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Lord Shaftesbury [Anthony Ashley Cooper, 3rd Earl of Shaftesbury]

First published Wed Mar 13, 2002; substantive revision Thu Oct 12, 2006

Anthony Ashley Cooper, the third Earl of Shaftesbury, lived from 1671 to 1713. He was one of the most important philosophers of his day, and exerted an enormous influence throughout the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries on British and European discussions of morality, aesthetics, and religion.

Shaftesbury's philosophy combined a powerfully teleological approach, according to which all things are part of a harmonious cosmic order, with sharp observations of human nature (see section 2 below). Shaftesbury is often credited with originating the moral sense theory, although his own views of virtue are a mixture of rationalism and sentimentalism (section 3). While he argued that virtue leads to happiness (section 4), Shaftesbury was a fierce opponent of psychological and ethical egoism (section 5) and of the egoistic social contract theory of Hobbes (section 6). Shaftesbury advanced a view of aesthetic judgment that was non-egoistic and objectivist, in that he thought that correct aesthetic judgment was disinterested and reflected accurately the harmonious cosmic order (section 7). Shaftesbury's belief in an harmonious cosmic order also dominated his view of religion, which was based on the idea that the universe clearly exhibits signs of perfect divine design (section 8). According to Shaftesbury, the ultimate end of religion, as well as of virtue, beauty, and philosophical understanding (all of which are turn out to be one and the same thing), is to identify completely with the universal system of which one is a part.

1. Shaftesbury's Life and Works

Shaftesbury lived from 1671 to 1713. His grandfather, the first Earl of Shaftesbury, oversaw Shaftesbury's early upbringing, and put John Locke in charge of his education. Shaftesbury would eventually come to disagree with many aspects of Locke's philosophy (such as the latter's empiricism, his social contract theory, and what Shaftesbury perceived to be his egoism), but Locke was clearly a crucially important influence on Shaftesbury's philosophical development, and the two remained friends until Locke's death.

Shaftesbury served in Parliament and the House of Lords, but ill health curtailed his political career when he was 30 years old. From then on, he concentrated his energies on his philosophical and literary writings.

The first work Shaftesbury published was an edited collection of sermons by Benjamin Whichcote, which came out in 1698. Shaftesbury wrote an unsigned preface to the sermons in which he praised Whichcote's belief in the goodness of human beings and urged his readers to use Whichcote's “good nature” as an antidote to the poisonous egoism of Hobbes and the pessimistic supralapsarianism of the Calvinists.

In 1699, John Toland published an early version of Shaftesbury's Inquiry concerning Virtue or Merit (IVM). But Shaftesbury renounced this version of the Virtue or Merit, claiming that it was produced without his authorization.

Most of the works for which Shaftesbury is famous were written between 1705-1710. It was during this period that he rewrote the Inquiry concerning Virtue or Merit and completed versions of A Letter concerning Enthusiasm (LCE), Sensus Communis: An Essay on the Freedom of Wit and Humour (SC), The Moralists (M) and Soliloquy, or Advice to an Author (SA).

In 1711, he collected his mature works into a single volume and added to them extensive notes and commentary, naming the book Characteristics of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times (C). He revised the Characteristics over the course of the next two years, up until his death in 1713. A revised edition came out in 1714.

The Characteristics is a remarkable volume. It covers a great many topics, ranging freely over morality, art, politics, religion, aesthetics, culture and politeness, and it is written in many different styles, including epistles, soliloquies, dialogues and treatises. The overarching goal of the book, as Klein has put it in his very helpful introduction, is to make its readers “effective participants in the world” (C viii). Shaftesbury saw the Characteristics as an exercise in practical (and not merely speculative) philosophy — as a work that would make people both happier and more virtuous. (See M part 1, section 1.)

The Characteristics was extremely popular in Britain and Europe throughout the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries. It was a book that was closely studied by numerous philosophers and artists, as well as widely read by educated people in general.

In addition to the Characteristics, there are two other posthumous collections of Shaftesbury's writings: the Second Characteristics, which is concerned chiefly with the visual arts, and Shaftesbury's philosophical notebooks, which Rand collected in The Life, Unpublished Letters and Philosophical Regimen of Anthony, Earl of Shaftesbury (LUP). The notebooks are particularly interesting, as they offer a view of Shaftesbury's private ruminations and his profound commitment to elements of Stoicism.

