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Relational Quantum Mechanics

First published Mon Feb 4, 2002; substantive revision Wed Jan 2, 2008

Relational quantum mechanics is an interpretation of quantum theory which discards the notions of absolute state of a system, absolute value of its physical quantities, or absolute event. The theory describes only the way systems affect each other in the course of physical interactions. State and physical quantities refer always to the interaction, or the relation, between two systems. Nevertheless, the theory is assumed to be complete. The physical content of quantum theory is understood as expressing the net of relations connecting all different physical systems.

1. Introduction

Quantum theory is our current general theory of physical motion. The theory is the core component of the momentous change that our understanding of the physical world has undergone during the first decades of the 20th century. It is one of the most successful scientific theories ever: it is supported by vast and unquestionable empirical and technological effectiveness and is today virtually unchallenged. But the interpretation of what the theory actually tells us about the physical world raises a lively debate, which has continued with alternating fortunes, from the early days of the theory in the late twenties, to nowadays. The relational interpretations are a number of reflections by different authors, which were independently developed, but converge in indicating an interpretation of the physical content of the theory. The core idea is to read the theory as a theoretical account of the way distinct physical systems affect each other when they interact (and not of the way physical systems "are"), and the idea that this account exhausts all that can be said about the physical world. The physical world is thus seen as a net of interacting components, where there is no meaning to the state of an isolated system. A physical system (or, more precisely, its contingent state) is reduced to the net of relations it entertains with the surrounding systems, and the physical structure of the world is identified as this net of relationships.

The possibility that the physical content of an empirically successful physical theory could be debated should not surprise: examples abound in the history of science. For instance, the great scientific revolution was fueled by the grand debate on whether the effectiveness of the Copernican system could be taken as an indication that the Earth was not in fact at the center of the universe. In more recent times, Einstein's celebrated first major theoretical success, special relativity, consisted to a large extent just in understanding the physical meaning (simultaneity is relative) of an already existing effective mathematical formalism (the Lorentz transformations). In these cases, as in the case of quantum mechanics, a very strictly empiricist position could have circumvented the problem altogether, by reducing the content of the theory to a list of predicted numbers. But perhaps science can offer us more than such a list; and certainly science needs more than such a list to find its ways.

The difficulty in the interpretation of quantum mechanics derives from the fact that the theory was first constructed for describing microscopic systems (atoms, electrons, photons) and the way these interact with macroscopic apparatuses built to measure their properties. Such interactions are denoted as "measurements". The theory consists in a mathematical formalism, which allows probabilities of alternative outcomes of such measurements to be calculated. If used just for this purpose, the theory raises no difficulty. But we expect the macroscopic apparatuses themselves — in fact, any physical system in the world — to obey quantum theory, and this seems to raise contradictions in the theory.

1.1 The Problem

In classical mechanics, a system S is described by a certain number of physical variables. For instance, an electron is described by its position and its spin (intrinsic angular momentum). These variables change with time and represent the contingent properties of the system. We say that their values determine, at every moment, the "state" of the system. A measurement of a system's variable is an interaction between the system S and an external system O, whose effect on O, depends on the actual value q of the variable (of S) which is measured. The characteristic feature of quantum mechanics is that it does not allow us to assume that all variables of the system have determined values at every moment (this irrespectively of whether or not we know such values). It was Werner Heisenberg who first realized the need to free ourselves from the belief that, say, an electron has a well determined position at every time. When it is not interacting with an external system that can detect its position, the electron can be "spread out" over different positions. In the jargon of the theory, one says that the electron is in a "quantum superposition" of two (or many) different positions. It follows that the state of the system cannot be captured by giving the value of its variables. Instead, quantum theory introduces a new notion of "state" of a system, which is different from a list of values of its variables. Such a new notion of state was developed in the work of Erwin Schrödinger in the form of the "wave function" of the system, usually denoted by Ψ. Paul Adrien Maurice Dirac gave a general abstract formulation of the notion of quantum state, in terms of a vector Ψ moving in an abstract vector space. The time evolution of the state Ψ is deterministic and is governed by the Schrödinger equation. From the knowledge of the state Ψ, one can compute the probability of the different measurement outcomes q. That is, the probability of the different ways in which the system S can affect a system O in an interaction with it. The theory then prescribes that at every such ‘measurement’, one must update the value of Ψ, to take into account which of the different outcomes has happened. This sudden change of the state Ψ depends on the specific outcome of the measurement and is therefore probabilistic. It is called the "collapse of the wave function".

