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Spinoza's Modal Metaphysics

First published Tue Aug 21, 2007

Spinoza's views on necessity and possibility, which he claimed were the “principal basis” of his Ethics (Ep75), have been less than well-received by his readers, to put it mildly. From Spinoza's contemporaries to our own, readers of the Ethics have denounced Spinoza's views on modality as metaphysically confused at best, ethically nihilistic at worst.[1] But to express matters this way implies that there is a consensus on Spinoza's metaphysics of modality and that interpreters differ only to the extent to which they distance themselves from his outrageous position. Of course, a cursory reading of certain passages of the Ethics supports the belief that, if Spinoza is clear anywhere, it is surely in his views of necessity and contingency. After all, this is the philosopher who claimed that “in nature there is nothing contingent, but all things have been determined from the necessity of the divine nature to exist and produce an effect in a certain way” (EIp29) and that “things could have been produced by God in no other way, and in no other order than they have been produced” (EIp33). Passages such as these suggest prima facie that Spinoza was a necessitarian, according to whom falsity and impossibility are co-extensive. The actual world, we might now say, is the only possible world. Events could not, in the strongest sense of that expression, have gone any differently than they in fact have gone.

And yet, such a picture of the interpretive landscape would be quite misleading. Spinoza studies have seen a renaissance of interest in his views on modality, spawning in recent years many full-length articles devoted to his modal views, plus the customary chapter devoted to modality in the numerous book-length treatments of Spinoza in the same time frame — not to mention the scattered discussions and exchanges in articles and books dedicated to other topics in Spinoza.[2] From this boon of research and interest (relative to Spinoza studies), considerable disagreement has emerged about just what Spinoza's modal commitments are. Much of this disagreement stems, in part, from larger interpretive disagreements about more general aspects of Spinoza's metaphysics. Hence by examining Spinoza's views on modality, we will also explore in greater detail a number of his most central metaphysical commitments.

After a brief introduction, I will begin by considering Spinoza's conclusions about the modal status of substances: all possible substances necessarily exist. This will be examined alongside his famous belief in substance monism: there is only one possible substance, God. I will then turn to Spinoza's account of modes, his category for everything that exists besides God. I will then discuss Spinoza's views on the modality of modes, with special attention to the vexed question of what Spinoza believes about the modal status of everyday objects like tables and persons. Resolving this matter will ultimately lead us deep into the heart of Spinoza's metaphysics, including his views on causation, inherence, God, ontological plenitude, the principle of sufficient reason, and even the nature of modality itself. (To avoid confusion upfront: throughout this article, by “modality” and “modal status” I mean things having to do with necessity, possibility, and contingency. On the other hand, by “modes” I will be referring to one of the basic categories of Spinoza's ontology, namely, modes. )

[Note: All references to the Ethics will use the form of PartTypeNumberSubtype (so “Ip4d” means Part One, Proposition Four, Demonstration). Other variants of types include “d” for definition, “ax” for axiom, and “le” for lemma. Other subtypes include “s” for scholium and “c” for corollary. Other citations from Spinoza are cited by page number in Edwin Curley's Collected Works, from which almost all translations are taken. The exceptions are Spinoza's letters, which are given their standard number (e.g., Ep75) and are taken from Samuel Shirley's translation.)

1. Introduction

If we were to ask Spinoza for his list of basic types of existing things, his response would be exceedingly brief: substances and modes (Ip4d).[3] If we were to then ask Spinoza how many existing tokens fell under each of these two basic types, he would give us two extremely different, but equally striking answers. There is only one existing substance, God, and there are an infinite number of modes. Without yet trying to unpack these claims, we might press Spinoza, “But could have been more substances or fewer modes than there in fact are?” Or, keeping the number of tokens the same, we might ask, “Could there have been a different substance or different modes than the ones that in fact exist?” Surprisingly, Spinoza seems inclined to answer “no” to all of these questions. If so, then the actual world is the only possible world. This is the position of necessitarianianism, a belief that very few people in the history of western philosophy have explicitly embraced. And for good reason — on the face of it, necessaritianism is highly counterintuitive. Surely the world could have gone slightly differently than it has gone. (Couldn't the Allies have lost WWII? Couldn't the leaf have landed an eighth of a centimeter farther to the right?) And surely the world could have contained different individuals in different numbers than it in fact contains. (Couldn't I have had a sister or not been born at all?)

Spinoza is not unaware of how deeply against the grain of common sense the truth of necessitarianism would run. So if he nonetheless believed in its truth, he must have thought he had very compelling reasons for doing so. What might such reasons be? We will work our way up to an account of why Spinoza was at least attracted to this striking modal conclusion by beginning with substances and then turning to modes. However, as we dig deeper into his ontology, we will see that there also appear to be good Spinozistic reasons for thinking that he did not intend to endorse necessitarianism. This will quickly lead us deep into the middle of an interpretive controversy that has ramifications for how we should understand many of Spinoza's other central metaphysical views. In the final section (4), we will look at one possible way of trying to consistently reconcile Spinoza's drive towards necessitarianism with what might have been equally important reasons for resisting such a strong conclusion.

2. Substances

In the case of substances, Spinoza claims that all existing substances necessarily exist (Ip7). No existing substance could have failed to exist. He also claims that only one substance, namely God, actually exists and that only this one substance could have existed (Ip14). Putting these claims together, we can see that Spinoza believes that all possible substances necessarily exist. Since God is the only possible substance, it is impossible for any other substance besides God to exist. As we might now state his conclusion: with respect to substances, the actual world with its one substance is the only possible world.

Spinoza's argument for this conclusion has two major stages:

  1. All possible substances necessarily exist.
  2. God is the only possible substance.

Let us consider Spinoza's reasoning for each of these steps in turn, as doing so will help us understand some of Spinoza's most important and basic metaphysical commitments.

In arguing for (1), Spinoza relies on two implicit, though related premises. One is the principle of sufficient reason (PSR) and the other involves his understanding of causation. Put roughly, the PSR states that every fact has a reason for its truth. (So if there are such things as negative facts that do not supervene on positive facts, such as the fact that there is no unicorn in my office, the truth of that negative fact must also have a reason according to the PSR). Most relevantly for our purposes, if something existed for no reason at all, the fact that it exists would be inexplicable, a violation for the PSR. And for parallel reasons, if something did not exist and there was no reason for its non-existence, the fact of its non-existence would be equally inexplicable. As Spinoza puts it, “For each thing there must be assigned a cause or reason, both for its existence and for its non-existence. For example, if a triangle exists, there must be a reason or cause why it exists; but if it does not exist, there must also be a reason or cause which prevents it from existing, or which takes its existence away” (Ip11d). Thus, according to the PSR, there must be reasons why each existing substance exists and also reasons why each non-existing substance does not exist.

The second implicit premise of Spinoza's argument for the claim that all possible substances necessarily exist is that causes provide sufficient explanatory reasons. This comes across in the previously quoted passage, in which Spinoza appeals to a “cause or [sive] reason” as a sufficient explanation for facts about the existence and non-existence of a triangular object. Applied to the case of substance, the sufficient reason for why a substance exists can be supplied by the causes of that substance.

Why does Spinoza think that an account of an object's causes provides a sufficient reason or explanation for that object's existence? His most revealing motivation traces back to the PSR as well. Because facts about the nature of causation itself are themselves facts, by the PSR facts about causation require explanation. So in the case in which x causes y, what is it in virtue of which the causal relation between x and y obtains? Although we may try to answer this question by appealing to other causes (say, z‘s causing x to cause y), the PSR demands an account of what it is in virtue of which x and y are causally related, as opposed to being merely sequentially ordered (or an account of why mere sequential ordering is sufficient for causal relatedness). That is, the PSR applies not only to facts about existence, but also to facts about relations between existents. (This point will be extremely important for correctly understanding Spinoza's modal theory in section 4.1 below.) The PSR asks not only for an explanation of the fact that x causes y in terms of prior first-order causes, but also for an explanation of why there is a causal relation of dependence between x and y and why it is not some other kind of relation. (Depending on one's account of explanation, these two conjuncts may not represent additional explanatory demands.) As it would not get us very far to answer by appealing to yet further first-order causal relations, the PSR is really asking us to give an account of causation itself. Causation, if the PSR is true, cannot be a primitive metaphysical relation unless there is a further reason for why causation is a primitive metaphysical relation. So, to echo a question that lingers today, just what is causation? (For more on the contemporary discussion, see the metaphysics of causation).

