Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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States of Affairs

First published Thu Jul 17, 2003

Like properties and particulars, states of affairs make up an ontological category — a fundamental kind of entity. At least, they seem to be so regarded by those philosophers who deploy this concept in philosophical explanations. Explicit recognition of states of affairs is relatively recent in philosophy. In the guise of facts, states of affairs entered center stage at the beginning of the 20th century in efforts of Bertrand Russell (Russell 1985) and Ludwig Wittgenstein (Wittgenstein 1961) to account for truth as a property of beliefs or sentences. A fact, it might be said, is a state of affairs that is the case or obtains, such as

(1) Gato's weighing ten pounds

The role assigned to facts was made clear at the outset of Russell's The Philosophy of Logical Atomism:

The first truism to which I wish to draw your that the world contains facts, which are what they are whatever we may choose to think about them, and that there are also beliefs, which have reference to facts, and by reference to facts are either true or false....If I say ‘It is raining’, what I say is true in a certain condition of weather and is false in other conditions. The condition of weather that makes my statement true (or false as the case may be), is what I should call a ‘fact.’ (Russell 1985, p. 40)

The entities that may have the properties of truth or falsity are called truth-bearers. The entities that account for a truth-bearer being true are called truth-makers. If states of affairs are the truth-makers, then presumably it is the obtaining of (1) that accounts for (2) being true, if it is.

(2) Gato weighs ten pounds.

States of affairs are also called "situations," "circumstances," or "occasions." The example of (1) illustrates that the standard way of forming an ostensible name of a state of affairs is to convert a sentence to its corresponding gerundive nominal. (Not all gerundive nominals exhibit the canonical form for designating states of affairs, however; this is discussed below in Section 9.1.)

The relationship between (1) and (2) in virtue of which (1) makes (2) true is sometimes called correspondence. The hypothesis that truth-bearers are made true by states of affairs that obtain is a version of the "correspondence theory of truth." (See the entry on the correspondence theory of truth.)

A philosophical dispute lurks beneath the terminological distinction between "fact" and "state of affairs." Perhaps Gato could have weighed less. Is there, then, in addition to the fact (1), an unrealized possibility, Gato's now weighing eight pounds? Are there states of affairs that are not the case?

How could a theory about states of affairs be defended or justified? Historically philosophers have often developed metaphysical views in an apriori manner, by deduction from first principles. This method has come under fire from a variety of directions in recent times. Another approach is to look at philosophical theories as a kind of explanation. States of affairs are typically introduced as part of an account or explanation of something of philosophical interest, such as truth or causality or possibility.

The justification for thinking there are states of affairs could thus be regarded as abductive, that is, as a kind of inference to the best explanation. This kind of inference can be evaluated along a number of dimensions — Is the data real or bogus? Is this the simplest hypothesis to account for the data? Does this hypothesis contribute to the most coherent overall view or does it clash with other things we accept? Opponents of states of affairs may argue that the data that are being explained by positing states of affairs are either bogus or could be explained more simply without positing states of affairs. In what follows I will discuss the following topics:

1. Properties and States of Affairs

Suppose that you are looking at a room full of computer equipment. You particularly notice a large number of green LEDs glowing in the computer racks. Let us suppose we name two of these LEDs "Fred" and "Jack." Then we would be saying something true if we said:

(3) Fred is on.
(4) Jack is on.

We may suppose that Jack and Fred are glowing at the same intensity, and exhibit the same exact shade of green. When we use the predicate "is on" in (3), we seem to be attributing a feature to Fred.

But, if so, what is the relationship between this feature and the state of affairs Fred's being on? Is the property a constituent or part of that state of affairs?

These questions suggest that the view that a philosopher holds about properties is likely to have an impact on how she thinks about states of affairs.

In (4) we use the same predicate "is on" to attribute a feature to Jack in (4). How do we account for the fact we use the same predicate in the two situations? Perhaps because emitting light is a phenomenon that it serves our purposes to have a word for, to coordinate behavior in regard to circumstances in which this feature occurs. Jill may say to one of her fellow system operators,

(5) If a red LED on a circuit board goes on, reset the board.

The statement (5) seems to presuppose there is a property that any of the red LEDs might have. From this way of looking at things, we might say that it is this same property that is predicated in both (3) and (4) of distinct LEDs. This assumes that the property of being on is one and the same entity in a variety of cases. A shareable entity of this sort is called a universal by philosophers. If we assume that properties are universals, we can account for the use of the same predicate in (3) and (4) by supposing that there is a single feature that is predicated in each case.

But this is not the only way of looking at this. Perhaps there is no single property that is predicated of Fred in (3) and of Jack in (4). It could be said that with (3) and (4) what are being reported are distinct cases, distinct properties, that are exactly similar. On this view, it is due to their exact similarity that we use the same predicate.

On this view, the glowing of Fred is a unique entity that characterizes Fred. It is a property, and is what is reported in (3), but it is distinct from any property of Jack. There is an exactly similar entity, a glowing of Jack, which is reported by (4). Nowadays entities of this sort are often called tropes. Other names that have been used are "cases," "abstract particulars," or "particularized properties." The view that properties are tropes, not universals, has a very ancient lineage. Something like this was probably Aristotle's view. Tropes were called "accidents" in the medieval Aristotelian philosophy. In early modern philosophy, tropes were sometimes called "modes." Tropes went under the name "moments" in the philosophy of Husserl and European phenomenology (Smith, Mulligan, and Simons 1984). (See the entry on tropes.)

In the late 19th century, philosophers such as C. S. Peirce and Bertrand Russell became dissatisfied with the treatment of relations in the Aristotelian logic and philosophy. It seemed to them that taking relations seriously meant recognizing their existence as universals that can hold between a number of entities. If Rene's house is three miles from the Russ Building, in which particular does this instance of being three miles from inhere? This seemed a difficulty for the trope theory.

But if we take properties to be universals, then it seems that we are forced to recognize states of affairs. The property of glowing, if it is a universal, could exist even if both Fred and Jack were dark. Other LEDs might be glowing but not Fred or Jack. The mere existence of the universal cannot account for the truth of (3) and (4). Presumably (3) is true only because Fred exhibits that universal. (3) is true only when that particular connection between particular and universal obtains. But Fred's exhibiting that universal is Fred's being on, which is a state of affairs. On the other hand, if Fred's glowing is a trope, the mere existence of that trope could be taken as sufficient to account for the truth of (3). That is, tropes can be taken to be truth-makers. As discussed below (Section 9.2), tropes can also provide an account of what concrete, unrepeatable events are — a view that competes with views that identify concrete events as states of affairs (see Section 9).