2. Shaftesbury's View of Human Nature: Teleology and Observation

Shaftesbury's view of human nature was both teleological and observation-based. Indeed, he believed that teleology and observation must go hand-in-hand — that accurate observation of human psychology requires a teleological conception of humanity, and that one needs to observe human beings to learn about the human telos. He was very critical of philosophers who examined human beings without placing their findings within a teleological context, comparing them to someone who examines the individual parts of a watch without taking into account the purpose for which the watch was designed: just as the latter person will never come to a proper understanding of the watch, Shaftesbury argued, so too the former will never come to a proper understanding of human nature. Shaftesbury thought that Descartes and Locke were guilty of this narrow, non-teleological type of philosophizing. (See SA part 2, section 1; IVM book 1, part 2, section 1; M part 2, section 4.)

3. Shaftesbury's View of Virtue:  Moral Sentimentalism and Moral Rationalism

Shaftesbury, like most teleologically-minded philosophers, held that the end or telos of human nature is virtue, and much of his writing is devoted to an explication of his conception of virtue. The account of virtue Shaftesbury proposes has often been taken to be the origin of moral sentimentalism, which Hutcheson and Hume would later develop. But while there are parts of Shaftesbury's account of virtue that are undeniably sentimentalist, there are also rationalist elements that defy the sentimentalist label.

To understand Shaftesbury's account of virtue, we must first examine his account of goodness. Something is good, according to Shaftesbury, if it contributes to the “existence or well-being” of the system of which it is a part (C 168). Every animal, for instance, is a part of its species. So a particular animal, say a tiger, is a good member of its species — it's a good tiger — if it contributes to the well-being of the tiger species as a whole. There is also “a system of all animals,” which consists of the “order” or “economy” of all the different animal species (C 169). So a good animal is one that contributes to the well-being of “animal affairs” in general (Ibid). The system of all animals, moreover, works with the system “of vegetables and all other things in this inferior world” to constitute “one system of a globe or earth” (Ibid). So something is a good earthly thing if it contributes to the existence of earthly things in general. And the system of this earth is itself part of a “universal system” or “a system of all things” (Ibid). So to be “wholly and really” good a thing must contribute to the existence of the universe as a whole (Ibid). This progression of ever-larger systems is a bit dazzling, and we might wonder how we can ever know (or even make sense of) whether something is contributing to the well-being of the universe as a whole. But Shaftesbury avoids this problem by discussing in detail only that which makes “a sensible creature” a good member of its species — by focusing on whether an individual creature is promoting the well-being of its species (C 169). Perhaps Shaftesbury believed that a creature that contributes to the well-being of its species will also always contribute to the well-being of the universe as a whole, in which case being a good member of one's species would be equivalent to being “wholly and really” good. (See IVM book 1, part 2, section 1)

Shaftesbury goes on to say that the goodness or evilness of a sensible creature is based on the creature's motives, and not simply on the results of the creature's actions (C169). And he then makes a crucial claim:  every motive to action involves affection or passion (C 173, 177-79, 193). Reason alone, Shaftesbury maintains, cannot motivate. This claim clearly anticipates some of the most influential anti-rationalist arguments of Hutcheson and Hume. (See IVM book 1, part 2, section 3; IVM book 1, part 2, section 4; IVM book 1, part 3, section 1; IVM book 2, part 1, section 1.)

