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Plato's Ethics: An Overview

First published Tue Sep 16, 2003; substantive revision Fri May 29, 2009

Like all ancient philosophers Plato maintains a virtue-based eudaemonistic ethics. That is to say, human well-being (eudaimonia) is the highest aim of moral thought and conduct; the virtues (aretê=‘excellence’) are the requisite skills and character-traits. If Plato's support for an ethics of happiness seems somewhat subdued that is due to several reasons. First of all, his conception of happiness differs in significant ways from ordinary views. He therefore devotes as much time to undermining the traditional understanding of the good life as to describing his own conception. Second, Plato regards happiness as a state of perfection that is hard to comprehend because it is based on metaphysical presuppositions that seem both hazy and out of the realm of ordinary understanding. Hence there is not — as there is in Aristotle — much talk about happiness as a self-sufficient state of the active individual; the emphasis is, rather, on problems and difficulties that need to be solved. Third, Plato's moral ideals appear both austere and self-abnegating: the soul is to remain aloof from the pleasures of the body; communal life demands the subordination of individual wishes and aims. The difficulties of assessing Plato's ethical thought are compounded by the fact that it was subject to various modifications during his long life. In Plato's early works, the so-called Socratic dialogues, there are no indications that the search for virtue and the human good goes beyond the human realm. This changes with the growing interest in an all-encompassing metaphysical grounding of knowledge in Plato's middle dialogues that leads to the recognition of the ‘Forms’ — the true nature of all things, culminating in the Form of the Good as the transcendent principle of all goodness. Moral values must be based on an appropriate political order that can be maintained only by leaders with a rigorous scientific training. Though the theory of the Forms is not confined to human values but embraces the nature of all there is, Plato at this point seems to presuppose no more than an analogy between human affairs and cosmic harmony. The late dialogues, by contrast, display a growing tendency to see a unity between the microcosm of human life and the order of the entire universe. Such holistic tendencies would seem to put the attainment of the requisite knowledge beyond human boundaries. Though Plato's late works do not display any readiness to lower the standards for knowledge as such, in his discussion of cosmic order he leaves room for conjecture and speculation, a fact that is reflected in a more pragmatic treatment of ethical standards and political institutions.

1. Preliminaries

If ethics is the most accessible branch of philosophy, it is so because many of its presuppositions seem to be truisms. To name just a few: All human actions serve some end or purpose. Whether these purposes are judged right or wrong depends on their overall aim. At least for secularists, the attainment of these overall aims constitutes the quality of life. What we regard as a life worth living depends on the notion we have of our own nature and of the conditions of its fulfillment. This in turn is determined, at least in part, by the society we live in, its values and standards. Personal ends and purposes in each case depend not only on reason, but also on the individual agents' dispositions, the likes and dislikes, that make up their character. In addition, these ends are influenced by external factors such as health, wealth, social standing, and even good looks or sheer luck.

Self-evident as these truisms may appear, most of the time we are aware of them only implicitly. Human beings grow into a form of life with certain standards and values; these are not objects of reflection and choice. It is only in times of crisis that a society's traditions are challenged by a Socrates, who sees the need to disturb his compatriots' complacency. The historical Socrates was, of course, not the first to question the Greek way of life. Certain Presocratic philosophers such as Heraclitus or Xenophanes had been critics of their time — and the sophists had argued that, contrary to the naïve view, it is custom and convention rather than nature that set the standards for what is deemed right or wrong, good or bad in a society. If other thinkers had preceded Socrates with moral and social criticism, he was certainly the first to challenge his fellows on an individual basis with his maxim that ‘the unexamined life is not worth living’ (Ap. 38a). Whatever position one may take in the controversy whether there is anything truly ‘Socratic’ in Plato's early dialogues, it seems beyond doubt that his cross-examinations (elenchos) not only questioned the supreme values in human life, but also challenged the customary notion of ‘virtue’ — the social ‘skills’, attitudes, or character-traits that were all too often geared towards their possessors' success, to the detriment of their neighbors' or the community's well-being. Socrates made it his mission to instigate a re-valuation of those values — and it seems to have cost him his life.

