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Reasons for Action: Justification vs. Explanation

First published Fri Feb 20, 2009

Modern philosophical literature distinguishes between explanatory reasons and justifying reasons. The former are reasons we appeal to in attempting to explain actions and attitudes. The latter are reasons we appeal to in attempting to justify them.

1. Introduction: The Basic Idea

Here is Galahad sticking pins in the Paraguayan flag. Why would he be doing that? Here's a possible explanation. Galahad has a murderous hatred for Paraguayans. He believes they are evil and wishes to destroy them. A well-intentioned acquaintance, seeking to render his murderous bigotry harmless, has persuaded him to believe the superstitious falsehood that the most efficient way to destroy Paraguayans is to obtain a Paraguayan flag and stick pins in it. This he is now doing.

We ask what reasons, if any, there are for Galahad to be acting as he is? And it is natural to answer that there are no reasons for him to be doing so. There is no story to be told to make good normative sense of what he is doing; for what he is doing makes no good normative sense. He is, quite evidently, engaged in a wholly pointless activity which he mistakenly sees as an effective means to his indefensible ends.

We might say then, that there are no reasons that justify what Galahad is doing. We have explained it by giving the reasons he took himself to have but this was no good as a justification based as it was on false beliefs and crazy desires. So we can explain Galahad's action by adducing his reasons for doing it, the reasons that furnish his motivation, but, if we look for reasons that would justify what he does, we can find none.

Lancelot is actively supporting a campaign to save the rainforest. He doesn't really care about saving the rainforest as such, but he is enamoured of Guinevere who, he believes, cares about this a great deal. He hopes his campaigning will favourably impress her, something he is very keen to do as he can imagine no happier state than being her spouse. Poor Lancelot, alas, is doubly deceived. Guinevere is not in fact even faintly impressed by such things. And marrying Guinevere, whose character he has gravely misjudged, would in fact make him quite miserable.

So the reasons that explain what Lancelot does, like Galahad's reasons, fail to justify his actions. But what Lancelot does may still be justified. For we might credibly suppose that, however little Lancelot may care about it, saving the rainforest, or contributing to saving it, is nonetheless worthwhile and perhaps too that the campaign he is supporting is a potentially effective one. So there may be excellent justifying reasons for what Galahad does even though these do not in any way engage him and so play no role in the explanation of his actions.

It is natural to say, then, that there are the reasons that explain what we do and the reasons that justify what we do. The reasons that explain may fail to justify, as we have seen with Galahad and Lancelot. And the reasons that justify may fail to explain, for actions may be justified by reasons quite distinct from those that explain them, as we have seen with Lancelot. And indeed justifying reasons can apply to actions that are not performed at all and for which explanatory questions consequently fail even to arise (cf. Woods 1972, 189).

We might note, following Baier, (1958, chapter 6) that we think about reasons in three main contexts: contexts of justification, contexts of explanation and contexts of deliberation. (I will be thinking here of the justification, explanation and deliberation of actions though much of what follows plausibly generalizes to a wide range of what Scanlon (1998) calls judgement-sensitive attitudes: “[t]he class of attitudes for which reasons… can sensibly be asked for or offered” (1998, 4–5). A pro tanto reason to φ is a reason that genuinely speaks in favour of φ-ing, but, while a pro tanto reason to φ favours φ-ing, it may not do so decisively: the overall balance of reasons may direct one to do otherwise. The fact that smoking a cigarette is pleasurable is a perfectly real, perfectly good justifying reason to smoke insofar as smoking really is pleasurable. It is a reason that really does speak in favour of smoking, even if we also believe other considerations outweigh it so that smoking, all things considered, is not a good idea. So even though the pleasurableness of smoking does not suffice to justify my smoking, all things considered, it is still a good reason for smoking. Indeed where we are concerned with justifying reasons, the “good” of “good reason” is a redundancy: if there is nothing good about, nothing to be said in favour of, your (explanatory) reason for φ-ing, it wasn't a (justifying) reason at all (Dancy 2000, 3; cf. Parfit 1984, 118).

