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Paraconsistent Logic

First published Tue Sep 24, 1996; substantive revision Fri Mar 20, 2009

The contemporary logical orthodoxy has it that, from contradictory premises, anything can be inferred. To be more precise, let ⊨ be a relation of logical consequence, defined either semantically or proof-theoretically. Call ⊨ explosive if it validates {A , ¬A} ⊨ B for every A and B (ex contradictione quodlibet (ECQ)). The contemporary orthodoxy, i.e., classical logic, is explosive, but also some ‘non-classical’ logics such as intuitionist logic and most other standard logics are explosive.

The major motivation behind paraconsistent logic is to challenge this orthodoxy. A logical consequence relation, ⊨, is said to be paraconsistent if it is not explosive. Thus, if ⊨ is paraconsistent, then even if we are in certain circumstances where the available information is inconsistent, the inference relation does not explode into triviality. Thus, paraconsistent logic accommodates inconsistency in a sensible manner that treats inconsistent information as informative.

There are several reasons driving such motivation. The development of the systems of paraconsistent logic has depended on these. The prefix ‘para’ in English has two meanings: ‘quasi’ (or ‘similar to, modelled on’) or ‘beyond’. When the term ‘paraconsistent’ was coined by Miró Quesada at the Third Latin America Conference on Mathematical Logic in 1976, he seems to have had the first meaning in mind. Many paraconsistent logicians, however, have taken it to mean the second, which provided different reasons for the development of paraconsistent logic as we will see below.

This article is not meant to be a complete survey of paraconsistent logic. The modern history of paraconsistent logic maybe relatively short. Yet the development of the field has grown to the extent that a complete survey is impossible. The aim of this article is to provide some aspects and features of the field that are philosophically salient. This does not mean that paraconsistent logic has no mathematical significance or significance in such areas as computer science and linguistics. Indeed, the development of paraconsistent logic in the last two decades or so indicates that it has important applications in those areas. However, we shall tread over them lightly and focus more on the aspects that are of interest for philosophers and philosophically trained logicians.

1. Paraconsistency

A logic is said to be paraconsistent iff its logical consequence relation is not explosive. Paraconsistency is thus a property of a consequence relation and of a logic. In the literature, especially in the part of it that contains objections to paraconsistent logic, there has been some confusion over the definition of paraconsistency. So before going any further, we make one clarification.

Paraconsistency, so defined, is to do with the inference relation {A , ¬A} ⊨ B for every A and B (ex contradictione quodlibet (ECQ)). Dialetheism, on the other hand, is the view that there are true contradictions. If dialetheism is to be taken as a view that does not entail everything, then a dialehtiest's preferred logic must better be paraconsistent. For dialetheism is the view that some contradiction is true and it does not amount to trivialism which is the view that everything, including every contradiction, is true.

Now, a paraconsistent logician may feel the force pulling them towards dialetheism. Yet the view that a consequence relation should be paraconsistent does not entail the view that there are true contradictions. Paraconsistency is a property of an inference relation whereas dialetheism is a view about some sentences (or propositions, statements, utterances or whatever, that can be thought of as truth-bearers). The fact that one can define a non-explosive consequence relation does not mean that some sentences are true. That is, the fact that one can construct a model where a contradiction holds but not every sentence of the language holds (or, if the model theory is given intensionally, where this is the case at some world) does not mean that the contradiction is true per se. Hence paraconsistency must be distinguished from dialetheism.

Moreover, as we will see below, many paraconsistent logics validate the Law of Non-Contradiciton (LNC) (⊨ ¬(A ∧ ¬A)) even though they invalidate ECQ. In a discussion of paraconsistent logic, the primary focus is not the obtainability of contradictions but the explosive nature of a consequence relation.

2. Motivations

The reasons for paraconsistency that have been put forward seem specific to the development of the particular formal systems of paraconsistent logic. However, there are several general reasons for thinking that logic should be paraconsistent. Before we summarise the systems of paraconsistent logic and their motivations, we present some general motivations for paraconsisent logic.

2.1 Inconsistent but Non-Trivial Theories

A most telling reason for paraconsistent logic is the fact that there are theories which are inconsistent but non-trivial. Once we admit the existence of such theories, their underlying logics must be paraconsistent. Examples of inconsistent but non-trivial theories are easy to produce. An example can be derived from the history of science. (In fact, many examples can be given from this area.) Consider Bohr's theory of the atom. According to this, an electron orbits the nucleus of the atom without radiating energy. However, according to Maxwell's equations, which formed an integral part of the theory, an electron which is accelerating in orbit must radiate energy. Hence Bohr's account of the behaviour of the atom was inconsistent. Yet, patently, not everything concerning the behavior of electrons was inferred from it, nor should it have been. Hence, whatever inference mechanism it was that underlay it, this must have been paraconsistent.