The Socratic legacy prompted Plato to engage in a thorough examination of the nature of knowledge and reality, an examination that gradually took him far beyond the scope of the historical Socrates' discussions. Nevertheless, Plato continued to present his investigations as dialogues between Socrates and some partner or partners and preserved this form even in those of his late works where Socrates is replaced by a stand-in and the didactic nature of the presentations is hard to reconcile with the pretense of dialogue. The literary form makes the interpretation of Plato's ethics difficult because the informal discussions combine questions of ethical, political, social or psychological importance with metaphysical, methodological and epistemological considerations. There are, as a result, no central texts on his ethical doctrine and the information collected from different dialogues may not always fit together well. Since Plato never speaks in his own name, it is difficult to assess the extent to which he agrees with his figures' pronouncements, including Socrates'. That a certain problem or its solution is not mentioned in a dialogue does not mean that Plato was unaware of it. This makes it hard to be certain about the question: “What did Plato see and when did he first see it?” What adds to this difficulty is the fact that we lack information about the order in which Plato wrote his works. It stands to reason, however, that he started with the short dialogues that question the traditional virtues — courage, justice, moderation, wisdom, or piety. It also stands to reason that Plato gradually widened the scope of his investigations by reflecting not only on social and political conditions of morality, but also on the logical, epistemological, and metaphysical presuppositions of a successful moral theory. These theoretical reflections often take on a life of their own. Several of Plato's later works are concerned with ethical problems only marginally or not at all. The Parmenides, the Theaetetus, and the Sophist deal primarily or exclusively with epistemological and metaphysical problems of a quite general nature. Nevertheless, as the Philebus, the Politicus, the Timaeus, and the Laws show, Plato never lost interest in the conditions of the good human life. This article will elucidate the most important stages in the progress of Plato's thought.

2. The early dialogues: Examining life

2.1 The quest for definitions

When confronted with Plato's early dialogues and their investigation of the different kinds of virtues, we may well ask ourselves why he focused on these virtues almost exclusively. The answer seems to lie in the peculiar style of Socratic discussions. First, they always address particular persons. Second, they ask for definitions and their presuppositions (cf. Xenophon Memorabilia I, 10; 16). Both features have important consequences. (1) The personal character of the discussion explains that the focus is on a particular virtue or virtues rather than on the general foundations and principles of ethical thought that would be the natural starting point in a systematic investigation. Socrates' partners either possess — or pretend to possess — certain socially valued skills and attitudes. Thus in the Euthyphro Socrates discusses piety with an ‘expert’ in religious affairs. In the Laches he discusses courage with two renowned generals of the Peloponnesian war, Laches and Nicias. In the Charmides Socrates addresses and — somewhat ironically — the nature of moderation with the two later tyrants, the then very young Charmides, an alleged paragon of modesty, and his guardian, Critias. The Greater Hippias raises the question of the nature of the beautiful with a producer of ‘beautiful things’, the sophist and polymath Hippias. The Protagoras focuses on the question of the unity of virtue with the most famous teacher of ‘civic virtues’ among the sophists. The Gorgias discusses the nature of rhetoric and its relation to virtue with the most prominent teacher of rhetoric among the sophists. In the Meno the question how virtue is acquired is raised by an ambitious seeker of power, wealth, and fame. All of Socrates' interlocutors are at first quite confident about their own competence in discussion. Nor is such confidence unreasonable. If virtue is a kind of ‘skill’ or attitude that enjoys general recognition, its possessor should be able to give an account of his excellence. That such ‘knowledge’ is often at best implicit comes to light only gradually — and often much to the victims' chagrin and anger when they are confronted with their own inability to explain the nature of their cherished expertise. This accounts at least for part of the widespread enmity against Socrates. (2) Though there were no acknowledged formal standards for definitions in Socrates' time, his investigations contributed significantly to the establishment of such standards by exposing the flaws in his partners' abortive attempts to justify their convictions. These flaws vary greatly in kind and gravity: Enumerations of examples are not sufficient to capture the nature of the thing in question. Definitions that merely replace a given concept with a synonym are open to the same attack as the term itself. Definitions may be hopelessly vague or miss the mark entirely; they may be too wide and include unwanted characteristics or subsets; they may be too narrow and exclude essential factors. Moreover, definitions may be incomplete because the subject in question does not constitute a unitary phenomenon. If generally accepted ‘social excellences’ are not simple conditions, they may be subject to conflicting convictions. Examples of all these flaws are exposed in Plato's early dialogues with more or less diagnostic clarity about the exact nature of the respective deficiencies.