Contexts of deliberation are essentially contexts where we look for and evaluate candidate justifying reasons for doing or refraining from various actions with a view to determining what to do. Our concern in such contexts is always normative rather than explanatory but the reasons we decide to act on in such contexts may subsequently be cited in explanation of what we do, at least in cases where we succeed in conforming our actions to the decisions in which our deliberation issues.

In contexts where we are concerned with explaining an action, we ask not what reasons there were to perform it but what were the agent's reasons for performing it. This is often a matter of identifying the reasons she took herself to have but here we should be cautious. An agent's reasons may well operate below the radar of her conscious self-knowledge. A vain person might choose to visit a certain shop because there is a mirror there without it ever consciously occurring to him that this is his reason. (The example is from Smith 1994, 106.)

Of course not all explanations of action proceed by reference to an agent's reasons at all.[1] Perhaps you speak angrily to me because you are stressed and sleep-deprived. Perhaps I come home early because I have forgotten my promise not to or laugh because of the contagious laughter of others. Certain features of my behaviour may be explained neuro-chemically by reference to my serotonin or testosterone levels; to the amount of alcohol, sugar or cocaine in my system; to traits of my character or features of my situation (Darwall 1983, 29; Dancy 2000, 5–6). But explanations of these kinds do not necessarily compete with explanations in terms of the agent's reasons (see Smith 1998).

Explanation in terms of the agent's reasons is plausibly special and distinctive, moreover, in that it applies to all cases of intentional action. For actions like those of Galahad we look in vain for justifying reasons but it is often claimed that the attributability of explanatory reasons is constitutive of intentional action as such. In that case a supposed action with no explanatory reasons just wouldn't be an action at all.[2]

The distinction between justifying reasons and explanatory reasons should not be confused with the distinction between subjective and objective reasons. The latter is a distinction between two kinds of justifying reason, the justifying reasons that apply to my circumstances as I, incompletely and perhaps incorrectly, understand them (subjective reasons) and the justifying reasons that apply to my circumstances as they actually are (objective reasons). Believing as I do that the liquid in the bottle is water I have a subjective reason to drink it but, as it is actually petrol, I have no objective reason. Ignorant as I am of how thin the ice is, I have a subjective reason to proceed with great caution. If it is in fact extremely solid and safe, I may have no such objective reason.

2. Supposed Historical Antecedents

The distinction between justifying and explanatory reasons is often (notably by Frankena 1958, 44) attributed to Hutcheson (1730, section 1). The attribution is plausibly contested by Dancy (2000, 20–21). Hutcheson distinguishes two kinds of “truth”, those which identify some “quality” of an action that excites the agent to perform it and those which identify some quality in the action in virtue of which we might come to approve of it morally. (Truths of either sort only attain the status of reasons, on Hutcheson's view, when they speak to something in the affections or instincts of those they are reasons for.)

Dancy also questions (2000, 21–23) whether Frankena himself in his classic paper “Obligation and Motivation in Recent Moral Philosophy” (1958) understands the distinction he draws there between what he calls exciting or motivating reasons and justifying reasons, in quite the way the explanatory/justifying distinction is now understood. Certainly Frankena seems unhelpfully to run this distinction together with a quite different distinction between moral and nonmoral reasons, identifying justifying reasons with the former, exciting reasons with the latter.[3]

3. Internalism and Externalism

Frankena introduces the distinction (1958, 44–45) in the course of criticizing such writers as G. C. Field, W. T. Stace, P. H. Nowell-Smith and W. D. Falk who are all critics of externalism. Externalism—as opposed to internalism—has it that claims about obligations or reasons can be taken to represent external facts. External facts here means facts external to, in the sense of independent of, the motivating states of those to whom the supposed obligations or reasons apply.

For externalists, then, there are the facts about what reasons apply to me and there are the facts about what motives drive and engage me and these facts are quite independent of each other. For internalists, on the other hand, facts about reasons I have are not independent of facts about what motivates me. Internalists' arguments, Frankena urges, trade on a confusion between exciting or motivating reasons and justifying reasons. The former kind of reason, he concedes, cannot secure their status as reasons independently of the agent's motives but that does not mean that the latter kind cannot.

