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The Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen Argument in Quantum Theory

First published Mon May 10, 2004; substantive revision Wed Aug 5, 2009

In the May 15, 1935 issue of Physical Review Albert Einstein co-authored a paper with his two postdoctoral research associates at the Institute for Advanced Study, Boris Podolsky and Nathan Rosen. The article was entitled “Can Quantum Mechanical Description of Physical Reality Be Considered Complete?” (Einstein et al. 1935). Generally referred to as “EPR”, this paper quickly became a centerpiece in the debate over the interpretation of the quantum theory, a debate that continues today. The paper features a striking case where two quantum systems interact in such a way as to link both their spatial coordinates in a certain direction and also their linear momenta (in the same direction). As a result of this “entanglement”, determining either position or momentum for one system would fix (respectively) the position or the momentum of the other. EPR use this case to argue that one cannot maintain both an intuitive condition of local action and the completeness of the quantum description by means of the wave function. This entry describes the argument of that 1935 paper, considers several different versions and reactions, and explores the ongoing significance of the issues they raise.

1. Can Quantum Mechanical Description of Physical Reality Be Considered Complete?

1.1 Setting and prehistory

By 1935 the conceptual understanding of the quantum theory was dominated by Bohr's ideas concerning complementarity. Those ideas centered on observation and measurement in the quantum domain. According to Bohr's views at that time, observing a quantum object involves a uncontrollable physical interaction with a classical measuring device that affects both systems. The picture here is of a tiny object banging into a big apparatus. The effect this produces on the measuring instrument is what issues in the measurement “result” which, because it is uncontrollable, can only be predicted statistically. The effect experienced by the quantum object restricts those quantities that can be co-measured with precision. According to complementarity when we observe the position of an object, we affect its momentum uncontrollably. Thus we cannot determine precisely both position and momentum. A similar situation arises for the simultaneous determination of energy and time. Thus complementarity involves a doctrine of uncontrollable physical interaction that, according to Bohr, underwrites the Heisenberg uncertainty relations and is also the source of the statistical character of the quantum theory. (See the entries on the Copenhagen Interpretation and the Uncertainty Principle.)

Initially Einstein was enthusiastic about the quantum theory. By 1935, however, his enthusiasm for the theory had given way to a sense of disappointment. His reservations were twofold. Firstly, he felt the theory had abdicated the historical task of natural science to provide knowledge of significant aspects of nature that were independent of observers or their observations. Instead the fundamental understanding of the wave function (alternatively, the “state function”, “state vector”, or “psi-function”) in quantum theory was that it provided probabilities but only for the outcomes of measurements (the Born Rule). The theory was simply silent about what, if anything, was likely to be true in the absence of observation. That there could be laws, even probabilistic laws, for finding things if one looks, but no laws of any sort for how things are independently of whether one looks, was irrealist. Secondly, the quantum theory was essentially statistical. The probabilities built into the state function were fundamental and, unlike the situation in classical statistical mechanics, they were not understood as arising from ignorance of fine details. In this sense the theory was indeterministic. Thus Einstein began to probe how strongly the quantum theory was tied to irrealism and indeterminism.

He wondered whether it was possible, at least in principle, to ascribe certain properties to a quantum system in the absence of measurement (and not just probabilistically). Can we suppose, for instance, that the decay of an atom occurs at a definite moment in time even though such a definite decay time is not implied by the quantum state function? That is, Einstein began to ask whether the quantum mechanical description of reality was complete. Since Bohr's complementarity provided strong support both for irrealism and indeterminism and since it played such a dominant role in shaping the prevailing attitude toward quantum theory, complementarity became Einstein's first target. In particular, Einstein had reservations about the scope and uncontrollable effects of the physical interactions invoked by Bohr and about their role in fixing the interpretation of the wave function. EPR was intended to support those reservations in a particularly dramatic way.

Max Jammer (1974, pp. 166-181) describes the EPR paper as originating with Einstein's reflections on a thought experiment he proposed in the 1930 Solvay conference. That experiment concerns a box that contains a clock which appears able to time precisely the release (in the box) of a photon with determinate energy. If this were feasible, it would appear to challenge the unrestricted validity of the Heisenberg uncertainty relation that sets a lower bound on the simultaneous uncertainty of energy and time (see the entry on the Uncertainty Principle). The uncertainty relations, understood not just as a prohibition on what is co-measurable, but on what is simultaneously real, were a central component in the irrealist interpretation of the wave function. Jammer (1974, p. 173) describes how Einstein's thinking about this experiment, and Bohr's objections to it, evolved into a different photon-in-a-box experiment, one that allows an observer to determine either the momentum or the position of the photon indirectly, while remaining outside, sitting on the box. Jammer associates this with the distant determination of either momentum or position that, we shall see, is at the heart of the EPR paper. Carsten Held (1996) cites a related correspondence with Paul Ehrenfest from 1932 in which Einstein described an arrangement for the indirect measurement of a particle of mass m using correlations with a photon established through Compton scattering. Einstein's reflections here foreshadow the argument of EPR, along with noting some of its difficulties.

Thus without an experiment on m it is possible to predict freely, at will, either the momentum or the position of m with, in principle, arbitrary precision. This is the reason why I feel compelled to ascribe objective reality to both. I grant, however, that it is not logically necessary. (Held 1998, p. 90)

Whatever their precursors, the ideas that found their way into EPR were worked out in a series of meetings with Einstein and his two assistants, Podolsky and Rosen. The actual text, however, was written by Podolsky and, apparently, Einstein did not see the final draft (certainly he did not inspect it) before Podolsky submitted the paper to Physical Review in March of 1935, where was sent for publication the day after it arrived, without changes. Right after it was published Einstein complained that his central concerns were obscured by the overly technical nature of Podolsky's development of the argument.