Given that the focus in the early dialogues is almost entirely on the exposition of inconsistencies, one cannot help wondering whether Plato himself knew the answers to his queries, had some card up his sleeve that he chose not to play for the time being. This would presuppose that he had not only a clear notion of the nature of the different virtues, but also a positive conception of the good life as such. Since Plato was neither a moral nihilist nor a sceptic, he cannot have regarded moral perplexity (aporia) as the ultimate end, nor continued mutual examination, more Socratico, as a way of life for everyone. Perplexity, as the Meno states, is just a wholesome intermediary stage on the way to knowledge (Me. 84a-b). But if Plato assumed that those convictions that survive Socratic questioning will coalesce into an account of the good life, then he keeps this expectation to himself. Nor would such optimism seem warranted given Socrates' disavowal of knowledge and his disdain for the values of the hoi polloi. There is no guarantee that only false convictions are discarded and true ones retained in a Socratic investigation. Quite the contrary, promising suggestions are as mercilessly discarded as their less promising brethren. Perhaps Plato counted on his readers' intelligence to straighten out what is skewed in Socratic refutations, to detect unfair moves, to supplement what is missing. It is in fact often quite easy to make out fallacies and to correct them; but such corrections must remain incomplete without sufficient information about Plato's conception of the good life and its moral presuppositions. It is therefore a matter of conjecture whether Plato himself held such a view while he composed one aporetic dialogue after the other. He may have either regarded his investigations as experimental stages or seen each dialogue as a piece of a mosaic that he hoped to complete eventually.

If there is a lesson to be drawn from the many failed accounts of the virtues by different partners, it is that definitions of particular virtues in isolation, summed up in one sentence, will not do. The evidence that Plato wanted his readers to draw this very conclusion from early on is somewhat contradictory, however. On the one hand Plato famously pleads for the unity of the virtues in the Protagoras and seems intent to reduce them all to knowledge. Scholars are therefore wont to speak of the ‘intellectualistic’ character of the so-called ‘Socratic ethics’ because it leaves no room for other motivational forces such as emotions or desires. Socrates' proof in the Protagoras that reason cannot be overcome by the passions has — from Aristotle on — been treated as a denial of akrasia, of the phenomenon that was later dubbed ‘weakness of the will’. This intellectualizing tendency does not tell us, however, what kind of master-science would fulfill all requirements and what its content should be. What is more, the emphasis on knowledge does not rule out an awareness on Plato's part of the importance of other factors, even in his early dialogues. Though he often compares the virtues with technical skills, such as those of a doctor or pilot, he may have realized that virtues also involve emotional attitudes, desires and preferences, but seen no clear way to coordinate the rational and the affective components that are connected with the virtues. The discussion of courage in the Laches, for instance, struggles with two different conditions. In his attempt to define courage as steadfastness in battle, Laches, one of the two generals and ‘experts’ on courage, is faced with the dilemma that steadfastness renders a satisfactory definition of courage neither in combination with knowledge nor without it (La. 192a-194c). His comrade Nicias, on the other hand, fails when he tries to identify courage with a certain type of knowledge (197e-200a). The investigation of moderation in the Charmides, likewise, points up that there are two disparate elements commonly associated with that virtue, namely a certain calmness of mind on the one hand (Chrm. 158e-160d) and self-knowledge on the other (166e-175a). It is clear that a complex account would be needed to combine these disparate factors. For moral skills not only presuppose sufficient ‘operative’ rationality but also the requisite attitude towards the desirable ends to be attained and the appropriate means to be employed. Such an insight is displayed in Socrates' long and passionate argument in the Gorgias against Polus and Callicles that the just life is better than the unjust life for the soul of its possessor, an argument that he fortifies with a mythical depiction of the soul's reward and punishment after death (523a-527e). But the nature of justice and the proper care for one's soul is thereby illuminated only indirectly. For the most part, the arguments rely on the incompatibility of his adversaries' selfish aims with their better social insights. Plato may or may not yet have envisaged the kind of solution to that problem he is going to present in the Republic: there he establishes a hierarchy among the virtues with wisdom, the only intellectual virtue, as their basis. Courage, moderation, as well as justice, presuppose a certain steadfastness of purpose and a harmony among the disparate parts of the soul, but their goodness depends entirely on the intellectual part of the soul, just as the virtue of the citizens in his state depends on the wisdom of the philosopher kings (R. 428a-444e). Thus Plato confines the dispositional or ‘demotic’ virtues to second rank (500d; 522a-b).