This concern with internalism is shared by more recent philosophers who stress the explanatory/justifying distinction, often echoing Frankena's charge that internalists somehow confound it.

The term “internalism” and its opposite “externalism” crop up in many contexts meaning different things. Some further terminological clarification is thus in order.

Sometimes externalism is understood as the claim that facts about reasons are independent of the motivational condition of those they are reasons for, internalism as the claim that this is not so, that facts about our reasons are tied essentially to features of our motivation. We might call these positions normative existence internalism and externalism.

Sometimes “internalism” is used in a somewhat different sense to mean that facts about moral obligation are tied essentially to the motivational condition of those supposedly obligated and externalism as the denial of this claim. Here we could speak of moral existence internalism and externalism.

Sometimes, finally, “internalism” is used to denote the claim that someone can only count as judging that some normative claim is true if he is in a suitable motivational condition. Again there is an analogous internalist claim for moral judgements. These claims we could call respectively normative and moral judgement internalism. (My terminology here follows Darwall 1983, 54; see further the entry on reasons for action: internal vs. external.)

It is normative existence internalism that is most often at issue in contexts where the explanatory/justifying distinction is emphasized and that we will be concerned with here.

Normative existence internalism has obvious appeal. If our understanding of reason talk leaves it wholly disconnected from anything at all in the economy of human motivation, such talk can readily come to seem puzzling and dubiously intelligible. The classic case for this kind of internalism in the contemporary literature is made by Bernard Williams in his 1980 paper “Internal and External Reasons”. Williams here distinguishes internal and external reasons, proposing that the truth conditions of internal reason statements be supposed essentially to involve facts about the motivations of the agent whereas those of external reasons should not. He then proceeds to argue that there are no external reasons so understood.

An early critic of Williams is E. J. Bond in his book Reason and Value (1983) where he urges, echoing Frankena's earlier critique of internalism, that Williams' argument is undermined if we distinguish clearly between what he calls motivating reasons and grounding reasons. More recently Williams' internalism is attacked by Derek Parfit who places a heavy emphasis on a distinction between motivating reasons and normative reasons and urges that the credibility of internalism depends on confusing the two (Parfit 1997, 2007). For Parfit such confusion is pervasive, found, he claims, not only in the writings of Williams, but in those of Christine Korsgaard (1996, 1997), David McNaughton (1988), Peter Railton (1993), J. L. Mackie (1977), Thomas Nagel (1970), P. H. Nowell-Smith (1954), R. M. Hare (1952, 1972), and W.D. Falk (1986).

Williams' argument for internalism appeals crucially to the supposed prior plausibility of a claim he formulates variously thus:

If there are reasons for action, it must be that people sometimes act for those reasons, and if they do, their reasons must figure in some correct explanation of their action… (1980, 102)
If something can be a reason for action, then it could be someone's reason for acting on a particular occasion, and it would then figure in an explanation of that action. (1980, 106)

In terms of our distinction between justifying and explanatory reasons we could capture this claim two ways:

WA. If R is a justifying reason, then it is sometimes an explanatory reason for some agent's action.
WB. If R is a justifying reason, then it might be an explanatory reason for some agent's action.

The bolder first version is suggested by the first quoted passage, the more cautious second by the second. Both are clearly problematic as they stand. The first, as it stands, is clearly false. Perhaps some easily manufactured chemical compound reliably cures all cancers but no one will ever discover this. Then no one will ever manufacture and distribute this compound for that reason. But it is certainly a reason.

The second is very plausible but extremely vague given the slipperiness of the modal term “might”. How different am I allowed to suppose myself in the possible worlds where R explains my action? With no constraints on this, WB is trivial. Williams seeks to put flesh on WB by characterizing what he calls sound deliberative routes, the thought then being that if R is a justifying reason for A, there is some sound deliberative route from A's actual motivational state to a state where he is motivated to act in a way that R would explain. In doing so he can rely at least on a sense that the more thoroughly remote the possible worlds we must go to to find counterparts of ourselves motivated by certain considerations, the more unreal the contention comes to appear that these considerations are reasons for us. His argument thus ultimately rests on the credibility of his sense that the internalist understanding of a justifying reason he spells out in this way is clear and straightforward while the rival understanding of justifying reasons as external reasons is mysterious and opaque.