For reasons of language this [paper] was written by Podolsky after several discussions. Still, it did not come out as well as I had originally wanted; rather, the essential thing was, so to speak, smothered by the formalism [Gelehrsamkeit]. (Letter from Einstein to Erwin Schrödinger, June 19, 1935. In Fine 1996, p. 35.)

Thus in discussing the argument of EPR we should consider both the argument in Podolsky's text and the line of argument that Einstein intended to offer. We should also consider an argument presented in Bohr's reply to EPR, which is possibly the best known version, although it differs significantly from the others.

1.2 The argument in the text

The EPR text is concerned, in the first instance, with the logical connections between two assertions. One asserts that quantum mechanics is incomplete. The other asserts that incompatible quantities (those whose operators do not commute, like a coordinate of position and linear momentum in that direction) cannot have simultaneous “reality” (i.e., simultaneously real values). The authors assert as a first premise, later to be justified, that one or another of these must hold. It follows that if quantum mechanics were complete (so that the first option failed) then the second option would hold; i. e., incompatible quantities cannot have real values simultaneously. However they also take as a second premise (also to be justified) that if quantum mechanics were complete, then incompatible quantities (in particular position and momentum) could indeed have simultaneous, real values. They conclude that quantum mechanics is incomplete. The conclusion certainly follows since otherwise (if the theory were complete) one would have a contradiction. Nevertheless the argument is highly abstract and formulaic and even at this point in its development one can readily appreciate Einstein's disappointment with it.

EPR now proceed to establish the two premises, beginning with a discussion of the idea of a complete theory. Here they offer only a necessary condition; namely, that for a complete theory “every element of the physical reality must have a counterpart in the physical theory.” Although they do not specify just what an “element of physical reality” is they use that expression when referring to the values of physical quantities (positions, momenta, and so on) provided the following sufficient condition holds (p. 777):

If, without in any way disturbing a system, we can predict with certainty (i.e., with probability equal to unity) the value of a physical quantity, then there exists an element of reality corresponding to that quantity.

This sufficient condition is often referred to as the EPR Criterion of Reality.

With these terms in place it is easy to show that if, say, the values of position and momentum for a quantum system were real simultaneously (i.e., were elements of reality) then the description provided by the wave function of the system would be incomplete, since no wave function contains counterparts for both elements. (Technically, no state function—even an improper one, like a delta function—is a simultaneous eigenstate for both position and momentum.) Thus they establish the first premise: either quantum theory is incomplete or there can be no simultaneously real values for incompatible quantities. They now need to show that if quantum mechanics were complete, then incompatible quantities could have simultaneous real values, which is the second premise. This, however, is not easily established. Indeed what EPR proceed to do is very odd. Instead of assuming completeness and on that basis deriving that incompatible quantities can have simultaneously real values, they simply set out to derive the latter assertion without any completeness assumption at all. This “derivation” turns out to be the heart of the paper and its most controversial part. It attempts to show that in certain circumstances a quantum system can have simultaneous values for incompatible quantities (once again, for position and momentum), where these values also pass the Reality Criterion's test for being “elements of reality”.

They proceed by sketching a thought experiment. In the experiment two quantum systems interact in such a way that two conservation laws hold following their interaction. One is the conservation of relative position. If we imagine the systems located along the x-axis, then if one of the systems (we can call it Albert's) were found at position q along the axis at a certain time, the other system (call it Niels') would be found then a fixed distance d away, say at q′ = q-d, where we may suppose that the distance d between q and q′ is substantial. The other conservation law is that the total linear momentum (along that same axis) is always zero. So when the momentum of Albert's system along the x-axis is determined to be p, the momentum of Niels' system would be found to be −p. The paper constructs an explicit wave function for the combined (Albert+Niels) system that satisfies both conservation principles. Although commentators later raised questions about the legitimacy of this wave function, it does appear to satisfy the two conservation principles at least for a moment (Jammer 1974, pp. 225-38; see also Halvorson 2000). In any case, one can model the same conceptual situation in other cases that are clearly well defined quantum mechanically (see Section 3.1).

At this point of the argument (p. 779) EPR make two critical assumptions, although they do not call special attention to them. (For the the significance of these assumptions in Einstein's thinking see Howard 1985 and also section 5 of the entry on Einstein.) The first assumption (separability) is that at the time when measurements will be performed on Albert's system there is some reality that pertains to Niels' system alone. In effect, they assume that Niels' system maintains its separate identity even though it is correlated with Albert's. They need this assumption to make sense of another. The second assumption is that of locality. This supposes that “no real change can take place” in Niels' system as a consequence of a measurement made on Albert's system. They gloss this by saying “at the time of measurement the two systems no longer interact.” Notice that this is not a general principle of no-disturbance, but rather a principle governing change only in what is real with respect to Niels' system. On the basis of these two assumptions they conclude that Niels' system can have real values (“elements of reality”) for both position and momentum simultaneously. There is no detailed argument for this in the text. Instead they use these two assumptions to show how one could be led to assign both a position eigenstate and a momentum eigenstate to Niels' system, from which the simultaneous attribution of elements of reality is supposed to follow. Since this is the central and most controversial part of the paper, it pays to go slowly here in trying to reconstruct an argument on their behalf.

