceeds to hit the screen). The disappearence of the interference term, however, can happen also spontaneously, even when no ‘true collapse’ is presumed to happen, namely if some other systems (say, sufficiently many stray cosmic particles scattering off the electron) suitably interact with the wave between the slits and the screen. In this case, the interference term is not observed, because the electron has become entangled with the stray particles (see the entry on quantum entanglement and information).[4] The phase relation between the two components which is responsible for interference is well-defined only at the level of the larger system composed of electron and stray particles, and can produce interference only in a suitable experiment including the larger system. Probabilities for results of measurements are calculated as if the wave function had collapsed to one or the other of its two components, but the phase relations have merely been distributed over a larger system.

It is this phenomenon of suppression of interference through suitable interaction with the environment that we refer to by ‘suppression of interference’, and that is studied in the theory of decoherence.[5] For completeness, we mention the overlapping but distinct concept of decoherent (or consistent) histories. Decoherence in the sense of this abstract formalism is defined simply by the condition that (quantum) probabilities for wave components at a later time may be calculated from those for wave components at an earlier time and the (quantum) conditional probabilities, according to the standard classical formula, i.e., as if the wave had collapsed. There is some controversy, which we leave aside, as to claims surrounding the status of this formalism as a foundational approach in its own right. Without these claims, the formalism is interpretationally neutral and can be useful in describing situations of suppression of interference. Indeed, the abstract definition has the merit of bringing out two conceptual points that are crucial to the idea of decoherence and that will be emphasised in the following: that wave components can be reidentified over time, and that if we do so, we can formally identify ‘trajectories’ for the system.[6]

2.2 Features of decoherence

The theory of decoherence (sometimes also referred to as ‘dynamical’ decoherence) studies concrete spontaneous interactions that lead to suppression of interference.

Several features of interest arise in models of such interactions (although by no means are all such features common to all models):

None of these features are claimed to obtain in all cases of interaction with some environment. It is a matter of detailed physical investigation to assess which systems exhibit which features, and how general the lessons are that we might learn from studying specific models. In particular one should beware of common overgeneralisations. For instance, decoherence does not affect only and all ‘macroscopic systems’. True, middle-sized objects, say, on the Earth's surface will be very effectively decohered by the air in the atmosphere, and this is an excellent example of decoherence at work. On the other hand, there are also very good examples of decoherence-like interactions affecting microscopic systems, such as in the interaction of alpha particles with the gas in a bubble chamber. And further, there are arguably macroscopic systems for which interference effects are not suppressed. For instance, it has been shown to be possible to sufficiently shield SQUIDS (a type of superconducting devices) from decoherence for the purpose of observing superpositions of different macroscopic currents — contrary to what one had expected (see e.g., Leggett 1984; and esp. 2002, Section 5.4). Anglin, Paz and Zurek (1997) examine some less well-behaved models of decoherence and provide a useful corrective as to the limits of decoherence.

3. Conceptual Appraisal

3.1 Solving the measurement problem?

The fact that interference is typically very well suppressed between localised states of macroscopic objects suggests that it is relevant to why macroscopic objects in fact appear to us to be in localised states. A stronger claim is that decoherence is not only relevant to this question but by itself already provides the complete answer. In the special case of measuring apparatus, it would explain why we never observe an apparatus pointing, say, to two different results, i.e., decoherence would provide a solution to the measurement problem. As pointed out by many authors, however (recently e.g., Adler 2003; Zeh 1995, pp. 14-15), this claim is not tenable.

The measurement problem, in a nutshell, runs as follows. Quantum mechanical systems are described by wave-like mathematical objects (vectors) of which sums (superpositions) can be formed (see the entry on quantum mechanics). Time evolution (the Schrödinger equation) preserves such sums. Thus, if a quantum mechanical system (say, an electron) is described by a superposition of two given states, say, spin in x-direction equal +1/2 and spin in x-direction equal -1/2, and we let it interact with a measuring apparatus that couples to these states, the final quantum state of the composite will be a sum of two components, one in which the apparatus has coupled to (has registered) x-spin = +1/2, and one in which the apparatus has coupled to (has registered) x-spin = -1/2. The problem is that while we may accept the idea of microscopic systems being described by such sums, we cannot even begin to imagine what it would mean for the (composite of electron and) apparatus to be so described.