There is no indication that Spinoza thought there was a principled reason for keeping causation as a metaphysical primitive; instead, he provides an account of causation in terms of something else. In Id1, Spinoza defines self-causation (causa sui) as “that whose essence involves existence or [sive] that whose nature cannot be conceived except as existing.” (Spinoza's sive should not be read in a disjunctive sense; what follows the “or” is generally a fuller account of what precedes it. Think of it as an “or better yet…”) Expanding his definition to cover causation in general, Spinoza's idea is that causation is a matter of conceptual connection. If x causes y, this fact obtains in virtue of a conceptual connection between the concept of x and the concept of y.[4] Spinoza frequently suggests that the conceptual connection or conceiving through relation is the paradigm of explanation (e.g., Iax5, IIp5, IIp7s). If so, then we can understand why Spinoza thinks causes can serve as sufficient explanatory reasons for facts about existence. If causal relations are grounded in conceptual relations, and conceptual relations are paradigms of explanation, then to give an account of an object's existence in terms of its causes is to explain the fact that it exists in just the way the PSR demands.

Let us apply this point to the case of substances. Spinoza reasons that existing substances exist in virtue of having causes that bring about and explain their existence and non-existing substances do not exist in virtue of causes that prevent their existence and explain their non-existence (Ip14). According to Spinoza's account of causation, this means that existing substances exist in virtue of conceptual relations to whatever explains their existence, and similarly, conceptual relations explain the non-existence of non-existing substances. So what causes or explains the existence or non-existence of a substance?

Spinoza argues that substances cannot be caused to exist or be prevented from existing by other substances or by any modes (Ip6), the only two types of existing things. But since all existing substances must nonetheless have causes and reasons for their existence, the fact that a substance exists must be explained entirely by the substance itself. That is, all existing substances must be self-caused and hence self-explained. For parallel reasons, the non-existence of a non-existing substance must be explained solely through facts about the non-existing substance. Hence, Spinoza infers, the concepts of non-existing substances must include the explanation for their own non-existence. What about the concept of a non-existing substance could explain that substance's non-existence? Spinoza's answer: a self-contradiction. Non-existing substances do not exist for the same reason that squared circles do not exist in Euclidean space: they are conceptually impossible (Ip11d). From the fact of non-existence plus the PSR, Spinoza concludes that all non-existing substances do not exist because they are each impossible. They cannot cause themselves to exist because their very concepts contain a contradiction, and facts about causation track facts about conceptual involvement and explanation.

So, returning to our opening questions, could there have been more substances than there in fact are? Spinoza's answer is no, which means that there could not be any merely possible substances. A substance either exists or its existence is impossible. But could an existing substance have failed to exist? Again, Spinoza's answer is no, since the only available explanatory basis for possible non-existence would be facts about the substance itself. But if an existing substance is completely causally isolated, what could bring about its non-existence? Only itself, Spinoza answers, which would again amount to the concept of that substance containing an internal contradiction that would prevent such a substance from existing in the first place (Ip7). But could an existing substance exist for a certain length of time and then go out of existence (putting aside larger worries about the relation of substances to time)? Spinoza's answer is again no, since that would mean that an existing substance causes its own self-destruction, a violation of Spinoza's doctrine that “No thing can be destroyed except through an external cause” (IIIp4). In reaching all of these conclusions, Spinoza relies on the entirely self-explaining or self-causing nature of substances and the explanatory demands of the PSR. Therefore, he concludes, for any existing substance, it could not have failed to exist nor can it cease to exist. So if a substance exists, it necessarily exists (Ip7d). On the other hand, if a substance does not exist, its existence is impossible. Combining these conclusions, we reach (1): all possible substances necessarily exist.

The second major stage of Spinoza's argument is to prove that God is the only possible substance. I will not here rehearse all the details of Spinoza's argument to this conclusion. But, like his argument for (1), Spinoza's argument for (2) relies on an unrestricted version of the PSR. Here is a very generalized sketch of the main argument:

  1. The concept of God is the concept of the most real and most perfect substance with the most power and reason to exist [Id6, Ip9, and Ip11d];
  2. The concept of God is internally consistent [assumption]
  3. At least one substance exists [by Iax1, Ip1, and Ip11d];[5]
  4. It would be inexplicable if the internally consistent concept of the most real being with the most power and most reason for existing was not instantiated while the concept of a less powerful substance with less power and less reason for existing was instantiated [Ip11d].
  5. Nothing is inexplicable [PSR].
  6. All possible substances necessarily exist [(1) above];
  7. The existence of God and the existence of other substances are not compossible [Id6, Ip5, and (8)];
  8. Therefore, the concept of God is instantiated [by (3-7)].
  9. Therefore, God is a possible substance [by 10].
  10. Therefore, God necessarily exists [by 8 and 11].
  1. Therefore, God is the only possible substance [by 9 and 12].[6]

Of all these steps, premise (4) is the one for which Spinoza seems to offer the least justification:

Since, then, there can be, outside the divine nature, no reason or cause which takes away the divine existence, the reason [for its non-existence] will necessarily have to be in his nature itself, if indeed he does not exist. That is, his nature would involve a contradiction. But it is absurd to affirm this of a Being absolutely infinite and supremely perfect (Ip11d, emphasis mine).

The absurdity Spinoza points to is actually the absurdity of the non-existence of a being according to whose concept it is infinite and supremely perfect. But why should we believe that the concept of Spinoza's God is internally consistent? If Spinoza fails to justify this premise, his ontological argument would fall victim to Leibniz's complaint that even if otherwise successful, all (pre-Leibnizian!) ontological arguments only prove a hypothetical truth: if God is a possible substance, then God necessarily exists. Spinoza's argument, absent a justification of (4), fails to prove the possibility of God (11) before asserting the necessity of God's existence (12).

Even worse, Spinoza faces an especially thorny problem in justifying (4). For his account of the concept of God in (3) relies on commitments that even others friendly to theism, such as Descartes, would reject. Spinoza defines God in Id6 as “a substance consisting of an infinity of attributes, of which each one expresses an eternal and infinite essence.” Spinoza then claims in Ip9, without any explicit argument, that “The more reality or being each thing [unaquaeque res] has, the more attributes belong to it.” But both this definition of God and the supporting principle in Ip9 were controversial even in Spinoza's own context. According to Descartes, a substance cannot have more than one (principal) attribute.[7] To say that the concept of God is the concept of a substance with multiple principle attributes is, in fact, to appeal to an internally inconsistent concept. So, the charge runs, not only has Spinoza failed to justify (4), but (3) is outright false.

Spinoza's defense of (3) would likely be to appeal to the self-containment of each attribute (Ip10). Like substance, each attribute is wholly self-contained and an entirely self-sufficient way of conceiving substance. Given such rigid containment, how could there be exclusionary relations between attributes? How can a thinking substance rule out that the same substance can also be conceived as extended if there are no explanatory or conceptual relations between the attribute of thought and the attribute of extension? The lack of a possible reason for exclusion is at least the beginnings of Spinoza's reason for including all possible attributes as attributes of God. But even if he can defend the self-containment of attributes, he will also need a positive reason for including them all together as attributes of a single substance.

This brings us back to Ip9 and the other objectionable aspect of (3). Why should perfection and reality to exist correspond to possessing a greater number of attributes? As I noted above, Spinoza does not offer any explicit defense of this correlation, but here is one possibility. The principle in Ip9 may actually be that to the extent to which a single thing [unaquaeque res] can be expressed by a greater number of attributes, to that extent it is more perfect. The emphasis (and Spinoza's word choice) brings out the idea that perfection involves both unity and diversity. To the degree to which one and the same thing can sustain a greater variety of expressions of it, to that extent it is more perfect. The perfection of God, on this account, is (at least partly) due to the fact that God's self-identity is compatible with a plentitude of incommensurate expressions and true predications of it. This view of metaphysical perfection, one which tries to maximize both identity and diversity, is very similar to Leibniz's account of perfection as harmony, a principle that Leibniz explains as “diversity compensated by identity.”[8] On this proposal, for Spinoza, God's perfection is the perfection of Leibniz's most harmonious world, the perfection of maintaining both the one and the many. Privileging neither unity nor diversity, Spinoza's PSR-driven account of the concept of God claims that it is (partly) constitutive of God's perfection that one and the same thing can be expressed truly in such a variety of incommensurate ways. Whether this was Spinoza's own emphasis in Ip9 and whether we should agree that this is an appropriate account of metaphysical perfection is worth further reflection.