Important as the distinction is between justifying and explanatory reasons, it would certainly be unfair to charge most contemporary internalists with simply confounding it. More charitably and correctly, internalists such as Williams can be read as fully appreciating the distinction but questioning whether, if justifying reasons had as little to do with what explains and motivates action as externalists suppose, we could retain any real purchase on what our talk of such reasons is even about.

4. Theories of Normative Reasons

Here our understanding of the significance of the explanatory/justifying distinction intersects with vexed debates over how talk of justifying, or as it is often now put, of normative reasons should be understood. Here only a brief snapshot of this vexed and intricate area of philosophy is either possible or appropriate.

Internalists seek to make sense of justifying reasons in terms of their connection to what motivates us. For internalists, to talk of reasons is, in effect, to talk of considerations that speak to our desires either as they are or subject to some idealizing constraint. (Foot 1972, Harman 1975, Williams 1980, Hubin 1999, Joyce 2001, chapters 2–5, Frankfurt 2006).

Note that this does not, by itself, imply the kind of relativism about reasons whereby a reason applies to someone only if they have an appropriate portfolio of desires. If the idealizing constraint is made potent enough, there might, as neo-Kantian rationalists believe, be motivations to which there is a sound deliberative route from any starting point (Korsgaard 1986; Smith 1994, 1995). Such reasons would be universal, non-relative, categorical requirements of reason. (We must of course be wary of strengthening any idealizing constraint in ways that might render internalism trivial.)

In tying reasons to motivation, internalism naturally comports with what are sometimes called desire-based theories of reason (Darwall 1983, Hubin 1999, Dancy 2000, chapter 2, Heuer 2004, Schroeder 2007). Desire-based theories of reason seek to unpack claims about what reasons one has in a naturalistic way as claims about what considerations speak to one's desires, actual or ideal. Both internalism and desire-based understandings of reason are often associated, more or less loosely, with Hume and are sometimes labelled accordingly (see e.g. Hubin 1999, Heuer 2004, Schroeder 2007) though the term “Humean”, like the term “internalism”, is used, even in the context of discussions of practical reason, to refer to a somewhat bewildering variety of views.

Internalism is intimately connected with desire-based theories of reason and plausibly entailed by them. But the two are distinct and should not be confused: any entailment is at most one-way. This is certainly the case when we understand internalism as the claim that a consideration C is a reason for an agent A if and only if it speaks to A's desires either as they are or subject to some idealizing constraint. This seems very close to what desire-based reasons theories say. But desire-based reasons theorists, as such, are committed, as internalists, as such, are not, to accepting a specific understanding of this internalist biconditional that reads the order of determination from right to left: what speaks to my desires determines what reasons I have and not vice versa. And desire-based reasons theorists do not, like Korsgaard and Smith, interpret any idealizing constraint as so potent as to free all our reasons from any counterfactual dependence on the specifics of what we desire.

Desire-based theories are attractive. They promise to make good naturalistic sense of normativity and they make it a very straightforward matter to understand why reason is of such interest and importance to us (Hubin 1999). But to make reasons contingent on facts about our motivation can appear to have unpalatable consequences of its own. Notably this has been argued, for example by Parfit, to entail that if my motivational system were unusual enough, I could have reasons to do very odd things such as eating light bulbs; and that if I had a motivational system to which the concerns of morality failed to speak I might have no reason to act morally (Parfit, 2006, 354–355; see also Quinn, 1993; Mele 2003, 79; Heuer 2004, 49–53; and Parfit On What Matters—see Other Internet Resources).