Now, what happens if we include decoherence in the description? Decoherence tells us, among other things, that there are plenty of interactions in which differently localised states of macroscopic systems couple to different states of their environment. In particular, the differently localised states of the macroscopic system could be the states of the pointer of the apparatus registering the different x-spin values of the electron. By the same argument as above, the composite of electron, apparatus and environment will be a sum of a state corresponding to the environment coupling to the apparatus coupling in turn to the value +1/2 for the spin, and of a state corresponding to the environment coupling to the apparatus coupling in turn to the value -1/2 for the spin. So again we cannot imagine what it would mean for the composite system to be described by such a sum.

We are left with the following choice whether or not we include decoherence: either the composite system is not described by such a sum, because the Schrödinger equation actually breaks down and needs to be modified, or it is, but then we need to understand what that means, and this requires giving an appropriate interpretation of quantum mechanics. Thus, decoherence as such does not provide a solution to the measurement problem, at least not unless it is combined with an appropriate interpretation of the wave function. And indeed, as we shall see, some of the main workers in the field such as Zeh (2000) and Zurek (1998) suggest that decoherence is most naturally understood in terms of Everett-like interpretations (see below Section 4.3, and the entries on Everett's relative-state interpretation and on the many-worlds interpretation).

Unfortunately, naive claims of the kind above are still somewhat part of the ‘folklore’ of decoherence, and deservedly attract the wrath of physicists (e.g., Pearle 1997) and philosophers (e.g., Bub 1999, Chap. 8) alike. (To be fair, this ‘folk’ position has the merit of attempting to subject measurement interactions to further physical analysis, without assuming that measurements are a fundamental building block of the theory.)

3.2 Compounding the measurement problem

Decoherence is clearly neither a dynamical evolution contradicting the Schrödinger equation, nor a new interpretation of the wave function. As we shall discuss, however, it does both reveal important dynamical effects within the Schrödinger evolution, and may be suggestive of possible interpretations of the wave function.

As such it has other things to offer to the philosophy of quantum mechanics. At first, however, it seems that discussion of environmental interactions even exacerbates the problems. Intuitively, if the environment is carrying out, without our intervention, lots of approximate position measurements, then the measurement problem ought to apply more widely, also to these spontaneously occurring measurements.

Indeed, while it is well-known that localised states of macroscopic objects spread very slowly under the free Schrödinger evolution (i.e., if there are no interactions), the situation turns out to be different if they are in interaction with the environment. Although the different components that couple to the environment will be individually incredibly localised, collectively they can have a spread that is many orders of magnitude larger. That is, the state of the object and the environment could be a superposition of zillions of very well localised terms, each with slightly different positions, and which are collectively spread over a macroscopic distance, even in the case of everyday objects.[11]

Given that everyday macroscopic objects are particularly subject to decoherence interactions, this raises the question of whether quantum mechanics can account for the appearance of the everyday world even beyond the measurement problem in the strict sense. To put it crudely: if everything is in interaction with everything else, everything is entangled with everything else, and that is a worse problem than the entanglement of measuring apparatuses with the measured probes. And indeed, discussing the measurement problem without taking decoherence (fully) into account may not be enough, as we shall illustrate by the case of some versions of the modal interpretation in Section 4.4.

3.3 Emergence of classicality

What suggests that decoherence may be relevant to the issue of the classical appearance of the everyday world is that at the level of components the quantum description of decoherence phenomena can display tantalisingly classical aspects. The question is then whether, if viewed in the context of any of the main foundational approaches to quantum mechanics, these classical aspects can be taken to explain corresponding classical aspects of the phenomena. The answer, perhaps unsurprisingly, turns out to depend on the chosen approach, and in the next section we shall discuss in turn the relation between decoherence and several of the the main approaches to the foundations of quantum mechanics.

Even more generally, one could ask whether the results of decoherence could thus be used to explain the emergence of the entire classicality of the everyday world, i.e., to explain both kinematical features such as macroscopic localisation and dynamical features such as approximately Newtonian or Brownian trajectories, whenever they happen to be phenomenologically adequate descriptions. As we have mentioned, there are cases in which a classical description is not a good description of a phenomenon, even if the phenomenon involves macroscopic systems. There are also cases, notably quantum measurements, in which the classical aspects of the everyday world are only kinematical (definiteness of pointer readings), while the dynamics is highly non-classical (indeterministic response of the apparatus). In a sense, the everyday world is the world of classical concepts as presupposed by Bohr (see the entry on the Copenhagen interpretation) in order to describe in the first place the ‘quantum phenomena’, which themselves would thus become a consequence of decoherence (Zeh 1995, p. 33; see also Bacciagaluppi 2002, Section 6.2). The question of explaining the classicality of the everyday world becomes the question of whether one can derive from within quantum mechanics the conditions necessary to discover and practise quantum mechanics itself, and thus, in Shimony's (1989) words, closing the circle.