In any case, whether or not Spinoza fully succeeds defending the consistency of his concept of God or the other controversial steps of his ontological argument, the striking modal conclusion he wants to draw is clear. “Except God, no substance can be or be conceived” (Ip14). This statement captures Spinoza's substance monism and his necessitarianism with respect to substances: (2) there is only one possible substance, God, and (1) that substance necessarily exists.

3. Modes

Immediately after wrapping up his proof for substance monism in Ip14, Spinoza claims in Ip15 that everything else that exists is a mode that inheres in God. Much of the rest of Part One of the Ethics is devoted to explaining just what everything else is like. But we should first pause and ask what Spinoza even means when he says in Ip15, “Whatever is, is in God, and nothing can be or be conceived without God.” By the definition of mode in Id5, Ip15 entails that everything that exists besides God is a mode of God (Id5). But what is a mode and what is it for a mode to inhere in a substance?

A natural way to think about modes is as properties. The circular shape of the coin on my desk is a mode of that coin; circularity is a property of the coin that inheres in it and can be predicated of it. Of course, there is an extremely wide range of views about properties, so claiming that modes are properties will not answer all questions [see the entry on properties]. But even if we ignore the details about inherence, property instantiation, and predication relations, one might immediately wonder if Spinoza has not made a colossal blunder here. After all, how can a table or human being be anything like a property? How can I inhere in something else? What sense would it make to say of something — substance — that it is Sam Newlandsish in the same sense in which I say of it that it is round? Isn't this a category mistake if there ever was one?[9]

We should be careful that our objections here aren't simply assuming that (a) objects like tables and human beings are (basic) substances and (b) that (basic) substances neither inhere in nor are predicable of other substances. Spinoza agrees with (b), but he has already argued pace (a) that there can be only one substance. It would be unfair to grant him that conclusion and then insist that other things still ought to have all the features of (basic) substances. (Of course, these intuitive objections to Spinoza's claims about modes may provide readers with yet more reasons to reconsider Spinoza's earlier argument for (a)).

However, many interpreters have tried to make sense of Spinoza's identification of everyday objects with modes without presupposing the denial of his substance monism. One very straightforward strategy is to deny that Spinoza intends anything like property, inherence and predication talk by his identification of everyday objects with modes of God. Rather, according to one prominent alternative (defended most famously by Edwin Curley), Spinoza's claims about inherence are really just claims about causal dependence (Curley 1969). Everyday objects inhere in God in the sense that they depend causally on God. So when Spinoza claims that “Whatever is, is in God” (Ip15), he really means only that everything is causally dependent on God, a fantastically unremarkable claim in this historical period. Indeed, as others have responded, this proposal makes Spinoza's claim in Ip15 so unremarkable that it is hard to see why Spinoza went to such obfuscating lengths to phrase his ontology in terms of inherence and modes in the first place, since he had the categories of efficient causation and dependent beings at his disposal. Why talk about inherence and immanent causation at all, then (Bennett 1991)?

A different strategy, advanced by John Carriero, is to preserve the link between modes and properties, but to see Spinoza as appealing to a kind of trope theory about properties with a bundle theory of non-substantial objects [see the entry on tropes]. According to this reading, collections of particularized properties constitute everyday objects for Spinoza. Such bundles of tropes inhere in substance, but they are not predicable of substance. This lets us avoid at least some of counter-intuitive consequences of saying that “Substance is Sam Newlandsish,” and bundle theory has a significant historical precedent (Carriero 1995). Whereas the first interpretation tries to explain inherence as nothing but efficient causation, this reading tries to keep causation and inherence as intensionally (though perhaps not extensionally) distinct metaphysical dependence relations.

Yet another, more circuitous option begins with a functional account of modes in Spinoza's ontology. The function of modes, according to passages like Ip25c, is to provide ways of expressing or conceiving the power of substance. On this account, Spinoza tries to provide an analysis of the relation of inherence in terms of an expressive or conceptual relation, similar to the way in which he provided an analysis of causation in terms of conceptual connection. Consider, for instance, Id3, in which Spinoza defines substance as that which is “[a] in itself and [b] is conceived through itself, that is, [c] that whose concept does require the concept of another thing from which it must be formed” (the brackets are mine). Instead of leaving inherence as an unprincipled primitive relation of metaphysical dependence (pace the PSR), we can read [c] as providing an analysis of both [a] and [b]. One thing inheres in another in virtue of being conceived through it, which, like causation, is a matter of conceptual involvement. That everyday objects are modes inhering in and/or predicated of substance is intensionally and extensionally equivalent, and perhaps even outright reducible, to the fact that the concepts of everyday objects are asymmetrically involved in the concept of substance. If correct, this would explain why modes function as particular ways of conceiving the nature or power of substance. Combined with our earlier discussion of causation, this reading argues that Spinoza's claim about inherence points to the same metaphysical dependence as the one he invokes by claiming everyday objects are caused by substance — namely, a more fundamental conceptual relation. On this interpretation, Spinoza provides an analysis of these dependence relations and so he claims in Ip15 that everyday objects stand in this more fundamental dependence relation to God: they are all conceived through God.

I will not try to settle this debate here, though how one understands the ontology of Spinoza's modes will help settle how one understands his views on their modality. For purposes of ease and neutrality, I will frequently refer to modes as “objects,” which I intend to be a neutral placeholder for “whatever else exists besides substance.”

3.1 The Modality of Modes: An Overview

Earlier, I raised the question of how many non-substantial objects exist according to Spinoza. His answer in Ip16 is that an infinite number of them exist: “From the necessity of the divine nature there must follow infinitely many things in infinitely many ways, i.e., everything which can fall under an infinite intellect.” Although Spinoza means more by “infinite” than simply “exhaustive,” he clearly intends “exhaustive” as well. How many objects are there? “As many as there can be,” is Spinoza's reply. That is, Spinoza endorses a principle of ontological plenitude (POP), according to which the maximal number of compossible objects actually exists. Spinoza's motivation for POP may derive from the PSR itself, since if the actual world were sub-maximal, non-existing but intrinsically possible objects would have no reason for not existing, a brute fact. Thus by the PSR, if there is to ontological space to be filled, it must be filled. (Traditional appeals to the will of God at this juncture will not sway Spinoza. It can't simply be that God decided, ab initio and without further explanation, to make a less than full world. Even if God had a will — which Spinoza is inclined to deny — its exercise here would also need to be explained. Barring an infinite regress, it is hard to see how this kind of response could ever explain the falsity of POP.) The truth of POP would mean that the number of objects is necessarily fixed: there could not be more or fewer objects without violations of Spinoza's explanatory commitments.

Though this is already quite a strong conclusion, it does not yet rise to the level of full-blown necessitarianism with respect to modes. There are still three possible sources of contingency for the world of modes. Alternative possibility 1 (AP1): There could have been a different collection of modes, equal in number to the actually existing collection, but with entirely different members. Alternative possibility 2 (AP2): For (at least) one individual member of the collection of actually existing modes, there could have been a different mode existing in its place. Alternative possibility 3 (AP3): At least one of the actual modes could have had different characteristics than it in fact has while still retaining its identity. The possibility of an entirely different collection, different members of the collection, or some alternative features of members of the collection (or some combination of the three) are all compatible with POP.

To briefly illustrate this point, let us use the collection of shirts hanging in my closet to stand for the collection of modes. (For ease, we will pretend that these alternative possibilities are mutually exclusive.) Let us suppose that there could not be a greater or fewer number of shirts than the number of shirts currently in my closet — my closet is as full as it can get and I'm the sort of person who could never have fewer shirts than the most that could all fit in there together. Still, couldn't I have had an equally numerous, but entirely different set of shirts (AP1)? Or, keeping fixed all the other shirts, couldn't I have had a modest blue shirt instead of the orange plaid shirt sitting there in the middle (AP2)? Or, keeping fixed all the shirts in the closet, couldn't the orange plaid shirt have had a single pocket instead of having the two pockets that it actually has (AP3)?

If any of these alternatives are genuine possibilities for Spinoza, then he will not be committed to necessitarianism with respect to modes. To get necessitarianism, one needs not only the necessity of the number of existents; one also needs the necessity of each member and the necessity of all of its characteristics. So does Spinoza want to deny that these are genuine possibilities for modes? Am I really stuck with the exact shirts I've got, double-pocketed orange plaid and all?