Others, nonreductive realists about reasons (Scanlon 1998; Dancy 2000; Parfit 2007; Parfit On What Matters—see Other Internet Resources), reject any view that seeks to unpack normative reason talk in terms of what does—or what might —engage our wills. We know what reasons are, such writers think, but there is little to be said by way of illuminating analysis or other philosophical explication. (See e.g. Parfit 2006, 330–331.) Thus Scanlon opens What We Owe to Each Other with this passage:

I will take the idea of a reason as primitive. Any attempt to explain what it is to be a reason for something seems to me to lead back to the same idea: a consideration that counts in favour of it. “Counts in favour how?” one might ask. “By providing a reason for it” seems to be the only answer. (1998, 17)

Then there is expressivism, a view distinct from both internalism and nonreductive realism. Expressivists seek to understand normative language in terms of the motivating states, desires, intentions etc. of those who use such language but as expressive and not descriptive of such states (Blackburn 1998, Gibbard 1990, 2003).

In general, the core idea of expressivism about some concept Fness is that the best philosophical explication of Fness consists not in some analytic account of what Fness is but in an account of what it is to call something F or to think something F. We then understand what thought is being expressed when something is called F. With straightforward descriptive concepts things are otherwise: I first understand what it is to be spherical and that understanding informs my understanding of what it is to call something spherical or to think it is spherical. For concepts about which expressivism is true, this order of understanding is reversed.

Normative expressivism applies this idea to the case of our normative concepts. Thus Gibbard (1990, 163) gives the following expressivist account of (normative) reasons:

When a person calls something—call it R—a reason for doing X, he expresses his acceptance of norms that say to treat R as weighing in favour of doing X.

In the light of an objection from Scanlon (1998, 58) that the foregoing presupposes a prior understanding, of what it is to count in favour of something, Gibbard in his later Thinking How to Live elaborates on this earlier proposal, suggesting that to treat R as weighing in favour of X is to plan in a certain way, a way we can describe without using the concept of a reason. That R counts in favour of X is then a normative thought that I might have in deliberating; but that I count R in favour of X is a psychological thought about the state of mind on which the expressivist's analysis focuses, a state we might programme a robot to mimic (2003, 188–191).

Expressivists like Gibbard and Blackburn are normative judgement internalists but not normative existence internalists, linking normative judgements analytically as they do to the motivations not of their subjects but of the speakers who give them voice (Blackburn 1998, 264–266; Gibbard 1990, 160–164). It thus makes perfect sense for me to say you have a reason to brush your teeth regularly even if there is nothing at all in your motivational portfolio to which such a reason speaks.

Like desire-based reasons theorists and unlike nonreductive realists, expressivists thus seek to render (justifying) reason talk intelligible by explicating it with reference to desires and other motivating states to which explanation by reference to someone's reasons appeals. But for expressivists the connection between these things is characterized in a very different way.

For desire-based reasons theorists, normative talk, talk about (justifying) reasons, is effectively talk about desires, talk the beliefs we express by which are made true, if they are true, by facts about the desires of the people to whom we say reasons apply. For expressivists, normative talk need not be about desires at all but remains intimately linked to motivation by being expressive of desires, not of beliefs. For desire-based reasons theorists, facts about explanatory reasons, about the reasons that do or could motivate us, function as conditions for the truth of claims about justifying reasons. For expressivists our talk of justifying reasons expresses the very motivating states that may also be invoked in explaining why we do what we do when the normative judgements we express in such talk come to motivate what we do. For nonreductive realists justifying reasons and explanatory reasons are connected in neither of these intimate ways.

5. Normative vs. Motivating Reasons

There is, as is already clear, a lack of consistency in the literature over the terminology that is applicable to our distinction. Arguably talk in terms of a distinction between normative and motivating reasons is now the dominant practice, adhered to as it is by, inter alia, three especially influential writers on practical reason, Michael Smith, Jonathan Dancy and, as we have seen, Parfit. Dancy explains his preference for “normative” and “motivating” as, firstly, in order to avoiding confusion over the fact that talk of justifying reasons can sometimes apply to considerations whose influence on the agent exculpates him for his action though they fail to count in its favour and, secondly, because normative reasons may also do explanatory work (2000, 6–7).

It's natural to think of this simply as a minor terminological variant on talk of justifying and explanatory reasons. For many purposes and in many contexts, this supposition is indeed safe enough. However the normative/motivating distinction may not always sit perfectly neatly over its justifying/explanatory counterpart. Partly this reflects varying ways the terminology is used. Smith's understanding of the former distinction can help us to see this.