The problem of the interpretation of quantum mechanics takes then different forms, depending on the relative ontological weight we choose to assign to the wave function Ψ or, respectively, to the sequence of the measurement outcomes q, q′, q″, …. If we take Ψ as the "real" entity which fully represents the actual state of affairs of the world, we encounter a number of difficulties. First, we have to understand how Ψ can change suddenly in the course of a measurement: if we describe the evolution of two interacting quantum systems in terms of the Schrödinger equation, no collapse happens. Furthermore, the collapse, seen as a physical process, seems to depend on arbitrary choices in our description and shows a disturbing amount of nonlocality. But even if we can circumvent the collapse problem, the more serious difficulty of this point of view is that it appears to be impossible to understand how specific observed values q, q′, q″, … can emerge from the same Ψ. A better alternative is to take the observed values q, q′, q″, … as the actual elements of reality, and view Ψ just as a bookkeeping device, determined by the actual values q, q′, q″, … that happened in past. From this perspective, the real events of the world are the "realization" (the "coming to reality", the "actualization") of the values q, q′, q″, … in the course of the interaction between physical systems. This actualization of a variable q in the course of an interaction can be denoted as the quantum event q. An exemple of a quantum event is the detection of an electron in a certain position. The position variable of the electron assumes a determined value in the course of the interaction between the electron and an external system and the quantum event is the "manifestation" of the electron in a certain position. Quantum events have an intrinsically discrete ("quantized") granular structure.

The difficulty of this second option is that if we take the quantum nature of all physical systems into account, the statement that a certain specific event q "has happened" (or, equivalently that a certain variable has or has not taken the value q) can be true and not-true at the same time. To clarify this key point, consider the case in which a system S interacts with another system (an apparatus) O, and exhibits a value q of one of its variables. Assume that the system O obeys the laws of quantum theory as well, and use the quantum theory of the combined system formed by O and S in order to predict the way this combined system can later interact with a third system O′. Then quantum mechanics forbids us to assume that q has happened. Indeed, as far as its later behavior is concerned, the combined system S+O may very well be in a quantum superposition of alternative possible values q, q′, q″, …. This "second observer" situation captures the core conceptual difficulty of the interpretation of quantum mechanics: reconciling the possibility of quantum superposition with the fact that the observed world is characterized by uniquely determined events q, q′, q″, …. More precisely, it shows that we cannot disentangle the two: according to the theory an observed quantity (q) can be at the same time determined and not determined. An event may have happened and at the same time may not have happened.

2. Relational view of quantum states

The way out from this dilemma suggested by the relational interpretations is that the quantum events, and thus the values of the variables of a physical system S, namely the q's, are relational. That is, they do not express properties of the system S alone, but rather refer to the relation between two systems.

The best developed of these interpretations is relational quantum mechanics (Rovelli 1996, 1997). For a detailed and critical account of this view of quantum theory, see (van Fraassen 2008) and (Bitbol 2007). The central tenet of relational quantum mechanics is that there is no meaning in saying that a certain quantum event has happened or that a variable of the system S has taken the value q: rather, there is meaning in saying that the event q has happened or the variable has taken the value q for O, or with respect to O. The apparent contradiction between the two statements that a variable has or hasn't a value is resolved by indexing the statements with the different systems with which the system in question interacts. If I observe an electron at a certain position, I cannot conclude that the electron is there: I can only conclude that the electron as seen by me is there. Quantum events only happen in interactions between systems, and the fact that a quantum event has happened is only true with respect to the systems involved in the interaction. The unique account of the state of the world of the classical theory is thus fractured into a multiplicity of accounts, one for each possible "observing" physical system. In the words of (Rovelli 1996): "Quantum mechanics is a theory about the physical description of physical systems relative to other systems, and this is a complete description of the world".

This relativisation of actuality is viable thanks to a remarkable property of the formalism of quantum mechanics. John von Neumann was the first to notice that the formalism of the theory treats the measured system (S ) and the measuring system (O) differently, but the theory is surprisingly flexible on the choice of where to put the boundary between the two. Different choices give different accounts of the state of the world (for instance, the collapse of the wave function happens at different times); but this does not affect the predictions on the final observations. Von Neumann only described a rather special situation, but this flexibility reflects a general structural property of quantum theory, which guarantees the consistency among all the distinct "accounts of the world" of the different observing systems. The manner in which this consistency is realized, however, is subtle.