One attempt might go as follows. Separability holds that some reality pertains to Niels' system. Suppose that we measure, say, the position of Albert's system. The reduction of the state function for the combined systems then yields a position eigenstate for Niels' system. That eigenstate applies to the reality there and that eigenstate enables us to predict a determinate position for Niels' system with probability one. Since that prediction only depends on a measurement made on Albert's system, locality implies that the prediction of the position of Niels' system does not involve any change in the reality of Niels' system. If we interpret this as meaning that the prediction does not disturb Niels' system, all the pieces are in place to apply The Criterion of Reality. It certifies that the predicted position value, corresponding to the position eigenstate, is an element of the reality that pertains to Niels' system. One could argue similarly with respect to momentum.

This line of argument, however, is deceptive and contains a serious confusion. It occurs right after we apply locality to conclude that the measurement made on Albert's system does not affect the reality pertaining to Niels' system. For, recall, we have not yet determined whether the position inferred for Niels' system is indeed an “element” of that reality. Hence it is still possible that the measurement of Albert's system, while not disturbing the reality pertaining to Niels' system, does disturb its position. To take the extreme case; suppose, for example, that the measurement of Albert's system somehow brings the position of Niels' system into being, or suddenly makes it well defined, and also allows us to predict it with certainty. It would then follow from locality that the position of Niels' system is not an element of the reality of that system, since it can be affected at a distance. But, reasoning exactly as above, the Criterion would still hold that the position of Niels' system is an element of the reality there, since it can be predicted with certainty without disturbing the reality of the system. What has gone wrong? It is that the Criterion provides a sufficient condition for elements of reality and locality provides a necessary condition. But, as above, there is no guarantee that these conditions will always match consistently. To ensure consistency we need to be sure that what the Criterion certifies as real is not something that can be influenced at a distance. One way to do this, which seems to be implicit in the EPR paper, would be to interpret locality in the EPR situation in such a way that measurements made on one system are understood not to disturb those quantities on the distant, unmeasured system whose values can be inferred from the reduced state of that system. Given the two conservation laws satisfied in the EPR situation, this extended way of understanding locality allows the Criterion to certify that position, as well as momentum, when inferred for Niels' system, are real there.

As EPR point out, however, position and momentum cannot be measured simultaneously. So even if each can be shown to be real in distinct contexts of measurement, are both real at the same time? EPR answers “yes”, but it does not provide a clear rationale for that conclusion. Here's one suggestion. (Dickson 2004 analyzes some of the modal principles involved and suggests another route, which he criticizes. Hooker 1972 is a comprehensive discussion that identifies several generically different ways to make the case.) Suppose the logical force of locality is to decontextualize the reality of Niels' system from goings on at Albert's. Clearly when we infer from a certain measurement made on Albert's system that Niels' system has an element of reality, locality kicks in and guarantees that Niels' system would have had that same element of reality even in the absence of the measurement on Albert's system. So suppose, then, the circumstance where we do not make that measurement. Could that absence of a measurement on Albert's system affect what is real on Niels' system? The suggestion is that we allow locality to kick in here as well, with the answer “no”. Put differently, we suggest that locality entitles us to conclude that Niels' system has a real position provided the conditional assertion “If a position measurement is performed on Albert's system, then Niels' system has a real position” holds. Similarly, Niels' system has a real momentum provided the conditional “If a momentum measurement is performed on Albert's system, then Niels' system has a real momentum” holds. Of course these conclusions presuppose that there are no interfering factors operating locally on Niels' system, such as a competing measurement. As we have seen, given separability, locality and the Criterion of Reality both conditionals hold. Hence, in the absence of interference, locality implies that Niels' system has real values of both position and momentum simultaneously, even though no simultaneous measurement of position and momentum is allowed. (Reciprocally, so would Albert's system, provided we made no interfering measurements there.)

In the penultimate paragraph of EPR (p. 780) they address the problem of getting real values for incompatible quantities simultaneously.

Indeed one would not arrive at our conclusion if one insisted that two or more physical quantities can be regarded as simultaneous elements of reality only when they can be simultaneously measured or predicted. … This makes the reality [on the second system] depend upon the process of measurement carried out on the first system, which does not in any way disturb the second system. No reasonable definition of reality could be expected to permit this.

The unreasonableness to which EPR allude in making “the reality [on the second system] depend upon the process of measurement carried out on the first system, which does not in any way disturb the second system” is just the unreasonableness that would be involved in renouncing locality understood as above. For it is locality that enables one to overcome the incompatibility of position and momentum measurements of Albert's system by requiring their joint consequences for Niels' system to be incorporated in a single, stable reality there. If we recall Einstein's acknowledgment to Ehrenfest that getting simultaneous position and momentum was “not logically necessary”, we can see how EPR respond by making it become necessary once locality is assumed.

Here, then, are the key features of EPR.

The EPR experiment with interacting systems accomplishes a form of indirect measurement. The direct measurement of Albert's system yields information about Niels' system; it tells us what we would find if we were to measure there directly. But it does this at-a-distance, without any further physical interaction taking place between the two systems. Thus the thought experiment at the heart of EPR undercuts the picture of measurement as necessarily involving a tiny object banging into a large measuring instrument. If we look back at Einstein's reservations about complementarity, we can appreciate that by focusing on a non-disturbing kind of measurement the EPR argument targets Bohr's program for explaining central conceptual features of the quantum theory. For that program relied on uncontrollable interaction with a measuring device as a necessary feature of any measurement in the quantum domain. Nevertheless the cumbersome machinery employed in the EPR paper makes it difficult to see what is central. It distracts from rather than focuses on the issues. That was Einstein's complaint about Podolsky's text in his June 19, 1935 letter to Schrödinger. Schrödinger responded on July 13 reporting reactions to EPR that vindicate Einstein's concerns. With reference to EPR he wrote:

I am now having fun and taking your note to its source to provoke the most diverse, clever people: London, Teller, Born, Pauli, Szilard, Weyl. The best response so far is from Pauli who at least admits that the use of the word “state” [“Zustand”] for the psi-function is quite disreputable. What I have so far seen by way of published reactions is less witty. … It is as if one person said, “It is bitter cold in Chicago”; and another answered, “That is a fallacy, it is very hot in Florida.” (Fine 1996, p. 74)

1.3 Einstein's versions of the argument

If the argument developed in EPR has its roots in the 1930 Solvay conference, Einstein's own approach to issues at the heart of EPR has a history that goes back to the 1927 Solvay conference. (Bacciagaluppi and Valentini 2009, pp. 198-202, would even trace it back to 1909 and the localization of light quanta.) At that 1927 conference Einstein made a short presentation during the general discussion session, where he focused on problems of interpretation associated with the collapse of the wave function. He imagines a situation where electrons pass through a small hole and are dispersed uniformly in the direction of a screen of photographic film shaped into a large hemisphere that surrounds the hole. On the supposition that quantum theory offers a complete account of individual processes then, in the case of localization, why does the whole wave front collapse to just one single flash point? It is as though at the moment of collapse an instantaneous signal were sent out from the point of collapse to all other possible collapse positions telling them not to flash. Thus Einstein maintains (Bacciagaluppi and Valentini 2009, p. 488),

the interpretation, according to which |ψ|² expresses the probability that this particle is found at a given point, assumes an entirely peculiar mechanism of action at a distance, which prevents the wave continuously distributed in space from producing an action in two places on the screen.

One could see this as a tension between local action and the description afforded by the wave function, since the wave function alone does not specify a unique position on the screen for detecting the particle. Einstein continues,

In my opinion, one can remove this objection only in the following way, that one does not describe the process solely by the Schrödinger wave, but that at the same time one localizes the particle during propagation.

Einstein points to de Broglie's pilot wave investigations as a direction to pursue if one is looking for an account of individual processes that avoids a “contradiction with the postulate of relativity.” Clearly, however, one could also backtrack and, instead of regarding the theory as describing individuals and their processes, regard it as describing, collectively, only ensembles of individuals. Indeed Einstein suggests additional difficulties for any more “complete” version, like de Broglie's, that requires representations in configuration space, difficulties that might move one further toward regarding quantum theory as not aspiring to a description of individual systems but as more amenable to an ensemble (or collective) point of view. Perhaps the most important feature of Einstein's reflections at Solvay 1927 is his insight that the clash between completeness and locality arises for a single variable (there, position) and does not require an incompatible pair, as EPR's treatment makes it seem.

Following the publication of EPR Einstein set about almost immediately to provide clear and focused versions of the argument. He began that process within few weeks of EPR, in the June 19 letter to Schrödinger, and continued it in an article published the following year (Einstein 1936). He returned to these ideas some years later in a few other publications. Although his various expositions differ they all employ composite systems as a way of implementing non-disturbing measurements-at-a-distance. None of Einstein's own accounts contains the Criterion of Reality nor the tortured EPR argument over when values of a quantity can be regarded as “elements of reality”. The Criterion and these “elements” simply drop out. Nor does Einstein engage in calculations, like those of Podolsky, concerning the explicit form of the total wave function for the composite system. Moreover, as early as June 19, 1935 Einstein makes it plain that he is not especially interested in the question of simultaneous values for incompatible quantities like position and momentum. Just as in Solvay 1927, the concern that he expresses to Schrödinger is with the question of completeness, given the resources of the quantum theory, in describing the situation concerning a single variable (maybe position, maybe momentum). With respect to the treatment of an incompatible pair he tells Schrödinger “ist mir wurst”—literally, it's sausage to me; i.e., he couldn't care less. (Fine 1996, p. 38). In his writings subsequent to EPR, Einstein probes an incompatibility between affirming locality and separability, on the one hand, and completeness in the description of individual systems by means of state functions, on the other. His argument is that we can have at most one of these but never both. He frequently refers to this dilemma as a “paradox”.

In the letter to Schrödinger of June 19, Einstein sketches a simple argument for the dilemma, roughly as follows. Consider an interaction between the Albert and Niels systems that conserves their relative positions. (We need not worry about momentum, or any other quantity.) Consider the evolved wave function for the total (Albert+Niels) system when the two systems are far apart. Now assume a principle of locality-separability (Einstein calls it a Trennungsprinzip—separation principle): Whether a physical property holds for Niels' system does not depend on what measurements (if any) are made locally on Albert's system. If we measure the position of Albert's system, the conservation of relative position implies that we can immediately infer the position of Niels'; i.e., we can infer that Niels' system has a determinate position. By locality-separability it follows that Niels' system must already have had a determinate position just before Albert began that measurement. At that time, however, Niels' system has no independent state function. There is only a state function for the combined system and that total state function does not predict with certainty the position one would find for Niels' system (i.e., it is not a product one of whose factors is an eigenstate for the position of Niels' system). Thus the description of Niels' system afforded by the quantum state function is incomplete. A complete description would say (definitely yes) if a physical property were true of Niels' system. (Notice that this argument does not even depend on the reduction of the total state function for the combined system.) In this formulation of the argument it is clear that locality-separability conflicts with the eigenvalue-eigenstate link, which holds that a quantity of a system has an eigenvalue if and only if the state of the system is an eigenstate of that quantity with that eigenvalue (or a mixture of such eigenstates). The “only if” part of the link would need to be weakened order to interpret quantum state functions as complete descriptions (see entry on Modal Interpretations).

