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Adolf Reinach

First published Sun Sep 21, 2008

Adolf Reinach was a leading representative of the so-called realist tradition within phenomenology who has been described as Husserl's “first real co-worker in the development of the phenomenological movement” (Willard 1969, p. 194). Although his life was tragically cut short, and his corpus of writings modest in size, Reinach's essays on general ontology, on the philosophy of law and on the philosophy of language, are remarkably clear and original examples of the phenomenological approach to philosophizing. His principal distinction lies in his 1913 monograph “On the A Priori Foundations of the Civil Law”, whose analysis of the act of promising anticipates several crucial aspects of the speech act theories of Austin and Searle.

1. Life and Works

Adolf Reinach was born into a prominent Jewish family in Mainz, Germany in 1883. He began his university studies in Munich in 1901, where he studied law, psychology and philosophy. In 1905 he completed his doctorate under the direction of Theodor Lipps with a dissertation entitled, “On the Concept of Causality in the Criminal Code.” During this time, Reinach joined a circle of philosophers who had studied Husserl's recently published Logical Investigations (1900–01), a circle which included Johannes Daubert, Alexander Pfänder, Theodor Conrad, and Moritz Geiger. In 1909 Reinach moved to Göttingen, where he completed his Habilitation under Husserl's sponsorship.

Shortly after the declaration of war in 1914 Reinach enlisted in the German army. While some letters and philosophical sketches from the war years have survived, Reinach never published another manuscript or directed another seminar. He died in battle in Flanders in 1917, shortly after becoming baptized into the Protestant Church.

The historian of phenomenology Herbert Spiegelberg writes:

Independently of each other, the Göttingen students of phenomenology like Wilhelm Schapp, Dietrich von Hildebrand, Alexander Koyré and Edith Stein, in their accounts of this period, refer to Reinach, not to Husserl, as their real teacher in phenomenology. Hedwig Conrad-Martius even goes so far as to call him the phenomenologist par excellence … It was his death in action in 1917 rather than Husserl's going to Freiberg which cut short not only his own promise but that of the Göttingen phenomenological circle. (1984, pp. 191–192)

The influence of Reinach did however continue to make itself felt above all in Poland through the work of Roman Ingarden and to some degree also of Karol Wojtyła (Pope John Paul II).

2. Reinach's Realist Phenomenology

Like the other realist phenomenologists, Reinach saw himself as developing a distinctive approach to philosophy, inspired by Husserl's Logical Investigations, with the goal of being faithful to what is given in different kinds of experience (e.g., linguistic, religious, moral, or aesthetic experience).

For realist phenomenologists, the distinction between a priori and a posteriori knowledge has to do with the kind of object studied and not (as for the later Husserl) with any special epistemological technique such as that of epoché or transcendental reduction. Reinach credited the possibility of a priori knowledge to certain special features (necessity, universality, timelessness, intelligibility) of the corresponding objects of knowledge (which are in Reinach's eyes certain kinds of states of affairs and associated essences or natures). Thus, Reinach writes

We can surely take it as generally granted that there are no self-evident and necessary relations of essence in the causal relations of external events. However it is, to speak with Hume, that we come to know that fire produces smoke, this is surely not intelligibly grounded in the essence of fire, as it lies in the essence of the number 3 to be larger than the number 2. (1913, p. 15, emphasis added)

Reinach saw these special features of certain essences—such as numbers, promising, and asserting—as straightforward features of reality, thereby insisting that calling something a priori “does not mean anything dark or mystical” (1913, p. 5). His realist understanding of material and synthetic a priori knowledge of essences is further elucidated in the next two sections.

