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Bernardino Telesio

First published Mon Aug 30, 2004; substantive revision Wed Nov 4, 2009

Bernardino Telesio (1509–1588) belongs to a group of independent philosophers of the late Renaissance who left the universities in order to develop philosophical and scientific ideas beyond the restrictions of the Aristotelian-scholastic tradition. Authors in the early modern period referred to these philosophers as ‘novateurs’ and ‘modern’. In contrast to his successors Patrizzi and Campanella, Telesio was a fervent critic of metaphysics and insisted on a purely empiricist approach in natural philosophy—he thus became a forerunner of early modern empiricism. He had a remarkable influence on Tommaso Campanella, Giordano Bruno, Pierre Gassendi, Francis Bacon, Thomas Hobbes and authors of the clandestine Enlightenment like Guillaume Lamy and Giulio Cesare Vanini.

1. Life, Works and Influence

Bernardino Telesio was born at Cosenza in Calabria in 1509 as the son of a noble and quite wealthy family. Having been educated by his uncle Antonio Telesio, a humanist of note, he studied in Milan, Rome and the famous university of Padua, which he left in 1535. There is no evidence that Telesio gained a doctorate. Instead of undertaking a university career, he spent several years in a Benedictine monastery (1535–44) without taking oaths. Later he lived in the Neapolitan home of Alfonso III Carafa, Duke of Nocera. In 1553 he married and settled in Cosenza, becoming the dominant figure of the Accademia Cosentina, which came to focus on natural philosophy under his tutelage. Telesio never held a salaried position. After the death of his wife in 1561, which marked the beginning of his financial difficulties, he seems to have spent some time in Rome under the patronage of Pope Pius IV. He rejected the Archbishopric of Cosenza offered by Pius IV in 1565, leaving this position to his brother. From 1576 on he was moving between Cosenza and Naples; in Naples he lived with the son and heir of Alfonso Carafa, Ferrante, to whom he dedicated the final version of his De rerum natura. He died in his hometown in 1588.

Telesio dedicated his whole life to establishing a new kind of natural philosophy, which can be described as an early defense of empiricism bound together with a rigorous criticism of Aristotelian natural philosophy and Galenic physiology. Telesio blamed both Aristotle and Galen for relying on elaborate reasoning rather than sense perception and empirical research. His fervent attacks against the greatest authorities of the Western philosophical and medical traditions led Francis Bacon to speak of him as “the first of the moderns” (Opera omnia vol. III, 1963, p. 114). He was perhaps the most strident critic of metaphysics in late Renaissance times. It was obviously due to his excellent relationships with popes and clerics that he was not persecuted and was able during his own lifetime to publish his rather heterodox writings, which went on the index shortly after his death. His principal work is the aforementioned De rerum natura iuxta propria principia (“On the Nature of Things according to their Own Principles”), which in the last augmented edition of the author's hand appeared in Naples in 1586. The De rerum natura is a huge treatise in nine books which deals with cosmology, biology, sense perception, reason and ethics. Another treatise of major importance is Quod animal universum ab unica animae substantia gubernatur. Contra Galenum, in which Telesio critizised central conceptions of Galenic physiology and psychology. This work was never printed, but circulated in manuscript copies (De Franco, 1981, p. XXII). Smaller treatises deal with a variety of themes such as colours, dreams, geology and meteorology, some of which were published in Rome in 1565 (De iis quae in aere fiunt et de terremotibus; De colorum generatione; De mari). Telesio's philosophy was disseminated by friends and students such as Tommaso Campanella,  whose writings contain long paraphrases of Telesian ideas; by Sertorio Quattromani, Telesio's successor as head of the Accademia Cosentina, who published a synthesis of his predecessor's philosophy in 1589; and by Antonio Persio, who gave lessons on Telesio's thought in Venice and published a collection of smaller works, the Varii de naturalibus rebus libelli, in 1590. Giordano Bruno speaks of the “giudiciosissimo Telesio” in the third dialog of De la causa, whilst Francis Bacon based his own speculative philosophy of nature on a blend of Telesian and Paracelsian conceptions (Giachetti Assenza 1980; Rees 1977; 1984). Thomas Hobbes followed Telesio in the rejection of species (Schuhmann 1990; Leijenhorst 1998, p. 116ff.) The physiology of René Descartes in De homine shows close similarities to Telesio's physiological theories as they are presented in De natura rerum (Hatfield 1992). Telesio also had some influence on Gassendi and on libertine thinkers (Bianchi 1992).