2.2 Dialetheias (True Contradictions)

Despite the fact that dialetheism and paraconsistency needs to be distinguished, dialetheism can be a motivation for paraconsistent logic. If there are true contradictions (dialetheias), i.e., there are sentences, A, such that both A and ¬A are true, then some inferences of the form {A , ¬A} ⊨ B must fail. For only true, and not arbitrary, conclusions follow validly from true premises. Hence logic has to be paraconsistent. One candidate for a dialetheia is the liar paradox. Consider the sentence: ‘This sentence is not true’. There are two options: either the sentence is true or it is not. Suppose it is true. Then what it says is the case. Hence the sentence is not true. Suppose, on the other hand, it is not true. This is what it says. Hence the sentence is true. In either case it is both true and not true. (See the entry on dialetheism in this encyclopedia for further details.)

2.3 Automated Reasoning

Paraconsistent logic is motivated not only by philosophical considerations, but also by its applications and implications. One of the applications is automated reasoning (information processing). Consider a computer which stores a large amount of information. While the computer stores the information, it is also used to operate on it, and, crucially, to infer from it. Now it is quite common for the computer to contain inconsistent information, because of mistakes by the data entry operators or because of multiple sourcing. This is certainly a problem for database operations with theorem-provers, and so has drawn much attention from computer scientists. Techniques for removing inconsistent information have been investigated. Yet all have limited applicability, and, in any case, are not guaranteed to produce consistency. (There is no algorithm for logical falsehood.) Hence, even if steps are taken to get rid of contradictions when they are found, an underlying paraconsistent logic is desirable if hidden contradictions are not to generate spurious answers to queries.

2.4 Belief Revision

As a part of artificial intelligence research, belief revision is one of the areas that have been studied widely. Belief revision is the study of rationally revising bodies of belief in the light of new evidence. Notoriously, people have inconsistent beliefs. They may even be rational in doing so. For example, there may be apparently overwhelming evidence for both something and its negation. There may even be cases where it is in principle impossible to eliminate such inconsistency. For example, consider the ‘paradox of the preface’. A rational person, after thorough research, writes a book in which they claim A1,…, An. But they are also aware that no book of any complexity contains only truths. So they rationally believe ¬(A1 ∧…∧ An) too. Hence, principles of rational belief revision must work on inconsistent sets of beliefs. Standard accounts of belief revision, e.g., that of Gärdenfors et al., all fail to do this, since they are based on classical logic. A more adequate account is based on a paraconsistent logic.

2.5 Mathematical Significance

Another area of significance for paraconsistent logic concerns certain mathematical theories. Examples of such theories are formal semantics, set theory, and arithmetic. The latter concerns Gödel's Theorem.

Formal Semantics and Set Theory

Semantics is the study that aims to spell out a theoretical understanding of meaning. Most accounts of semantics insist that to spell out the meaning of a sentence is, in some sense, to spell out its truth-conditions. Now, prima facie at least, truth is a predicate characterised by the Tarski T-scheme:

T(A) ↔ A

where A is a sentence and A is its name. But given any standard means of self-reference, e.g., arithmetisation, one can construct a sentence, B, which says that ¬T(B). The T-scheme gives that T(B) ↔ ¬T(B). It then follows that T(B) ∧ ¬T(B). (This is, of course, just the liar paradox.)

The situation is similar in set theory. The naive, and intuitively correct, axioms of set theory are the Comprehension Schema and Extensionality Principle:


x(xyxz) → y = z

where x does not occur free in A. As was discovered by Russell, any theory that contains the Comprehension Schema is inconsistent. For putting ‘yy’ for A in the Comprehension Schema and instantiating the existential quantifier to an arbitrary such object ‘r’ gives:


So, instantiating the universal quantifier to ‘r’ gives:


It then follows that rrrr.

The standard approaches to these problems of inconsistency are, by and large, ones of expedience. However, a paraconsistent approach makes it possible to have theories of truth and sethood in which the mathematically fundamental intuitions about these notions are respected. For example, as Brady (1989) has shown, contradictions may be allowed to arise in a paraconsistent set theory, but these need not infect the whole theory.