According to Reinach, material a priori states of affairs and essences exist independently of the contingent minds that may apprehend them and of the individual objects that may instantiate them. Such instantiation will however bring in its wake a series of concrete associations with other entities. Thus in writing about the legal entities (such as rights and obligations) that are grounded in the essence of promising, Reinach notes that when such legal entities exist, they become “intimately interwoven with the rest of the natural world, with all the experiencing of persons who perform acts, with their feelings and wishes, their desires and intentions, their expectations and fears, etc.” (1913, p. 130)

Reinach's insistence that the objects of a priori knowledge can be considered apart from any realization in the world led to Husserl's later accusation that Reinach embraced a Platonism that “distorted the true picture of phenomenology” (Spiegelberg, p. 192). Yet Reinach explicitly rejected any notion of essences of the sort that would generate any form of third man argument. In his article, “The Supreme Rules of Rational Inference According to Kant” (1911a), he observes that judgments such as “the triangle has three sides” or “the lion has a tail” have often been said to refer to general concepts such as “triangle” or “lion.” But this leads not only to odd ideas (e.g., that a concept has a tail) but also, as Berkeley noted, to impossible ideas (such as a triangle that is at once right-angled, equilateral, and obtuse). Reinach notes that the ontological mistake lies in assuming that essences are substances or really existing particulars; the logical mistake is assuming that judgments about “the triangle” or “the lion” refer to concepts at all. Rather, the judgment that “the triangle has three sides” is more precisely expressed as having the general form “everything that is a triangle has three sides.” It is this general state of affairs that is the specific object of our a priori knowledge.

3. Investigations into the Material A priori

Reinach notes in his Marburg lecture (1914) that, while many philosophers had acknowledged the existence of a priori truths, most had restricted the a priori to a very narrow sphere, confining it either to the formal a priori (Hume) or to the a priori of Newtonian physics (Kant). For Reinach, in contrast, there are material a priori structures in every domain of reality. If we know that only a free agent can be responsible, then this is because we understand the necessary and timeless natures of freedom and responsibility. In “Concerning Phenomenology” Reinach states that “the realm of the a priori is incalculably large … [and this] opens up for investigation an area so large and rich that still today we cannot see its boundaries” (1914, pp. 215–216). In defending the existence of material a priori truths (also called ‘essential laws’), Reinach and his colleagues thus believed that they had established a new kind of research agenda for philosophy. And while in many respects this is an agenda which combats reductionism, its proponents have at the same time provided us with several examples in which careful analysis of essences in the spirit of this agenda precisely refutes the existence of certain supposed entities.

3.1 Ordinal Numbers Do Not Exist

“Concerning Phenomenology” stands out not least in that it is one of the earliest attempts by a German philosopher to come to grips with Frege's work. Reinach observes that, while the division of numbers into two sorts, the ordinal and the cardinal, is generally accepted, it is widely debated which kind of number is more primitive or basic. Reinach attempts to resolve this debate, and in the process provides an account of number predications, such as “The Kaiser's coach is drawn by four horses,” of a sort treated also by Frege. He begins by noting that cardinal numbers are properly speaking not predicated of things. Frege, for example, argued that in statements such as “The Kaiser's coach is drawn by four horses” the number four is predicated of a concept, namely, horse that draws the Kaiser's coach. However, Reinach finds it to be self-evident that “a concept which subsumes four objects is just as little four as a concept which subsumes material objects is, therefore, itself material” (p. 206). Neither numbers nor categorical elements such as “some” or “all” are properties, by this argument, and accordingly they are not really predicated of things. Numbers rather give the range of objects that fall within the scope of a predication. Put another way, numbers do not answer the question “how many” but rather “how many As are B?”

Reinach finds that so-called ordinal numbers are nothing but a shorthand way of referring to the (cardinal) number of terms a certain series contains up to some given term. In any given series, we have a first term, a last term, and any number of terms in between. Naturally, we may wish to denote the position of a term within an ordered series. Yet this can quickly become very cumbersome. As Reinach notes, if we use letters to denote an ordered series of four terms—a, b, c, and d—then already “c” would be called “the term following the term following the opening term.” It is much easier simply to adopt a numerical convention according to which “c” is named in reflection of the fact that it is the term up to which the series contains three terms. Yet in no way does such designation constitute a new sort of number; in saying the series ‘contains three members up to this point’, we are still making use of the cardinal number three. Reinach writes that there is

no peculiarity of series terms as such, nothing numerical—which might be grasped by us. The elements have their positions in the series, and these positions can be defined by the successor's relation to the opening term. Nothing is said of number. … there are no ordinal numbers. Philosophy has possibly been flustered here because it blindly followed the sign-makings of the mathematicians, and thereby took words for facts. (p. 208)