To understand why Spinoza might be attracted to answering “yes,” we need to fill in a few more details of his ontology of modes. So far, I have lumped all the modes together into a single ontological category: those objects which are not substances. But Spinoza sometimes distinguishes between two types of modes: infinite modes and finite modes. Unfortunately, Spinoza gives only a very sparse account of these infinite modes, and the number of direct textual references to them is quite small. In fact, when Georg Schuller wrote to Spinoza to ask him for some examples of these curious entities, Spinoza replied with such obscure gems as “the face of the whole universe,” “motion and rest,” and “absolutely infinite intellect” (Ep64). (I am inclined to think that if the best available elucidation of an elaborate philosophical doctrine requires reference to “the face of the whole universe,” then the doctrine still needs further development.) But equally unfortunate for interpreters, these infinite modes appear to do some significant work in Spinoza's metaphysics, so we cannot simply ignore them if we are to understand his modal commitments.

3.2 Infinite modes

The most salient feature of infinite modes is that they stand in a more direct relation to substance than finite modes do. Spinoza claims that infinite modes follow in more or less direct ways from “the absolute nature of any of God's attributes,” whereas finite modes do not (see Ip21-22; 28). According to some interpreters, understanding this distinction is the key to understanding whether or not Spinoza was a necessitarian.

At first, Spinoza's picture seems clear enough. Some modes follow directly from substance. (I will continue to ignore the complicating role of attributes). These are now commonly called the immediate infinite modes (Ip21). Other modes follow directly from those immediate infinite modes. These are commonly called the mediate infinite modes (Ip22). There is then a gap of some kind, and on the other side of the gap is the maximally full collection of finite modes. Unlike the infinite modes, finite modes do not follow either directly or indirectly from what Spinoza calls “the absolute nature” of God. But just what is this “following-from” relation? And how should we understand the apparent following-from gap between infinite from the finite modes? I will focus on the former question here and will take up the latter question later in section 3.4 below.

The distinction between infinite and finite modes is especially relevant because of what Spinoza says about the modality of infinite modes. We saw earlier that substance exists necessarily for Spinoza. Spinoza reasons that if an object necessarily follows from something that exists necessarily, that object also exists necessarily (Ip21). This sounds very much like what is now a familiar and widely accepted modal axiom: (□x & □(xy)) → □y. According to an applied version of this axiom, if God necessarily exists, and if, necessarily, God's existence entails the existence of another object, then that other object also exists necessarily. Of course, we need not (and should not) interpret Spinoza's following-from relation as involving the strict logical entailment that our modern axiom uses. All we really need to see is that Spinoza thinks necessity transfers down the following-from chain. If x necessarily exists and y necessarily follows from x, then y necessarily exists. For ease, I will call this the modal transfer principle. (Later, we will try to gain a better understanding of exactly why Spinoza thinks the modal transfer principle works.)

Notice that both conjuncts of the modal transfer principle must be satisfied if y is to exist necessarily according to the modal transfer principle. That is, in order to apply the modal transfer principle to y in our example, it must be the case that both (i) y necessarily follows from x and (ii) x necessarily exists. To mark this point terminologically, I will use the traditional terms of “hypothetical” and “absolute” necessity. Keeping matters very simple, let us say that y exists with hypothetical necessity if x exists and (i) is true. Let us say that y exists with absolute necessity if y is hypothetically necessary and (ii) is true.[10] These are not two distinct species of necessity, despite the traditional terminology; the same distinction can be made using only the modern “□” to stand for the single kind of metaphysical necessity: absolute necessity. The important point is simply that an object's necessarily following from another does not alone make its own existence necessary; it might nonetheless be contingent or not “absolutely necessary.”

Two further points about these terms are important to notice at the outset. On this simple sketch, being absolutely necessary entails being hypothetically necessary, but not vice versa. Therefore, I will sometimes talk about being “merely hypothetically necessary” to mark cases of hypothetical, but non-absolute necessity. An important interpretive question will be whether Spinoza thinks everything is absolutely necessary or whether some things are merely hypothetically necessary (i.e., contingent, though necessarily following from other things). Keep this in mind: necessitarianism requires an exceptionless commitment to the absolute necessity of all things.

Even more importantly, an object that is absolutely necessary may derive its necessity from an external source. The account of absolute necessity I am using here is neutral on the question of source. If God is absolutely necessary and the existence of a white horse necessarily follows from God's existence, then the white horse will itself be absolutely necessary. Whatever significant difference there may be between an object that exists necessarily in virtue of its own nature and an object that exists necessarily in virtue of necessarily following from the necessity of another, that distinction is wholly internal to absolute necessity. The question of an external versus internal source of necessity, a distinction of which Spinoza was quite aware (Ip33s), does not in and of itself entail a distinction in type of necessity or even strength of necessity, and Spinoza nowhere says that it does.[11] So again, a central question facing Spinoza's modal metaphysics is whether or not everything exists with absolute necessity, regardless of whether or not that necessity is derived from the necessity of another.

Let us return now to our question about the following-from relation that Spinoza invokes when discussing different types of modes. Spinoza thinks that the following-from relation at least tracks the causal relation. Indeed, I see no reason for thinking that the following-from relation is supposed to be distinct from the causal relation, especially given the language of causal production that Spinoza associates with “following-from” (e.g., Ip16c, Ip28d). If so, the following-from relation will inherit the features of causation, including the fact that causal relations involve necessary connections between causal relata (Iax3). That is, if y follows from/is caused by x, then, given x, y will exist with hypothetical necessity. So if two distinct objects stand in the following-from relation, the dependent relatum will always be hypothetically necessary. Furthermore, Spinoza claims that in the realm of modes at least, everything follows from something else (Ip16 and Ip36); there are no causal dead-ends. Thus, every mode will be hypothetically necessary. Remember that this does not yet amount to necessitarianism, for if the causes of a mode are not themselves absolutely necessary, the mode will be merely hypothetically necessary and the modal transfer principle will not apply. Therefore, the strength of Spinoza's modal views with respect to modes turns in part on whether or not the prior causes of a mode are absolutely necessary or merely hypothetically necessary.

In the case of existing infinite modes, Spinoza's position is that they are all absolutely necessary. In Ip22, Spinoza claims that immediate infinite modes necessarily follow from something that exists with absolute necessity, namely substance itself. Therefore, by the modal transfer principle, existing immediate infinite modes are absolutely necessary. Similarly, since existing mediate infinite modes follow from something that necessarily exists (namely the immediate infinite modes), they too exist necessarily (Ip23). More generally, because there is a chain of necessary dependence stretching to infinite modes from the necessarily existing substance, the absolute necessity of substance's existence transfers down the dependence chain to all those participating in the chain. Thus, all existing infinite modes exist with absolute necessity.

As we saw in the case of substance, however, even this strong conclusion is not sufficient for full-blown necessitarianism with respect to the infinite modes. Spinoza needs to rule out the possibility of merely possible, though non-actual infinite modes. Even if we grant that the infinite modes that actually exist are each necessary, why couldn't there have also been others? To claim that everything that exists is necessary is not yet to endorse necessitarianism; one must also claim that nothing more could have existed as well. I am not aware of any texts in which Spinoza explicitly rules this out, but possible reasons are not hard to find. These allegedly merely possible infinite modes will not be necessary (or else they would actually exist, on the plausible assumption that everything that is necessary actually exists). So by reductio, consider a non-actual possible world containing one of these extra infinite modes. What is the manner of its dependence? Spinoza's discussion of the infinite modes, thin as it is, suggests that infinite modes by definition must follow from God's nature, either directly or indirectly. If so, then in this possible world, the merely possible, non-actual infinite mode would also follow from God. But then the modal transfer principle would kick in, such that it would exist with absolute necessity. But again by the plausible assumption that everything that is necessary actually exists, the merely possible infinite mode wouldn't be merely possible after all, a rather glaring contradiction. QED.

Of course, that account relies on possible world semantics and some loaded, though defensible theses about relations between the possible worlds. Perhaps Spinoza could reach a similar conclusion without recourse to all that. Spinoza might instead appeal back to his plentitude principle and its basis in the PSR. For it to be possible that there could have been more infinite modes than there in fact are, these possibilia must be compossible with the necessarily existing collection of infinite modes. (Another (related) plausible assumption: if something is not compossible with what necessarily exists, then its existence is not possible.) But if there were additional infinite modes that were compossible with the collection of necessarily existing infinite modes and yet did not exist, what could explain their non-existence? This possibility would mean that the collection of existing infinite modes was not as full as it could be, but what could explain this unfilled ontological space? Unless an answer can be given, Spinoza will infer from a violation of the PSR to falsity. Barring an answer, we again reach the conclusion that necessitarianism is true with respect to all infinite modes. Like substance, all possible infinite modes exist with absolute necessity.[12] (Remember that this conclusion is consistent with the fact that these modes nonetheless derive their necessity from substance.)