Unlike formal semantics and set theory, there may not be any obvious arithmetical principles that give rise to contradiction. Nonetheless, just like the classical non-standard models of arithmetic, there is a class of inconsistent models of arithmetic (or more accurately models of inconsistent arithmetic) which have an interesting and important mathematical structure.

One interesting implication of the existence of inconsistent models of arithmetic is that some of them are finite (unlike the classical non-standard models). This means that there are some significant applications in the metamathematical theorems. For example, the classical Löwenheim-Skolem theorem states that Q (Robinson's arithmetic which is a fragment of Peano arithmetic) has models of every infinite cardinality but has no finite models. But, Q can be shown to have models of finite size too by referring to the inconsistent models of arithmetic.

Gödel’s Theorem

It is not only the Löwenheim-Skolem theorem but also other metamathematical theorems can be given a paraconsistent treatment. In the case of other theorems, however, the negative results that are often shown by the limitative theorems of metamathematics may no longer hold. One important such theorem is Gödel’s theorem.

One version of Gödel’s first incompleteness theorem states that for any consistent axiomatic theory of arithmetic, which can be recognised to be sound, there will be an arithmetic truth - viz., its Gödel sentence - not provable in it, but which can be established as true by intuitively correct reasoning. The heart of Gödel’s theorem is, in fact, a paradox that concerns the sentence, G, ‘This sentence is not provable’. If G is provable, then it is true and so not provable. Thus G is proved. Hence G is true and so unprovable. If an underlying paraconsistent logic is used to formalise the arithmetic, and the theory therefore allowed to be inconsistent, the Gödel sentence may well be provable in the theory (essentially by the above reasoning). So a paraconsistent approach to arithmetic overcomes the limitations of arithmetic that are supposed (by many) to follow from Gödel’s theorem. (For other ‘limitative’ theorems of metamathematics, see Priest 2002.)

3. A Brief History of ex contradictione quodlibet

It is now standard to view ex contradictione quodlibet as a valid form of inference. This contemporary view, however, should be put in a historical perspective. It was towards the end of the 19th century, when the study of logic achieved mathematical articulation, that an explosive logical theory became the standard. With the work of logicians such as Boole, Frege, Russell and Hilbert, classical logic became the orthodox logical account.

In antiquity, however, no one seems to have endorsed the validity of ECQ. Aristotle presented what is sometimes called the connexive principle: “it is impossible that the same thing should be necessitated by the being and by the not-being of the same thing.” (Prior Analytic II 4 57b3). (See the entry on connexive logic that has been developed based on this principle.) This principle became a topic of debates in the Middle Ages or Medieval time. Though the medieval debates seem to have been carried out in the context of conditionals, we can also see it as debates about consequences. The principle was taken up by Boethius (480–524 or 525) and Abelard (1079–1142), who considered two accounts of consequences. The first one is a familiar one: it is impossible for the premises to be true but conclusion false. The first account is thus similar to the contemporary notion of truth-preservation. The second one is less accepted recently: the sense of the premises contains that of the conclusion. This account, as in relevant logics, does not permit an inference whose conclusion is arbitrary. Abelard held that the first account fails to meet the connexive principle and that the second account (the account of containment) captured Aristotle's principle.

Abelard's position was shown to face a difficulty by Alberic of Paris in the 1130s. Most medieval logicians didn’t, however, abandon the account of validity based on containment or something similar. (See, for example, Martin 1987.) But one way to handle the difficulty is to reject the connexive principle. This approach, which has become most influential, was accepted by the followers of Adam Balsham or Parvipontanus (or sometimes known as Adam of The Little Bridge) (12th CE). The Parvipontanians embraced the truth-preservation account of consequences and the ‘paradoxes’ that are associated with it. In fact, it was a member of the Parvipontanians, William of Soissons, who discovered in the 12th century what we now call the C.I. Lewis (independent) argument for ECQ. (See Martin 1986.)

The containment account, however, did not disappear. John Duns Scotus (1266–1308) and his followers accepted the containment account (see Martin 1996). The Cologne School of the late 15th century argued against ECQ by rejecting disjunctive syllogism (see Sylvan 2000).