There is thus a certain competition between tropes and states of affairs in philosophical explanations. This suggests an hypothesis that may explain why states of affairs were not introduced into philosophical discussion until the late 19th century. The widespread acceptance of tropes in earlier centuries may have inhibited philosophers from recognizing or accepting states of affairs as a distinct ontological category.

To have a complete theory of states of affairs there are a number of metaphysical issues or questions that the theorist needs to navigate. The sections that follow examine some of these major questions about states of affairs.

2. Are Concrete Particulars Constituents of States of Affairs?

This question separates two paradigmatic ways of conceiving of states of affairs:

Let us look at the concrete compositionalist view first. (Situational abstractionism will be examined in Section 7.) Presumably concrete particulars are such things as you and I, palm trees, a chunk of copper wire, cats, electrons, the kitchen sink, and so on. Concrete particulars differ from abstract entities such as numbers or properties. How so? Perhaps the concreteness of particulars is related to their ability to have a causal impact, an impact on the history of the cosmos. Philosophers have proposed a variety of criteria for what counts as an abstract entity; see the entry on abstract objects.

Suppose that Luisa points to the red power-on LED on her computer and says

(6) This LED is emitting light.

Presumably it is the LED's having a certain feature that makes (6) true. Perhaps, then, the LED's having that feature is what (7) consists in.

(7) this LED's emitting light

This suggests a certain picture of what a state of affairs like (7) is. The idea is that a particular LED and the feature of emitting light make up (7); they are constituents or components of that state of affairs. This suggests what we may call the "thesis of concrete compositionality":

(CC) (a) If a is any concrete particular and F is a property a has, then A and F are constituents of the state of affairs consisting in a having F; and
(b) If an n-place relation R holds among concrete particulars, then and R are all constituents of the state of affairs consisting in R's holding among those relata.

Let us say that a states of affairs is basic if it is a state of affairs of the form a's-having-F, where F is a one-place property, or of the form R's holding among, where R is an n-place relation.

On a compositionalist view, then, each basic state of affairs has a property or relation that is constitutive of it.

A compositionalist is also likely to say that (7) could not have existed if that LED had not existed. (7) is just a connecting by exemplification of that LED to a certain feature. This suggests a hypothesis that G.W. Fitch (Fitch 1994) calls the "constitution principle":

(CP) If a is a constituent of S, then S exists only if a exists.

We can take (CC) and (CP) to encapsulate the concrete compositionalist view. (The idea that a state of affairs such as (7) consists in a connection between the LED and a property emitting light has been criticized as leading to an infinite regress; the argument is often called "Bradley's regress." This criticism is discussed in the supplementary document Bradley's Regress.)

Concrete particulars are usually regarded by philosophers as having contingent existence. That is, it is usually thought that in most (perhaps all) cases, if X is a concrete particular, then it is possible that X should have failed to exist, even if in fact X does exist. But if (CP) is true, a state of affairs that has contingently existing concrete particulars as constituents, such as (7), will also exist contingently. Alvin Plantinga has an argument against the thesis that states of affairs depend ontologically on contingently existing concrete particulars. Plantinga's argument will be discussed below in Section 7.2.

The debate about the ontological dependence of states of affairs on constituents has mostly focused on particulars. But what if properties exist contingently? According to some philosophers, properties exist only if they are exhibited by something. But if properties exist contingently, this will also entail that states of affairs in which they are constituents exist contingently, if (CP) is true.

The discussion of compositionality thus far takes for granted the idea that ordinary things such as cats can be constituents of states of affairs. An unexamined question lies behind this assumption: What are ordinary particulars such as cats? Some philosophers (for example, Armstrong 1997) take the view that ordinary things are themselves states of affairs or aggregations of states of affairs. For example, a philosopher who holds this view might take an ordinary object to be a series of occupations of spacetime regions or other basic states of affairs involving fundamental physical entities.

3. Are There States of Affairs that Do Not Obtain?

This question is closely tied to another question, Are there concrete particulars that do not exist? In 1903 Bertrand Russell wrote the following:

Being is that which belongs to every conceivable term, to every possible object of thought...."A is not" must always be either false or meaningless. For if A were nothing, it could not be said not to be. (Russell 1967, p. 449)

This view that there are things that might have existed or would have existed had things been otherwise, but which fail to ever actually exist, is called possibilism. This viewpoint requires that we interpret the "particular" quantifier "some" or "there is" in such a way that existence is not packed into it. Otherwise, the statement (8)

(8) There is an entity that could exist but never does exist.

would be interpreted in a way that makes it self-contradictory:

(8′) There exists an entity that could exist but never does exist.

By the time Russell wrote The Philosophy of Logical Atomism his "sense of reality" had led him to reject the possibilist view. He came to hold that anything that is, that has any properties, exists. We might call this the "principle of actualism":

(PA) If an item a has any properties, then a exists.

And it might seem that Russell's rejection of possible but non-actual states of affairs is simply a consequence of (PA). But this is not so clear. A philosopher might hold that

(9) Gato's weighing eight pounds

is made up entirely of the furniture of the actual world — Gato exists and so does the property of weighing eight pounds. (9) exists, a philosopher might say; it just happens not to be the case because, in fact, Gato weighs ten pounds. A philosopher who holds this view thus accepts (PA), but insists that the property of obtaining or being the case is distinct from existence.

Borrowing terminology from Robert Adams (Adams 1979), we may say that a philosopher is a hard actualist if she holds that facts — the obtaining states of affairs — are the only states of affairs there are. A philosopher is a soft actualist if she holds that there are both obtaining and non-obtaining states of affairs but the non-obtaining states of affairs are made up entirely out of entities that actually exist. Among contemporary philosophers, Plantinga (Plantinga 1974), John Pollock (Pollock 1984) and Gustav Bergmann (Bergmann 1964) are examples of soft actualists; D. M. Armstrong (Armstrong 1997) and Ruth Millikan (Millikan 1984) are hard actualists. See the entry on actualism.

3.1 Naturalist Concerns

Possibilism bangs up against the preference that many contemporary philosophers have for naturalistic accounts. Naturalism embraces a series of concerns that operate as a kind of constraint on an acceptable theory.

A philosopher with naturalist sympathies may be reluctant to posit entities that would be causally inert; they would have no impact on anything. If an entity cannot affect the course of events, how could we learn anything about it? How could it interact with our physical organism?

If a soft actualist is a concrete compositionalist, she might note that her basic non-obtaining states of affairs are composed of entities the naturalist should feel comfortable with — concrete particulars and their features and relations. But this may not shield soft actualism from naturalist objections. Such a view requires states of affairs that do not obtain. States of affairs that actually do obtain, a naturalist might say, enter into causal or explanatory links with other states of affairs. They are part of the causal web of the world. But how could a state of affairs that never obtains have any causal link to anything? Again, the objection is that such an entity appears to be causally inert. How could we acquire knowledge of it then?