There are at least some indications that Plato already saw the need for a holistic conception of the good life at the time when he composed his ‘Socratic’ dialogues. At the end of the Laches he lets Nicias founder with his attempt to define courage as the ‘knowledge of what is to be feared and what should inspire confidence’. He is forced to admit that such knowledge presupposes the knowledge of good and bad tout court (La. 199c-e). In a different but related way Socrates alludes to a comprehensive knowledge at the end of the Charmides in his final refutation of Critias' definition of moderation as ‘knowledge of knowledge’ by urging that this type of knowledge is insufficient for the happy life without the knowledge of good and bad (Chrm. 174b-e). But pointing out what is wrong and missing in particular arguments is a far cry from an explanation of what is good and bad in human life. The fact that Plato insists on the shortcomings of a purely ‘technical’ conception of virtue suggests that he was at least facing up to these problems. The discussion of the ‘unity of the virtues’ in the Protagoras — regardless of the perhaps intentionally unsatisfactory structure of his proofs — confirms that Plato realized that a critique of the inconsistencies implied in the conventional values must be insufficient to justify such a unitary point of view. But the evidence of a definitive conception of the good life remains at most indirect at this early stage.

2.2 Definition and recollection

Reflection on what is implied in the quest for definitions confirms that Plato cannot have been blind to the sterility of a purely negative way of argument, or if he was blind at first, his blindness cannot have lasted long. For the quest for definitions has important consequences. First and foremost, definitions presuppose that there is a definable object; that is to say, that it must have a stable nature. Nothing can be defined whose nature changes all the time. In addition, the object in question must be a unitary phenomenon, even if its unity may be complex. If definitions are to be used as a basis, one needs to embrace some kind of essentialism. This presupposition is indeed made explicit in the Euthyphro, where Plato employs for the first time the terminology that will be characteristic of his full-fledged theory of the Forms. In response to Euthyphro's enumeration of various examples of pious behavior, Socrates demands an account of the one feature (Euthphr. 5d: idea; 6d: eidos; 6e: paradeigma) that is common to all cases of what is holy or pious. In spite of this pregnant terminology, few scholars nowadays hold that the Euthyphro already presupposes transcendent Forms in a realm of their own — models that are incompletely copied by their imitations in material conditions. The terms eidos and idea preserved their original meaning of ‘look’ or ‘shape’ into the classical age. But they were also often used in ordinary prose in the more abstract sense of ‘form’, ‘sort’, or ‘kind’. No more than this abstract sense seems to be presupposed in the Euthyphro. There is, at any rate, no mention here of any separation of a sensible and an intelligible realm, let alone of an existence of ‘the holy itself’, as an entity existing in splendid isolation from all particular cases of holiness.