In this generality the question is clearly too hard to answer, depending as it does on how far the physical programme of decoherence (Zeh 1995, p. 9) can be successfully developed. We shall thus postpone the (partly speculative) discussion of how far the programme of decoherence might go until Section 5.

4. Decoherence and Approaches to Quantum Mechanics

There is a wide range of approaches to the foundations of quantum mechanics. The term ‘approach’ here is more appropriate than the term ‘interpretation’, because several of these approaches are in fact modifications of the theory, or at least introduce some prominent new theoretical aspects. A convenient way of classifying these approaches is in terms of their strategies for dealing with the measurement problem.

Some approaches, so-called collapse approaches, seek to modify the Schrödinger equation, so that superpositions of different ‘everyday’ states do not arise or are very unstable. Such approaches may have intuitively little to do with decoherence since they seek to suppress precisely those superpositions that are created by decoherence. Nevertheless their relation to decoherence is interesting. Among collapse approaches, we shall discuss (in Section 4.1) von Neumann's collapse postulate and theories of spontaneous localisation (see the entry on collapse theories).

Other approaches, known as ‘hidden variables’ approaches, seek to explain quantum phenomena as equilibrium statistical effects arising from a theory at a deeper level, rather strongly in analogy with attempts at understanding thermodynamics in terms of statistical mechanics (see the entry on philosophy of statistical mechanics). Of these, the most developed are the so-called pilot-wave theories, in particular the theory by de Broglie and Bohm (see the entry on Bohmian mechanics), whose relation to decoherence we discuss in Section 4.2.

Finally, there are approaches that seek to solve the measurement problem strictly by providing an appropriate interpretation of the theory. Slightly tongue in cheek, one can group together under this heading approaches as diverse as Everett interpretations (see the entries on Everett's relative-state interpretation and on the many-worlds interpretation), modal interpretations and Bohr's Copenhagen interpretation (Sections 4.3, 4.4 and 4.5, respectively).

We shall be analysing these approaches specifically in their relation to decoherence. For further details and more general assessment or criticism we direct the reader to the relevant entries.

4.1 Collapse approaches

4.1.1 Von Neumann

It is notorious that von Neumann (1932) proposed that the observer's consciousness is somehow related to what he called Process I, otherwise known as the collapse postulate or the projection postulate, which in his book is treated on a par with the Schrödinger equation (his Process II). There is some ambiguity in how to interpret von Neumann. He may have been advocating some sort of special access to our own consciousness that makes it appear to us that the wave function has collapsed, thus justifying a phenomenological reading of Process I. Alternatively, he may have proposed that consciousness plays some causal role in precipitating the collapse, in which case Process I is a physical process fully on a par with Process II.[12]

In either case, von Neumann's interpretation relies on the insensitivity of the final predictions (for what we consciously record) to exactly where and when Process I is used in modelling the evolution of the quantum system. This is often referred to as the movability of the von Neumann cut between the subject and the object, or some similar phrase. Collapse could occur when a particle impinges on a screen, or when the screen blackens, or when an automatic printout of the result is made, or in our retina, or along the optic nerve, or when ultimately consciousness is involved. Before and after the collapse, the Schrödinger equation would describe the evolution of the system.

Von Neumann shows that all of these models are equivalent, as far as the final predictions are concerned, so that he can indeed maintain that collapse is related to consciousness, while in practice applying the projection postulate at a much earlier (and more practical) stage in the description. What allows von Neumann to derive this result, however, is the assumption of absence of interference between different components of the wave function. Indeed, if interference were otherwise present, the timing of the collapse would influence the final statistics, just as it would in the case of the two-slit experiment (collapse behind the slits or at the screen). Thus, although von Neumann's is (at least on some readings) a true collapse approach, its reliance on decoherence is in fact crucial.