What appears with respect to O as a measurement of the variable q (with a specific outcome), appears with respect to O′ simply as the establishing of a correlation between S and O (without any specific outcome). As far as the observer O is concerned, a quantum event has happened and a property q of a system S has taken a certain value. As far as the second observer O′ is concerned, the only relevant element of reality is that a correlation is established between S and O. This correlation will manifest itself only in any further observation that O′ would perform on the S+O system. Up to the time in which it physically interacts with S+O, the system O′ has no access to the actual outcomes of the measurements performed by O on S . This actual outcome is real only with respect to O (Rovelli 1996, pp. 1650-52). Consider for instance a two-state system O (say, a light-emitting diode, or l.e.d., which can be on or off) interacting with a two-state system S (say, the spin of an electron, which can be up or down). Assume the interaction is such that if the spin is up (down) the l.e.d. goes on (off). To start with, the electron can be in a superposition of its two states. In the account of the state of the electron that we can associate with the l.e.d., a quantum event happens in the interaction, the wave function of the electron collapses to one of two states, and the l.e.d. is then either on or off. But we can also consider the l.e.d./electron composite system as a quantum system and study the interactions of this composite system with another system O′. In the account associated to O′, there is no event and no collapse at the time of the interaction, and the composite system is still in the superposition of the two states [spin up/l.e.d. on] and [spin down/l.e.d. off] after the interaction. It is necessary to assume this superposition because it accounts for measurable interference effects between the two states: if quantum mechanics is correct, these interference effects are truly observable by O′. So, we have two discordant accounts of the same events. Can the two discord accounts be compared and does the comparison lead to contradiction? They can be compared, because the information on the first account is stored in the state of the l.e.d. and O′ has access to this information. Therefore O and O′ can compare their accounts of the state of the world.

However, the comparison does not lead to contradiction because the comparison is itself a physical process that must be understood in the context of quantum mechanics. Indeed, O′ can physically interact with the electron and then with the l.e.d. (or, equivalently, the other way around). If, for instance, he finds the spin of the electron up, quantum mechanics predicts that he will then consistently find the l.e.d. on (because in the first measurement the state of the composite system collapses on its [spin up/l.e.d. on] component). That is, the multiplicity of accounts leads to no contradiction precisely because the comparison between different accounts can only be a physical quantum interaction. This internal self-consistency of the quantum formalism is general, and it is perhaps its most remarkable aspect. This self consistency is taken in relational quantum mechanics as a strong indication of the relational nature of the world.

In fact, one may conjecture that this peculiar consistency between the observations of different observers is the missing ingredient for a reconstruction theorem of the Hilbert space formalism of quantum theory. Such a reconstruction theorem is still unavailable: On the basis of reasonable physical assumptions, one is able to derive the structure of an orthomodular lattice containing subsets that form Boolean algebras, which "almost", but not quite, implies the existence of a Hilbert space and its projectors' algebra (see the entry Quantum Logic and Quantum Probability.) Perhaps an appropriate algebraic formulation of the condition of consistency between subsystems could provide the missing hypothesis to complete the reconstruction theorem.

Bas van Fraassen has given an extensive critical discussion of this interpretation; he has also suggested an improvement, in the form of an additional postulate weakly relating the description of the same system given by different observers (van Fraassen 2008). Michel Bitbol has analyzed the relational interpretation of quantum mechanics from a Kantian perspective, substituting functional reference frames for physical (or naturalized) observers (Bitbol 2007).

3. Correlations

The conceptual relevance of correlations in quantum mechanics, — a central aspect of relational quantum mechanics — is emphasized by David Mermin, who analyses the statistical features of correlation (Mermin 1998), and arrives at views close to the relational ones. Mermin points out that a theorem on correlations in Hilbert space quantum mechanics is relevant to the problem of what exactly quantum theory tells us about the physical world. Consider a quantum system S with internal parts s, s′,…, that may be considered as subsystems of S , and define the correlations among subsystems as the expectation values of products of subsystems' observables. It can be proved that, for any resolution of S into subsystems, the subsystems' correlations determine uniquely the state of S. According to Mermin, this theorem highlights two major lessons that quantum mechanics teaches us: first, the relevant physics of S is entirely contained in the correlations both among the s, s′,…, themselves (internal correlations) and among the s′,…, and other systems (external correlations); second, correlations may be ascribed physical reality whereas, according to well-known ‘no-go’ theorems, the quantities that are the terms of the correlations cannot (Mermin 1998).