Another naturalist objection might be directed against situational abstractionism, apart from its commitment to non-obtaining states of affairs. Abstractionism thinks of states of affairs as necessarily existing abstract entities that exist outside the spatiotemporal order. Such entities would seem to be causally inert, some philosophers will say. If so, how could we perceive or be affected by such entities? How could our brains be linked to them?

3.2 Explanatory Value

Balanced against the naturalist concerns described in the previous section are the theoretical value that many philosophers see in accepting non-obtaining states of affairs. As an example, a philosopher might posit possible but non-obtaining states of affairs as part of an account of the semantics of fragments of English. Consider the following inference:

(A1) If Alfred goes to the party, he will enjoy himself.

(A2) If Alfred and Betty go to the party, Alfred will enjoy himself.

(A2) follows from (A1) in classical first-order logic; it is an instance of an inference pattern called "antecedent strengthening." The problem here is that (A1)-(A2) appears to be an invalid inference.

Maybe Betty's outspokenness and insensitivity and her attitude towards Alfred would guarantee that Alfred would be miserable if they both went. Yet in the situation where (A1) is used, it may be that Betty does not know the person putting on this party; she runs in a different crowd. The odds of her showing up are low. Hence, (A1) is true in the situation where it was used. But (A2) might still be false due to Betty's proclivities and Alfred's sensitivities. But if (A1) could be true while (A2) would be false, the inference of (A2) from (A1) is invalid.

A possible diagnosis of this inference might go something like the following. In the situation where (A1) is used, there is a range of possible states of affairs that are envisioned where the antecedent of (A1) would be true. Call this set S. William Lycan calls S "the real and relevant possibilities" to the user of (A1) (Lycan 1993). We might then suggest the following truth-condition for the conditional (A1):

(C) If the consequent of (A1) is true in all of the possible states of affairs in S where the antecedent is, then (A1) is true; false otherwise.

And the actual course of events need not be one of the possible states of affairs in S. (A1) could be true even if Alfred does not in fact go to the party. But in those states of affairs envisioned when (A1) is used, where the antecedent would be true (the states of affairs in S), none of them are states of affairs that include Betty going to the party. The use of (A2), on the other hand, refers to a different set of possible states of affairs, say R, where Betty does go to the party. Since it is not the case that Alfred enjoys himself in all such situations, the conditional (A2) is false. So this diagnosis of (A1)-(A2) suggests that the problem is an equivocation. If we evaluate (A1) with respect to R, it would be falsified along with (A2). R includes a state of affairs, Betty's going to the party, that would undercut the assumption behind (A1).

This way of solving the problem of seemingly validating an invalid inference involves a semantics for the conditionals that embraces possible but non-obtaining states of affairs, as in (C). Some philosophers will argue that the explanatory value of positing non-obtaining states of affairs in such applications in semantic theory warrants their ontological acceptance (Lycan 1979, Pollock 1984, Barwise 1989).

3.3 The Combination Argument

Why did Russell become a hard actualist? Various passages in the writings of Russell (Russell 1971, pp. 109-110) and G.E. Moore suggest an argument against the existence of non-obtaining states of affairs, based on the compositional conception of states of affairs. This argument is discussed in the supplementary document The Combination Argument.

4. Are There Non-basic States of Affairs?

Basic states of affairs, discussed in Section 2, consist in a thing having a one-place property, or an n-place relation holding among n entities. (If there are relations that hold among infinitely many relata, such infinitely complex states of affairs would be basic also.) Are there states of affairs that are not basic? Is there a disjunctive state of affairs corresponding to (10)?

(10) The lights are on or the power is off.

If so, this would presumably have the lights' being on and the power's being off as constituents. Disjunctive, conditional, conjunctive, and negative states of affairs might be called molecular state of affairs. But are there molecular states of affairs? Do the logical words "or", "and", "if", "not", "some", and "all" stand for structural elements of reality? Or is this an unwarranted reification? Is there a universal state of affairs All raccoons having intestines that corresponds to (11)?

(11) All raccoons have intestines.

Existential and universal states of affairs would be non-basic states of affairs, if there are such states of affairs.

4.1 Logical Atomism

Some philosophers find it implausible to suppose that there are disjunctive, conditional, negative, or general facts in reality. Dispensing with such "funny" facts was a motivation behind the philosophical program known as Logical Atomism. Wittgenstein (Wittgenstein 1961) suggested that logical words such as "all", "some", "if", and "or" do not stand for anything in reality and thus cannot link entities into more complex states of affairs. An atomic state of affairs is a basic state of affairs whose constituents are all simple (that is, lacking in constituents). Logical Atomists like Armstrong (Armstrong 1997) and the Wittgenstein of the Tractatus Logico-philosophicus tend to embrace a principle of independence:

(PI) There are no necessary connections between atomic states of affairs, that is, each atomic state of affairs is logically independent of any other.

(PI) seems to be grounded in the Leibnizian thesis that all simple universals are logically compatible.

To provide an account of truth without logically complex states of affairs, Logical Atomism relies on a recursive account of truth (Pendlebury 1986). For basic sentences of the forms


the truth-makers are the basic states of affairs. Thus a basic sentence of the form "Fa" is true if X's-having-P obtains, where "a" stands for X and "F" stands for P. A basic sentence of the form "" is true if M's-holding-between-x1...xn obtains, where "R" stands for M and "a1" stands for x1, and so on, and "an" standing for xn.

Given this initial clause in the statement of truth-conditions, truth-conditions can then be defined for the truth-functional connectives: "P or Q" is true if P is true or Q is true. "P and Q" is true if P is true and Q is true. "It is not the case that P" is true if P is not true.

Logical Atomism in a pure form would imply that atomic states of affairs are the only states of affairs there are. Except perhaps for the exemplification connection in basic states of affairs, there would be no logical connectivity in reality. In practice few Logical Atomists were able to entirely avoid non-basic states of affairs. Although Armstrong rejects negative facts, Russell accepted them.

Universal sentences posed another challenge. For Wittgenstein the truth-maker for a universal sentence of the form "All Fs are G" is taken to be a conjunction of basic facts: a1-being-F & a1-being-G & a2-being-F & a2-being-G &…. Russell and Armstrong reject this analysis, however. Armstrong argues that, even if all raccoons are included in the conjunction corresponding to (11),

(11) All raccoons have intestines.

there could have been more. Russell and Armstrong think a kind of totality fact is needed: x1 plus x2 plus … being all the raccoons.