Normative reasons Smith conceives of as truths that speak to the issue of whether some action is justified. Motivating reasons, on the other hand, he conceives of as psychological states of an agent that make possible a rationalizing explanation of what an agent does. More particularly, for Smith, motivating reasons are understood, following Davidson (1963), as complexes of beliefs and desires that motivate actions and that we cite in explaining them, where the explanation in question is taken to be causal (Smith 1994, 94–98).

For Smith, motivating reasons explain our actions. I φ because I have some belief-desire complex that motivates me to φ. But Smith's position is subtle. Normative reasons also play an explanatory role. Or, more precisely, beliefs about normative reasons play such a role for people who are practically rational. According to Smith, normative and evaluative beliefs about what I ought to do or what it would be desirable for me to do, cause me, insofar as I am rational, to have relevant desires that then proceed to play their essential role in motivation.

So, on Smith's account, here I am believing that it would be desirable for me to φ. In virtue of having this belief, I am brought to desire to φ. This desire of mine to φ together with a belief that ψ-ing is a necessary means to φ-ing then motivate me to ψ. The desire of mine to φ together with the belief that I can φ by ψ-ing motivate my ψ-ing and constitute my motivating reason to ψ. The belief that it would be desirable for me to φ causes my desire to φ and features in a rationalizing explanation of that desire but does not motivate that desire.

Smith seeks to clarify this by comparing the cases where, on the one hand, we explain A's coming to believe that q in terms of his believing that p and that p supports q; and where, on the other, we explain A's coming to believe that q in virtue of his desiring to believe that q. The latter case, where the rationalizing explanation invokes A's desire, is a case of motivated belief. The former case, where the explanation is in terms of belief alone, is a rational process but not a case of motivation at all. Similarly the causation of my desire to φ by my belief that φ-ing would be desirable is a rational process but not a process of motivation. So, where Smith is concerned, it makes sense to regard my belief that φ-ing would be desirable as an explanatory reason—for it does real explanatory work—but he does not regard it as a motivating reason (1994, 177–180).

Normative and evaluative beliefs that explain why rational creatures come to have appropriate desires do not then, for Smith, count as motivating reasons. Not everyone would agree. Some such as Eve Garrard and David McNaughton (1998) and Richard Norman (2001) would want to insist that being moved to action by such normative and evaluative beliefs, with no independent contribution from desire, should count as motivation. The issue is made harder to adjudicate by a certain murkiness attaching to the term “motivation”, a point which Garrard and McNaughton vividly emphasize.

Norman agrees with Garrard and McNaughton that to believe that one has a reason to φ is to be motivated to φ but takes this to be, in effect, trivial, amounting to a “redundancy theory” of motivation whereby the content of

X is motivated to φ.

simply reduces to

X believes he has a reason to φ.

Of course it's true that we tend to act in accordance with our beliefs about what we have reason to do but for Norman this is not a phenomenon we should look to some philosophical account of motivation to explain. Human beings tend to do this, we simply say, thereby offering a “dispositional explanation” akin to explaining the cherry tree's losing its leaves in autumn by observing that that's what cherry trees do. Why human beings tend to do this, like why cherry trees lose their leaves in the autumn, is, he urges, a matter for the empirical sciences, not a philosophical theory of motivation.

6. Psychologism

For Smith, as we have seen, normative and motivating reasons are entirely distinct, categorically different sorts of things: normative reasons are truths, while motivating reasons are belief-desire pairs, psychological features of the agent (1994, 96; 2004a, 151–152). What unites them, for Smith, is that, in different ways, they confer intelligibility on actions (Smith 1994, 95. For sceptical comment on this, see Dancy 1995, section I). For others, notably Dancy, this is all quite wrong. Dancy wants to reject what he calls psychologism: “the claim that the reasons for which we act are psychological states of ourselves” (2000, 98).