2. Cosmology

Telesio's vision of the genesis of nature is simple to the point of being archaic, yet at the same time astonishingly modern in the sense that he seems to have been one of the very first defenders of a theory of natural evolution without metaphysical or theological presuppositions. According to his De rerum natura, the only things which must be presupposed are passive matter and active force, the latter of which Telesio thought of as twofold, heat and cold. These principles were meant to replace the Aristotelian metaphysical principles of matter and form. In order to explain how all natural beings came into existence by  these opposing forces, Telesio presumed that in the beginning God had created two primary globes, the sun and the earth, the sun being the seat of heat, the earth that of coldness, and that He had separated them with such a distance in space that they could not extinguish each other (DRN book I, ch. IV). All natural things result from the battle of these antagonistic forces for the possession of matter. The main region of that creative battle is the surface of the earth, where they create metals, stones and animate beings. The primary activity of warmth is to move fast and to dilate and rarefy matter, whereas that of cold is to hinder movement and to condense matter. Things differ according to the amount of heat or cold they possess (and therefore according to their density and derivative qualities such as velocity and colour). The quantity of matter is not changed through the action of these forces upon it. The role of heat, cold and matter as ‘natural principles’ had been highlighted before by Girolamo Fracastoro in the first version of the Homocentrica and in the dialogue Fracastorius sive De anima (Lerner 1992), as well as by Girolamo Cardano in his Liber unicus de natura.

Telesio's cosmology puts an end to metaphysical explanations. Telesio thought space to be absolute (DRN book I, ch. XXV–XXVIII), thus abolishing the Aristotelian notion of a bipartite cosmos divided into a sublunary world, in which generation and corruption take place, and a supralunary sphere with eternal regular movements. The existence of vacuum within space is admitted, but things are said to have a natural inclination to avoid empty space. In the cosmological chapters of book IV Telesio critizised the Aristotelian explanation of the movement of the sky by a transcendent telos, the God of Aristotle's metaphysics: the sky doesn't move because of a desire for a being more perfect than itself, but because it is its own nature to move and thus to sustain its own life (DRN book IV, ch. XXIV; Aristotle, Metaph. XII, ch. 6–7).

The things of nature are not created, governed and sustained by divine providence. In Telesio's philosophy, there is no such thing as a transcendent mind or idea. All things act solely according to their own nature, starting from the primary forces of cold and heat. The Epicurean chance is enclosed in Telesio's Stoic-influenced philosophy of nature (Kessler 1992): everything can produce everything, an idea which was soon to be sharply rejected by Francesco Patrizzi da Chierso, one of the most important contemporary readers of Telesio (“Obiectiones”, in the appendix of Telesio's Varii libelli, p. 467 f.). In order to sustain themselves, these primary forces and all beings which arise through their antagonistic interaction must be able to sense themselves as well as the opposite force, that is, they must sense what is convenient and what is inconvenient or damaging for their survival and well-being. Sensation, therefore, is not the property of embodied souls. Telesio's philosophy can thus be described as a pansensism in the sense that all beings, animate or inanimate, are said to have the power of sensation.

3. Psychology

With regard to psychology, Telesio took a materialist standpoint. According to his general rejection of the metaphysical (and therefore inappropriate) principles of matter and form, he rejected Aristotle's definition of the soul as forma corporis, i.e. as form and entelechy of an organic body (Aristotle, De anima II,1). According to Telesio, the soul is a separate being, but not in the sense of the Platonists, who define it as an immortal essence acting as the governor and mover of the body during its embodied life. Telesio held the soul to be a specific part of the body, defining it as the spiritus coursing through the nervous system and having its main seat in the brain. The spiritus which overtakes the role of the anima of the philosophical tradition is produced by the white ‘semen’. Telesio calls it the spiritus e semine eductus. He maintains in DRN book V, ch. I:

“This [separate substance] will therefore be the spiritus, which took its origin from the semen, as we will explain elsewhere (and it is to be found in all things made from semen, namely those which are white and bloodless, with the exception of the bones and similar things); and only the spirit is what perceives in the animal, and moves sometimes with the whole body, sometimes with single parts thereof, and solely governs the whole animal. That is to say, it performs those actions which, according to the concurring opinion of all, are typical of the soul.” (Vol. II, p. 208).