4.2 Objections to Logical Atomism

There are a number of objections to the Logical Atomist program:

Objection: Logical Atomism's purely truth-functional account of conditionals and other molecular sentences appears not to work in all cases. Counterfactuals and even ordinary conditionals such as those in argument (A1)–(A2) (discussed above in Section 3.2) appear to not be truth-functional.

Objection: What is the relationship between atomic sentences and atomic states of affairs? Wittgenstein talked of a sentence being a picture of the fact it represents. But this metaphor has been generally rejected as unsatisfactory. The sentence "Gato has yellow eyes" does not look anything like the chunk of reality that would make it true.

Objection: If (12) is true

(12) Jack believes that a cat is in the basement.

Jack may be mistaken, but how do we account for what he believes? "Believes" appears to stand for a relation. If there are only states of affairs that obtain, as Russell and Armstrong suppose, what is it that Jack is related to in the state of affairs represented by (12)?

4.3 Biosemantics and States of Affairs

Ruth Garrett Millikan has developed a semantic program (Millikan 1984) called biosemantics that supports a form of the correspondence theory of truth. Millikan's approach has hard actualist implications — the theory leaves no role for possible but non-actual states of affairs. In Millikan's theory, the function of the logical words "is" (in the sense of identity), "exists", "some", "all", "if", "not", and "or" is taken to be non-representational, that is, they do not stand for elements in reality. The Logical Atomist goal of not reifying logical structures is carried out in a particularly thorough way in Millikan's semantic program. The biosemantic implications for the metaphysics of states of affairs is discussed in the supplementary document Biosemantics and States of Affairs.

5. How Are States of Affairs Individuated?

What are the conditions of identity for states of affairs? On the compositionalist view, it might seem that having the constituents (13) has — an LED and the property of emitting light — is what it is to be (13).

(13) this LED's emitting light

But this suggestion has a snag. Ralph's love for Julia might be unrequited. In that case, (14) would obtain but (15) would not.

(14) Ralph's loving Julia
(15) Julia's loving Ralph

So (14) and (15) are distinct. Yet it seems that (14) and (15) have the same constituents. Perhaps a compositionalist could get around this objection if she were willing to countenance loving Ralph as an entity. Then (15) might be regarded as having overlapping constituents. If loving Ralph is not recognized as a distinct entity, then it seems that the compositionalist needs a notion of direction or order of constituents to differentiate distinct states of affairs (Armstrong 1997). This suggests the following principle of identity for states of affairs:

(SI) S1 is identical with S2 if and only if S1 and S2 have the same constituents and in the same direction.

Some philosophers (for example, Plantinga 1985) regard the notion of a constituent as "obscure." Without the constituency notion, what are the identity conditions for states of affairs? A proposal endorsed by Pollock (Pollock 1984), Chisholm (Chisholm 1976, p. 118), and Olson (Olson 1987) is the idea that necessarily equivalent states of affairs are identical; this could be formulated as (SI′):

(SI′) S1 is identical with S2 if and only if it is not possible that S1 should obtain with S2 obtaining and it is not possible that S2 should obtain without S1 obtaining.

Philosophers usually think that mathematical subject matter is such that if a mathematical statement is true, it is necessarily true. If so, it seems there would be only one truth-maker for the huge realm of mathematical truths if (SI′) is true. Some philosophers will object that this is too coarse-grained a conception of states of affairs.

6. Are States of Affairs what Possible Worlds Are?

What are the truth-conditions for (16) and (17)?

(16) It is possible that Gato should weigh eight pounds.
(17) It is necessary that all emeralds are green.

The familiar Kripke-style semantics suggest that (16) will be true if and only if there is a possible world at which — or of which — (18) would be true.

(18) Gato weighs eight pounds.

And (17) will be true if and only if (19) is true at, or of, all possible worlds.

(19) All emeralds are green.

But how are we to interpret this talk of "possible worlds"? Some philosophers (for example, Armstrong 1989a) suggest that talk of possible worlds can be regarded as a "mere manner of speaking" or a "convenient fiction." This perspective is called modal fictionalism; this approach is discussed in the entry on modal fictionalism.

Quine suggested that possible worlds could perhaps be modeled as sets of physical particulars and space-time points (see Lycan 1979). These set-theoretic constructs could "represent" alternative possible arrangements of existing things. This approach would be consistent with the kind of nominalism that reduces properties to sets of their instances.

David Lewis offered another alternative for possible worlds talk. Lewis suggested that we view the actual world as a kind of mereological sum of all the physical things that stand in some spatiotemporal relation to us. A possible world thus has a certain kind of maximality property — maximal spatiotemporal inclusion. Possible but non-actual worlds are then treated as possible but non-actual mereological sums of spatiotemporally related things. On Lewis's view, possible states of affairs are reduced to sets of Lewisian possible worlds. The state of affairs that would make "Gato weighs ten pounds" true is identified with the set of possible worlds such that there is something that makes that sentence true "of" or "at" that world.

6.1 A Situational Theory of Possible Worlds

Some philosophers (Plantinga 1974, Pollock 1984) have suggested that possible worlds can be understood as states of affairs of a certain sort — states of affairs that satisfy some condition of inclusiveness or maximality. If so, it seems that accounting for possible worlds — and thus the semantics of the alethic modalities — is another explanatory job for states of affairs.

The world is presumably some sort of all-encompassing reality — perhaps the totality of facts. But that is the actual world. Possible but non-actual worlds are presumably alternative histories of everything, alternative total ways that everything might have turned out. A basic state of affairs like Bill's having pneumonia is presumably not comprehensive enough to be a possible world.

In defining possible worlds, Plantinga makes use of a distinction between transient and non-transient states of affairs. (20) is a state of affairs that can obtain at a certain point in time.

(20) this light's being on

When someone flips the switch to off, or there is a power outage, (20) may fail to obtain. A state of affairs that obtains during certain periods of time but not at other times is a transient state of affairs. States of affairs that always obtain if they obtain at all are non-transient. Nixon's being president in 1970 is a non-transient state of affairs; this state of affairs obtains eternally, if it obtains at all.

On Plantinga's view, states of affairs are not all logically independent of each other. Thus Gato's being yellow-eyed could not obtain unless Gato is alive and has eyes. Plantinga appeals to a concept of inclusion between states of affairs. He defines inclusion as in (I):

(I) S1 includes S2 if and only if it is not possible that S1 should obtain and S2 fail to obtain.

In other words, if the conjunctive state of affairs Gato's being yellow-eyed while Gato fails to be alive is not possible, then Gato's being yellow-eyed includes Gato's being alive. Plantinga also defines a relation of preclusion, as follows:

(P) S1 precludes S2 if and only if it is not possible that both S1 and S2 should obtain.