4. Self-reference and self-measurement

From a relational point of view, the properties of a system exists only in reference to another system. What about the properties of a system with respect to itself? Can a system measure itself? Is there any meaning of the correlations of a system with itself? Implicit in the relational point of view is the intuition that a complete self-measurement is impossible. It is this impossibility that forces all properties to be referred to another system. The issue of the self-measurement has been analyzed in details in two remarkable works, from very different perspectives, but with similar conclusions, by Marisa Dalla Chiara and by Thomas Breuer.

4.1 Logical aspect of the measurement problem

Marisa Dalla Chiara (1977) has addressed the logical aspect of the measurement problem. She observes that the problem of self-measurement in quantum mechanics is strictly related to the self-reference problem, which has an old tradition in logic. From a logical point of view the measurement problem of quantum mechanics can be described as a characteristic question of "semantical closure" of a theory. To what extent can quantum mechanics apply consistently to the objects and the concepts in terms of which its metatheory is expressed? Dalla Chiara shows that the duality in the description of state evolution, encoded in the ordinary (i.e. von Neumann's) approach to the measurement problem, can be given a purely logical interpretation: "If the apparatus observer O is an object of the theory, then O cannot realize the reduction of the wave function. This is possible only to another O′, which is ‘external’ with respect to the universe of the theory. In other words, any apparatus, as a particular physical system, can be an object of the theory. Nevertheless, any apparatus which realizes the reduction of the wave function is necessarily only a metatheoretical object " (Dalla Chiara 1977, p. 340). This observation is remarkably consistent with the way in which the state vector reduction is justified within the relational interpretation of quantum mechanics. When the system S+O is considered from the point of view of O′, the measurement can be seen as an interaction whose dynamics is fully unitary, whereas by the point of view of O the measurement breaks the unitarity of the evolution of S. The unitary evolution does not break down through mysterious physical jumps, due to unknown effects, but simply because O is not giving a full dynamical description of the interaction. O cannot have a full description of the interaction of S with himself (O), because his information is correlation information and there is no meaning in being correlated with oneself. If we include the observer into the system, then the evolution is still unitary, but we are now dealing with the description of a different observer.

4.2 Impossibility of complete self-measurement

As is well known, from a purely logical point of view self-reference properties in formal systems impose limitations on the descriptive power of the systems themselves. Thomas Breuer has shown that, from a physical point of view, this feature is expressed by the existence of limitations in the universal validity of physical theories, no matter whether classical or quantum (Breuer 1995). Breuer studies the possibility for an apparatus O to measure its own state. More precisely, of measuring the state of a system containing an apparatus O. He defines a map from the space of all sets of states of the apparatus to the space of all sets of states of the system. Such a map assigns to every set of apparatus states the set of system states that is compatible with the information that — after the measurement interaction — the apparatus is in one of these states. Under reasonable assumptions on this map, Breuer is able to prove a theorem stating that no such map can exist that can distinguish all the states of the system. An apparatus O cannot distinguish all the states of a system S containing O. This conclusion holds irrespective of the classical or quantum nature of the systems involved, but in the quantum context it implies that no quantum mechanical apparatus can measure all the quantum correlations between itself and an external system. These correlations are only measurable by a second external apparatus, observing both the system and the first apparatus.