4.1.2 Spontaneous collapse theories

The best known theory of spontaneous collapse is the so-called GRW theory (Ghirardi Rimini & Weber 1986), in which a material particle spontaneously undergoes localisation in the sense that at random times it experiences a collapse of the form used to describe approximate position measurements.[13] In the original model, the collapse occurs independently for each particle (a large number of particles thus ‘triggering’ collapse much more frequently); in later models the frequency for each particle is weighted by its mass, and the overall frequency for collapse is thus tied to mass density.[14]

Thus, formally, the effect of spontaneous collapse is the same as in some of the models of decoherence, at least for one particle.[15] Two crucial differences on the other hand are that we have ‘true’ collapse instead of suppression of interference (see above Section 2), and that spontaneous collapse occurs without there being any interaction between the system and anything else, while in the case of decoherence suppression of interference obviously arises through interaction with the environment.

Can decoherence be put to use in GRW? The situation may be a bit complex when the decoherence interaction does not approximately privilege position (e.g., currents in a SQUID instead), because collapse and decoherence might actually ‘pull’ in different directions.[16] But in those cases in which the main decoherence interaction also takes the form of approximate position measurements, the answer boils down to a quantitative comparison. If collapse happens faster than decoherence, then the superposition of components relevant to decoherence will not have time to arise, and insofar as the collapse theory is successful in recovering classical phenomena, decoherence plays no role in this recovery. Instead, if decoherence takes place faster than collapse, then (as in von Neumann's case) the collapse mechanism can find ‘ready-made’ structures onto which to truly collapse the wave function. This is indeed borne out by detailed comparison (Tegmark 1993, esp. Table 2). Thus, it seems that decoherence does play a role also in spontaneous collapse theories.

A related point is whether decoherence has implications for the experimental testability of spontaneous collapse theories. Indeed, provided decoherence can be put to use also in no-collapse approaches such as pilot-wave or Everett (possibilities that we discuss in the next sub-sections), then in all cases in which decoherence is faster than collapse, what might be interpreted as evidence for collapse could be reinterpreted as ‘mere’ suppression of interference (think of definite measurement outcomes!), and only cases in which the collapse theory predicts collapse but the system is shielded from decoherence (or perhaps in which the two pull in different directions) could be used to test collapse theories experimentally.

One particularly bad scenario for experimental testability is related to the speculation (in the context of the ‘mass density’ version) that the cause of spontaneous collapse may be connected with gravitation. Tegmark 1993 (Table 2) quotes some admittedly uncertain estimates for the suppression of interference due to a putative quantum gravity, but they are quantitatively very close to the rate of destruction of interference due to the GRW collapse (at least outside of the microscopic domain). Similar conclusions are arrived at by Kay (1998). If there is indeed such a quantitative similarity between these possible effects, then it would become extremely difficult to distinguish between the two (with the above proviso). In the presence of gravitation, any positive effect could be interpreted as support for either collapse or decoherence. And in those cases in which the system is effectively shielded from decoherence (say, if the experiment is performed in free fall), if the collapse mechanics is indeed triggered by gravitational effects, then no collapse might be expected either. The relation between decoherence and spontaneous collapse theories is thus indeed far from straightforward.

4.2 Pilot-wave theories

Pilot-wave theories are no-collapse formulations of quantum mechanics that assign to the wave function the role of determining the evolution of (‘piloting’, ‘guiding’) the variables characterising the system, say particle configurations, as in de Broglie's (1928) and Bohm's (1952) theory, or fermion number density, as in Bell's (1987, Chap. 19) ‘beable’ quantum field theory, or again field confugurations, as in Valentini's proposals for pilot-wave quantum field theories (Valentini, in preparation; see also Valentini 1996).

De Broglie's idea had been to modify classical Hamiltonian mechanics in such a way as to make it analogous to classical wave optics, by substituting for Hamilton and Jacobi's action function the phase S of a physical wave. Such a ‘wave mechanics’ of course yields non-classical motions, but in order to understand how de Broglie's dynamics relates to typical quantum phenomena, we must include Bohm's (1952, Part II) analysis of the appearance of collapse. In the case of measurements, Bohm argued that the wave function evolves into a superposition of components that are and remain separated in the total configuration space of measured system and apparatus, so that the total configuration is ‘trapped’ inside a single component of the wave function, which will guide its further evolution, as if the wave had collapsed (‘effective’ wave function). This analysis allows one to recover qualitatively the measurement collapse and by extension typical quantum features such as the uncertainty principle and the perfect correlations in an EPR experiment (we are ignoring here the well developed quantitative aspects of the theory).