If it is not possible that Audry should be made entirely of glass and also be a human being, then Audry's being a human being precludes Audry's being made entirely of glass.

For Plantinga a possible world is a possible state of affairs that has a property of maximal consistency. Plantinga defines the relevant maximality condition as follows:

(M) A state of affairs, W, is maximal if and only if for every non-transient state of affairs, S, either W includes S or W precludes S. (Plantinga 1974, p. 45, and Plantinga 1985)

If a state of affairs is possible, could that state of affairs have failed to be possible? In the semantics of modal logic a notion is employed of "relative" possibility. According to this notion, a state of affairs, S, may be possible "relative to" a possible world W1 but not relative to a possible world W2. This means that, had W1 been the case, S would be a possibility. But if W2 had been the case, S would not have been possible; there is no way it could have happened or been realized, given what W2 contains. If we think of possibilities as grounded in what actually exists, it may make sense to think of things this way. Perhaps there are aspects about the cosmos that allow for certain possibilities that would not have been possibilities had the fundamental physical laws of the cosmos been different. If so, then if something is a possibility, it is not necessary that it be a possibility.

The medieval philosopher John Duns Scotus offers an opposite view, as in the following passage:

I prefer to propose conclusions and premises about the possible....Those about the actual are contingent...whereas those about the possible are necessary. (Scotus 1966, p. 42)

Plantinga accepts a strong form of Scotus's principle:

(SP) If a state of affairs S is possible, then S is necessarily possible, that is, possible with respect to every possible world. (Plantinga 1974 p. 54)

(SP) is characteristic of the modal logic system S5. A corollary of (SP) is that the modal status of any state of affairs will be the same with respect to every possible world. Since every state of affairs has its modal status in every possible world, every state of affairs exists in every possible world if we assume that the principle of actualism (PA) is necessarily true. The thesis that (PA) is necessarily true is called "serious actualism" by Plantinga. Plantinga's world theory is thus committed to the thesis that states of affairs are necessarily existing entities.

Plantinga uses a notion of things having properties or existing in a state of affairs. Let G be the state of affairs of Gato's being blue-eyed. G is not an obtaining state of affairs. But if G had been the case, presumably Gato would have had eyes, he would have been alive, he would have been a cat, and so on. Thus we can say that "in" G Gato would have the property of being alive. This means that if G been the case, Gato would have had the property of being alive. Thus, Plantinga endorses (IN):

(IN) A has a property F in a state of affairs, S, if and only if, had S obtained, A would have had F.

Since a possible world is simply a state of affairs, we can also speak of things having properties or existing in a possible world. This is to be explicated as in (IN). Plantinga uses this notion to introduce the concept of a world-indexed property. Consider G again, Gato's being blue-eyed. If G had been the case then Gato would have been alive. Plantinga would suggest that being alive-in-G is thus a property of Gato. This is an example of a situation-indexed property. Situation-indexed properties are a kind of conditional property. World-indexed properties are a special case of situation-indexed properties.

Plantinga suggests that situation-indexed properties are essential properties of the things that have them. If a state of affairs S1 includes a state of affairs S2, then it is impossible that S1 should obtain without S2. If inclusion holds as a relation between S1 and S2, then it will not be possible that S1 and S2 exist without S1 including S2. This result will follow from Scotus's principle (SP) because impossibility will be an essential trait of S1's obtaining without S2. Thus if Gato's being blue-eyed includes Gato's being alive, Gato could not exist without this inclusion relation obtaining. Hence, the property of being alive-in-G appears to be an essential property of Gato.

6.2 An Objection to Abstractionist World Theory

David Lewis has objected that Plantinga's abstractionist possible worlds are "ersatz" worlds, mere stand-ins, not real possibilities. A soft actualist compositionalist might agree with this criticism without necessarily accepting David Lewis's conception of possible worlds. This disagreement focuses on Plantinga's conception of possible states of affairs as necessarily existing abstract entities that "represent" a way things might be.

How could an abstract entity that "represents" Gato's having that relation to the sofa but does not necessarily involve Gato be relevant to whether his curling up on the sofa is a possibility? The possibility, it may be said, is something which would be a perceptible chunk of reality if it obtained.

If states of affairs are taken to be truth-makers for sentences and beliefs, as in some versions of the correspondence theory of truth, then presumably it is the truth-bearers — the sentences and beliefs — that "represent" some way the world is. They make a "claim" about the way the world is. If states of affairs are the truth-makers, then presumably the obtaining of the state of affairs Gato's weighing ten pounds is what makes "Gato weighs ten pounds" true. If so, then it is presumably the state of affairs that makes a sentence or belief true that is "represented" by that sentence or belief. But if the obtaining of (21) is what would make "Gato is curled up on the sofa" true in a possible world where it is true, this seems to conflict with treating (21) as an abstract "representation" of a way the world might be. If states of affairs are "representations," what do they represent?

7. Are States of Affairs Necessarily Existing Abstract Entities?

Situational abstractionism views states of affairs as necessarily existing abstract entities that do not have contingently existing entities as constituents, and which are necessarily not dependent on contingently existing entities. Roderick Chisholm's early treatment of states of affairs employs the abstractionist conception:

States of affairs are here understood as abstract entities which exist necessarily and which are such that some but not all of them occur, take place, or obtain....States of affairs...are in no way dependent for their being upon the being of concrete, individual things. Even if there were no concrete, individual things, there would be indefinitely many states of affairs. (Chisholm 1976, p. 114)

Chisholm's characterization of states of affairs appeals to a number of criteria for what it is to be abstract — necessary existence, no dependence on concrete things. Earlier (Section 3.1) I mentioned that lack of causal impact is another criterion of abstractness employed by some philosophers. The concept of an abstract entity is explored further in the entry on abstract objects.

As discussed in Section 1, the introduction of states of affairs at the end of the 19th century seems to be derived from a revival of interest in universals since a structured view of states of affairs acknowledges connections between universals and the entities that exemplify them. Does such structure presuppose that these entities are present as constituents in states of affairs? If so, situational abstractionism seems to be a retreat from the implications of that earlier structuralism.

Soft actualism seems to be one motivation behind abstractionism. A number of philosophers want to accept possible but non-obtaining states of affairs for a variety of theoretical uses, in the semantics of modality and elsewhere, but without following Alexius Meinong and David Lewis in positing a realm of non-actual particulars existing in non-actual possible worlds. This leads a number of philosophers to think of possible but non-actual states of affairs and possible worlds "not as alternative realities, but rather as abstract objects representing various ways the world might have been, only one being the way the world actually is." (Barwise 1989, p. 260)

7.1 The Problem of Aliens

An advantage of taking possible states of affairs as necessarily existing abstract entities is that it appears to provide a solution to the problem of aliens. Perhaps there could have been more people or more electrons than there actually are. If so there could have been particulars other than all the particulars that do exist. An alien particular is a thing such that it never exists at any time in the actual world but could have existed — it is alien to our world. Representing these possibilities as abstract entities may avoid commitment to possible but non-existent particulars — a desirable goal for a philosopher with actualist sympathies. This topic is discussed further in the supplementary document The Problem of Aliens.