Although this simple argument concentrates on what Einstein saw as the essentials, stripping away most technical details and distractions, he had another slightly more complex argument that he was also fond of producing. (It is actually buried in the EPR paper, p. 779.) This second argument focuses clearly on the interpretation of quantum state functions and not on any issues about simultaneous values (real or not) for incompatible quantities. It goes like this.

Suppose, as in EPR, that the interaction between the two systems preserves both relative position and zero total momentum and that the systems are far apart. As before, we can measure either the position or momentum of Albert's system and, in either case, we can infer the position or momentum for Niels' system. It follows from the reduction of the total state function that, depending on whether we measure the position or momentum of Albert's system, Niels' system will be left (respectively) either in a position eigenstate or in a momentum eigenstate. Suppose too that separability hold for Niels; that is, that Niels' system has some real physical state of affairs. If locality holds as well, then the measurement of Albert's system does not disturb the assumed “reality” for Niels' system. However, that reality appears to be represented by quite different state functions, depending on which measurement of Albert's system one chooses to carry out. If we understand a “complete description” to rule out that one and the same physical state can be described by state functions with distinct physical implications, then we can conclude that the quantum mechanical description is incomplete. Here again we confront a dilemma between separability-locality and completeness. Many years later Einstein put it this way (Schilpp 1949, p. 682);

[T]he paradox forces us to relinquish one of the following two assertions:
(1) the description by means of the psi-function is complete
(2) the real states of spatially separate objects are independent of each other

It appears that the central point of EPR was to argue that in interpreting the quantum state functions we are faced with these alternatives.

As we have seen, in framing his own EPR-like arguments for the incompleteness of quantum theory, Einstein makes use of separability and locality, which are also tacitly assumed in the EPR paper. He provides a clear statement of his ideas here in a letter to Max Born,

It is … characteristic of … physical objects that they are thought of as arranged in a space-time continuum. An essential aspect of this arrangement … is that they lay claim, at a certain time, to an existence independent of one another, provided these objects “are situated in different parts of space”. … The following idea characterizes the relative independence of objects (A and B) far apart in space: external influence on A has no direct influence on B. (Born, 1971, pp. 170-71)

In the course of his correspondence with Schrödinger, however, Einstein realized that assumptions about separability and locality were not necessary in order to get the incompleteness conclusion that he was after; i.e., to show that state functions may not provide a complete description of the real state of affairs with respect to a system. Separability supposes that there is a real state of affairs and locality supposes that one cannot directly influence it by acting at a distance. What Einstein realized was that separability was already part of the ordinary conception of a macroscopic object. This suggested to him that if one looks at the interaction of a macro-system with a micro-system one could avoid having to assume locality at all in order to conclude that the quantum description of the whole was incomplete with respect to its macroscopic part. Writing to Schrödinger on August 8, 1935 Einstein says that he will show this by means of a “crude macroscopic example”.

The system is a substance in chemically unstable equilibrium, perhaps a charge of gunpowder that, by means of intrinsic forces, can spontaneously combust, and where the average life span of the whole setup is a year. In principle this can quite easily be represented quantum-mechanically. In the beginning the psi-function characterizes a reasonably well-defined macroscopic state. But, according to your equation [i.e., the Schrödinger equation], after the course of a year this is no longer the case. Rather, the psi-function then describes a sort of blend of not-yet and already-exploded systems. Through no art of interpretation can this psi-function be turned into an adequate description of a real state of affairs; in reality there is just no intermediary between exploded and not-exploded. (Fine 1996, p. 78)

The point is that after a year either the gunpowder will have exploded, or not. (This is the “real state of affairs” which in the EPR situation requires one to assume separability.) The state function, however, will have evolved into a complex superposition over these two alternatives. Provided we maintain the eigenvalue-eigenstate link, the quantum description by means of that state function will yield neither conclusion, and hence the quantum description is incomplete. For a contemporary response to this line of argument, one might look to the program of decoherence. (See the entry on Decoherence.) That program points to interactions with the environment which quickly reduce the likelihood of any interference between the “exploded” and the “not-exploded” branches of the evolved psi-function. Then, breaking the eigenvalue-eigenstate link, one might interpret the psi-function (artfully) so that its (almost) non-interfering branches yield a perspective according to which the gunpowder is indeed either exploded or not. Certainly such interpretations of the psi-function, based on decoherence, are controversial. (See Schlosshauer 2007, especially Chapter 8.)

The reader may recognize the similarity between Einstein's exploding gunpowder example and Schrödinger's cat (Schrödinger 1935a, p. 812). In the case of the cat an unstable atom is hooked up to a lethal device that, after an hour, is as likely to poison (and kill) the cat as not, depending on whether the atom decays. After an hour the cat is either alive or dead, but the quantum state of the whole atom-poison-cat system at this time is a superposition involving the two possibilities and, just as in the case of the gunpowder, is not a complete description of the situation (life or death) of the cat. The similarity between the gunpowder and the cat is hardly accidental since Schrödinger first produced the cat example in his reply of September 19, 1935 to Einstein's August 8 gunpowder letter. There Schrödinger says that he has himself constructed “an example very similar to your exploding powder keg”, and proceeds to outline the cat (Fine 1996, pp. 82-83). Although the “cat paradox” is usually cited in connection with the problem of quantum measurement (Measurement in Quantum Theory) and treated as a paradox separate from EPR, its origin is here as a compact version of the EPR argument for incompleteness. Schrödinger's development of “entanglement”, the term he introduced as a general description of the correlations that result when quantum systems interact, also began in this correspondence over EPR (Schrödinger 1935a, 1935b; see Quantum Entanglement and Information).