The passage in the Euthyphro makes intelligible, however, why Plato felt encouraged to develop such a view in the dialogues that no longer confine themselves to the ‘negative way’ of questioning the foundations of other people's convictions. The requisite unity and invariance of entities like ‘the holy’, ‘ the beautiful’, ‘the just’ or ‘the equal’, necessarily prompts reflections on their ontological status and on the appropriate means of access to them. Given that they are the objects of definition and the paradigms of their ordinary representatives, there is every reason not only to treat them as real, but also to assign them a state of higher perfection. And once this step has been taken, it is only natural to make certain epistemological adjustments. Access to paradigmatic entities is not to be expected through ordinary experience, but presupposes some special kind of intellectual insight. It seems, then, that Plato was predestined to follow the path that let him adopt a metaphysics and epistemology of transcendent Forms once he had accepted invariant and unitary objects of thought as the subject of definitions. The alternative of treating the objects of definitions as mere constructs of the mind that more or less fit the manifold of everyday-experience clearly was not to Plato's taste. It would have meant the renunciation of the claim to unassailable knowledge and truth in favor of conjecture and, horribile dictu, human convention. The very fact that mathematics was already an established science with rigorous standards and unitary and invariant objects must have greatly enhanced Plato's confidence in applying the same standards to moral philosophy. It led him to search for models of morality beyond the limits of everyday experience. This, in turn, explains the development of his theory of recollection and the postulate of transcendent immaterial objects as the basis of reality and thought, that he presents in the Meno and the Phaedo.

We do not know when, precisely, Plato adopted this mode of thought, but it stands to reason that contact with the Pythagorean school on his first voyage to Southern Italy and Sicily around 390 BC played a major role in this development. Mathematics as a model-science has several advantages: it deals with unchangeable entities that are set down in definitions. It also shows that the essence of these entities cannot properly be comprehended in isolation but only in a network of interconnections that have to be worked out at the same time as each particular entity is defined. To understand what it is to be a triangle, it is necessary — inter alia — to understand the nature of points, lines, planes and their interrelations. That Plato was aware of this fact is indicated already by the somewhat prophetic statement in his introduction of the theory of recollection in the Meno, 81d: “As the whole of nature is akin, and the soul has learned everything, nothing prevents a man, after recalling one thing only — a process men call learning — discovering everything else for himself, if he is brave and does not tire of the search, for searching and learning, are, as a whole, recollection (anamnesis).” The somewhat mystifying claim of an ‘overall kinship’ is then illuminated in the famous ‘mathematical experiment’ (Me. 82b-85c). The slave finally manages — with some pushing and pulling by Socrates and some drawings in the sand — to double the area of a given square. In the course of this interrogation, the disciple gradually discovers the relations between the respective squares and triangles. That Plato takes this to be a crucial feature of knowledge is confirmed later by the distinction between knowledge and true opinion (97b-98b). As Socrates explains, true opinions are unreliable — they are like the statues of Daedalus that easily run away as long as they are not tied down. The requisite ‘tying down’ happens, 98a: “by giving an account of the reason why. And that, Meno my friend, is recollection, as we previously agreed. After they are tied down, in the first place, they become knowledge, and then they remain in place.” This explanation indicates that according to Plato knowledge does not consist in a mental ‘gazing’ at isolated models, but rather in uncovering the invariant relations that constitute the objects in question.