3.3 Finite modes: A first pass

What about finite objects like furniture and persons? Are they absolutely necessary, according to Spinoza? This is where the aforementioned “gap” between infinite and finite modes becomes significant. If a finite mode followed from an infinite mode or from substance itself, the modal transfer principle would kick in and the finite mode would exist with absolute necessity. But consider what Spinoza says in the lengthy, though important demonstration of Ip28:

Whatever has been determined to exist and produce an effect has been so determined by God (by Ip26 and Ip24c). But what is finite and has a determinate existence could not have been produced by the absolute nature of an attribute of God; for whatever follows from the absolute nature of an attribute of God is eternal and infinite (Ip21). It had, therefore, to follow either from God or from an attribute of God insofar as it is considered to be affected by some mode….But it also could not follow from God, or from an attribute of God, insofar as it is affected by a mode which is eternal and infinite (by Ip22). It had, therefore, to follow from or be determined to exist and produce an effect by God insofar as it is modified by a mode which is finite and has a determinate existence…and in turn, this cause or mode…had also to be determined by another which is also finite and has a determinate existence; and again…and so always (by the same reasoning) to infinity.

In this passage, Spinoza works very hard to deny that any particular finite mode follows from either an infinite mode or from “the absolute nature of an attribute of God.” We will consider this last qualification shortly. A cursory reading suggests that instead, the existence and features of particular finite modes like my desk follow only from other particular finite modes that are the immediate causes of my desk. This emphasizes the apparent gap between the infinite and finite modes. It is still true that the existence of my desk is hypothetically necessary in virtue of its necessarily following from something else (namely, another finite mode). But unless my desk follows from something that is absolutely necessary, the existence of my desk will be merely hypothetically necessary and hence Spinoza will not be a necessitarian with respect to finite modes.

So are the causes of my desk absolutely necessary? Again, the answer will be “no” if finite objects follow only from other finite objects. After all, the causes of my desk will themselves be merely hypothetically necessary, unless the causes of those causes are absolutely necessary. And again, the same reasoning will apply to the causes of the causes, and so forth. So unless we can find something in the chain of finite causes that exists with absolute necessity, it appears that we will have no grounds for attributing full-blown necessitarianism to Spinoza.

However, one might respond, suppose we trace the causal chain of finite objects all the way back to its very beginning. Surely the initial starting point of the universe — from which all the subsequent objects (and events) necessarily follow — surely that initial mode follows from God or one of God's infinite modes? And if the initial starting point did so follow, then that initial mode would be absolutely necessary, and so the subsequent history of the world which follows from this initial state would also be absolutely necessary in virtue of the modal transfer principle. If so, we will have found the basis in Spinoza for necessitarianism after all.

Unfortunately, this option will not work for Spinoza. In the above quote from Ip28, Spinoza explicitly rejects the idea that the world of finite objects has an initial starting point. Spinoza thinks that the causal history of the world extends back in an infinitely long chain that contains no initial state. Think about that for a moment. For any prior cause of the desk, there will always be a prior cause of that cause. And a prior cause of the cause of that cause. And so on, ad infinitum. Ad nauseam as well? Well, Spinoza has little sympathy with the traditional theistic idea that God created the world of finite things via an ex nihilo creation of an initial state of the world at a particular first moment. There is no true “in the beginning” style cosmogony, according Spinoza. If our present universe can be traced back to the Big Bang, there had to be a state prior to the Big Bang that caused the Big Bang, and a state prior to that, and so on. Is such an infinite chain intelligible? Prima facie, there is no PSR violation. For every particular finite object, there is a sufficient reason for its existence and characteristics, given in terms of its prior finite causes. Each finite object follows from and is thus explained by the prior state of the world, whose constituents are themselves explained by a yet prior state, and so on.

If all of the preceding were correct, then Spinoza would not be committed to necessitarianism about finite modes. Each finite mode would exist with only hypothetical necessity. Since there would be no members of the series that existed with absolute necessity, the modal transfer principle would never apply to finite modes.

3.4 The problem of the gap

Unfortunately, there is a problem in all this that complicates (and enriches!) matters considerably. Recall that according to our simple reading of Ip28, particular finite modes do not follow from the absolute nature of God or an infinite mode, but instead each finite mode follows only from other finite modes.[13] I put this point in terms of an apparent “gap” between infinite modes and finite modes. According to this simple reading, finite modes are causally dependent only on other finite modes. Infinite modes are dependent only on other infinite modes and substance itself. If so, the absolute necessity of substance will not transfer down to the finite realm because of the gap, and so something less than absolute necessity will be true of objects like tables and persons.

However, this clean picture has trouble making sense of Spinoza's repeated claims that everything is caused by God (Ip25-26), repeated in the very first sentence of Ip28d. Spinoza frequently emphasizes that God's power or essence is the cause and explanation of everything that exists (Ip16, 17, 29s, 33, IAppendix). But how can everything follow from God's power if finite modes follow only from other finite modes? Won't the alleged gap between finite and infinite modes mean that finite things do not, after all, follow from substance? And won't that violate one of the most basic features of modes, namely their dependence, qua modes, on substance (Id5)?

This is a notoriously difficult question facing Spinoza's metaphysics, one that was raised by Leibniz just a year after Spinoza's death.[14] Sometimes this worry is discussed in terms of whether Spinoza can “derive” the finite from the infinite, but it is not simply a question of logical deduction. How can Spinoza believe both that God is the cause of all things and that finite things follow only from other finite things? One possible response would appeal to the close relationship between finite modes and the power of God. Yes, finite modes are only caused by other finite modes (the response runs), but being caused by other finite modes is a way of being determined by God's power, since finite modes just are limited expressions of God's power. How successful this response is will depend heavily on how well one can defend this close relationship between finite modes and God's power in Spinoza's metaphysics.

A more elaborate but very elegant solution, proposed by Curley, tries to reconcile Ip28 and the claim that all modes follow from substance without requiring such a close relationship between God and finite modes. (Recall from section 3 above that Curley believes the relationship between God and modes is exclusively causal, which implies a greater distinction between God and modes than more traditional, pantheistic interpretations allow.) Curley suggests that Spinoza's finite modes are only partially determined by other finite modes (Curley 1969, ch 2). They are also partially determined by infinite modes, which Curley understands to be general features of the world described by the laws of nature. My desk follows partly from infinite modes and partly from other particular finite modes. In more familiar terms, a given state of the world is determined by both the laws of nature and a prior state of the world. Each source is necessary but neither alone is sufficient, and so Spinoza can have it both ways. Particular finite modes follow partly from God's nature (in virtue of following partly from infinite modes) and they also follow partly from other finite modes. Admittedly, Spinoza does not say in Ip28 that finite modes follow only partly from other finite modes, but neither does he explicitly say that they follow entirely from other finite modes either.

If the infinite modes are absolutely necessary, will this account make Spinoza's finite modes absolutely necessary after all? Curley's answer is no, because there is only a partial determination from the infinite modes. The other condition for the existence of a finite mode — other finite modes — is merely hypothetically necessary (for the reasons previously discussed). But because one constituent of the explanation or cause of a finite mode is merely hypothetically necessary, the finite mode itself will be merely hypothetically necessary, even though another part of its cause is absolutely necessary. Thus, the interpretation concludes, particular finite modes are not absolutely necessary, despite following (partly) from God's nature. Hence full-blown necessitarianism with respect to finite modes is false; AP1, AP2, and AP3 represent alternative possibilities for Spinoza. As for the textual passages in which Spinoza seems to profess full-blown necessitarianism (i.e., Ip16, 17, 29, 33, Appendix), Spinoza's appeals to necessity are read as equivocating between the absolute and merely hypothetical distinction. Yes, everything is necessary in some sense, but finite modes are mere hypothetically necessary, whereas everything else is absolutely necessary. And, as I emphasized earlier, mere hypothetical necessity is weaker than necessitarianism.[15]

But consider AP1 again, the possibility of an entirely different collection of finite modes. The core idea is that because each member of the collection is not absolutely necessary, the collection itself will not be absolutely necessary. So God could have brought about an entirely different order of finite modes. But suppose we invoke the PSR and ask, “What is it in virtue of which this entire series of finite modes exists, as opposed to one of the alternative series?” This is not asking why God chose to create this series of modes rather than another possible series, a question that worried Leibniz. Spinoza denies that God has a will in the traditional sense, and so talk about choosing one possible world over another has no place in Spinoza's system (Ip17s and IIp49c). Spinoza's PSR, I suggested earlier, may also privilege ontologically full collections of modes over sub-maximal collections. But why think there is only one possible and maximal collection of finite modes? Leibniz's response, purified from reference to God's will and perfection, is that there would be no reason in virtue of which one maximal series would be brought about rather than another equally maximal series. (This ultimately led Leibniz to the belief that ours is the single best possible world.) That is, the actual existence of one maximal series plus the possibility of other maximal series would violate the PSR, since there would be no principled reason in virtue of which the actually existing series existed instead of one of the other series. If we try to find some other PSR-relevant feature of the actually existing series that explains why it exists as opposed to the others (such as its greater perfection), then we begin to wonder whether the other series are really possible after all. (Leibniz worried about this problem a lot.)