2. A popular form of the argument: Bohr's response

The literature surrounding EPR contains yet another version of the argument, a popular version that—unlike any of Einstein's—features the Criterion of Reality. Assume again an interaction between our two systems that preserves both relative position and zero total momentum and suppose that the systems are far apart. If we measure the position of Albert's system, we can infer that Niels' system has a corresponding position. We can also predict it with certainty, given the result of the position measurement of Albert's system. Hence, according to the Criterion of Reality, the position of Niels' system constitutes an element of reality. Similarly, if we measure the momentum of Albert's system, we can conclude that the momentum of Niels' system is an element of reality. The argument now concludes that since we can choose freely to measure either position or momentum, it “follows” that both must be elements of reality simultaneously.

Of course no such conclusion follows from our freedom of choice. It is not sufficient to be able to choose at will which quantity to measure; for the conclusion to follow from the Criterion alone one would need to be able to measure both quantities at once. This is precisely the point that Einstein recognized in his 1932 letter to Ehrenfest and that EPR addresses by assuming locality and separability. What is striking about this version is that these principles, central to the original EPR argument and to the dilemma at the heart of Einstein's versions, are obscured here. Instead the Criterion and those “elements of reality” are featured. Perhaps the difficulties presented by Podolsky's text contribute to this reading. In any case, this version of the argument is commonly cited in the physics literature and attributed to EPR and to Einstein. No doubt that is because this reading has a prominent source in terms of which one can understand its popularity among physicists; it is Niels Bohr himself.

By the time of the EPR paper many of the early interpretive battles over the quantum theory had been settled, at least to the satisfaction of working physicists. Bohr had emerged as the “philosopher” of the new theory and the community of quantum theorists, busy with the development and extension of the theory, were content to follow Bohr's leadership when it came to explaining and defending its conceptual underpinnings (Beller 1999, Chapter 13). Thus in 1935 the burden was on Bohr to explain what was wrong with the EPR “paradox”. The major article that he wrote in discharging this burden (Bohr 1935a) became the canon for how to respond to EPR. Unfortunately, Bohr's summary of EPR in that article, which is the version just above, also became the canon for what EPR contained by way of argument.

Bohr's response to EPR begins, as do many of his treatments of the conceptual issues raised by the quantum theory, with a discussion of limitations on the simultaneous determination of position and momentum. As usual, these are drawn from an analysis of the possibilities of measurement if one uses an apparatus consisting of a diaphragm connected to a rigid frame. Bohr emphasizes that the question is to what extent we can trace the interaction between the particle being measured and the measuring instrument. (See Beller 1999, Chapter 7 for a detailed analysis and discussion of the “two voices” contained in Bohr's account.) Following the summary of EPR, Bohr (1935a, p. 700) then focuses on the Criterion of Reality which, he says, “contains an ambiguity as regards the meaning of the expression ‘without in any way disturbing a system’.” Bohr concedes that the indirect measurement of Niels' system achieved when one makes a measurement of Albert's system does not involve any “mechanical disturbance” of Niels' system. Still, he claims that a measurement on Albert's system does involve “an influence on the very conditions which define the possible types of predictions regarding the future behavior of [Niels'] system.” What Bohr may have had in mind is that when, for example, we measure the position of Albert's system and get a result we can predict the position of Niels' system with certainty. However, measuring the position of Albert's system does not allow a similarly certain prediction for the momentum of Niels' system. The opposite would be true had we measured the momentum of Albert's system. Thus depending on which variable we measure on Albert's system, we will be entitled to different sorts of predictions about the results of further measurements on Niels' system.

There are two important things to notice about this response. The first is this. In conceding that Einstein's indirect method for determining, say, the position of Niels' system does not mechanically disturb that system, Bohr departs from his original program of complementarity, which was to base the uncertainty relations and the statistical character of quantum theory on uncontrollable physical interactions, interactions that were supposed to arise inevitably between a measuring instrument and the system being measured. Instead Bohr now distinguishes between a genuine physical interaction (his “mechanical disturbance”) and some other sort of “influence” on the conditions for specifying (or “defining”) sorts of predictions for the future behavior of a system. In emphasizing that only the latter arise in the EPR situation, Bohr retreats from his earlier, physically grounded conception of complementarity.

The second important thing to notice is how Bohr's response needs to be implemented in order to block the type of arguments favored by Einstein, which pose a dilemma between principles of locality and completeness. In Einstein's arguments the locality principle makes explicit reference to the reality of the unmeasured system (no immediate influence on the reality there due to measurements made elsewhere). Hence Bohr's pointing to an influence on conditions for specifying predictions would not affect the argument at all unless one includes those conditions as part of the reality of Niels' system. That would be implausible on two counts. Firstly, it would make what is real about Niels' system encompass what is happening to Albert's system, which is someplace else. Secondly, there is an issue of intelligibility. For how could one talk intelligibly about conditions for predicting the future behavior of Niels' system if the reality that we designate by the expression “Niels' system” includes these very conditions for predicting its future? What could one possibly understand by “it” here? Nevertheless, this is the move that Bohr appears to make, maintaining that the “conditions” (which define the possible types of predictions regarding the future behavior of Niels' system) “constitute an inherent element of the description of any phenomena to which the term ‘physical reality’ can be properly attached” (Bohr 1935a, p. 700). To be sure, if sense could be made of including such conditions as part of the “reality” of the unmeasured system then, by definition, the locality principle would fail to hold (although separability might) and so the EPR inference to the incompleteness of the quantum theory would be blocked. Thus this way out concedes the validity of the EPR argument and would blocks its impact on the issue of completeness by expanding the concept of physical reality in such a way as to make the quantum theory highly nonlocal, by definition.