Also crucial is the distinction Shaftesbury draws between goodness and virtue. Goodness is something that is within the reach of all sensible creatures, not only humans but also non-human animals, such as tigers. This is because a creature is good if its affections promote the well-being of the system of which it is a part, and non-human animals are just as capable of possessing this type of affection as humans. “Virtue or merit,” on the other hand, is within the reach of “man only” (C 172). And that is because virtue or merit is tied to a special kind of affection that only humans possess. This special kind of affection is a second-order affection, an affection that has as its object another affection. We humans experience these second-order affections because we, unlike non-human animals, are conscious of our own passions. Not only do we possess passions, but we also reflect on or become aware of the passions we have. And when we reflect on our own passions, we develop feelings about them. Imagine, for instance, you feel the desire to help a person in distress. In addition to simply feeling that desire, you may also become aware that you are feeling that desire. And when you become aware of that, you may experience a positive feeling (or “liking”) towards your desire to help. Or imagine you feel the desire to harm a person who has bested you in a fair competition. In addition to simply feeling the desire to harm, you may also become aware that you are feeling that desire. And when you become aware of that, you may experience a negative feeling (or “dislike”) towards your desire to harm. These are the kinds of phenomena Shaftesbury has in mind when he says that “the affections of pity, kindness, gratitude and their contraries, being brought into the mind by reflection, become objects. So that, by means of this reflected sense, there arises another kind of affection towards those very affections themselves, which have been already felt, and are now become the subject of a new liking or dislike” (C 172). (See IVM book 1, part 2, section 3.)

Shaftesbury calls this capacity to feel second-order affections the “sense of right and wrong” or the “moral sense” (C 179-80). The moral sense is that which produces in us feelings of “like” or “dislike” for our own (first-order) affections. When the moral sense is operating properly, it produces positive feelings towards affections that promote the well-being of humanity and negative feelings towards affections that detract from the well-being of humanity. The second-order feelings that the moral sense produces can themselves motivate one to action. And people are virtuous if they act from those second-order feelings. In contrast, non-human animals, because they lack the powers of reflection necessary for consciousness of their own affections, do not possess a moral sense. So non-human animals are incapable of achieving virtue (C 175). (See IVM book 1, part 2, section 3.)

Also in line with sentimentalist moral theory is Shaftesbury's discussion of how a person can come to lose his or her sense of right and wrong. He argues (in a manner that anticipates Hume) that because our sense of morality is a sentiment, it can be opposed only by another sentiment, and not by reason or belief. “Sense of right and wrong,” he writes, “therefore being as natural to us as natural affection itself, and being a first Principle in our constitution and make, there is no speculative opinion, persuasion or belief which is capable immediately or directly to exclude or destroy it… [T]his affection being an original one of earliest rise in the soul or affectionate part, nothing beside contrary affection, by frequent check and control, can operate upon it, so as either to diminish it in part, or destroy it in the whole” (C 179). (See IVM book 1, part 3, section 1.)

But while Shaftesbury claims that human moral judgment and human virtue essentially involve affection, he does not believe that all value depends on human affections. Goodness, which is the basis of morality and virtue, is an objective property, one that is independent of all human minds, and it is reason that can inform us of what that property consists. Goodness is real eternal and immutable, not something created by will, command, opinion, custom, or social contract. So even if every member of society were to approve of something harmful to humanity, it would still be vicious. For that which is destructive of the species can never be “virtue of any kind or in any sense but must remain still horrid depravity, notwithstanding any fashion, law, custom or religion which may be ill and vicious itself but can never alter the eternal measures and immutable independent nature of worth and virtue” (C 175). Fashion, law, custom, and religion can cause people to develop positive affections towards things harmful to humanity. But the development of such affections will never make such things right. The “eternal Measures” of right and wrong are not constituted by human affections. Right and wrong have an “immutable independent nature.”  And we are virtuous just to the extent that our affections lead us to act in accord with these eternal and immutable moral truths. (See LCE section 4; SC part 1, section 6; SC part 2, section 1; SC part 3, section 1; SC part 3, section 2; SA part 3; IVM book 1, part 2, section 1; IVM book 1, part 3, section 2; M part 2, section 2; M part 2, section 3; M part 2, section 4.)

In Shaftesbury's account of virtue, then, reason and sentiment both play essential roles. A person is virtuous if and only if her actions flow from the properly functioning moral sentiments.  And reason tells us that moral sentiments are functioning properly if and only if they promote the well-being of the species as a whole.  Shaftesbury's “sense of right and wrong” is truly a sentiment, but it is a sentiment that accurately represents an objective reality — i.e., a reality that is independent of human sentiments.