Therefore, if there are genuinely possible alternative series of finite modes, Curley's account will be unable to provide sufficient reasons for why the actually existing series exists as opposed to one of the other merely possible series. Spinoza can certainly explain why a given particular mode exists by appealing (in part) to other particular modes. But it will be hopeless for him to try to explain why the entire series as opposed to some other series exists by appealing to other particular, existing modes. This would be like trying to explain why an entire series of causes exists by appealing to one of those very causes. We aren't asking why any particular mode exists, but why this whole series, and not some other series, exists. Appealing to yet another contingent fact will get us nowhere towards accounting for the entire set of contingent facts.[16]

But neither, it seems, could Spinoza appeal to substance or to the infinite modes to explain the entire series, for two reasons. First, by the very account under consideration, substance and the infinite modes never fully explain or cause any particular finite mode (by Ip28). But how could they explain or cause the entire series without thereby causing or explaining each individual member? The intuitive thought is that there is nothing to the collection of finite modes above and beyond the individual members themselves. So how could substance and the infinite modes fully explain or cause the series without fully explaining or causing each member? Second, if the entire series of finite modes was caused by something that followed from God, then the entire series would be absolutely necessary after all (pace AP1). Remember that causation, necessary connection, and following-from track each other, according to Spinoza. So if the entire series followed from something that was itself absolutely necessary, then by the modal transfer principle, the series itself would be absolutely necessary. If so, then there really could not be any alternative possibilities for the series of finite modes after all. Furthermore, it is hard to see how Spinoza could block the transfer of the absolute necessity of the series from extending down to the individual members, in which case both AP2 and AP3 would also be ruled out as well.

So neither modes nor substance will be able to explain the existence of the entire collection of finite modes without committing Spinoza to necessitarianism and violating his alleged (partial) divide between the finite and infinite of Ip28.

This leaves us with an interpretive dilemma. On the one hand, Curley's account makes sense of both Ip28 and Spinoza's frequent claims that all modes, including finite ones, follow from God's nature. His account has the consequence that Spinoza is committed to the denial of full-blown necessitarianism. However, accepting this interpretation also requires interpreting Spinoza as rejecting some very natural sounding demands of the PSR. Spinoza would have to accept that there can be no explanation for why this entire series of finite modes exists rather than another possible series. To some, this will be too high an interpretive price to pay, especially since there is no independent, principled reason — other than to preserve the interpretation — to think Spinoza would reject the demands of the PSR when applied to the series of finite modes. But is there a way for Spinoza to accept the PSR without qualification and still preserve the claim in Ip28 that particular finite modes do not follow from infinite modes or the absolute nature of God?

3.5 Finite modes: a second pass

Let us begin by reconsidering the crucial claim in Ip28. It states that particular finite modes [i.] do not follow from “the absolute nature of an attribute of God,” but that [ii.] they do follow from an attribute of God “insofar as it is considered to be affected by some mode.” (As a reminder: I will continue to drop the reference to attributes and talk about “following from God's absolute nature.”) Two questions immediately arise. (1) What is the difference between [i.] following from the absolute nature of God and [ii.] merely following from God in the second, more qualified manner? (2) Why should how a particular thing is considered be at all relevant for this distinction?

According to a prominent answer to (1), proposed by Don Garrett, Spinoza really means that no particular finite object follows from God independently of its relations to other finite objects, and therefore, no particular finite object follows from the absolute nature of God, just as [i.] states. To follow from the absolute nature of God is to follow in an unqualified, pervasive and permanent manner, like infinite modes do (Ip21-23). But because particular finite objects follow from God's nature only insofar as they are related to other particular finite modes (as [ii.] states), they do not follow from the absolute nature of God [i.].

However, this restriction applies only to particular finite modes. Whereas no particular finite mode can follow from the absolute nature of God, the entire collection of finite modes as a whole can nonetheless follow from the absolute nature of God or from something else that follows from the absolute nature of God.

If correct, Garrett's account presents a five-fold division of Spinoza's expression “following from God's nature”:

  1. The immediate infinite modes follow directly from God's absolute nature.
  2. The mediate infinite modes follow indirectly from God's absolute nature.
  3. The infinite collection of finite modes, considered as a whole, follows indirectly from God's absolute nature. [17]
  4. Each particular finite mode, considered in relation to the other members of the series, follows from God's non-absolute nature.
  5. Each finite mode, considered independently of its relation to the other members of the series, does not follow from God's nature at all.

What happens if we apply Spinoza's modal transfer principle to this division? As we have already seen, the objects described in [a] and [b] will exist with absolute necessity. What about [c]? Like [b], the necessity of God's nature would trickle-down the following-from relation, and so even though [c] follows only indirectly from God, its existence would nonetheless be absolutely necessary. As I noted above, the modal transfer principle ignores the more fine-grained distinction between direct and indirect following-from ([a] vs. [b]-[c]). It simply looks for cases of following-from, checks to see if the originating source is absolutely necessary, and if it is, blindly and blissfully transfers along the absolute necessity.

What about [d]? On Garrett's proposal, the objects described in [d] will also be absolutely necessary. This makes Spinoza a full-blown necessitarian with respect to all objects, including desks and persons. To see why, notice that the difference between [c] and [d] is not a function of the presence or absence of the following-from relation itself. The difference is between following from God's absolute and non-absolute nature, whatever that distinction amounts to. Just as was the case in [b] and [c], Spinoza's modal transfer principle is indifferent to the distinction between [c] and [d]. It is too coarse-grained to pick up on the absolute/non-absolute distinction; it looks only for the presence or absence of the following-from relation plus an absolutely necessary source.[18] Since those conditions are met in [d], the absolute necessity will be transferred down from the whole collection to the individual members themselves. Thus, my desk exists with absolute necessity, just as does the entire collection of finite objects, the collection of infinite modes and ultimately substance itself. If this is all correct, Spinoza can consistently claim that every finite mode exists with absolute necessity and follows from God's nature in some way [ii], while still maintaining that all particular modes fail to follow directly or indirectly from the absolute nature of God [i].

What about [e]? As stated, the objects described in [e] do not follow from God's nature. Therefore, the modal transfer principle does not apply, and so their modality will be less than absolutely necessary. But what is the difference between the objects described in [d] and the objects described in [e]? In one sense, nothing: they are the same objects! But that can't be the full story, or else nothing would explain the fact that the objects in [d] follow from the nature of God, whereas those very same objects in [e] do not follow from the nature of God. So what is the salient difference between [d] and [e]? It must be, as Garrett suggests, that they are considered differently in each case. (Garrett himself does not say whether he thinks there really are any ways of truly considering objects as described in [e]; they might be all false, on his account.)

So if my desk is considered in relation to the entire series of finite modes, it follows from God's nature. Considered independently of that relation — if such can be done — it does not follow from God's nature. But this simply reasserts a more careful version of our earlier question in this section: (2′) why should how a particular thing is considered in relation to other particular things be at all relevant for the following from God distinction? And, since that difference is supposed to generate a difference in modality, we can also ask Spinoza (3): why should how a thing is considered in relation to other things be relevant for its modal status?

We will need to dig yet deeper into Spinoza's metaphysics to find answers to these questions, which we will do in the next section. First, however, there is an independent worry facing Garrett's account that Curley and others have raised (Curley and Walski 1999, Huenemann 1999). Consider again the relationship between [c] and [d]. There is supposed to be a significant difference between the manner in which the collection of finite modes follows from God as a whole and the manner in which any particular member of that collection follows from God. But, to repeat a point from the previous section, what is there to the series of finite modes above and beyond its individual members? If the entire collection follows indirectly from God's absolute nature, won't that fact (at least partly) be made true by the fact that each individual member of the series follows indirectly from God's absolute nature? How could I make it the case that the group of objects on my desk is covered in coffee without making it true, of each object on my desk, that it is covered in coffee? Or to put the point even more minimally, it is hard to see how the entire series of finite modes could have the property following from God's absolute nature if no member of the series has that type of property.