7.2 An Argument Against Concrete Compositionalism

Plantinga uses the label "existentialism" for the concrete compositionalist view that states of affairs depend for their existence on contingently existing entities such as concrete particulars. Plantinga's argument against existentialism (Plantinga 1983, Pollock 1985) provides support for situational abstractionism.

Plantinga's argument revolves around the interpretation of statements of non-existence. If we agree that Socrates could have failed to exist, then we would agree that (B1) is true:

(B1) Possibly Socrates does not exist.

Plantinga's argument then adds some additional premises:

(B2) If (B1) is true then the state of affairs Socrates's not existing is possible.

(B3) If the state of affairs Socrates's not existing is possible, it is possible it should have obtained.

(B4) Necessarily, if Socrates's not existing had obtained, then Socrates's not existing would have existed.

(B5) Necessarily, if Socrates's not existing had obtained, then Socrates would have not existed.

From (B1)-(B5) we can infer (B6):

(B6) It is possible that Socrates's not existing should have existed even when Socrates does not exist.

And (B6) directly contradicts the constitution principle (CP). It also follows that a soft actualist compositionalist cannot accept Plantinga's version of Scotus's principle (SP):

(SP) If a state of affairs S is possible, then S is necessarily possible, that is, possible with respect to every possible world.

Suppose W1 is a possible world where Gato fails to exist. If Gato's being blue-eyed is possible, (SP) entails that Gato's being blue-eyed must have the property of being possible even in W1. But on the soft actualist compositionalist view, Gato's being blue-eyed doesn't exist in W1 because one of its constituents is missing in W1. Hence Gato's being blue-eyed cannot have any properties at all in W1, since it would have to exist in W1 to have any properties in W1 (if serious actualism is true).

How could a soft actualist compositionalist respond to Plantinga's argument? A number of philosophers (Armstrong 1997, Millikan 1984) deny that there are negative properties or negative states of affairs. Plantinga's argument seems to suppose that there are logically complex states of affairs corresponding to logical words like "not." A number of philosophers would challenge this assumption. This is discussed in Section 4.

8. A Hybrid Approach

There are theories of states of affairs which analyze them in ways that fall between the compositionalist and abstractionist account. On such theories, states of affairs are abstract entities consisting, in some sense, of properties and concrete individuals. In Zalta 1993, there is a formal theory of states of affairs, situations, and possible worlds. In Zalta's treatment, situations are not states of affairs; situations are viewed as a special case of abstract objects, and are thus accommodated within a broader theory and formal logic of abstract objects — a theory that provides a unified treatment of mathematical objects, fictional discourse, modality, and belief reports and other discourse exhibiting "intentionality" (see Zalta 1983, 1988, 1993, Linsky and Zalta 1994).

Abstract objects are non-spatiotemporal, necessarily existing entities which "encode" properties. (Encoding is discussed the first section of the supplementary document States of Affairs and Abstract Object Theory.) In order to treat situations and possible worlds as abstract objects that "make factual" the states of affairs that would obtain or be factual "in" that world or situation, abstract object theory introduces the idea of a state of affairs property (SOA-property), such as the property being such that G. W. Bush is president of the USA in 2003 or being such that Socrates taught in Athens. The property of being such that G.W. Bush is president of the USA in 2003 is exhibited by everything since G.W. Bush's being president of the USA in 2003 is factual.

Thus being such that Jack is standing on top of the Russ Building is a property "encoded", for example, by situations S in which Jack climbs onto the roof of the Russ Building. The situation S "makes factual" the state of affairs Jack's standing on top of the Russ Building because, if the SOA-properties encoded in S are actually exemplified, then being such that Jack is standing on top of the Russ Building will be exemplified. And this property can be exemplified only if Jack's being on top of the Russ Building actually obtains, that is, is factual. In other words, a situation, S, makes factual a state of affairs, H, just in case S encodes the SOA-property corresponding to H. Abstract object theory allows that states of affairs (and thus SOA-properties) may have concrete particulars as constituents — thus satisfying a compositionalist desideratum.

Possible worlds are defined as situations that satisfy a maximality condition. Both states of affairs and possible worlds end up as necessarily existing abstract entities. For further discussion, see the remaining sections of the supplementary document States of Affairs and Abstract Object Theory.

9. Are States of Affairs What Events Are?

Accounting for what events are is another possible explanatory role for states of affairs. There are a number of contemporary philosophers who have offered accounts of events in which they are identified as states of affairs, of a certain sort (for example, Chisholm 1990, Lombard 1986). (See the entry on events for a broader discussion of events.)

There is an ambiguity in the word "event" between a type of event and particular tokens of that type. If someone says "The American presidential campaign occurs every four years," we may suppose that they are referring to a type of event that has a unique instance every four years.

If we focus not on the event types but on the "particular" events — concrete, unrepeatable occurrences — a question arises: What are they?

Jaegwon Kim and Alvin Goldman independently developed an account of events in which they are treated as a kind of state of affairs: a thing's exemplifying a property at a time (Kim 1973, 1980; Goldman 1970). An event such as

(24) this LED's flashing at 1:10 PM today

is thus taken to consist in a concrete particular, this LED, exemplifying the property of flashing at a certain time. Kim sometimes writes as if an event such as (24) could be modeled as an ordered set:

(25) <this LED, flashing, 1:10 PM today>

But Kim makes clear that the event only occurs if that LED exemplifies that property at that time. The mere existence of the set <Jack, eating, this goldfish> does not entail that Jack ate the goldfish. The event is not a set of its constituents. This also implies that Kim is a hard actualist about events — the only events are those that do occur (obtain) at some time. There are no possible but non-actual events.

The view offered by Kim and Goldman had consequences for event identity that were at odds with views articulated by Donald Davidson. Davidson wrote:

What is the relation between my pointing the gun and pulling the trigger, and my shooting the victim? The natural, and I think, correct answer is that the relation is that of identity. (Davidson 1967)

Goldman labels this "the identity thesis"; Goldman disputes this thesis by appeal to Leibniz's Law:

(LL) If x is identical with y then x and y must have all the same properties.