A natural idea is now that this analysis should be extended from the case of measurements induced by an apparatus to that of the ‘spontaneous measurements’ performed by the environment in the theory of decoherence, thus applying the same strategy for recovering both quantum and classical phenomena. The resulting picture is one in which de Broglie-Bohm theory, in cases of decoherence, would describe the motion of particles that are trapped inside one of the extremely well localised components selected by the decoherence interaction. Thus, de Broglie-Bohm trajectories will partake of the classical motions on the level defined by decoherence (the width of the components). This use of decoherence would arguably resolve the puzzles discussed e.g., by Holland (1996) with regard to the possibility of a ‘classical limit’ of de Broglie's theory. One baffling problem is for instance that possible trajectories in de Broglie-Bohm theory differing in their initial conditions cannot cross, because the wave guides the particles by way of a first-order equation, while Newton's equations are second-order, as well-known, and possible trajectories do cross. However, the non-interfering components produced by decoherence can indeed cross, and so will the trajectories of particles trapped inside them.

The above picture is natural, but it is not obvious. De Broglie-Bohm theory and decoherence contemplate two a priori distinct mechanisms connected to apparent collapse: respectively, separation of components in configuration space and suppression of interference. While the former obviously implies the latter, it is equally obvious that decoherence need not imply separation in configuration space. One can expect, however, that decoherence interactions of the form of approximate position measurements will.

If the main instances of decoherence are indeed coextensive with instances of separation in configuration, de Broglie-Bohm theory can thus use the results of decoherence relating to the formation of classical structures, while providing an interpretation of quantum mechanics that explains why these structures are indeed observationally relevant. The question that arises for de Broglie-Bohm theory is then the extension of the well-known question of whether all apparent measurement collapses can be associated with separation in configuration (by arguing that at some stage all measurement results are recorded in macroscopically different configurations) to the question of whether all appearance of classicality can be associated with separation in configuration space.[17]

A discussion of the role of decoherence in pilot-wave theory in the form suggested above is still largely outstanding. An informal discussion is given in Bohm and Hiley (1993, Chap. 8), partial results are given by Appleby (1999), and a different approach is suggested by Allori (2001; see also Allori & Zanghì 2001). Appleby discusses trajectories in a model of decoherence and obtains approximately classical trajectories, but under a special assumption.[18] Allori investigates in the first place the ‘short wavelength’ limit of de Broglie-Bohm theory (suggested by the analogy to the geometric limit in wave optics). The role of decoherence in her analysis is crucial but limited to maintaining the classical behaviour obtained under the appropriate short wavelength conditions, because the behaviour would otherwise break down after a certain time.

4.3 Everett interpretations

Everett interpretations are very diverse, and possibly only share the core intuition that a single wave function of the universe should be interpreted in terms of a multiplicity of ‘realities’ at some level or other. This multiplicity, however understood, is formally associated with components of the wave function in some decomposition.[19]

Various Everett interpretations, roughly speaking, differ as to how to identify the relevant components of the universal wave function, and how to justify such an identification (the so-called problem of the ‘preferred basis’ — although this may be a misnomer), and differ as to how to interpret the resulting multiplicity (various ‘many-worlds’ or various ‘many-minds’ interpretations), in particular with regard to the interpretation of the (emerging?) probabilities at the level of the components (problem of the ‘meaning of probabilities’).

The last problem is perhaps the most hotly debated aspect of Everett. Clearly, decoherence enables reidentification over time of both observers and of results of repeated measurement and thus definition of empirical frequencies. In recent years progress has been made especially along the lines of interpreting the probabilities in decision-theoretic terms for a ‘splitting’ agent (see in particular Wallace 2003b, and its longer preprint, Wallace 2002).[20]

The most useful application of decoherence to Everett, however, seems to be in the context of the problem of the preferred basis. Decoherence seems to yield a (maybe partial) solution to the problem, in that it naturally identifies a class of ‘preferred’ states (not necessarily an orthonormal basis!), and even allows to reidentify them over time, so that one can identify ‘worlds’ with the trajectories defined by decoherence (or more abstractly with decoherent histories).[21] If part of the aim of Everett is to interpret quantum mechanics without introducing extra structure, in particular without postulating the existence of some preferred basis, then one will try to identify structure that is already present in the wave function at the level of components (see e.g., Wallace, 2003a). In this sense, decoherence is an ideal candidate for identifying the relevant components.