Now, the history of logic in the ‘East’, or more specifically Asia, is moot. There is a tendency, for example, in Jaina and Buddhist traditions to consider the possibility of statements being both true and false. Moreover, the logics developed by the major Buddhist logicians, Dignāga (5th century) and Dharmakīrti (7th century) do not embrace ECQ. Their logical account is, in fact, based on the ‘pervasion’ (Skt: vyāpti, Tib: khyab pa) relation among the elements of an argument. Just like the containment account of Abelard, there must be a tighter connection between the premises and conclusion than the truth-preservation account allows. (For the logic of Dharmakīrti and its subsequent development, see for example Dunne 2004 and Tillemans 1999.)

4. Modern History of Paraconsistent Logic

In the 20th century, the idea of challenging the explosive orthodoxy occurred to different people at different times and places independently of each other. They were often motivated by different considerations. The earliest paraconsistent logics in the contemporary era seem to have been given by two Russians. Starting about 1910, Vasil’év proposed a modified Aristotelian syllogistic including statements of the form: S is both P and not P. In 1929, Orlov gave the first axiomatisation of the relevant logic R which is paraconsistent. (On Vasil’év, see Arruda 1977 and Arruda 1989, pp. 102f. On Orlov, see Anderson, Belnap and Dunn 1992, p. xvii.)

The work of Vasil’év or Orlov did not make any impact at the time. The first (formal) logician to have developed paraconsistent logic was the Polish logician, Jaśkowski, who was a student of Łukasiewicz, who envisaged paraconsistent logic in his critique of Aristotle on LNC (Łukasiewicz 1951).

Paraconsistent logics were also developed in South America by Asenjo (1954) and da Costa (1963) in their doctoral dissertations. Since then, an active group of logicians has been working on paraconsistent logic in Brazil, especially in Campinas and in São Paulo.

Paraconsistent logics in the forms of relevant logics were proposed in England by Smiley in 1959 and also at about the same time, in a much more developed form, in the USA by Anderson and Belnap. An active group of relevant logicians grew up in Pittsburgh including Dunn and Meyer. The development of paraconsistent logics (in the form of relevant logics) was transported to Australia. R. Routley (later Sylvan) and V. Routley (later Plumwood) discovered an intentional semantics for some of Anderson/Belnap relevant logics. A school developed around them in Canberra which included Brady and Mortensen, and later Priest who, together with R. Routley, incorporated dialetheism to the development.

By the mid-1970s, the development of paraconsistent logic became international. In Belgium, a group of logicians around Batens in Ghent grew up and remains active. Paraconsistent logic is also actively investigated in Canada by Jennings, Schotch and their student Brown. In 1997, the First World Congress on Paraconsistency was held at the University of Ghent in Belgium. The Second World Congress was held in São Sebastião (São Paulo, Brazil) in 2000, the Third in Toulous (France) in 2003 and the Fourth in Melbourne (Australia) in 2008. We now see logicians working on paraconsistent logic in Bulgaria, China, France, Germany, Italy, Japan, New Zealand to name just a few.

5. Systems of Paraconsistent Logic

A number of formal techniques to invalidate ECQ have been devised. Most of the techniques have been summarised elsewhere, for example Brown 2002 and Priest 2002. As the interest in paraconsistent logic grew, different techniques developed in different parts of the world. As a result, the development of the techniques has somewhat a regional flavour (though there are, of course, exceptions, and the regional differences can be over-exagerated). (See Tanaka 2003.)

Most paraconsistent logicians do not propose a wholesale rejection of classical logic. They usually accept the validity of classical inferences in consistent contexts. It is the need to isolate an inconsistency without spreading everywhere that motivates the rejection of ECQ. Depending on how much revision one thinks is needed, we have a technique for paraconsistency. The taxonomy given here is based on the degree of revision to classical logic. Since the logical novelty can be seen at the propositional level, we will concentrate on the propositional paraconsistent logics.

5.1 Discussive Logic

The first formal paraconsistent logic to have been developed was discussive (or discursive) logic by the Polish logician Jaśkowski (1948). The thought behind discussive logic is that, in a discourse, each participant puts forward some information, beliefs or opinions. Each assertion is true according to the participant who puts it forward in a discourse. But what is true in a discourse on whole is the sum of assertions put forward by participants. Each participant's opinions may be self-consistent, yet may be inconsistent with those of others. Jaśkowski formalised this idea in the form of discussive logic.

A formalisation of discussive logic is by means of modelling a discourse in a modal logic. For simplicity, Jaśkowski chose S5. We think of each participant’s belief set as the set of sentences true at a world in a S5 model M. Thus, a sentence A asserted by a participant in a discourse is interpreted as “it is possible that A” (◊A). That is, a sentence A of discussive logic can be translated into a sentence ◊A of S5. Then A holds in a discourse iff A is true at some world in M. Since A may hold in one world but not in another, both A and ¬A may hold in a discourse. Indeed, one should expect that participants disagree on some issue in a rational discourse.