Goldman's strategy is to show that events that Davidson might wish to identify do not have the same properties, and thus are distinct (by (LL)). Goldman notes that John's pulling the trigger caused the gun's going off. Is it plausible to say that John's killing Smith caused the gun's going off? If so, then John's pulling the trigger has a property that John's killing Smith does not have, and they are thus not identical.

The use of gerundive nominals to designate events indicates that Kim and Goldman are treating "particular events" as states of affairs. Events are "particular" (adjective) in that they are not types or universals but unique occurrences. Each event, on this view, has a constitutive property which is essential to its being the event it is. Each event also has as a constituent a particular entity that exhibits that property, such as a person or a physical particular or perhaps a spatial area. The property that is constitutive of an event is essential to that event; thus Lawrence Lombard (Lombard 1986) calls the constitutive property of an event a "property essence" of that event. There is no problem with contingently existing physical particulars being constituents in the events because events are treated as contingently existing entities.

This view of events fits well with the concrete compositionalist (Section 2) view of basic states of affairs but seems to be incompatible with the idea that states of affairs are necessarily existing abstract entities.

Kim and Goldman analyze an event such as (24) as a state of affairs consisting in this particular having a certain dynamic property — flashing — at a certain time.

(24) this LED's flashing at 1:10 PM today

An event is thus essentially indexed to a time.

9.1 Designators for Events and States of Affairs

The Kim/Goldman analysis of events as time-indexed basic states of affairs gives a very fine-grained differentiation of events. Davidson objects that the analysis is too fine-grained:

No stabbing can be a killing and no killing can be a murder, no arm-raising can be a signaling, and no birthday party a celebration. I protest. (Davidson, 1969)

Jonathan Bennett (Bennett 1988) proposes a way of understanding the dispute between Davidson, on the one hand, and Kim and Goldman, on the other hand.

Bennett introduces a distinction between two different types of designator. The gerundive nominals that are the canonical designators for states of affairs are called imperfect nominals because (in the words of Zeno Vendler) they "still have a verb alive and kicking" inside them; they are not perfectly noun-like. A perfect nominal is more noun-like; for example:

The death of Caesar
The sinking of the Titanic
The theft that Mary committed
Quisling's betrayal of Norway
Mary's theft of the bicycle

Perfect nominals, unlike imperfect nominals, can take plurals. For example: "Mary's thefts eventually led to prison." Bennett suggests that perfect nominals are the canonical designators for events. So, whatever it is that these expressions designate, that is what events are.

Bennett suggests that the role of perfect nominals is often to pick out a complex dynamic situation, by means of something like a definite description, in order to describe it or attribute some property to it. The richness of the event is not fully articulated in the designator. In (24)

(24) The quarrel between Sam and Enrique was savage.

the designator "the quarrel between Sam and Enrique" picks out a complex situation that was made up of a variety of concrete events or processes such as loud utterances, a glass being thrown against the wall, racial slurs, a punch to the nose, and so on. The predicate "was savage" is here not taken to indicate a feature that was constitutive of what unfolded that evening, but is a characterization of the whole episode. In (24), a property is being attributed to the situation.

The imperfect, gerundive nominals that are used canonically to designate states of affairs have a "thinner" mode of reference. From these expressions one can "read off" the composition of the state of affairs thus articulated, Bennett suggests. "What you see is what you get," says Bennett. "Mary's stealing the bicycle" designates a state of affairs in which the relevant entities are Mary, the bicycle and the property of stealing.

Bennett notes that imperfect gerundive nominals can take logical words like "not" or "or." His suggestion that the structure of a state of affairs can be simply "read off" from the imperfect nominal would seem to imply that (25) would designate a disjunctive state of affairs.

(25) Isabel's being at home or hiking in the hills

This implies that there are negative or disjunctive states of affairs; but this claim would be disputed (see Section 4.1) by a number of philosophers.

If events are states of affairs, the upshot of Bennett's discussion is that we have ways of talking about them where predicates are used sometimes to indicate the properties that are constitutive of the event, and sometimes used to attribute a property to an event — a property that the event may have contingently. If I say "The arrival of the garbage truck at 5 AM woke up Sammy," I am attributing to an event a certain causal property. If Sammy had been out of town that night, the arrival of the garbage truck at 5 AM would not have had that property. Waking up Sammy was not a "property essence" of the garbage truck's arrival that morning.

To illustrate the distinction, Bennett looks at (26) and (27):

(26) Mary's stealing the bicycle surprised us.
(27) Mary's theft of the bicycle surprised us.

In (26), the "thinness" of "Mary's stealing the bicycle" means that it is just the fact (obtaining state of affairs) that she stole the bicycle that was surprising. There is nothing else that is picked out that might be an explanation of the surprise. But in (27), there might be aspects of the theft that were the explanation of the surprise. For example, suppose the bicycle was chained on a busy sidewalk. And suppose that Mary was in fact wanted for a number of other bicycle thefts. Her stealing a bicycle would not be surprising. Perhaps what was surprising was the way she did it — the quick and quiet chopping of the lock that enabled her to make off with the bicycle on a busy sidewalk without drawing attention. This suggests that "Mary's theft of the bicycle" is being used to refer to a rich, complex situation that constituted a theft, not just the "thin" state of affairs consisting in her stealing the bicycle.

Bennett suggests that, in talking about events, Kim and Goldman typically have recourse to the "thin" imperfect gerundive designators whereas Davidson more often has recourse to the "thicker" perfect nominals. As Bennett sees it, the issue in event individuation is, How to determine which descriptions or features attributed to events are constitutive ("property essences") of the events versus mere attributions of contingent features to those events? Bennett suggests that there is no clear way of deciding this question. (Bennett 1986, p. 126)

Lombard suggests that the way to get at the distinction is to look at the underlying changes that constitute an event (Lombard 1986). If we consider states that physical entities can be in, these often are arranged in contraries that fall under some determinable, such as distinct spatial locations, or distinct colors. Lombard calls the range of determinates or contraries under a single determinable a quality space. A change consists in a thing moving through a quality space, that is, having initially one of the static properties in a range and then losing that property and gaining one of the other determinates in that range and so on. Atomic events are those that supervene on, or are equivalent to, a process of change. For example, if X moves from position P1 to position Pn over a certain duration T, this event of movement supervenes on or is equivalent to a process that consists in X progressively occupying a continuous series of positions. The event descriptions that articulate event essences, for Lombard, are those that articulate atomic events. For Lombard, atomic events (and events, if any, that are parts of them) are the only events there are.