5. Other relational views

5.1 Quantum reference systems

A relational view of quantum mechanics has been proposed also by Gyula Bene (1997). Bene argues that quantum states are relative in the sense that they express a relation between a system to be described and a different system, containing the former as a subsystem and acting for it as a quantum reference system (here the system is contained in the reference system, while in Breuer's work the system contains the apparatus). Consider again a measuring system (O) that has become entangled with a measured system (S ) during a measurement. Once again, the difficulty of quantum theory is that there is an apparent contradiction between the fact that the quantity q of the system assumes an observed value in the measurement, while the composite S+O system still has to be considered in a superposition state, if we want to properly predict the outcome of measurements on the S+O system. This apparent contradiction is resolved by Bene by relativizing the state not to an observer, as in the relational quantum mechanics sketched in Section 2, but rather to a relevant composite system. That is: there is a state of the system S relative to S alone, and a state of the system S relative to the S+O composite system. (Similarly, there is a state of the system O relative to itself alone, and a state of the system O relative to the S+O ensemble.) The ensemble with respect to which the state is defined is called by Bene the quantum reference system . The state of a system with respect to a given quantum reference system correctly predicts the probability distributions of any measurement on the entire reference system. This dependence of the states of quantum systems from different quantum systems that act as reference systems is viewed as a fundamental property that holds no matter whether a system is observed or not.

5.2 Sigma algebra of interactive properties

Similar views have been expressed by Simon Kochen in unpublished but rather well-known notes (Kochen, 1979, preprint). In Kochen's words: "The basic change in the classical framework which we advocate lies in dropping the assumption of the absoluteness of physical properties of interacting systems… Thus quantum mechanical properties acquire an interactive or relational character." Kochen uses a σ-algebra formalism. Each quantum system has an associated Hilbert space. The properties of the system are established by its interaction with other quantum systems, and these properties are represented by the corresponding projection operators on the Hilbert space. These projectors are elements of a Boolean σ-algebra, determined by the physics of the interaction between the two systems. Suppose a quantum system S can interact with quantum systems Q, Q′,…. In each case, S will acquire an interaction σ-algebra of properties σ(Q), σ(Q′) since the interaction between S and Q may be finer grained than the interaction between S and Q′. Thus, interaction σ-algebras may have non-trivial intersections. The family of all Boolean σ-algebras forms a category, with the sets of the projectors of each σ-algebra as objects. In Kochen's words: "Just as the state of a composite system does not determine states of its components, conversely, the states of the… correlated systems do not determine the state of the composite system […] We thus resolve the measurement problem by cutting the Gordian knot tying the states of component systems uniquely to the state of the combined system." This is very similar in spirit to the Bene approach and to Rovelli's relational quantum mechanics, but the precise technical relation between the formalisms utilized in these approaches has not yet been analysed in full detail.

Further approaches at least formally related to Kochen's have been proposed by Healey (1989), who also emphasises an interactive aspect of his approach, and by Dieks (1989). See also the entry on ’Modal Interpretations of Quantum Mechanics’.

5.3 Quantum theory of the universe

Relational views on quantum theory have been defended also by Lee Smolin (1995) and by Louis Crane (1995) in a cosmological context. If one is interested in the quantum theory of the entire universe, then, by definition, an external observer is not available. Breuer's theorem shows then that a quantum state of the universe, containing all correlations between all subsystems, expresses information that is not available, not even in principle, to any observer. In order to write a meaningful quantum state, argue Crane and Smolin, we have to divide the universe in two components and consider the relative quantum state predicting the outcomes of the observations that one component can make on the other.

5.4 Relation with Everett's relative-state interpretation

Relational ideas underlie also the interpretations of quantum theory inspired by the work of Everett. Everett’ original work (Everett 1975) relies on the notion of "relative state" and has a marked relational tone (see quantum mechanics: Everett's relative-state formulation of). In the context of Everettian accounts, a state may be taken as relative either (more commonly) to a "world", or "branch", or (sometimes) to the state of another system (see for instance Saunders 1996, 1998). While the first variant (relationalism with respect to branches) is far from the relational views described here, the second variant (relationalism with respect to the state of a system) is closer.

However, it is different to say that something is relative to a system or that something is relative to a state of a system. Consider for instance the situation described in the example of Section 5: According to the relational interpretation, after the first measurement the quantity q has a given value and only one for O, while in Everettian terms the quantity q has a value for one state of O and a different value for another state of O, and the two are equally real. In Everett, there is an ontological multiplicity of realities, which is absent in the relational point of view, where physisical quantities are uniquely determined, once two systems are given.

The difference derives from a very general interpretational difference between Everettian accounts and the relational point of view. Everett (at least in its widespread version) takes the state Ψ as the basis of the ontology of quantum theory. The overall state Ψ includes different possible branches and different possible outcomes. On the other hand, the relational interpretation takes the quantum events q, that is, the actualizations of values of physical quantities, as the basic elements of reality (see Section 1.1 above) and such q's are assumed to be univocal. The relational view avoids the traditional difficulties in taking the q's as univocal simply by noticing that a q does not refer to a system, but rather to a pair of systems.