Reinach's view of ordinal numbers may seem radical. However, it is not only internally consistent with his philosophy of ideal objects and predication, but it seems consistent also with ordinary language. As Reinach observes, the way that we designate the position of elements in a series does not always use numerical names:

the first is not the onest [einste]. … Also, the term following the first need not be designated with the aid of a number. We, indeed, say “zweite,” but the Latin says “secundus.” So not all ordinal designations are ordinal number-designations.

3.2 The Category Mistake Behind the Concept of Negative Properties

Throughout his writings, Reinach makes extensive use of the category of states of affairs (Sachverhalte). For example, he maintains that a priori knowledge is first and foremost knowledge of specific states of affairs (e.g., the being equal of 2+2 and 4) rather than of propositions or things. States of affairs may be most accurately described as states of being. This is because it is the being (the copula) in a state of affairs that typically bears the special (for example modal) properties attributed to that state of affairs. For example, in the being equal of 2+2 and 4 it is the being equal that is necessary, just as in the being red of the house it is the being red that is contingent. Similarly, when we assert “that house is not red” we are asserting a state of affairs we have apprehended, namely, the not being red of the house. In this case, the negativity pertains to the copula of the state of affairs, that is, the not being red of the house, rather than the being not-red of the house. There are no negative properties, for Reinach. That is to say, negative properties have no existence, and those philosophers who have posited their existence have been misled by language, which frequently says things are, e.g., not red.

Reinach claims that numerous properties that are standardly viewed by philosophers as properties of objects are most properly conceived as properties of states of affairs.

Many of Reinach's fellow realist phenomenologist came to embrace the idea that either all states of affairs (Lipps 1928; Pfänder 1921) or at least negative states of affairs (Ingarden 1964–65) exist only as intentional objects. Reinach, however, embraced a realist position towards both positive and negative states of affairs. The kind of being Reinach attributed to states of affairs was that of “obtaining” (Bestehen); they do not really “exist” as do things, but neither are they simply mental or intentional objects. Reinach believed that negative states of affairs obtain precisely as do positive states of affairs; otherwise, he did not see how we could defend objective knowledge of the most basic laws of ontology and logic (specifically, the principle of contradiction and the law of the excluded middle). On the other hand he did not believe that every positive or negative sentence corresponds to some state of affairs which obtains; this applies only to those sentences which are true, and thus only to one member of any given positive and negative pair of putative states of affairs.

3.3 How the Law Misinterprets the Moral Significance of Deliberation

In his essay, “Deliberation: Its Ethical and Legal Significance” (1912/1913), Reinach observes that there are contradictions in how we evaluate the moral significance of deliberation. For example, we consider a crime more reprehensible if it is performed after deliberation, yet we also judge harshly one who performs a crime without a second thought. Reinach noted that in the German law in his day killing without deliberation could mean as little as six months in prison where killing after deliberation would mean certain capital punishment.

Reinach distinguishes between intellectual and volitional deliberation. The former aims at apprehending what is the case, the latter at apprehending what should be done. For example, upon arriving in a concentration camp, an inmate might intellectually deliberate about the odds of successfully escaping. He might decide the odds are low (say 1 in 20) yet still volitionally deliberate about whether he ought to attempt to escape. Of the two, volitional deliberation is psychologically the more complex. Intellectual deliberation tends to culminate in conviction once we apprehend what is the case. In contrast, volitional deliberation has no “automatic” conclusion because the value of an act is subject to modification when it is connected to the real world of consequences. An act that appears highly noble in itself may have such negative consequences that the value of actually undertaking it is modified to a disvalue. For example, while escaping from a concentration camp may be good in itself, it may be a disvalue if escapes are punished through increased torture and killing of remaining inmates. Moreover, even after one rightly discerns the value of an action per se and the value of undertaking a proposed action, experience shows that value perception does not compel either the will or the heart to provide a fitting response. That is, one might decide that escaping is wrong—all things considered—yet still attempt an escape to save one's own life or sanity.