4. Virtue and Happiness

Shaftesbury maintained that virtue promotes the good of all humankind. As he says, “To love the public, to study universal good, and to promote the interest of the whole world, as far as lies within our power, is surely the height of goodness” (C 20). Or as he puts it elsewhere, the virtuous person is the one who strives to develop an “equal, just and universal friendship” with all humankind (C 256). This view of the content of virtue — that to be virtuous is to promote the good of all humankind — fits well with Shaftesbury's teleological approach. For he believes that everything is designed to promote the good of the system of which it is a part. And he also believes that every human being is a part of the system that is the human species as a whole. It is natural for him to think, therefore, that every human being is designed to promote the good of the human species as a whole. (It is important to remember, however, that this view of a system and its parts explains only Shaftesbury's view of the content of goodness, which is something that non-humans can also attain. Virtue or merit, which humans alone can attain, involves not merely acting for the good of the system but performing such actions in a self-aware or reflective manner.)  Shaftesbury also consistently maintains that in addition to promoting the good of humanity, virtue promotes the happiness of the virtuous person him or herself, and that vice harms not only humanity as a whole but also the vicious person. As Shaftesbury puts it, “virtue and interest may be found at last to agree” (C 167). Or as he says in the conclusion of the Inquiry, “And thus virtue is the good and vice the ill of everyone” (C 229-330). (See SC section 3; IVM book 2; M part 2).

This coincidence of virtue and happiness is just what Shaftesbury's teleological approach should lead us to expect. For teleological thinking generally involves the idea that the best life for a being is one that fulfills the being's natural end or purpose, and being virtuous is the end or purpose for which humans were designed.  Shaftesbury corroborates this teleological connection between virtue and happiness by investigating the pleasures and pains of which human happiness and unhappiness consist. He begins this investigation by drawing a broad distinction between pleasures of the body and pleasures of the mind. He next contends that a person's happiness depends more on mental pleasures than on bodily pleasures. And he then seeks to show that living virtuously is by far the best way to gain the crucially important mental pleasures. Shaftesbury bases much of his argument for the connection between virtue and happiness on the idea that the mental pleasures are within one's own control, insulated from the vicissitudes of “fortune, age, circumstances and humour” (C 334). As one of Shaftesbury's characters rhetorically asks, “How can we better praise the goodness of Providence than in this, ‘That it has placed our happiness and good in things we can bestow upon ourselves’?” (C 335). The importance Shaftesbury places on our control over our mental pleasures grows directly out of his appreciation for the Stoics. Indeed, it can be plausibly maintained that Stoicism is one of the strongest and most fundamental commitments of Shaftesbury's thought overall. (See SA part 3, section 2; IVM book 2; M part 3, section 3.)

5. Attacks on Egoism

But although Shaftesbury believed that being virtuous makes a person happy, it would be wrong to label him an egoist. In fact, he launched many attacks on both psychological egoism and ethical egoism, attacks that had as their main target Hobbes and which clearly anticipated the influential anti-egoist arguments in Butler, Hutcheson, and Hume.

Shaftesbury argues that psychological egoism does a simply terrible job of explaining the wide spectrum of observable activities humans engage in. He ridicules, for instance, egoistic interpretations of things as “civility, hospitality, humanity towards strangers or people in distress,” maintaining that it is much easier to explain such phenomena simply by positing real sociability and benevolence (C 55). He points out that humans are often motivated by “passion, humour, caprice, zeal, faction and a thousand other springs, which are counter to self-interest” (C 54)  And he maintains that the only way psychological egoism can be plausibly maintained is at the expense of becoming tautologous. (See SC section 2; SC section 3; M part 2, section 1.)

Against ethical egoism, Shaftesbury argues that virtue can exist only if it's possible for people to be motivated by something other than self-interest. For persons’ virtue, according to Shaftesbury, consists not of the actions they perform but of the motives they have for performing them. And the motive with which we identify virtue is benevolence, not self-interest. Shaftesbury emphasizes this point by drawing attention to the difference between a knave and a saint. We judge the saint virtuous, he explains, because we think he is motivated by something other than the selfishness of the knave. And if we came to believe that the saint were motivated solely by self-interest, we would no longer judge him to be virtuous. As he puts it, “If the love of doing good be not of itself a good and right inclination, I know not how there can possibly be such a thing as goodness or virtue” (C 46). (See SC part 2, section 3, part 3; SC section 4, part 4, Section 1; SA part 1, section 2; IVM book 2, part 2, section 2; IVM book 2, part 2, section 4.)