A justification for this identification can then be variously given by suggesting that a ‘world’ should be a temporally extended structure and thus reidentification over time will be a necessary condition for identifying worlds, or similarly by suggesting that in order for observers to evolve there must be stable records of past events (Saunders 1993, and the unpublished Gell-Mann & Hartle 1994 (see the Other Internet Resources section below), or that observers must be able to access robust states, preferably through the existence of redundant information in the environment (Zurek's ‘existential interpretation’, 1998).

In alternative to some global notion of ‘world’, one can look at the components of the (mixed) state of a (local) system, either from the point of view that the different components defined by decoherence will separately affect (different components of the state of) another system, or from the point of view that they will separately underlie the conscious experience (if any) of the system. The former sits well with Everett's (1957) original notion of relative state, and with the relational interpretation of Everett preferred by Saunders (e.g., 1993) and, it would seem, Zurek (1998). The latter leads directly to the idea of many-minds interpretations (see the entry on Everett's relative-state interpretation and the website on ‘A Many-Minds Interpretation of Quantum Theory’ referenced in the Other Internet Resources). If one assumes that mentality can be associated only with certain decohering structures of great complexity, this might have the advantage of further reducing the remaining ambiguity about the preferred ‘basis’.

The idea of many minds was suggested early on by Zeh (2000; also 1995, p. 24). As Zeh puts it, von Neumann's motivation for introducing collapse was to save what he called psycho-physical parallelism (arguably supervenience of the mental on the physical: only one mental state is experienced, so there should be only one corresponding component in the physical state). In a decohering no-collapse universe one can instead introduce a new psycho-physical parallelism, in which individual minds supervene on each non-interfering component in the physical state. Zeh indeed suggests that, given decoherence, this is the most natural interpretation of quantum mechanics.[22]

4.4 Modal interpretations

Modal interpretations originated with Van Fraassen (1973, 1991) as pure reinterpretations of quantum mechanics (other later versions coming to resemble more hidden variables theories). Van Fraassen's basic intuition was that the quantum state of a system should be understood as describing a collection of possibilities, represented by components in the (mixed) quantum state. His proposal considers only decompositions at single instants, and is agnostic about reidentification over time. Thus, it can directly exploit only the fact that decoherence produces descriptions in terms of classical-like states, which will count as possibilities in Van Fraassen's interpretation. This ensures ‘empirical adequacy’ of the quantum description (a crucial concept in Van Fraassen's philosophy of science). The dynamical aspects of decoherence can be exploited indirectly, in that single-time components will exhibit records of the past, which ensure adequacy with respect to observations, but about whose veridicity Van Fraassen remains agnostic.

A different strand of modal interpretations is loosely associated with the (distinct) views of Kochen (1985), Healey (1989) and Dieks and Vermaas (e.g., 1998). We focus on the last of these to fix the ideas. Van Fraassen's possible decompositions are restricted to one singled out by a mathematical criterion (related to the so-called biorthogonal decomposition theorem), and a dynamical picture is explicitly sought (and was later developed). In the case of an ideal (non-approximate) quantum measurement, this special decomposition coincides with that defined by the eigenstates of the measured observable and the corresponding pointer states, and the interpretation thus appears to solve the measurement problem (in the strict sense).

At least in Dieks's original intentions, however, the approach was meant to provide an attractive interpretation of quantum mechanics also in the case of decoherence interactions, since at least in simple models of decoherence the same kind of decomposition singles out more or less also those states between which interference is suppressed (with a proviso about very degenerate states).

However, this approach fails badly when applied to other models of decoherence, e.g., that in Joos and Zeh (1985, Section III.2). Indeed, it appears that in general the components singled out by this version of the modal interpretation are given by delocalised states, as opposed to the components arising naturally in the theory of decoherence (Bacciagaluppi 2000; Donald 1998). Notice that van Fraassen's original interpretatioin is untouched by this problem, and so are possibly some more recent modal or modal-like interpretations by Spekkens and Sipe (2001), Bene and Dieks (2002) and Berkovitz and Hemmo (in preparation).

Finally, some of the views espoused in the decoherent histories literature could be considered as cognate to Van Fraassen's views, identifying possibilities, however, at the level of possible courses of world history. Such ‘possible worlds’ would be those temporal sequences of (quantum) propositions that satisfy the decoherence condition and in this sense support a description in terms of a probabilistic evolution. This view would be using decoherence as an essential ingredient, and in fact may turn out to be the most fruitful way yet of implementing modal ideas; a discussion in these terms still needs to be carried out in detail, but see Hemmo (1996).