At the heart of Dancy's case against psychologism is a strong emphasis on the restatement and development of Williams' thesis WB, discussed above in section 3. Dancy finds (2000, 24) Baier's talk of “contexts” congenial, regarding motivating reason talk and normative reason talk as talk about the very same things in different contexts. He insists on the truth of what Norman (2001, 5) has called Dancy's Maxim: that “A reason must be something for which someone could have acted, and in any case, where someone does act for that reason, the reason contributes to the explanation of her action” (1995, 4). Similarly, Garrard and McNaughton emphasize what they call Korsgaard's Constraint whereby “the reason why you ought to do an action and the reason why you do it can be the same” (1998, 48). Effectively these are both formulations of what Ulrike Heuer, more recently, labels the identity thesis:

By this I mean that when an agent acts for a (specific) reason that very reason is also the explanation (or at least part of the explanation) of why she did what she did. Normative or justificatory and explanatory reasons are the same reasons in such a case and not different kinds of reasons altogether…. “[I]dentity” in this sense does not imply the claim that justificatory and explanatory reasons can never come apart. On its current, quite restricted interpretation the identity thesis picks out a subset of reasons which are both explanatory and justificatory: the reasons a person acts for who is neither weak-willed, nor mistaken about her reasons. (2004, 45)

The identity thesis, Heuer urges, is not credibly questionable. It

leads right into the centre of our understanding of rational agency. It explains what “acting for a reason” means. It in fact accounts for the special importance of rationalizing explanations. (2004, 59)

For Dancy and others, then, normative and motivating reasons are sometimes the same. Therefore they are not, as Smith supposes, categorically different kinds of beast. And they are to be supposed identical in particular for agents in what we might call sound normative shape, agents who have their facts right, correctly gauge the normative significance of those facts and act accordingly without derailment by any kind of weakness. Such agents act only on good reasons so that the motivating reasons that explain their actions are also the normative reasons that favour them.

The normative reasons that favour actions are not psychological states but facts or truths, features of the world that speak in their favour. (The vagueness with which I have put this gets resolved by different writers in different ways. Sometimes normative reasons are taken to be propositions (see, e.g., Darwall 1983, 31; Smith 1994, 95). However, Dancy (2000, 114–117) argues that propositions are the wrong sort of thing to be normative reasons, which should instead be identified with states of affairs.) They can be facts of many sorts. But they are not, Dancy and Smith would agree, features of the agent's psychology. On rare occasions they might indeed be facts about the agent's psychology. That the agent believes the cliff is crumbling is a reason not to climb it as the nervousness the belief engenders increases the likelihood of her falling off. But this is hardly the normal case (Dancy 2000, 124). In the normal case my normative reason for fleeing the burning building is that it is on fire—a fact that presents a real danger to me if I stay put—and not that I believe it is on fire—a fact which, by itself, presents no danger to me at all. In normal cases, where my actions are justified, the normative reasons that justify them are not features of my psychology, not even facts about my psychology but the facts about the world to which my psychological states, insofar as I am in sound normative shape, respond. And if this is true of normative reasons, it must also be true, if we accept the identity thesis, of motivating reasons. So if normative reasons are not psychological states of the agent or even, ordinarily, facts about psychological states of the agent, neither are motivating reasons. So, argues Dancy, we should reject psychologism, the claim defended by Smith and others that motivating reasons are psychological states of the agent (2000, especially chapters 5 and 6.).[4]

This makes a least a degree of initial sense. It is after all extremely natural to explain the agent's fleeing the building by reference not to his belief that there was a fire but to the fact that there was a fire. Or, when we ask, Why does Angus punch his boss? we naturally reply, Because he has been fired; not, Because he believes he has been fired. It's the fact to which the belief answers, not the belief itself, to which the explanation of such actions naturally refers. (In discussing psychologism here I'll focus on beliefs as Dancy and others have contested the supposed essential role of desires as components of motivating reasons in what they deem relatively plausible forms of psychologism. See Dancy 2000, chapter 4; Garrard and McNaughton 1998; Norman 2001).