Despite Bohr's seeming endorsement of nonlocal interactions in his response to EPR, in other places Bohr rejects nonlocality in the strongest terms. For example in discussing an electron double slit experiment, which is Bohr's favorite model for illustrating the novel conceptual features of quantum theory, and writing only weeks before EPR, Bohr argues as follows.

If we only imagine the possibility that without disturbing the phenomena we determine through which hole the electron passes, we would truly find ourselves in irrational territory, for this would put us in a situation in which an electron, which might be said to pass through this hole, would be affected by the circumstance of whether this [other] hole was open or closed; but … it is completely incomprehensible that in its later course [the electron] should let itself be influenced by this hole down there being open or shut. (Bohr 1935b)

It is uncanny how closely Bohr's language mirrors that of EPR. But here Bohr defends locality and regards the very contemplation of nonlocality as “irrational” and “completely incomprehensible”. Since “the circumstance of whether this [other] hole was open or closed” does affect the possible types of predictions regarding the electron's future behavior, if we expand the concept of the electron's “reality”, as he appears to suggest for EPR, by including such information, we do “disturb” the electron around one hole by opening or closing the other hole. That is, if we give to “disturb” and to “reality” the very same sense that Bohr appears to give them when responding to EPR, then we are led to an “incomprehensible” nonlocality, and into the territory of the irrational.

There is another way of trying to understand Bohr's position. According to one common reading (see Copenhagen Interpretation), after EPR Bohr embraced a relational (or contextual) account of property attribution. On this account to speak of the position, say, of a system presupposes that one already has put in place an appropriate interaction involving an apparatus for measuring position (or at least an appropriate frame of reference for the measurement; Dickson 2004). Thus “the position” of the system refers to a relation between the system and the measuring device (or measurement frame). In the EPR context this would seem to imply that before one is set up to measure the position of Albert's system, talk of the position of Niels' system is out of place; whereas after one measures the position of Albert's system, talk of the position of Niels' system is appropriate and, indeed, we can then say truly that Niels' system “has” a position. Similar considerations govern momentum measurements. It follows, then, that local manipulations carried out on Albert's system, in a place we may assume to be far removed from Niels' system, can directly affect what is meaningful to say about, as well as factually true of, Niels' system. Similarly, in the double slit arrangement, it would follow that what can be said meaningfully and said truly about the position of the electron around the top hole would depend on the context of whether the bottom hole is open or shut. One might suggest that such relational actions-at-a-distance are harmless ones, perhaps merely “semantic”; like becoming the “best” at a task when your only competitor—who might be miles away—fails. Note, however, that in the case of ordinary relational predicates it is not inappropriate (or “meaningless”) to talk about the situation in the absence of complete information about the relata. So you might be the best at a task even if your competitor has not yet tried it, and you are definitely not an aunt (or uncle) until one of your siblings gives birth. But should we say that an electron is nowhere at all until we are set up to measure its position, or would it be inappropriate (meaningless?) even to ask?

If quantum predicates are relational, they are different from many ordinary relations in that the conditions for the relata are taken as criterial for the application of the term. In this regard one might contrast the relativity of simultaneity with the proposed relativity of position. In relativistic physics specifying a world-line fixes a frame of reference for attributions of simultaneity to events regardless of whether any temporal measurements are being made or contemplated. But in the quantum case, on this proposal, specifying a frame of reference for position (say, the laboratory frame) does not entitle one to attribute position to a system, unless that frame is associated with actually preparing or completing a measurement of position for that system. To be sure, analyzing predicates in terms of occurrent measurement or observation is familiar from neopositivist approaches to the language of science; for example, in Bridgman's operational analysis of physical terms, where the actual applications of test-response pairs constitute criteria for any meaningful use of a term (see theory and observation in science ). Carnap's later introduction of reduction sentences (see the entry on the Vienna Circle) has a similar character. Still, this positivist reading entails just the sort of nonlocality that Bohr seemed to abhor.

In the light of all this it is difficult to know whether a coherent response can be attributed to Bohr reliably that would derail EPR. (In different ways, Dickson 2004 and Halvorson and Clifton 2004 make an attempt on Bohr's behalf. These are examined in Fine 2007 and Whitaker 2004.) Bohr may well have been aware of the difficulty in framing the appropriate concepts clearly when, a few years after EPR, he wrote,

The unaccustomed features of the situation with which we are confronted in quantum theory necessitate the greatest caution as regard all questions of terminology. Speaking, as it is often done of disturbing a phenomenon by observation, or even of creating physical attributes to objects by measuring processes is liable to be confusing, since all such sentences imply a departure from conventions of basic language which even though it can be practical for the sake of brevity, can never be unambiguous. (Bohr 1939, p. 320. Quoted in Section 3.2 of the entry on the Uncertainty Principle.)