The complexity underlying Plato's theory of the Forms at this stage is easily overlooked because the first application of that theory in the Phaedo suggests that recollection is no more than the grasping of concepts such as ‘exact equality in size’ prompted by the perception of more or less equal seeming sticks and stones (74a-e). Not only that, the same is suggested by the list that first introduces the Forms, 65d-e: “Do we say that there is such a thing as the Just itself or not? And the Beautiful, and the Good? […] I am speaking of all things such as Tallness, Health, Strength, and in a word, the reality of all other things, that which each of them essentially is.” Such an appeal to recollection leaves a lot to be desired. How is one to be sure that one's intuitive grasp of these natures is correct? That ‘recollection’ of isolated ideal objects is not the whole story emerges later in the Phaedo when Socrates presents a ‘simple minded hypothesis’ of the Forms as a way to avoid his difficulties with the causes of generation and destruction (Phd. 99d-100e). The hypothesis he starts out with seems simpleminded, indeed, because it consists of no more than the assumption that everything is what it is by participating in the corresponding Form. But it soon turns out that more is at stake than such naïveté (101d-102a). First, the hypothesis of the respective Form is to be tested by looking at the compatibility of its consequences; second, the hypothesis itself is to be secured by higher hypotheses until some satisfactory starting-point is attained. Unfortunately Socrates gives neither an explanation of the kinds of consequences he has in mind, nor of the kind of ‘satisfactory highest principle’, but confines himself to the demand for orderly procedure. The subsequent distinctions he introduces in preparation of the last proof of the immortality of the soul seem, however, to provide some information about the consequences and hypotheses in question (103d-107b). He first introduces the distinction between essential and non-essential attributes. This distinction is then applied to the soul: since it always causes life in whatever it occupies, it must have life as its essential property, which it cannot lose; hence the soul is incompatible with death and must therefore be immortal. The viability of this argument, stripped here to its bare bones, need not engage us. The procedure shows, at any rate, why Plato resorts to relations between Forms here. The essential tie between soul and life is clearly not open to sense-perception; instead, it takes a good deal of reflection of the mind by itself on what it means to be and to have a soul. To admirers of a two-world metaphysics in Plato it may come as a disappointment that recollection should consist of no more than the uncovering of such relationships. But this agrees well with the fact that with the exception of such concepts of perfection as ‘the Good’ and ‘the Beautiful’, all of Plato's examples in the Phaedo are quite pedestrian. Not only does he confine himself to concepts like ‘tallness’, ‘health’, ‘strength’ and ‘the equal as such’, he treats the fact that knowledge of their nature cannot be derived from sense-perception alone as sufficient evidence for the existence of such Forms, as the case of equal looking sticks and stones supposedly shows.

Plato does not in the Phaedo employ his newly established metaphysical entities to work out a definitive conception of human nature and the appropriate way of life. Rather he confines himself to warnings against the contamination of the soul by the senses and their pleasures and against corruption by worldly values, quite generally. He gives no advice concerning human conduct beyond the recommendation of a general abstemiousness from worldly temptations. This seems a rather austere picture of human life, and an egocentric one, to boot, for nothing is said about relations between human beings. Socrates treats as sufficient the warning that everyone should take care of his soul as best he can. It is unclear whether this negative attitude is the sign of a particularly pessimistic period in Plato's life or whether it merely reflects the circumstances of the discussion, Socrates' impending death. As long as this negative attitude towards the physical side of human nature prevails no interest is to be expected in nature as a whole — let alone in the principles of the cosmic order (but cf. 5.1 below). But it is not only Platonic asceticism that stands in the way of such a wider perspective. Socrates himself seems to have been quite adverse to the study of nature. Not only does Plato make him admit his inability to understand the causes of natural processes in the Phaedo (96a-99e). In his Apology he lets him deny energetically any concern with natural philosophy. The accusations that depict Socrates as “a student of all things in the sky and below the earth” are quite false (18c); he has never conversed on such issues at all; the attribution to him of Anaxagorean tenets such as that the sun is stone and the moon earth is a sign of his accusers' recklessness (26d-e). And in a dialogue as late as the Phaedrus, Socrates famously explains his preference for the city and his avoidance of nature (230d): “landscapes and trees have nothing to teach me — only the people in the city can do that.” That Plato is not here distorting the facts is confirmed by the testimony of Xenophon, who is equally emphatic about Socrates' repudiation of the study of heavenly phenomena and his concentration on human affairs (Memorabilia I 1.15-16). If Plato later takes a much more positive attitude towards nature in general, this is a considerable change of focus. In the Phaedo he quite deliberately confines his account of the nature of heaven and earth to the myth (108d-114c). As he states in conclusion, this mythical depiction is not to be taken literally but as an encouragement to heed its moral message and to take care of one's soul (114d-e). This is as constructive as Plato gets in his earlier discussion of the principles of ethics.