To ascribe psychic functions to a specific part of the body implies a rejection of the difference between organic and inorganic life, which dichotomy was central to the Aristotelian, Platonic and Christian traditions. According to Telesio, there is a quantitative and not a qualitative difference here, which consists in the higher degree of complexity and the higher degree of warmth that some physical bodies possess. Whereas metals or stones are homogenous bodies, organic bodies consist of heterogeneous parts, including the bodily (though invisible) spirit in the nerves and brain (DRN book V, ch. II). And just as there is no metaphysical difference between living and non-living bodies, there also does not exist a qualitative difference between animals and humans—in both, it is the same spirit which coordinates the functions and operations of the different bodily parts. In DRN book V, ch. III Telesio states:

…and when it has been proved that in animals the spirit produced from the semen is the substance of their soul, then one cannot doubt that the same exists in humans, albeit in a much more noble form, and it is surely not of a very different nature and does not possess highly different capabilities. We see that humans are formed by the same things as the other animals, and that they possess the same abilities and even the same organs for feeding and reproduction, and that they produce a very similar semen and eject it in the same way and with the same pleasure and from a very similar part and become tired after ejaculation, and that the same things are being formed out of the semen in both cases, namely the same nervous and membranous systems. And it is only [the spirit] which in all animate beings is perceiving and moving in the same way and according to the same dispositions. (Vol II, p. 216).

In order to explain how animate beings perform different functions and operations, traditional psychological as well as physiological theories referred to a threefold soul. Whereas Aristotle in De anima had distinguished between the anima vegetativa, anima sensitiva and anima cogitativa (which distinction also corresponds to that of plants, animals and humans with their specific faculties), Plato had established three parts of the soul (Republic 434d-443e), which in the Timaios (69aff.) he had associated with different organs, namely the rational part of the soul (logistikon) to the brain, the spirited (thumoeides) to the heart and the desirous or lower passions (épithumêtikon) to the liver. In this tripartition he was followed by the Stoic physician Galen (De placitis Hippocratis et Platonis VII, I and III), who added a threefold spirit—the spiritus naturalis being produced in the liver, the spiritus vitalis refined in the blood and the spiritus animalis distilled in the brain. Whereas the Aristotelian psychology was combatted in the De rerum natura, Telesio dedicated a whole treatise to the criticism of Galen, the Quod animal universum ab unica animae substantia gubernatur. Contra Galenum. According to Telesio, the functioning of an organic body cannot be explained by presupposing a plurality of rulers. In asserting the unity of the soul (i.e. spirit), Telesio followed the medical theorist Giovanni Argenterio (1513–1572), who defended the unity of the spirit against the Aristotelian and medical traditions.

Telesio combined the medical theory of spirit with a basically Stoic notion, that of the hegemonikon, according to which the spirit in the brain is responsible for all the states and operations traditionally ascribed to the tripartite soul: “the animal … is governed by one substance residing in the brain” (Quod animal universum ch. XXV; Var. lib. p. 254). Whereas in Quod animal universum he went on to explain the affects in terms of physiology, in De rerum natura he added a theory of sense perception and a theory of knowledge on physical grounds.

4. Theory of sense perception

Telesio rejected the traditional concept of sense organs, replacing it with a mechanistic explanation of sense perception (DRN books V–VII). In his opinion, to speak of sense organs is inappropriate, as the so-called sense organs are nothing else than “parts of the body which are either more subtle or soft than others, or perforated and open. One should not believe in the slightest that they are made thus in order to offer some capacity or support of perceiving to the sensitive soul (which seems to be the duty of organs), but in order to provide an easy and open entry to the forces of external things and to those things themselves.” (DRN book I, ch.VI; vol. I, p. 68). What is perceived are not the forms or species of things as the Aristotelians believed, but impulses of light and air (DRN book V, ch. VIII; vol. II, 254; for the rejection of species see DRN book VII, ch. XXX–XXXIII against the Aristotelian and ch. XVIII–XXIX against the Galenic theory; Telesio's rejection of species was taken up by Hobbes, Leviathan book I, ch. I “De sensu”). As the sense of touch provides the most narrow contact between outer object and sensing spirit, it assumes the role of the primary sense, which was traditionally identified with the sense of vision (DRN book VII, ch. IX, vol. III, p. 34.) The informatio theory being rejected, Telesio comes close to a neuronal explanation of sense perception, which is a mechanical process arising from the transfer of tactile impressions through the nerves to the brain. It is the spirit residing in the brain which experiences nervous dilatations and contractions, and which judges these sensations according to the basic scheme of pleasure and pain, giving out corresponding reactions like moving towards something or avoiding contact (DRN book VII ch. II–V). Strictly speaking, sense perception is a sensation of sensing (sensus sensus) which takes place in the brain: “Sense perception can only be the perception of the activities of things and impulses in the air, and can only consist of the perception of [the spirit's] own passions, transformations and movements, particularly the latter. Indeed, the spirit perceives them because he perceives that it is affected by them, that it is being changed and moved.” (Vol. III, p. 6)

In his explanation of sense perception Telesio comes close to the Democritan theory which he combines with the basic Stoic notion of conservatio sui, a key term in Telesio's philosophy. Pleasure is identified with the sensation of self-preservation, pain is the sensation of destruction (DRN book VII, ch. III; vol. III, p. 10). In this, as well as in his theory of knowledge, Telesio seems to follow Girolamo Fracastoro's explanation of sense perception and understanding given in the closing chapters of De sympathia et antipathia rerum and in the epistemological treatise Turrius sive de intellectione.