4.5 Bohr's Copenhagen interpretation

It appears that Bohr held more or less the following view. Everyday concepts, in fact the concepts of classical physics, are indispensable to the description of any physical phenomena (in a way — and terminology — much reminiscent of Kant's transcendental arguments). However, experimental evidence from atomic phenomena shows that classical concepts have fundamental limitations in their applicability: they can only give partial (complementary) pictures of physical objects. While these limitations are quantitatively negligible for most purposes in dealing with macroscopic objects, they apply also at that level (as shown by Bohr's willingness to apply the uncertainty relations to parts of the experimental apparatus in the Einstein-Bohr debates), and they are of paramount importance when dealing with microscopic objects. Indeed, they shape the characteristic features of quantum phenomena, e.g., indeterminism. The quantum state is not an ‘intuitive’ (anschaulich, also translated as ‘visualisable’) representation of a quantum object, but only a ‘symbolic’ representation, a shorthand for the quantum phenomena constituted by applying the various complementary classical pictures.

While it is difficult to pinpoint exactly what Bohr's views were (the concept and even the term ‘Copenhagen interpretation’ appear to be a later construct; see Howard 2003), it is clear that according to Bohr, classical concepts are autonomous from, and indeed conceptually prior to, quantum theory. If we understand the theory of decoherence as pointing to how classical concepts might in fact emerge from quantum mechanics, this seems to undermine Bohr's basic position. Of course it would be a mistake to say that decoherence (a part of quantum theory) contradicts the Copenhagen approach (an interpretation of quantum theory). However, decoherence does suggest that one might want to adopt alternative interpretations, in which it is the quantum concepts that are prior to the classical ones, or, more precisely, the classical concepts at the everyday level emerge from quantum mechanics (irrespectively of whether there are even more fundamental concepts, as in pilot-wave theories). In this sense, if the programme of decoherence is successful as sketched in Section 3.3, it will indeed be a blow to Bohr's interpretation coming from quantum physics itself.

On the other hand, Bohr's intuition that quantum mechanics as practised requires a classical domain would in fact be confirmed by decoherence, if it turns out that decoherence is indeed the basis for the phenomenology of quantum mechanics, as the Everettian and possibly the Bohmian analysis suggest. As a matter of fact, Zurek (2003) locates his existential interpretation half-way between Bohr and Everett. It is perhaps a gentle irony that in the wake of decoherence, the foundations of quantum mechanics might end up re-evaluating this part of Bohr's thinking.

5. Scope of Decoherence

We have already mentioned in Section 2.2 that some care has to be taken lest one overgeneralise conclusions based on examining only well-behaved models of decoherence. On the other hand, in order to assess the programme of explaining the emergence of classicality using decoherence (together with appropriate foundational approaches), one has to probe how far the applications of decoherence can be pushed. In this final section, we survey some of the further applications that have been proposed for decoherence, beyond the easier examples we have seen such as chirality or alpha-particle tracks. Whether decoherence can indeed be successfully applied to all of these fields will be in part a matter for further assessment, as more detailed models are proposed.

A straightforward application of the techniques allowing one to derive Newtonian trajectories at the level of components has been employed by Zurek and Paz (1994) to derive chaotic trajectories in quantum mechanics. The problem with the quantum description of chaotic behaviour is that prima facie there should be none. Chaos is characterised roughly as extreme sensitivity in the behaviour of a system on its initial conditions, where the distance between the trajectories arising from different initial conditions increases exponentially in time. Since the Schrödinger evolution is unitary, it preserves all scalar products and all distances between quantum state vectors. Thus, it would seem, close initial conditions lead to trajectories that are uniformly close throughout all of time, and no chaotic behaviour is possible (‘problem of quantum chaos’). The crucial point that enables Zurek and Paz' analysis is that the relevant trajectories in decoherence theory are at the level of components of the state of the system. Unitarity is preserved because the vectors in the environment to which these different components are coupled, are and remain orthogonal: how the components themselves evolve is immaterial. Explicit modelling yields a picture of quantum chaos in which different trajectories branch (a feature absent from classical chaos, which is deterministic) and then indeed diverge exponentially. As with the crossing of trajectories in de Broglie-Bohm theory (Section 4.2), one has behaviour at the level of components that is qualitatively different from the behaviour derived from wave functions of an isolated system.