For a comparison between the relational interpretation and other current interpretations of quantum mechanics, see Rovelli 1996.

6. Some consequences of the relational point of view

A number of open conceptual issues in quantum mechanics appear in a different light when seen in the context of a relational interpretation of the theory. In particular, the Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen (EPR) correlations have a substantially different interpretation within the perspective of the relational interpretation of quantum mechanics. Laudisa (2001) has argued that the non-locality implied by the conventional EPR argument turns out to be frame-dependent, and this result supports the "peaceful coexistence" of quantum mechanics and special relativity. More radically, Rovelli and Smerlak (2006) argue that these correlations do not entail any form of "non-locality", when viewed in the context of this interpretation, essentially because there is a quantum event relative to an observer that happens at a spacelike separation from this observer. The abandonment of strict Einstein realism implied by the relational stance permits to reconcile quantum mechanics, completeness and locality.

Also, the relational interpretation allows one to give a precise definition of the time (or, better, the probability distribution of the time) at which a measurement happens, in terms of the probability distribution of the correlation between system and apparatus, as measurable by a third observer (Rovelli 1998).

Finally, it has been suggested in (Rovelli 1997) that the relationalism at the core of quantum theory pointed out by the relational interpretations might be connected with the spatiotemporal relationalism that characterizes general relativity. Quantum mechanical relationalism is the observation that there are no absolute properties: properties of a system S are relative to another system O with which S is interacting. General relativistic relationalism is the well known observation that there is no absolute localization in spacetime: localization of an object S in spacetime is only relative to the gravitational field, or to any other object O, to which S is contiguous. There is a connection between the two, since interaction between S and O implies contiguity and contiguity between S and O can only be checked via some quantum interaction. However, because of the difficulty of developing a consistent and conceptually transparent theory of quantum gravity, so far this suggestion has not been developed beyond the stage of a simple intuition.

7. Conclusion

Relational interpretations of quantum mechanics propose a solution to the interpretational difficulties of quantum theory based on the idea of weakening the notions of the state of a system, event, and the idea that a system, at a certain time, may just have a certain property. The world is described as an ensemble of events ("the electron is the point x") which happen only relatively to a given observer. Accordingly, the state and the properties of a system are relative to another system only. There is a wide diversity in style, emphasis, and language in the authors that we have mentioned. Indeed, most of the works mentioned have developed independently from each other. But it is rather clear that there is a common idea underlying all these approaches, and the convergence is remarkable.

Werner Heisenberg first recognized that the electron does not have a well defined position when it is not interacting. Relational interpretations push this intuition further, by stating that, even when interacting, the position of the electron is only determined in relation to a certain observer, or to a certain quantum reference system, or similar.

In physics, the move of deepening our insight into the physical world by relativizing notions previously used as absolute has been applied repeatedly and very successfully. Here are a few examples. The notion of the velocity of an object has been recognized as meaningless, unless it is indexed with a reference body with respect to which the object is moving. With special relativity, simultaneity of two distant events has been recognized as meaningless, unless referred to a specific state of motion of something. (This something is usually denoted as "the observer" without, of course, any implication that the observer is human or has any other peculiar property besides having a state of motion. Similarly, the "observer system" O in quantum mechanics need not to be human or have any other property beside the possibility of interacting with the "observed" system S.) With general relativity, the position in space and time of an object has been recognized as meaningless, unless it is referred to the gravitational field, or to some other dynamical physical entity. The move proposed by the relational interpretations of quantum mechanics has strong analogies with these, but is, in a sense, a longer jump, since all physical events and the entirety of the contingent properties of any physical system are taken to be meaningful only as relative to a second physical system. The claim of the relational interpretations is that this is not an arbitrary move. Rather, it is a conclusion which is difficult to escape, following from the observation — explained above in the example of the "second observer" — that a variable (of a system S) can have a well determined value q for one observer (O) and at the same time fail to have a determined value for another observer (O′).

This way of thinking the world has certainly heavy philosophical implications. The claim of the relational interpretations is that it is nature itself that is forcing us to this way of thinking. If we want to understand nature, our task is not to frame nature into our philosophical prejudices, but rather to learn how to adjust our philosophical prejudices to what we learn from nature.


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