These facts about deliberation help us to recognize shortcomings in the significance that the law attaches to deliberation. Reinach claims that our belief that a crime is made worse by deliberation rests on the assumption that when an individual undertakes a project that is disvaluable (say killing), the moral situation is worsened by knowledge of the relevant disvalue. That is to say, individuals are less culpable when they act in ignorance of the disvalue of their crime. Reinach finds that deliberation is actually playing a symbolic role when its significance is interpreted in this fashion: it is taken to signify that the individual had in fact apprehended the disvalue of an act prior to choosing to perform it. However, the connection between deliberation and the perception of a disvalue is not a necessary connection: one may apprehend a disvalue without deliberation, and one may deliberate and still fail to apprehend a disvalue. Thus, the law is in no position to determine the precise significance of deliberation in an a priori fashion.

In fact, Reinach argues that the common-sense assumption that a reprehensible deed is actually worse when done without a second thought—an assumption that contradicts the prevailing wisdom of criminal law—more properly reflects the direct moral significance of deliberation. It is good for people to consider what they do. Failure to deliberate about a crime implies either a fundamental disregard for or an insensitivity to values—and neither seems to reduce the culpability of a criminal act. Thus, Reinach concludes that the law is mistaken in attaching more severe punishment to deliberate than to non-deliberate crimes.

3.4 Claims and Obligations

Reinach's major work, “The A priori Foundations of the Civil Law” (1913) begins with the following claim:

Insofar as philosophy is ontology or the a priori theory of objects, it has to do with the analysis of all possible kinds of objects as such. We shall see that philosophy here comes across objects of quite a new kind, objects which do not belong to nature in the proper sense, which are neither physical nor psychical and which are at the same time different from all ideal objects in virtue of their temporality. (p. 6)

Reinach here refers specifically to claims and obligations. He asserts that they exist just as much as do trees and houses. Clearly, they are not physical entities, but neither are they mental. They do indeed presuppose a person as their “bearer”—that is, real claims and obligations always belong to someone. In addition, psychological properties may correspond to claims and obligations; for example, one may feel entitled or feel obligated. However, if I accept a car loan and contractually agree to pay back the loan over a 36-month period, my obligation does not cease to exist even if such feelings fade away and even if I forget about the obligation completely. The very fact that a claim or obligation may last for years without change speaks against any alleged reduction to something psychological, for there is nothing in the psychological (or indeed in the physical) domain that remains static over time.

4. Reinach's Theory of Social Acts

In the Logical Investigations, Husserl developed a thesis advanced by his teacher Brentano to the effect that all mental acts are intentional, that is, that they are directed towards an object. Husserl maintained that all intentional experiences are in this sense ‘objectifying acts’.

Husserl's account of meaning builds upon this theory. All uses of language are, he says, referential. Accordingly, Husserl viewed acts such as questions or commands as masked assertions. The command “sit down on the chair” he interpreted as a statement to the effect that “your sitting down on the chair is my current request.”

It was in critical reaction to such theses that Reinach developed his theory of social acts (Smith 1990), a theory which bears striking similarities to the theory of speech acts later developed by Austin and Searle.

Both promising and communicating one's intention to do something, according to Reinach, belong to the category of what he calls “spontaneous” acts, i.e. acts which involve a subject's bringing something about within his own psychic sphere, as contrasted with passive experiences of, say, feeling a pain or hearing an explosion (1913, p. 706, Eng. p. 18). Certain types of spontaneous act are such as to require as a matter of necessity a linguistic utterance or some other overt performance of a non-natural and rule-governed sort. This does not hold of judging or deciding, nor even of forgiving, but it does hold of apologizing, commanding, or accusing. We may accordingly divide spontaneous acts into two classes, which we might call internal and external, according to whether the act's being brought to overt expression is a separable or an inseparable moment of the relevant complex whole.