To be more precise, let d be a translation function from a formula of discussive logic into a formula of S5. Then (p)d = ◊p. For complex formulas

A)d = ¬(Ad)
(AB)d = AdBd
(AB)d = AdBd
(AB)d = AdBd
(AB)d = AdBd

It is easy to show that B is a discussive consequence of A1, …, An iff the formula ◊A1d ⊃ (… ⊃ (◊And ⊃ ◊Bd)…) is a theorem of S5.

To see that discussive logic is paraconsistent, consider a S5 model, M, such that A holds at w1, ¬A holds at a different world w2 but B does not hold at any world for some B. Then both A and ¬A hold, yet B does not hold in M. Hence discussive logic invalidates ECQ.

However, there is no S5 model where A ∧ ¬A holds at some world. So an inference of the form {A ∧ ¬A} ⊨ B is valid in discussive logic. This means that, in discussive logic, adjunction ({A, ¬A} ⊨ A ∧ ¬A) fails. But one can define a discussive conjunction, ∧d, as A ∧ ◊B (or ◊AB). Then adjunction holds for ∧d (Jaśkowski 1949).

One difficulty is a formulation of a conditional. In S5, the inference from ◊p and ◊(pq) to ◊q fails. Jaśkowski chose to introduce a connective which he called discussive implication, ⊃d, defined as ◊AB. This connective can be understood to mean that “if some participant states that A, then B”. As the inference from ◊AB and ◊A to ◊B is valid in S5, modus ponens for ⊃d holds in discussive logic. A discussive bi-implication, ≡d, can also be defined as (◊AB) ∧ ◊(◊AB) (or ◊(◊AB) ∧ (◊AB)).

5.2 Non-Adjunctive Systems

A non-adjunctive system is a system that does not validate adjunction (i.e., {A, B} ⊭ AB). As we saw above, discussive logic without a discussive conjunction is non-adjunctive. Another non-adjunctive strategy was suggested by Rescher and Manor 1970-71. In effect, we can conjoin premises, but only up to maximal consistency. Specifically, if Σ is a set of premises, a maximally consistent subset is any consistent subset Σ′ such that if A ∈ Σ − Σ′ then Σ′ ∪ {A} is inconsistent. Then we say that A is a consequence of Σ iff A is a classical consequence of Σ′ for some maximally consistent subset Σ′. Then {p, q} ⊨ pq but {p, ¬p} ⊭ p ∧ ¬p.

5.3 Preservationism

In the non-adjunctive system of Rescher and Manor, a consequence relation is defined over some maximally consistent subset of the premises. This can be seen as a way to ‘measure’ the level of consistency in the premise set. The level of {p, q} is 1 since the maximally consistent subset is the set itself. The level of {p, ¬p}, however, is 2: {p} and {¬p}.

If we define a consequence relation over some maximally consistent subset, then the relation can be thought of as preserving the level of consistent fragments. This is the approach which has come to be called preservationism. It was first developed by the Canadian logicians Ray Jennings and Peter Scotch.

To be more precise, a (finite) set of formulas, Σ, can be partitioned into classically consistent fragments whose union is Σ. Let ⊢ be the classical consequence relation. A covering of Σ is a set {Σi : iI}, where each member is consistent, and Σ = iI Σi. The level of Σ, l(Σ), is the least n such that Σ can be partitioned into n sets if there is such n, or ∞ if there is no such n. A consequence relation, called forcing, [⊢, is defined as follows. Σ [⊢ A iff l(Σ) = ∞, or l(Σ) = n and for every covering of size n there is a jI such that ΣjA. If l(Σ) = 1 or ∞ then the forcing relation coincides with classical consequence relation. In case where l(Σ) = ∞, there must be a sentence of the form A ∧ ¬A and so the forcing relation explodes.

A chunking strategy has also been applied to capture the inferential mechanism underlying some theories in science and mathematics. In mathematics, the best available theory concerning infinitesimals was inconsistent. In the infinitesimal calculus of Leibniz and Newton, in the calculation of a derivative infinitesimals had to be both zero and non-zero. In order to capture the inference mechanism underlying the infinitesimal calculus of Leibniz and Newton (and Bohr’s theory of the atom), we need to add to the chunking a mechanism that allows a limited amount of information to flow between the consistent fragments of these inconsistent but non-trivial theories. That is, certain information from one chunk may permeate into other chunks. The inference procedure underlying the theories must be Chunk and Permeate.