3. Development of EPR

3.1 Spin and The Bohm version

For about fifteen years following its publication, the EPR paradox was discussed at the level of a thought experiment whenever the conceptual difficulties of quantum theory became an issue. In 1951 David Bohm, a protégé of Robert Oppenheimer and then an untenured Assistant Professor at Princeton University, published a textbook on the quantum theory in which he took a close look at EPR in order to develop a response in the spirit of Bohr. Bohm showed how one could mirror the conceptual situation in the EPR thought experiment by looking at the dissociation of a diatomic molecule whose total spin angular momentum is (and remains) zero; for instance, the dissociation of an excited hydrogen molecule into a pair of hydrogen atoms by means of a process that does not change an initially zero total angular momentum (Bohm 1951, Sections 22.15-22.18). In the Bohm experiment the atomic fragments separate after interaction, flying off in different directions freely. Subsequently, measurements are made of their spin components (which here take the place of position and momentum), whose measured values would be anti-correlated after dissociation. In the so-called singlet state of the atomic pair, the state after dissociation, if one atom's spin is found to be positive with respect to the orientation of an axis at right angles to its flight path, the other atom would be found to have a negative spin with respect to an axis with the same orientation. Like the operators for position and momentum, spin operators for different orientations do not commute. Moreover, in the experiment outlined by Bohm, the atomic fragments can move far apart from one another and so become appropriate objects for assumptions that restrict the effects of purely local actions. Thus Bohm's experiment mirrors the entangled correlations in EPR for spatially separated systems, allowing for similar arguments and conclusions involving locality, separability, and completeness. Indeed, a recently discovered note of Einstein's, that may have been prompted by Bohm's treatment, contains a very sketchy spin version of the EPR argument – once again pitting completeness against locality (“A coupling of distant things is excluded.” Sauer 2007, p. 882). Following Bohm (1951) a paper by Bohm and Aharonov (1957) went on to outline the machinery for a plausible experiment in which entangled spin correlations could be verified. It has become customary to refer to experimental arrangements involving determinations of spin components for spatially separated systems, and to a variety of similar set-ups (especially ones for measuring photon polarization), as “EPRB” experiments—“B” for Bohm. Because of technical difficulties in creating and monitoring the atomic fragments, however, there seem to have been no immediate attempts to perform a Bohm version of EPR.

3.2 Bell and beyond

That was to remain the situation for almost another fifteen years, until John Bell utilized the EPRB set-up to construct a stunning argument, at least as challenging as EPR, but to a different conclusion (Bell 1964). Bell shows that, under a given set of assumptions, certain of the correlations that can be measured in runs of an EPRB experiment satisfy a particular set of constraints, known as the Bell inequalities. In these EPRB experiments, however, quantum theory predicts that the measured correlations violate the Bell inequalities, and by an experimentally significant amount. Thus Bell shows (see the entry on Bell's Theorem) that quantum theory is inconsistent with the given assumptions. Prominent among these is an assumption of locality, similar to the locality assumptions tacitly assumed in EPR and explicitly assumed in Einstein's versions (apart from the gunpowder case). Thus Bell's theorem is often characterized as showing that quantum theory is nonlocal. However, since several other assumptions are needed in any derivation of the Bell inequalities (roughly, assumptions guaranteeing a classical representation of the quantum probabilities; see Fine 1982a, and Malley 2004), one should be cautious about singling out locality as necessarily in conflict with the quantum theory.

Bell's results were explored and deepened by various theoretical investigations and they have stimulated a number of increasingly sophisticated and delicate EPRB-type experiments designed to test whether the Bell inequalities hold where quantum theory predicts they should fail. With a few anomalous exceptions, the experiments confirm the quantum violations of the inequalities. (Baggott 2004 contains a readable account of the major refinements and experiments.) The confirmation is quantitatively impressive, although the experiments continue to leave open at least two different ways (corresponding to the prism and synchronization models sketched in Fine 1982b) to reconcile the data with frameworks that embody locality and separability. One way (prisms) exploits the low rate of detection in all the experiments that satisfy signal locality; the other way (synchronization) exploits time delays associated with coincidence counts. (See Larsson 1999, and Szabo and Fine 2002 for the former and for the latter Larsson and Gill 2004 and the EPRB simulation constructed in de Raedt et al 2007.) While the exact significance of experimental tests of the Bell inequalities thus remains a matter of continued controversy, the techniques developed in the experiments, and related theoretical ideas for utilizing the entanglement associated with EPRB-type interactions, have become important in their own right. These techniques and ideas, stemming from EPRB and the Bell theorem, have applications now being advanced in several relatively new fields of investigation—quantum cryptography, teleportation and computing (see Quantum Entanglement and Information).

To go back to the EPR dilemma between locality and completeness, it would appear from the Bell theorem that Einstein's strategy of maintaining locality, and thereby concluding that the quantum description is incomplete, may have fixed on the wrong horn. Even though the Bell theorem does not rule out locality conclusively, it should certainly make one wary of assuming it. On the other hand, since Einstein's exploding gunpowder argument (or Schrödinger's cat) supports incompleteness without assuming locality, one should be wary of adopting the other horn of the dilemma, affirming that the quantum state descriptions are complete and “therefore” that the theory is nonlocal. It may well turn out that both horns need to be rejected: that the state functions do not provide a complete description and that the theory is also nonlocal (although possibly still separable; see Winsberg and Fine 2003). There is at least one well-known approach to the quantum theory that makes a choice of this sort, the de Broglie-Bohm approach (Bohmian Mechanics). Of course it may also be possible to break the EPR argument for the dilemma plausibly by questioning some of its other assumptions (e.g., separability, the reduction postulate, or the eigenvalue-eigenstate link). That might free up the remaining option, to regard the theory as both local and complete. If it were made cogent, perhaps some version of the Everett Interpretation would come to occupy this branch of the interpretive tree.


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Bell's Theorem | Einstein, Albert: philosophy of science | quantum mechanics: action at a distance in | quantum mechanics: Bohmian mechanics | quantum mechanics: Copenhagen interpretation of | quantum mechanics: Everett's relative-state formulation of | quantum mechanics: modal interpretations of | quantum mechanics: the role of decoherence in | quantum theory: measurement in | quantum theory: quantum entanglement and information | Uncertainty Principle