Shaftesbury's belief that true virtue must flow from non-egoistic motives leads him to criticize sharply the emphasis many religious moralists place on reward and punishment in the afterlife. As one of his characters explains when summarizing the goal of the Inquiry, “[The author of the Inquiry] endeavors chiefly to establish virtue on principles by which he is able to argue with those who are not as yet induced to own a god or future state. If he cannot do thus much, he reckons he does nothing” (C 266). Shaftesbury eschews considerations of the afterlife in his case for virtue because he believes that persons who perform virtuous actions only because they desire reward and fear punishment have no real virtue in them at all. And persons who are constantly made to dwell on reward and punishment are likely to become overly concerned with their own “self-good and private interest,” which must “insensibly diminish the affections towards public good or the interest of society and introduce a certain narrowness of spirit” (C 184). So an emphasis on reward and punishment cannot make people more virtuous, and it may very well make them less so (C 45-46). (See SC part 3, section 3; IVM book 1, part 3, section 3; M part 3, section 3.)

Shaftesbury's anti-egoistic view also leads him to an interesting consideration of what we should say to someone who asks for a reason to be virtuous when he knows he will not be punished for vice, or, as Shaftesbury puts the question, “Why should a man be honest in the dark?” (C 58). At times Shaftesbury suggests that a person who asks this question is already lost to virtue — that someone who cares about virtue for its own sake won't need another reason to act virtuously, and that someone who needs another reason doesn't have what it takes to be truly virtuous in the first place. At other times, Shaftesbury suggests that we should be honest even in the dark (i.e., virtuous even when we will not be punished for vice) because such conduct is a necessary condition for having an identity or unified self at all (C 127). These suggestions of how to deal with the question “Why be moral?” are almost certainly antecedents of Hume's response to the sensible knave at the end of his Enquiry concerning Morals. (See SC part 3, section 4; SA part 3, section 1).

It is noteworthy that despite his anti-egoism, Shaftesbury goes to great lengths to show that the virtuous person will be happier than the vicious person (IVM book II). At one point, he justifies this procedure by contending that while it is best to act for entirely disinterested motives, we sometimes might have to rely on interested considerations to induce to morally correct action those people (including ourselves) who are not yet capable of achieving the heights of virtue. As he puts it, “[W]e ought all of us to aspire, so as to endeavour that the excellence of the object, not the reward or punishment, should be our motive, but … where, through the corruption of our nature, the former of these motives is found insufficient to excite to virtue, there the latter should be brought in aid and on no account be undervalued or neglected” (C 269).  (See IVM book 2; M part 2, section 3.)

6. Attacks on Social Contract Theory and Defense of Political Liberty

Another point on which Hume was probably indebted to Shaftesbury was criticism of social contract theory. Shaftesbury argued that the selfish beings Hobbes described in his state of nature bear no resemblance to humans as they actually are. For naturally, Shaftesbury contended, humans are sociable. And society is thus humankind's natural condition. “In short, if generation be natural, if natural affection and the care and nurture of the offspring be natural, things standing as they do with man and the creature being of that form and constitution he now is, it follows that society must be also natural to him and that out of society and community he never did, nor ever can, subsist” (C 287). Shaftesbury also argued that if Hobbes's description of an amoral state of nature were correct, then it would be impossible for Hobbes ever to establish a duty to obey the laws of society. For if there had been no duty to keep one's promises in the state of nature, then the original contract could not have created a duty. And if the original contract did give rise to a duty, then there must have been a duty to keep one's promises even in the state of nature (C 51). Shaftesbury was not the first to criticize social contract theories in this way, but his version of this criticism is stated very clearly and was probably among the most influential.  (See SC part 3, section 1; M part 3, section 4.)

Shaftesbury's positive political views emphasized the importance of liberty. He believed that totalitarianism made citizens less civil and increased the chances of violent conflict, while greater liberty made citizens more “polite” and peaceful. He thought, consequently, that government should grant its citizens broad freedom to publish what they wish and practice religion in the way they choose. (See SC passim; M part 2, Section 3.)