Acts are divided further into self-directable and non-self-directable. Self-directable acts are such that the subject toward whom they are directed may be identical with the subject of the act (as in cases of self-pity, self-hatred, etc.). Non-self-directable acts, on the other hand, such as forgiving or praying, demand an alien subject. A peculiarity of certain external and non-self-directable acts is that the relevant utterance must of necessity be not only directed toward a certain subject but also registered or grasped by this subject in a further act: a command must be received and understood by those to whom it is addressed (something which does not apply, for example, to an act of blessing or cursing). It is part of the essential structure of a command that it be an action of a subject which is spontaneous, intentional, non-self-directable and in need of being grasped by the subject towards whom it is addressed. The same holds also of requests, admonishments, questionings, informings, answerings, and many other types of act. (Reinach 1913, p. 707, Eng. pp. 19f.) Each social act constitutes an inner unity of deliberate execution and deliberate utterance. The experience is here impossible in the absence of the utterance. And the utterance for its part is not something that is added to the experience as an incidental extra; it stands in the service of the social act and is necessary in order that the latter should fulfill its announcing function.

Reinach mentions many social acts in his treatise on “The A Priori Foundations of the Civil Law” (1913)—commanding, requesting, warning, questioning and answering, informing, enacting, revoking, transferring, granting, and waiving of claims—but he devotes the most attention to the act of promising. Drawing on the theory of essences or intrinsically intelligible structures referred to above, Reinach offers the following examples of a priori truths about what he sees as the intrinsically intelligible structure instantiated through the performance of a promising act:

Reinach maintains that such truths are not merely necessary and universal, but also informative, thus that they are examples of truths that are both a priori and synthetic.

Reinach's views are in this respect opposed to those of Searle (1969), who argued that promising is a social institution that can be explained in terms of so-called constitutive rules analogous to the rules of chess (Zaibert and Smith 2007). Once one stipulates the rules, on this account, then certain necessary truths can be derived. Reinach, in contrast, held that promising is a sui generis phenomenon that is not invented but rather discovered, as is seen in the contrast between promising and those elements of a code of law which truly are constructed, for example specific rules concerning primogeniture or the discharging of liens. Reinach speculates that an individual who orally contracts to rent a piece of property for three years may be surprised to learn that, in German law, this contract is made for an “indefinite length of time.” In contrast, someone who waives a claim will hardly be surprised by the fact that the claim is now extinguished. The latter, in Reinach's terms, flows from the very essence of a claim and of the act of waiving a claim, and in this it contrasts sharply with the non-intuitive arbitrariness of the rules of chess.

Reinach next surveys Hume, who familiarly provides an account of why a promise is binding which rests on the idea that there is a certain sort of sui generis experience which becomes expressed in a promise and which is somehow binding on the subject but which is at the same time analogous to experiences of resolving, wishing, willing in that it can be present also without any accompanying expression. Reinach rejects this account – denying that such an experience could exist – and rejects also a variety of other psychologistic and consequentialistic theories because they are, he claims, seeking an explanation of a phenomenon so basic that it cannot be further elucidated in terms of anything more simple. As he himself expresses it:

Strictly speaking, we are not proposing any theory of promising. For we are only putting forward the simple thesis that promising as such produces claim and obligation. One can try, and we have in fact tried, to bring out the intelligibility of this thesis by analysis and clarification. To try to explain it would be just like trying to explain the proposition, 1 × 1 = 1. It is a fear of what is directly given, a strange reluctance or incapacity to look the ultimate data in the face and to recognize them as such, that has driven unphenomenological philosophies, in this as in so many other more fundamental problems, to untenable and ultimately to extravagant constructions. (1913, p. 46)

In this passage, Reinach summarizes his view not only of promising, but also of phenomenological philosophy itself. The central task of phenomenology is to describe faithfully what is given in experience, preferring knowledge that is immediate and intuitive to that which is known indirectly through deduction or other means.


Works by Reinach

In German:

In English:

References and Further Readings

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

analytic/synthetic distinction | a priori justification and knowledge | Husserl, Edmund | Ingarden, Roman | phenomenology | speech acts | states of affairs