5. Theory of knowledge

For Telesio, the conservatio sui is the foundation from which all sensitive and cognitive functions arise. Defending an empirical approach in epistemology, Telesio tried to annul the traditional distinction between sense perception and reason, and he denied that there exists something like a purely mental sphere and a corresponding intellect which Aristotle in De anima III had called nous. Understanding is a process which requires sense perception and memory. According to Telesio, our memory is not visual. What we remember are movements which our spirit has experienced and given out when being in contact with external forces. If now the spirit undergoes a similar experience, for example the pain of getting burned, it will ascribe this perception to a similar or identical cause and call it ‘fire’ (DRN book VIII, ch. 1; vol. III, p. 160). The ability of making rational conclusions (ratiocinari) consists in comparing new expierences to old ones and in supplementing hidden or unknown aspects when refering them to former experiences. Telesio even suggests replacing the term intelligere with existimari and commemorari (DRN book VIII, ch. III; vol. III, p. 164f.). Intellectual understanding therefore does not mean to reach a realm of necessity and eternity, not even in mathematics, which according to Telesio arises from sensual experience and is a science of less dignity than the observation-based natural philosophy (DRN book VIII, ch. IV; vol. III, p. 176f.).

6. Ethics

The ethics exposed in the 9th book of De rerum natura is strictly naturalist. The only objective which Telesio ascribes to the spirit is self-preservation and self-improvement, the former lying in its ability to react suitably to influences from the external world, the latter in its capability of finding means to improve its state of being. This comes about through theoretical knowledge, specifically through natural philosophy and medicine (cf. DRN book VIII, ch. XXI) and through learning to control one's own emotions and desires. According to Telesio, we can voluntarily provoke and suppress affections and their related actions (DRN book IX, ch. I; vol. III, p. 332f.); what is more, we are able to master the degree to which we desire and are affected (DRN book IX, ch. II; vol. III, p. 334). The principle of moral virtue is said to be a knowledge of what is helpful and what is damaging for survival and well-being in human society. All virtues and vices are reduced to self-conservation.

7. Science and Religion

Whereas medieval and Renaissance authors often seemed to rely on the double-truth theory in order to maintain the freedom of scientific research and teaching, Telesio maintained a purely scientific approach. But he did not deny the existence of God and of the human soul. Telesio's God is not the God who acts in nature and history, though he did not deny the possibility of miracles (DRN book IV, ch. XXV; vol. I, p. 176). The God Telesio seems to imagine can be compared to a mechanic. Just as the best mechanic creates an artefact which will work without interruption and default, so the power of the almighty divine artist is represented in a cosmos which is able to generate and to sustain itself without ever running the danger of corruption (see DRN book I, ch. X).

Besides the natural soul or spirit Telesio accepted the existence of an immortal soul superimposed by God (DRN book V, ch. II–III). But in his theory of psychology and ethics the soul does not play any significant role, for which reason researchers have often held it to be an addition designed to avoid conflicts with the Church. On the other hand, there do exist certain modes of behavior which cannot be explained in a purely naturalistic and materialistic way, such as the human striving for eternity and the martyrs' denial of the highest objective of self-preservation. Far from building a bridge to the philosophical tradition, Telesio's definition of a second, divinely superimposed soul as “forma corporis et praecipue spiritus” deals a deathblow to Aristotle's teachings. According to Telesio, the idea of an immortal soul was totally unknown to the heathen Aristotle, who is severely criticized for confusing the concept of a natural spirit with the religious idea of a soul (DRN book V, ch. II–III):

And when we have reproved Aristotle and will continue to reprove him for having introduced the soul into the body as its peculiar form, we have not condemned him and we will not condemn him because he equated the soul created by God (a thing which one might suspect was completely unknown to him) with the form of humans, but rather because... he equated the soul which was generated from the semen and which is the only one which senses, causes movements and is (so to speak) something akin to the semen, with the form of the body. (Vol. II, p. 218f.)


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Related Entries

Aristotle, General Topics: metaphysics | Aristotle, General Topics: psychology | Bacon, Francis | Bruno, Giordano | Campanella, Tommaso | Cardano, Girolamo [Geronimo] | Descartes, René | Galen | Gassendi, Pierre | Patrizi, Francesco | Plato: ethics | soul, ancient theories of | Stoicism