The idea of effective superselection rules was mentioned in Section 2.2. As pointed out by Giulini, Kiefer and Zeh (1995, see also Giulini et al. 1996, Section 6.4), the justification for the (strict) superselection rule for charge in quantum field theory can also be phrased in terms of decoherence. The idea is simple: an electric charge is surrounded by a Coulomb field (which electrostatically is infinitely extended; the argument can also be carried through using the retarded field, though). States of different electric charge of a particle are thus coupled to different, presumably orthogonal, states of its electric field. One can consider the far-field as an effectively uncontrollable environment that decoheres the particle (and the near-field), so that superpositions of different charges are indeed never observed.

Another claim about the significance of decoherence relates to time asymmetry (see e.g., the entries on time asymmetry in thermodynamics and philosophy of statistical mechanics), in particular of whether decoherence can explain the apparent time-directedness in our (classical) world. The issue is again one of time-directedness at the level of components emerging from a time-symmetric evolution at the level of the universal wave function (presumably with special initial conditions). Insofar as (apparent) collapse is indeed a time-directed process, decoherence will have direct relevance to the emergence of this ‘quantum mechanical arrow of time’ (for a spectrum of discussions, see Zeh 2001, Chap. 4; Hartle 1998, and references therein; and Bacciagaluppi 2002, Section 6.1). Whether decoherence is connected to the other familiar arrows of time is a more specific question, various discussions of which are given, e.g., by Zurek and Paz (1994), Hemmo and Shenker (2001) and the unpublished Wallace (2001) (see the Other Internet Resources Section below).

In a recent paper, Zeh (2003) argues from the notion that decoherence can explain ‘quantum phenomena’ such as particle detections that the concept of a particle in quantum field theory is itself a consequence of decoherence. That is, only fields need to be included in the fundamental concepts, and ‘particles’ are a derived concept, unlike what is suggested by the customary introduction of fields through a process of ‘second quantisation’. Thus decoherence seems to provide a further powerful argument for the conceptual primacy of fields over particles in the question of the interpretation of quantum field theory.

Finally, it has been suggested that decoherence could be a useful ingredient in a theory of quantum gravity, for two reasons. First, because a suitable generalisation of decoherence theory to a full theory of quantum gravity should yield suppression of interference between different classical spacetimes (Giulini et al. 1996, Section 4.2). Second, it is speculated that decoherence might solve the so-called problem of time, which arises as a prominent puzzle in (the ‘canonical’ approach to) quantum gravity. This is the problem that the candidate fundamental equation (in this approach) — the Wheeler-DeWitt equation — is an analogue of a time-independent Schrödinger equation, and does not contain time at all. The problem is thus simply: where does time come from? In the context of decoherence theory, one can construct toy models in which the analogue of the Wheeler-DeWitt wave function decomposes into non-interfering components (for a suitable sub-system) each satisfying a time-dependent Schrödinger equation, so that decoherence appears in fact as the source of time.[23] An accessible introduction to and philosophical discussion of these models is given by Ridderbos (1999), with references to the original papers.


Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Einstein, Albert: Einstein-Bohr debates | quantum mechanics | quantum mechanics: Bohmian mechanics | quantum mechanics: collapse theories | quantum mechanics: Copenhagen interpretation of | quantum mechanics: Everett's relative-state formulation of | quantum mechanics: many-worlds interpretation of | quantum theory: measurement in | quantum theory: quantum entanglement and information | quantum theory: quantum field theory | quantum theory: quantum gravity | quantum theory: the Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen argument in | statistical physics: philosophy of statistical mechanics | time: thermodynamic asymmetry in | Uncertainty Principle


I wish to think many people in discussion with whom I have shaped my understanding of decoherence over the years, in particular Marcus Appleby, Matthew Donald, Beatrice Filkin, Meir Hemmo, Simon Saunders, David Wallace and Wojtek Zurek. For more recent discussions and correspondence relating to this article I wish to thank Valia Allori, Peter Holland, Martin Jones, Tony Leggett, Hans Primas, Alberto Rimini, Philip Stamp and Bill Unruh. I also gratefully acknowledge my debt to Steve Savitt and Philip Stamp for an invitation to talk at the University of British Columbia, and to Claudius Gros for an invitation to the University of the Saarland, and for the opportunities for discussion arising from these talks. Finally I wish to thank the referee of this entry, again David Wallace, for his clear and constructive commentary, my fellow subject editor John Norton, who corresponded with me extensively over a previous version of part of the material and whose suggestions I have taken to heart, my editor-in-chief Edward N. Zalta for his saintly patience, and my friend and predecessor as subject editor, the late Rob Clifton, who invited me to write on this topic in the first place.