The most promising line of response will be to deny that the series of finite modes is nothing above and beyond the collection of its members. Like others, I have been describing the entirety of finite modes as a “series” or “collection,” a label that naturally suggests that the properties of the entire collection will be posterior to and derivative from the properties of its individual members. Spinoza himself rarely refers to just the collection of finite modes with a single expression, though he sometimes includes them in his locution “the order of nature” and once uses the expression “series.” But regardless of the terminology, one could argue in a holist vein that the whole series is more than just the sum of the members of the series. Spinoza does sometimes suggest that wholes can be prior to their parts (Ep32, IIp13le7s), though other times he suggests that parts are always prior to wholes (Ip15). Whether the collection of finite modes is more holist or atomistic, and whether, on the holist account, one of the non-supervening properties of the whole is following from God's absolute nature, are still open interpretive questions. The soundness of this reply will likely turn on whether or not the collection of finite modes is itself an infinite mode, a point about which interpreters continue to disagree.

4. A New Middle Ground?

We have now seen two competing accounts of Spinoza's views about the modal status of finite objects. On the one hand, some have argued that Spinoza's finite modes are merely hypothetically necessary and that there are alternative possibilities that God did not bring about. Spinoza, although endorsing a very strong form of determinism, is not a necessitarian.[19] A key piece of support for this view was that Spinoza's account of the relation between finite modes and God in Ip28 will block the modal transfer principle from applying to finite modes. This interpretation is closely allied, we saw, with a reading of Spinoza's ontology according to which there is a deep ontological divide between substance qua cause and finite modes qua things caused by God. Spinoza's modal conclusions are thereby seen as deeply rooted in the rest of his metaphysics.

On the other hand, we saw that other interpreters claim that Spinoza's ontology, including Ip28, can and should readily accommodate thorough-going necessitarianism. When this point is combined with the large number of textual passages in which Spinoza appears to affirm necessitarianism, the argument runs, there is sufficient evidence to reasonably conclude that Spinoza endorsed full-blown necessitarianism. This interpretation relies on an appeal to ways of considering finite objects such that they follow from God and exist necessarily when considered in relation to the rest of the series, but fail to do so when considered independently of such relations. We have yet to understand how this might actually work, however.

Spinoza affirms something like the latter in an appendix to his early book on Descartes. He writes that existing finite objects are contingent insofar as “we consider only their essence,” though these same objects are necessary when considered in relation “to nature,” which includes considering them in relation to at least the rest of the collection of finite things (C 307-8). He sometimes makes a similar appeal in the Ethics, such as Ip35: “Whatever we conceive to be in God's power, necessarily exists” (emphasis mine), an appeal that suggests, at the very least, that the ways in which things are conceived or considered are modally significant. But what does talk of considering or conceiving have to do with modality and following from God? In this section, I will propose an answer that has the benefit of consistently reconciling the previous two interpretive approaches. In the end, we will see that Spinoza can consistently affirm both necessitarianism and its denial.

4.1 Spinoza's analysis of modality

In order to arrive at this striking conclusion, we should step back and ask an important, though difficult question. Just what is modality, according to Spinoza? Spinoza is emphatic that modal ascriptions have reasons behind them: “A thing is called necessary either by reason of its essence or by reason of its cause” (Ip33s1). But I want us to ask Spinoza a higher order question: for what reason(s) do the modal ascriptions work in the way that Spinoza claims they do? For ease, let us talk about modal properties instead of modal ascriptions. Our question here is similar to the one we raised earlier about causation: what explains the causal relation itself? Spinoza's answer, we saw briefly, was conceptual in nature. Causal relations obtain in virtue of conceptual connections between causal relata. Here, we are wondering about modality itself. Do modal properties obtain in virtue of some further relation, as in the case of causation, or is modality primitive for Spinoza?

Given Spinoza's embrace of the PSR and his efforts to explain other dependence relations (such as causation and, possibly, inherence), it would be both surprising and disappointing if modality got a free explanatory pass. Of course, we probably should not expect Spinoza to have anything like a full-blown theory of modality in the forms that contemporary metaphysicians now provide (for instance, see the entry on actualism). It has taken philosophers quite a while to appreciate just how complex and rich modality is, and Spinoza would be in good company if he says things that seem, by today's standards, quite underdeveloped. But does he have at least the beginnings of an answer that would help illuminate his modal commitments?

I think he does, which we can see if we start with what he says about God's existence. In Ip11, Spinoza argues that God necessarily exists. But what is it in virtue of which God necessarily exists? This may initially sound like an odd question. Once we reach a necessarily existing object, can we even ask further explanatory questions about that object's existence and dependence? When we reach necessity, haven't we reached the end of “in virtue of” explanations?[20] Spinoza is clearly committed to rejecting at least a general version of this reply, because he thinks that necessarily existing objects can enter into asymmetrical dependence relations (such as infinite modes depending on substance). So Spinoza believes that dependence and explanation are more fine-grained affairs than our modern logical entailment allows, since the latter claims (on standard accounts) that every necessary proposition entails and is entailed by every other necessary proposition. But what about the case of God? Can we really ask what is it in virtue of which God necessarily exists, since God depends (by definition) on nothing outside of God?

Well, suppose we reverse the question: why should the explanatory demands of the PSR be restricted from explaining necessary facts in general and the necessity of God's existence in particular? Indeed, applied to itself, the PSR should demand a principled account of why only contingent matters fall within its scope. There may be a PSR-satisfying answer available, but Spinoza shows no indication that he thought such explanatory restrictions were legitimate. Rather, Spinoza writes as though even God's existence, necessary though it may be, requires some further grounding. What could such further grounding be?

Spinoza's answer, embodied in the opening lines of the Ethics, is that God exists in virtue of God Himself. This may sound like a non-answer after all, but it is not. Spinoza is not claiming that there are no explanatory grounds for God's existence; he is claiming that facts about God explain God's existence. Self-explanation, though perhaps odd, is not identical to non-explanation. What about God explains God's existence? In Ip7 and Ip11, Spinoza appeals to an involvement relation between the concept of God's essence and the concept of God's existence. That is, God exists in virtue of the fact that the concept of God involves the concept of existence. But Spinoza thinks that the conceptual involvement relation between God and existence explains not only the fact of God's existence; it also explains the fact that God necessarily exists. In Ip19d, Spinoza writes,

For God (by Id6) is substance, which (by Ip11) necessarily exists, that is (by p7), to whose nature it pertains to exist, or (what is the same) from whose definition it follows that he exists.

In Ip7, Spinoza equates “it pertains to its nature to exist” with “essence necessarily involving existence” and “causing itself.” Self-causation is explained in Id1 as belonging to a “nature that cannot be conceived except as existing.” That is, what explains the necessity of God's existence is the fact that the very concept of God involves the concept of existence. In other words, Spinoza analyzes necessity in terms of conceptual connections. Although Spinoza does not develop a richer account of conceptual relations that Leibniz will later achieve, his idea seems to be that conceptual relations are the relations that explain and ground necessary relations.

Spinoza makes similar appeals to conceptual relations when he invokes geometrical examples to describe the necessity with which other things follow from God:

…all things have necessarily flowed, or always follow, by the same necessity and in the same way as from the nature of a triangle it follows…that its three angles are equal to two right angles (Ip17s).

Spinoza later identifies this same geometrical relationship with the conceptual involvement relation (IIp49). What it is for things to follow from God necessarily is for the concept of those things to be (asymmetrically) involved in the concept of God, whose concept involves (the concept of) existence. The necessity of God and the necessity of existing things are equally explained by and grounded in conceptual involvement.

Conversely, contingency is grounded in the lack of certain conceptual connections. In the case of contingent existence, an object exists contingently just in case its concept is not connected to existence or to something whose concept is connected to existence, either immediately or via further conceptual connections. Hence if a mode is conceived in such a way that it is not conceived in relation to something involving existence, it will exist contingently and not necessarily (as per Iax7). It isn't just that it would be conceived, perhaps incorrectly, as contingent; how it is conceived partly determines its very modal status. In explaining modal features in terms of an involvement relation between concepts, Spinoza thereby identifies himself with a long and distinguished tradition of philosophers who explain modal facts by appeal to conceptual relations.