Let C = {Σi : iI} and ρ a permeability relation on C such that ρ is a map from I × I to subsets of formulas of the language. If i0I, then any structure ⟨C, ρ, i0⟩ is called a C&P structure on Σ. If B is a C&P structure on Σ, we define the C&P consequences of Σ with respect to B, as follows. For each i ∈ Σ, a set of sentences, Σin , is defined by recursion on n:


That is, Σin+1     comprises the consequences from Σin   together with the information that permeates into chunk i from the other chunk at level n. We then collect up all finite stages:


The C&P consequences of Σ can be defined in terms of the sentences that can be inferred in the designated chunk i0 when all appropriate information has been allowed to flow along the permeability relations. (See Brown and Priest 2004.)

5.4 Adaptive Logics

One may think not only that an inconsistency needs to be isolated but also that a serious need for the consideration of inconsistencies is a rare occurrence. The thought may be that consistency is the norm until proven otherwise: we should treat a sentence or a theory as consistently as possible. This is essentially the motivation for adaptive logics, pioneered by Diderik Batens in Belgium.

An adaptive logic is a logic that adapts itself to the situation at the time of application of inference rules. It models the dynamics of our reasoning. There are two senses in which reasoning is dynamic: external and internal. Reasoning is externally dynamic if as new information becomes available expanding the premise set, consequences inferred previously may have to be withdrawn. The external dynamics is thus the non-monotonic character of some consequence relations: Γ ⊢ A and Γ ∪ Δ ⊬ A for some Γ, Δ and A. However, even if the premise-set remains constant, some previously inferred conclusion may considered as not derivable at a later stage. As our reasoning proceeds from a premise set, we may encounter a situation where we infer a consequence provided that no abnormality, in particular no contradiction, obtains at some stage of the reasoning process. If we are forced to infer a contradiction at a later stage, our reasoning has to adapt itself so that an application of the previously used inference rule is withdrawn. In such a case, reasoning is internally dynamic. Our reasoning may be internally dynamic if the set of valid inferences is not recursively enumerable (i.e., there is no decision procedure that leads to ‘yes’ after finitely many steps if the inference is indeed valid). It is the internal dynamics that adaptive logics are devised to capture.

In order to illustrate the idea behind adaptive logics, consider the premise set Γ = {p, q, ¬pr, ¬rs, ¬s}. One may start reasoning with p and ¬pr. Provided that p ∧ ¬p does not obtain at some stage in the reasoning process, DS can be applied to derive r. Now, we can apply DS to ¬rs and r to derive s provided that s ∧ ¬s does not obtain. However, by conjoining s and ¬s, we can obtain s ∧ ¬s. Hence we must withdraw the application of DS to ¬rs and r so that s would not be a consequence of this reasoning process. A consequence of this reasoning is what cannot be defeated at any stage of the process.

A system of adaptive logic can generally be characterised as consisting of three elements:

  1. A lower limit logic (LLL)
  2. A set of abnormalities
  3. An adaptive strategy

LLL is the part of an adaptive logic that is not subject to adaptation. It consists essentially of a number of inferential rules (and/or axioms) that one is happy to accept regardless of the situation in a reasoning process. A set of abnormalities is a set of formulas that are presupposed as not holding (or as absurd) at the beginning of reasoning until they are shown to be otherwise. For many adaptive logics, a formula in this set is of the form A ∧ ¬A. An adaptive strategy specifies a strategy of handling the applications of inference rules based on the set of abnormalities. If LLL is extended with the requirement that no abnormality is logically possible, one obtains the upper limit logic (ULL). ULL essentially contains not only the inferential rules (and/or axioms) of LLL but also supplementary rules (and/or axioms) that can be applied in the absence of abnormality, such as DS. By specifying these three elements, one obtains a system of adaptive logic.

5.5 Logics of Formal Inconsistency

The approaches taken for motivating the systems of paraconsistent logic which we have so far seen isolate inconsistency from consistent parts of the given theory. The aim is to retain as much classical machinery as possible in developing a system of paraconsistent logic which, nonetheless, avoids explosion when faced with a contradiction. One way to make this aim explicit is to extend the expressive power of our language by encoding the metatheoretical notions of consistency (and inconsistency) in the object language. The Logics of Formal Inconsistency (LFIs) are a family of paraconsistent logics that constitute consistent fragments of classical logic yet which reject explosion principle where a contradiction is present. The investigation of this family of logics was initiated by Newton da Costa in Brazil.