Smith (2004b) thinks this is readily explained in ways consistent with his Hume-Davidson inspired story of motivating reasons as belief-desire complexes. Believing Angus to have been fired and knowing him to have punched his boss I explain his violent outburst with reference to his firing. It is natural to move to the psychological form of explanation—Angus punched his boss because he believed he had been fired—only when there is at least some doubt in my mind about the truth of his belief. Either I think he has not, contrary to what he supposed, been fired at all, or I am at least unsure enough to be unwilling to commit myself. I thus cautiously confine myself to the relatively non-committal psychologised explanation and, in doing so, I thereby convey to my hearers, by Gricean implicature, just such doubtfulness concerning the correctness of Angus' belief. Where I am free of such doubts, consequently, to offer the psychologised explanation—because he believed he had been fired—is to say something misleading. But that is not to say it is saying something false.

This account of the matter allows philosophers friendly to psychologism to explain away the great naturalness of the explanation that appeals directly past the agent's belief to the fact which he believes, and to explain it in a way consistent with a Smith-style Humean story even in cases where the agent's belief is true. The biggest headache for anti-psychologists such as Dancy however is furnished by cases where the agent's belief is false. The fact of Angus' being fired is naturally adduced to explain his punching his boss in cases where he has indeed been fired. But in cases where Angus punches his boss, believing mistakenly that he has been fired, it seems quite wrong to say he so acts because he has been fired. In such a case we surely must retreat to a psychologised explanation if we are to have a credible motivating reason explanation at all.

Dancy recognizes this problem and suggests (2000, 131–133) that it impresses us only because we are tempted to think of all sentences of the form:

The reason why it is the case that p is that q.

as factive, i.e., as entailing both p and q. Such explanatory claims, he concedes, often are factive.

Caesar died because Brutus plotted his death.

can be true only if Caesar did indeed die and Brutus did indeed plot. But in contexts where we are concerned with motivating reasons, he urges, such sentences, sentences like:

His reason for doing it was that it would increase his pension.

are not factive, as is illustrated by the ready intelligibility of:

His reason for doing it was that it would increase his pension but in fact he was quite wrong about that.

This claim would be contested however by those like Smith who take the explanatory relation between motivating reasons and actions to be a causal one, for as Dancy acknowledges (2000, 161), explanations that are non-factive cannot be causal. He's happy enough with this, rejecting as he does a causal understanding of explanation in terms of motivating reasons (2000, 161–163). But for those less happy, accepting his rejection of psychologism is liable to carry costs. (For a recent defence of causalism about motivating reasons with copious references to relevant literature see Mele 2003, esp. chapter 2.)

We may be left unsatisfied, finding it metaphysically obscure how invoking a putative fact that does not obtain can do explanatory work. Here Dancy suggests, drawing on A.R. White (1972), that we may think of the reference to what the agent believes, where his belief is false, as what he calls an intentional-accusative. Compare the suspicion that p. When Holmes suspects that Black did it and Black has in fact done no such thing, it nonetheless makes sense to speak of the thing that Holmes suspects, of what Holmes suspects, and in so speaking we are neither speaking of some feature of Holmes's psychology nor picking out some spooky and bizarre entity among the constituents of the world (Dancy 2000, 147–8).

The most promising line of resistance to Dancy's case against psychologism is perhaps one that queries his insistence on the fact that, for a normative reason to be my reason for acting, it must be thought of as strictly identical to my motivating reason. It is decidedly unclear, for all Dancy and others say, why we need insist on identity here as opposed to forms of intimacy that fall short of it. Thus if the building being on fire is a good normative reason to flee, I can surely be represented as fleeing for that reason in virtue of my motivating reasons comprising, inter alia perhaps, a belief that the building is on fire. The motivating reason here is not identical to the normative reason but, because it is or includes a representation of it, it surely makes plenty good sense to describe me as acting for that reason. The rationality of an agent in sound normative shape is then a matter of his motivating reasons conforming to and reflecting the good normative reasons available to him. That is an intimacy that falls short of identity but is surely, nonetheless, an intimacy adequate to render fully credible our representation of the agent as, precisely, rational.


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action | cognitivism vs. non-cognitivism, moral | Davidson, Donald | Kant, Immanuel: moral philosophy | motivation: moral | naturalism: moral | non-naturalism, moral | practical reason | practical reason: and the structure of actions | reasons for action: agent-neutral vs. agent-relative | reasons for action: internal vs. external | weakness of will | Williams, Bernard