This account also explains why Spinoza would have been attracted to the modal transfer principle in the first place. Recall that the modal transfer principle states that necessity transfers down the following-from relation. (If y follows from x, and x is absolutely necessary, then y will also be absolutely necessary.) Why does this principle work for Spinoza? Recall that the following-from relation is a causal relation. The causal relation, we have already seen, is itself a conceptual relation. But we have now seen that necessity too is partly a function of conceptual relations. Hence necessity will track the following-from relation because both are grounded in the same relations of conceptual involvement. In other words, the modal transfer principle works because it always corresponds to cases in which there is a chain of conceptual involvement relations reaching to the concept of God.

4.2 Necessitarianism Vindicated

The most important upshot of the previous section is that modality is not a wholly extensional affair for Spinoza. The ways in which objects are conceived is relevant for the metaphysical determination of their modal status. Because modal relations are ultimately functions of conceptual relations, how objects are conceived will obviously be relevant for their modal status. More particularly, whether or not a finite mode exists necessarily or not will depend on whether it is conceived in an appropriate relation to substance, whose concept immediately involves existence.

Return, then, to Garrett's proposed account of Spinoza's necessitarianism. We saw that his interpretation relied on the idea that particular modes, conceived in relation to all the other particular modes, followed from God. Conceived independently of that relation, however, such a mode fails to follow from God. It also thereby fails to be necessary. We can now understand why Spinoza accepts this analysis.

Suppose the entire collection of finite modes, considered as a whole, follows from an absolutely necessary infinite mode and that the entire collection as a whole exists with absolute necessity. If any particular finite mode in the collection is to exist necessarily, it must be conceived in such a way that it too follows from something absolutely necessary. But how is any particular finite mode to be considered such that it follows from something absolutely necessary? The answer is clear: by being conceived in relation to the whole collection. That is, when finite modes are considered in relation to all the other finite modes, there will be the right conceptual connections to invoke Spinoza's modal transfer principle. The considering function is relevant because, on Spinoza's account, modal facts are sensitive to the conceptual relations that the considering function picks up on.

Furthermore, not just any way of considering a finite mode will be relevant for its modality. Considered as “the largest piece of furniture in the office,” my desk will not be necessary. The way of conceiving the desk needs to pick up on something that follows from God if it is to be necessary. What is this something? Spinoza's answer is that a finite object exists necessarily if it is considered in relation to the whole of nature, a whole which indirectly follows from God's absolute nature. This, then, is why object's being considered in relation to the rest of the entire collection of finite objects is relevant for determining its modal status, whereas considering it in other, less causally relevant and less inclusive ways will not be.[21]

4.3 Non-necessitarianism also vindicated

But if particular finite things are necessary in virtue of being considered in relation to the whole series of finite things, two lingering questions remain. First, can we human beings ever conceive anything in such an all-encompassing manner? Secondly, are there other, less inclusive ways of conceiving a finite object in virtue of which it does not exist necessarily? That is, if modality is sensitive to ways of conceiving objects, does Spinoza think there are multiple ways of conceiving finite modes, such that objects can have different modalities, depending on how they are conceived?

With the respect to the first question, Spinoza's answer is unfortunately negative. Spinoza calls the mental corollary of these very complete ways of conceiving objects “adequate ideas,” and he seems pretty pessimistic about the prospects of our ever having adequate ideas of particular things (see IIp24-31, though he holds out more hope in Part Five). He even links our naturally inadequate and incomplete ways of conceiving singular things to their contingency (IIp31c), just as the above interpretation predicts he should. So while necessitarianism is true from God's perspective, and while we can understand the metaphysical principles which guarantee the truth of necessitarianism in virtue of the existence of such comprehensive ways of conceiving the world, the ways of conceiving finite objects we tend to adopt will rarely, if ever, be sufficiently complete so as to entail true predications of necessitarianism. This judgment can be tempered by the fact that because there is a way of conceiving objects in the relevantly complete way, it is still true that those objects exist necessarily. We will simply never be in the position to grasp such complete and necessitating concepts. Yet, necessitarianism will also be false in virtue of inadequate ways of conceiving finite objects that we perhaps inevitably adopt — if there are such ways of conceiving.

This is an unfortunately negative answer in the light of Spinoza's later ethical theory. As a systematic thinker, Spinoza's metaphysical conclusions about modality have consequences for his ethical theory. Although pursuing the relations between Spinoza's metaphysics and ethics are beyond the scope of this article, Spinoza clearly thinks that ethically relevant conclusions follow from his metaphysics, including his metaphysics of modality. The clearest example occurs in Part V: “Insofar as the mind understands all things as necessary, it has a greater power over the affects, or is less acted on them” (Vp6). Because Spinoza thinks that our moral improvement results from our gaining greater power over the passive affects and becoming more active, our inability to conceive things as necessary will mean the prospects for moral perfection are quite dim — or are at least dim with respect to the project of complete moral perfection.

A paragraph ago, I claimed that necessitarianism is true with respect to complete ways of conceiving singular things, namely in virtue of their being conceived in relation to the “entire order of nature.” I added that if there are incomplete ways of conceiving singular things, necessitarianism will also be false. Spinoza certainly suggests that there are more and less complete ways of genuinely conceiving objects (see, for instance, Ip24d and IVd3-4). Indeed, on the functional account of Spinoza's ontology mentioned in section 3 above, what it is to be a finite mode is to be an incomplete way of considering God — so unless Spinoza thinks there really are no finite modes, he'd better grant that incompleteness in and of itself does not entail falsity.

If there are true but incomplete ways of conceiving objects, Spinoza will occupy the interesting position of consistently affirming both necessitarianism and its denial, relative to these different ways of conceiving objects. This pairing sounds like a contradiction until we appreciate the force of Spinoza's conceptualist account of modality. If the truth-value of modal predications is sensitive to ways of conceiving objects, as the modern day anti-essentialist would agree, and if Spinoza endorses a variety of modally relevant ways of conceiving objects, then he can consistently affirm both the truth and falsity of full-blown necessitarianism relative to different ways of conceiving objects.

If this is all correct (a very big “if”), then Garrett and Curley's interpretations are both right, though neither tells the complete modal story. Something less than full-blown necessitarianism will be true in virtue of concepts of objects that do not include their relations to the entire, infinitely large and complex range of other particular things. Full-blown necessitarianism, on the other hand, will also be true in virtue of concepts that are maximally inclusive with respect to relations to the rest of the world. Thus we can answer Curley's otherwise worrisome objection to the necessitarian interpretation: “If each particular feature of the universe, considered in itself, is contingent, then their totality is also contingent” (Curley 1988, 49).[22] This expansion of contingency from the part to the whole would be true only if the shift in the ways modes are conceived did not sometimes entail a shift in the mode's modal status. Though a very natural essentialist assumption, it is a false one according to this proposed reading of Spinoza's modal theory. Just as necessitarianism at the most expansive conceptual level will not jeopardize contingency at the narrower level, so too contingency at the narrower level will not entail an explosion of it into the broadest consideration of modes.

What then, are the truth-values of predications of modality to objects (i.e., “my desk is contingent” or “my desk is necessary”)? It depends on which concept the ascription invokes. Unfortunately, Spinoza thinks, for most of us most of the time, we rely on very limited ways of conceiving objects, resulting in our making true but rather non-salutary predications of contingency to the world around us. And, he adds with a prod, it would sure be better for each of us if we were to wean ourselves from this dependence on such limited perspectives.

Lastly, what about Garrett's suggestion, expressed in [e], that finite modes conceived independently of the entire collection of other finite modes do not follow at all from God's nature? In a sense, this is unnecessarily strict. It will be the case that, more narrowly considered, finite modes do not follow from an infinite mode. But that need not mean that they do not follow, in any sense at all, from God's nature or power. Returning to a much earlier suggestion, Spinoza thinks that one way in which finite things follow from God's nature is in virtue of being caused by other finite things that are themselves expressions of Divine power. If so, the definition of modes as things conceived through God will be retained even when modes are considered independently of their relation to all the other modes taken collectively. So long as they are conceived in relation to something that is an expression of God's power, they will be conceived through God. However, they will not, on this proposal, be thereby conceived as, and hence they will not be absolutely necessary.

The cogency of this last suggestion and the larger question of correctly interpreting of Spinoza's modal commitments will depend greatly on how one settles the other interpretive controversies surrounding Spinoza's metaphysics, such as the relation between substance and modes we discussed earlier. But perhaps we shouldn't be surprised or discouraged if the success of interpreting a part of a system builder's metaphysics depends on the success of interpreting all the other parts.


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