An effect of encoding consistency (and inconsistency) in the object language is that we can explicitly separate inconsistency from triviality. With a language rich enough to express inconsistency (and consistency), we can study inconsistent theories without assuming that they are necessarily trivial. This makes it explicit that the presence of a contradiction is a separate issue from the non-trivial nature of paraconsistent inferences.

The thought behind LFIs is that we should respect classical logic as much as possible. It is only when there is a contradiction that logic should deviate from it. This means that we can admit the validity of ECQ in the absence of contradictions. In order to do so, we encode ‘consistency’ into our object language by circ. Then ⊢ is a consequence relation of an LFI iff

  1. ∃Γ∃AB(Γ, A, ¬AB) and
  2. ∀Γ∀AB(Γ, circA, A, ¬AB).

Let ⊢C be the classical consequence (or derivability) relation and circ(Γ) express the consistency of the set of formulas Γ such that if circA and circB then circ(A * B) where * is any two place logical connective. Then we can capture derivability in the consistent context in terms of the equivalence: ∀Γ∀B∃Δ(Γ ⊢C B iff circ(Δ), Γ ⊢ B).

Now take the positive fragment of classical logic with modus ponens plus double negation elimination (¬¬AA) as an axiom and some axioms governing circ:

circA → (A → (¬AB))
(circAcircB) → circ(AB)
(circAcircB) → circ(AB)

Then ⊢ provides da Costa’s system C1. If we let A1 abbreviate the formula ¬(A ∧ ¬A) and An+1 the formula (¬(An ∧ ¬An))1, then we obtain Ci for each natural number i greater than 1.

To obtain da Costa’s system Cω, instead of the positive fragment of classical logic, we start with positive intuitionist logic instead. Ci systems for finite i do not rule out (An ∧ ¬AnAn+1) from holding in a theory. By going up the hierarchy to ω, Cω rules out this possibility. Note, however, that Cω is not a LFC as it does not contain classical positive logic.

For the semantics for da Costa’s C-systems, see for example da Costa and Alves 1977 and Loparic 1977.

5.6 Many-Valued Logics

Perhaps the simplest way of generating a paraconsistent logic, first proposed by Asenjo in his PhD dissertation, is to use a many-valued logic. Classically, there are exactly two truth values. The many-valued approach is to drop this classical assumption and allow more than two truth values. The simplest strategy is to use three truth values: true (only), false (only) and both (true and false) for the evaluations of formulas. The truth tables for logical connectives, except conditional, can be given as follows:

t f
b b
f t
t b f
t t b f
b b b f
f f f f
t b f
t t t t
b t b b
f t b f

These tables are essentially those of Kleene’s and Łukasiewicz’s three valued logics where the middle value is thought of as indeterminate or neither (true nor false).

For a conditional ⊃, following Kleene’s three valued logic, we might specify a truth table as follows:

t b f
t t b f
b t b b
f t t t

Let t and b be the designated values. These are the values that are preserved in valid inferences. If we define a consequence relation in terms of preservation of these designated values, then we have the paraconsistent logic LP of Priest 1979. In LP, ECQ is invalid. To see this, we assign b to p and f to q. Then ¬p is also evaluated as b and so both p and ¬p are designated. Yet q is not evaluated as having a designated value. Hence ECQ is invalid in LP.

As we can see, LP invalidates ECQ by assigning a designated value, both true and false, to a contradiction. Thus, LP departs from classical logic more so than the systems that we have seen previously. But, more controversially, it is also naturally aligned with dialetheism. However, we can interpret truth values not in an aletheic sense but in an epistemic sense: truth values (or designated values) express epistemic or doxastic commitments. (See for example Belnap 1992.) Or we might think that the value both is needed for a semantic reason: we might be required to express the contradictory nature of some of our beliefs, assertions and so on. (See Dunn 1976, p. 157.) If these interpretative strategy is successful, we can separate LP from necessarily falling under dialetheism.

One feature of LP which requires some attention is that in LP modus ponens comes out to be invalid. For if p is both true and false but q false (only), then pq is both true and false and hence is designated. So both p and pq are designated, yet the conclusion q is not. Hence modus ponens for ⊃ is invalid in LP. (One way to rectify the problem is to add an appropriate conditional connective as we will see in the section on relevant logics.)