7. Aesthetics

Shaftesbury's aesthetic theory was one of the first and most influential produced by an English-speaking philosopher. Beauty, for Shaftesbury, is a kind of harmony, proportion, or order.  There is a sense in which it can be said that Shaftesbury believed that beauty is mind-dependent, in that he thought beauty is dependent on the mind of God, the artist-creator of the universe. But it is clear that Shaftesbury also thought that beauty is independent of human minds. The human responses that are the origin of human judgments of beauty are not the origin of beauty itself. (See SC part 4, section 3; M part 3, Section 2.)

Shaftesbury held that all beauty can be placed in a three-part hierarchy. The lowest order of beauty belongs to “the dead forms” — physical things such as manmade works of art and natural objects (C 323). The second order of beauty belongs to human minds, or “the forms which form, that is, which have intelligence, action, and operation” (Ibid).  The third order of beauty belongs to that “which forms not only such as we call mere forms but even the forms which form” (Ibid). This highest, most supreme and sovereign beauty, belongs to God, who has created everything in the world, including human minds. (See M part 1, section 3; M part 2, section 4; M part 3, section 2.)

Shaftesbury held that aesthetic appreciation is essentially disinterested. There has been some controversy about the sense in which Shaftesburean aesthetic judgment can be said to be disinterested. But it is clear enough that he thought that true aesthetic appreciation of an object (like the motivation underlying true moral conduct) is independent of any ideas of how the object might promote one's own interests. Establishing this non-egoistic position on aesthetic judgment would also be the main goal of Hutcheson in his Inquiry concerning Beauty. (See M part 3, section 2.)

Shaftesbury sometimes maintained that virtue is a species of beauty, or that virtue and beauty are “one and the same.”  He suggested that the positive reaction we have when observing a moral action or character is the same as (or one example of) the positive reaction we have when observing the beauty of nature or works of art, and that the motive to act virtuously is the same as (or one example of) an artist's motive to create beauty. Shaftesbury also said that the virtuous person is one who attempts to make her life a thing of moral beauty in the same way that an artist tries to make beautiful works of art. (See SC part 4, section 3; SA part 3, Section 3; IVM book 1, part 2, section 3; M part 2, section 1; M part 3, section 2.)

It is not entirely clear whether Shaftesbury thought that our aesthetic judgments originated in sentiment or in reason alone.  At certain points he suggested the former (C 172-3) and at other points he suggested the latter (C 330-332). It's possible that his views on this matter changed over time. However that may be, it's clear that Shaftesbury thought that our aesthetic judgments originated in a tendency that is instinctive or natural to all humans. He refrained from insisting on the “innateness” of this natural human tendency because he did not want to become entangled in the epistemological debate over innate ideas, although there can be little doubt that his own sympathies were with the anti-empiricist side of this debate. (See M part 3, section 2; LUP 404, 415)

But while Shaftesbury held that aesthetic judgment originated in an instinctive, natural human tendency, he also maintained that one needed training in order to make correct aesthetic judgments. A great deal of practice and study are needed in order to develop true discernment or “taste.”  The judgment of an accomplished critic is thus likely to be more natural than the judgment of an uneducated rustic. (See SA part 1, section 3; SA part 2, section 2; SA part 2, section 3; M part 3, section 2; Miscellaneous Reflections (MR) 3.)

8. Religion

Shaftesbury believed that everything in the world was created by a morally perfect God and that the world God created is the best of all possible ones. Any evil we observe, according to Shaftesbury, is only apparent or subordinate, not real or ultimate. It's no surprise, therefore, that Leibniz said of Shaftesbury's work, “I found in it almost all of my Theodicy before it saw the light of day…. If I had seen this work before my Theodicy was published, I should have profited as I ought and should have borrowed its great passages.”  (See LCE section 5; M part 1, sections 2; M part 1, section 3; M part 2, section 3; M part 2, section 4.) 

Shaftesbury based his belief in the existence of God on the argument for design (although at one point, C 306, he suggests that it is possible to give an a priori argument for the existence of God as well). He emphasized what he took to be the systematic nature of the universe. Everything in the universe fits together and works in perfect order, he argued, and so we can only conclude that the universe was created by a perfectly ordered, rational mind. Later versions of the argument from design, such as Paley's, are much indebted to Shaftesbury, and Hume's attack on the argument in his Dialogues concerning Natural Religion could have been aimed at Shaftesbury's Moralists just as easily as it could have been aimed at Butler's Analogy of Religion. (See M part 2, section 4; M part 2, section 5; M part 3, section 1.) 