Any atomic event consists in a thing X exemplifying a dynamic property P at some time T. Identity of the supervening process of E1 and E2 would be sufficient for E1 and E2 to be the same event for Lombard. (Lombard 1986, p. 179) Like Bennett, Lombard suggests that much of the dispute over identity of events occurs because events may be picked out or described in ways other than by articulating an event's property essence. For example, if Jones sticks his arm out the window, is Jones's extending his arm out the window identical with Jones's signaling a left turn? Since signaling a left turn is a different property than extending one's arm out the window, it might seem they are not the same event. But Lombard suggests that signaling a left turn may simply be a property of that event which is the extending of the arm out the window.

Descriptions of events in terms of their causes, in particular, are not descriptions of constitutive properties of events, for Lombard. Thus "Tim's blowing up the building" does not articulate an event essence because this is a description in terms of causal consequences.

9.2 Events As Tropes

From a metaphysical point of view, it might seem that Bennett, Goldman, Lombard, and Kim all agree that events are states of affairs. Even if constitutive features of the event designated by "Mary's theft of the bicycle last Saturday" are not fully articulated in that designator, Bennett seems to be suggesting that it is a situation — a complex state of affairs — that is designated by "Mary's theft of the bicycle last Saturday."

But it is not clear that this is Bennett's most considered view. Bennett also suggests that events are tropes. Let us suppose that X is a particular LED that flashes on three distinct occasions, 1:10 PM, 3:03 PM, and 4:13 AM. Then we have three distinct events. On the Kim/Goldman view, these "concrete particular" events would be understood as:

(28) x's flashing at 4:13 AM

(29) x's flashing at 1:10 PM

(30) x's flashing at 3:03 PM

But if (28) obtains at all, it seems that it must obtain at any time x exists. For if it is true that x flashes at 4:13 AM today, then it was true last week that x would flash at 4:13 AM. Of course, if we accept the Constitution Principle (Section 2), (28) could not obtain if x ceases to exist because a constituent of that state of affairs would be missing. But as long as x does exist, (28) will obtain; that is, (28) will obtain throughout the history of x.

Bennett objects that a concrete, particular occurrence such as this flashing of x should occur or exist only when it does occur. Bennett thus suggests that it is a mistake to pack the time of occurrence into the analysis of what the event is.

But if the time of occurrence is not constitutive of the event, what distinguishes these three distinct flashings of x? Bennett suggests that we should not understand the actual flashings as states of affairs consisting of x and a universal — the property of flashing — but as tropes. Thus each flashing is a particularized property of x; it should not be analyzed into a structure with X and a universal as constitutive elements. However, Bennett thinks that the states of affairs (28)-(29)-(30) do also exist. This seems to commit Bennett to tropes, universals, and states of affairs. Many philosophers are likely to object that this commits us to an undesirable ontological duplication of basic kinds of entity.

9.3 Events As States of Affairs Without Times

Roderick Chisholm, in elaborating his later theory of events (Chisholm 1990), agrees with Bennett that we should not view time of occurrence as a constitutive element packed into events. Nonetheless, Chisholm rejects the trope view of events.

For Chisholm, an event is a contingent basic state of affairs of the form x-having-F, where x is an entity that exists contingently and F is a property that x might not have had. The entity x in x-having-F is the subject of the event, which Chisholm calls the substrate of the event.

Chisholm objects to inclusion of times as constitutive of particular events since he wants to avoid commitment to times as entities. But if x is an LED that flashes now and has flashed on two earlier times today, aren't there three flashings of x? Yet, on Chisholm's view, each of these occurrences is distinct yet consists only in x having the property of flashing. What individuates the present flashing of x from the two earlier flashings?

To begin with, Chisholm would insist that there is only one flashing of x — the flashing that is happening now. It is true, he will agree, that x did flash previously. But there are no past flashings of x. Rather, there were past flashings. Chisholm adheres to presentism — the view that "whatever exists exists now."

Still, what individuates this flashing of x from any earlier flashings? Chisholm holds that concrete, particular events do not recur. He argues that entities cannot have intermittent existence. Each new coming into existence of a flashing of x requires a distinct event. But if so, what individuates each flashing of x? If the flashings at 1:10 PM, 4:13 AM, and 3:03 PM each consist solely in x having the property of flashing, each has the same "property essence" — flashing. And each has the same "substrate" — x. Each of these is essential to making that event the event it is, Chisholm agrees. Dean Zimmerman (Zimmerman 1997) raises the following objection: Shouldn't there be some ontological difference between each of these three occurrences if they are three and not one?

This consideration leads Zimmerman to suggest that we think of events as entities that can recur. Thus Zimmerman would say that if x flashes at 4:13 AM, 1:10 PM, and 3:03 PM, one and the same particular event — X's flashing — occurs on each of these occasions. But the following would be a true statement:

(31) There were three flashings of this LED today.

Events are things that we appear to count. For example:

I had seven student visits today.
Three gunshots could be heard in the neighborhood last night.
Twelve murders occurred in the city last year.

What is it that is being counted in (31)? On Zimmerman's view there is only one entity and it recurs. If we say that the same event recurred "on three occasions," what are "occasions"? Perhaps Zimmerman could hold that we count the contexts in which an event recurs.

Chisholm responds that the "contemporaries" of an event provide the ontological differentiation (Brandl 1997). In other words, a concrete, particular event is partially individuated by its context.

9.4 Questions for Chisholm's Theory of Events

Various questions about Chisholm's theory remain. The apparent possibility of a universe that repeats itself presents a difficulty for the view that events are individuated by their contemporaries. If a certain thing x has a property F at one time in a context that consists of a complex contemporary situation S1, if the universe is repeating, x might have F again when its contemporary situation, S2, is exactly the same as S1 in entities (substrates) and constitutive features (content).

Also, why should the contemporaries of an event be more essential to that event's differentiation than the preceding and following events — that is, the event's sequence or order in the unfolding history of the particular in which it occurs? The invocation of "contemporaries" seems motivated by Chisholm's presentism. Given the relativity of simultaneity, does the invocation of contemporary events require that the individuating context be limited to the same inertial frame?

Presentism itself raises a variety of questions. What is the "present"? Is it a durationless line dividing past and future? If so, is it plausible to take present-tensed verbs as referring literally to "the present"? This seems to presuppose that human communicative purposes are served by having a means to track durationless moments in history. But human consciousness of "the present" seems to be of a finite stretch of unfolding processes. Due to the time-lag in perception, some philosophers would say, events that appear "now" to us occur in reality somewhat in the past relative to our perception of them. If there are no past events, what, then, are we perceiving? The events that we now perceive are paradigmatic referents for present-tense sentences. It could be argued, then, that events designated using the present tense are often past. Chisholm might respond that events endure over a period of time. An event whose past phase is being perceived now may still be occurring when we refer to it. For example, if I say "the fire is heating the room," the fire is a process that will have phases contemporary with my utterance even though the phases that provoked my saying it no longer exist, on Chisholm's view.


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