Another way to develop a many-valued paraconsistent logic is to think of an assignment of a truth value not as a function but as a relation. Let P be the set of propositional parameters. Then an evaluation, η, is a subset of P × {0, 1}. A proposition may only relate to 1 (true), it may only relate to 0 (false), it may relate to both 1 and 0 or it may relate to neither 1 nor 0. The evaluation is extended to a relation for all formulas by the following recursive clauses:

¬1 iff 0
¬0 iff 1

A1 iff 1 and 1
A0 iff 0 or 0

A1 iff 1 or 1
A0 iff 0 and 0

If we define validity in terms of truth preservation under all relational evaluations then we obtain First Degree Entailment (FDE) which is a fragment of relevant logics. These relational semantics for FDE are due to Dunn 1976.

5.7 Relevant Logics

The approaches to paraconsistency we have examined above all focus on the inevitable presence or the truth of some contradictions. A rejection of ECQ, in these approaches, depends on an analysis of the premises containing a contradiction. One might think that the real problem with ECQ is not to do with the contradictory premises but to do with the lack of connection between the premises and the conclusion. The thought is that the conclusion must be relevant to the premises in a valid inference.

Relevant logics were pioneered in order to study the relevance of the conclusion with respect to the premises by Anderson and Belnap (1975) in Pittsburgh. Anderson and Belnap motivated the development of relevant logics using natural deduction systems; yet they developed a family of relevant logics in axiomatic systems. As development proceeded and was carried out also in Australia, more focus was given to the semantics.

The semantics for relevant logics were developed by Fine (1974), Routley and Routley (1972), Routley and Meyer (1993) and Urquhart (1972). (There are also algebraic semantics. See for example Dunn and Restall 2002, pp. 48ff.) In the Routleys-Meyer semantics, based on possible-world semantics (which is the most studied semantics for relevant logics, especially in Australia), conjunction and disjunction behave in the usual way. But each world, w, has an associate world, w*, and negation is evaluated in terms of w*: ¬A is true at w iff A is false, not at w, but at w*. Thus, if A is true at w, but false at w*, then A ∧ ¬A is true at w. To obtain the standard relevant logics, one needs to add the constraint that w** = w. As is clear, negation in these semantics is an intensional operator.

The primary concern with relevant logics is not so much with negation as with a conditional connective → (satisfying modus ponens). In relevant logics, if AB is a logical truth, then A is relevant to B, in the sense that A and B share at least one propositional variable.

Semantics for the relevant conditional are obtained by furnishing each Routleys-Meyer model with a ternary relation. In the simplified semantics of Priest and Sylvan 1992 and Restall 1993 and 1995, worlds are divided into normal and non-normal. If w is a normal world, AB is true at w iff at all worlds where A is true, B is true. If w is non-normal, AB is true at w iff for all x, y, such that Rwxy, if A is true at x, B is true at y. If B is true at x but not at y where Rwxy, then BB is not true at w. Then one can show that A → (BB) is not a logical truth. (Validity is defined as truth preservation over normal worlds.) This gives the basic relevant logic, B. Stronger logics, such as the logic R, are obtained by adding constraints on the ternary relation.

There are also versions of world-semantics for relevant logics based on Dunn’s relational semantics for FDE. Then negation is extensional. A conditional connective, now needs to be given both truth and falsity conditions. So we have: AB is true at w iff for all x, y, such that Rwxy, if A is true at x, B is true at y; and AB is false at w iff for some x, y, such that Rwxy, if A is true at x, B is false at y. Adding various constraints on the ternary relation provides stronger logics. However, these logics are not the standard relevant logics developed by Anderson and Belnap. To obtain the standard family of relevant logics, one needs neighbourhood frames. (See Mares 2004.) Further details concerning relevant logics can be found in the article on that topic in this encyclopedia.


For Paraconsistency in general:

For Inconsistent but Non-Trivial Theories

On Dialetheism

For Automated Reasoning

For Belief Revision

For Mathematical Significance

For a History of ex contradictione quodlibet

For Modern History of Paraconsistent Logic

For the Systems of Paraconsistent Logic in general

For Discussive Logic

For Non-Adjunctive Systems

For Preservationism

For Adaptive Logics

For Logics of Formal Inconsistency

For Many-Valued Logics

For Relevant Logics

Other Works Cited

Other Internet Resources

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Related Entries

dialetheism [dialethism] | logic: many-valued | logic: relevance | logic: substructural | mathematics: inconsistent | Sorites paradox