Shaftesbury's emphasis on the orderly functioning of the universe led him to reject the traditional Christian view of miracles. He certainly did not think that miracles were needed to prove the existence of God. And he probably did not think that a perfectly ordered, rational mind, such as God's, would countenance miracles at all, as they constituted a violation of the natural order. Shaftesbury was somewhat circumspect, however, about issuing an outright denial of the miracles reported in the Bible. (See M part 2, section 5.)

Shaftesbury was a proponent of natural religion. He denied that humans need supernatural revelation in order to discover and realize what constitutes true religion. And he claimed that the Scriptures are not self-verifying and that we ought to accept only those parts that can withstand rational scrutiny. (See LCE section 4; SA part 3, section 1; M part 2; M part 2, section 5.)

It is difficult to find anything distinctively Christian in Shaftesbury's religious views. His theology seems to have more in common with ancient Greek philosophy than with any specifically Christian teaching. Shaftesbury was also highly critical of what he took to be the pernicious moral influence of certain Christian sects (such as Calvinism and other kinds of Puritanism) that emphasized the depravity of human nature and the jealousy of God.   He maintained that such religions were a worse moral influence than atheism, as the former corrupted humans’ moral sentiments while the latter neither helped nor harmed the cause of virtue. (See LCE section 4; LCE section 5; IVM book 1, part 3.)

Shaftesbury's natural religion had much in common with the views of the English Deists. But he differed from them in holding that the essence of religion is not merely dispassionate belief in a few rationally-established tenets but a feeling of expansive love for the universe as a whole. The truly religious frame of mind, for Shaftesbury, is that of reasonable enthusiasm. Shaftesbury took great pains to distinguish this kind of enthusiasm from false, non-rational enthusiasm, which leads to superstition, zealotry, fanaticism, and sectarian violence. Shaftesbury's reasonable enthusiasm is exemplified by Theocles, the hero of The Moralists, and it unites Shaftesbury's views of aesthetics, religion, and virtue. To truly appreciate the beauty of the world, for Shaftesbury, is to revere the world's Creator, which reverence also gives rise to love for all the Creator's creatures. (See LCE, passim; M part 1, section 3; M part 2, section 3; M part 3, section 2.)


Shaftesbury's Works

C Characteristics of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times, edited by Lawrence E. Klein, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
LCE Letter Concerning Enthusiasm (in C, pp. 4–28).
SC Sensus Communis: An Essay on the Freedom of Wit and Humour (in C, pp. 29–69).
SA Soliloquy, or Advice to an Author (in C, pp. 70–162).
IVM Inquiry Concerning Virtue or Merit (in C, pp. 163–230).
M The Moralists, a Philosophical Rhapsody (in C, pp. 231–338).
MR Miscellaneous Reflections (in C, pp. 339–483).
LUP The Life, Unpublished Letters and Philosophical Regimen of Anthony, Earl of Shaftesbury, edited by Benjamin Rand, London: Swan Sonnenschein, 1900.
* Second Characters or the Language of Forms by the Right Honourable Anthony, Early of Shaftesbury, edited by Benjamin Rand, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1914; reprinted, New York: Greenwood Press, 1969.
* Preface to Benjamin Whichcote, The Works, Volume III, New York & London: Garland Publishing, Inc., 1977.

Secondary Literature

Biography of Shaftesbury with extensive discussion of his thought as a whole:

Book length treatment of Shaftesbury's thought as a whole:

Detailed discussions of many aspects of Shaftesbury's philosophy and its historical context:

On Shaftesbury's account of morality:

On Shaftesbury's view of innate ideas:

On Shaftesbury's religious views:

On Shaftesbury's aesthetics:

On Shaftesbury's views of personal identity:

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

aesthetics: British, in the 18th century | contractarianism | creationism | deism | egoism | emotion: 17th and 18th century theories of | Hobbes, Thomas | Hume, David | Locke, John | Stoicism | teleology: teleological arguments for God's existence