3. The middle period: Justice and other virtues

3.1 The needy nature of human beings

If Plato went through a period of open-ended experimentation, this stage was definitely over when he wrote the Republic, the central work of his middle years. That there is a major change of mind is indicated already by the dialogue's dramatic means. The aporetic controversy about justice in the first book is set off quite clearly against the cooperative discussion that is to follow in the remaining nine books. Like the Gorgias, the first book of the Republic presents three partners who defend, with increasing tension, their notion of justice against Socrates' elenchos. Of these disputes especially the altercation with the sophist Thrasymachus has received a lot of attention, because he defends the provocative thesis that justice is the right of the stronger and that conventional justice is at best high-minded foolishness. The arguments employed by Socrates at the various turns of the discussion will not be presented here. Though they reduce Thrasymachus to angry silence they are not above criticism. Even Socrates himself expresses dissatisfaction with the result of this discussion, R. 354c: “As far as I am concerned, the result is that I know nothing, for when I don't know what justice is, I'll hardly know whether it is a kind of virtue or not, or whether a person who has it is happy or unhappy.“ For once, the confession of aporia is not the end of the discussion. Two members of the audience, Plato's brothers Glaucon and Adeimantus, challenge Socrates: Thrasymachus has defended his case badly. If Socrates wants to convince his audience, he must do better than that. Not only do the brothers demand a positive account of what justice is and does to the soul of its possessor, Glaucon also makes clear that he expects a systematic investigation by distinguishing three types of goods (357b): There is (a) the kind of good that is welcome for its own sake, regardless of any consequences; such are joy and the harmless pleasures. There is (b) the kind of good that is desired for its own sake and also for the sake of its consequences; such are sight, knowledge, or health. There is (c) the kind of good that is not chosen for its own sake but only on account of its consequences, such as physical training, or the acquisition of wealth. Since all are agreed that (b) is the most valuable kind, Socrates is to prove that justice belongs to that class of goods.

The change of character in the ensuing discussion is remarkable. Not only are the two brothers not subjected to an elenchos, they get ample time to elaborate on their objections (357a-367e). Though they are not themselves convinced that injustice is a better good than justice, they argue that in the present state of society injustice pays — with the gods as well as with men — as long as the semblance of respectability is preserved. To prove this claim the brothers assume the role of devil's advocate by unfolding a scathing picture of their society's attitude towards justice. As the story of the Ring of Gyges and its gift of invisibility proves, everyone who does not have a god-like character will eventually succumb to the ring's temptations (359c-360d). Instead of the wolf, as in Thrasymachus' account, it is the fox who is the paragon of injustice. He will succeed at every level because he knows how to play the power-game with cunning. The just man, by contrast, pays no heed to semblance and therefore suffers a Christ-like fate, because he does not comply with the demands of favoritism and blandishment (361e). Even the gods, so the poets allegedly confirm, are on the side of the successful scoundrel since they can be propitiated by honors and sacrifices. Given this state of affairs, the brothers regard a logic-chopping argument that justice is better than injustice as quite insufficient (367b-e: logô). Instead, Socrates is to tell them what effect each of them have on the soul of their possessors. Plato clearly regards refutation as insufficient to make true converts; whether he ever had such confidence in the power of refutation must remain a moot point. The Republic shows, at any rate, that he saw that the time had come for a positive account of morality and the good life. If elenchos is used in Plato's later dialogues it is never used in the knock-down fashion of the early dialogues.

Socrates complies with the brothers' request. Ignoring his own disclaimer of knowledge from the end of book I, he now readily engages in a long drawn-out investigation on justice and injustice. A brief sketch of its main points must suffice here, to make intelligible Plato's definition of justice and the other kinds of virtue. Instead of setting out with a definition of justice, Socrates asserts the need to study its nature in a ‘larger text’, the state, rather than in the smaller and harder to decipher soul. A study of how a city comes to be will supposedly reveal how justice and injustice arise in it (369a). The justification of the assumed isomorphism between the state and the soul is postponed till book IV, after the establishment of a three-class society. This procedure has received much comment and criticism in the secondary literature, but its justification will not here be subject to any closer scrutiny. Instead, it is necessary to take a closer look at the principle of mutual economic need that Socrates introduces as the principle on which communities are based in 369b: “A city comes to be because none of us is self-sufficient (autarkês), but we all need many things. […] And because people need many things, and because one person calls on a second out of one need and on a third out of a different need (chreia), many people gather in a single place to live together as partners and helpers.” The need in question is, at least at this point, purely economic. The minimal city is based on the need for food, clothing, shelter, and the corresponding tools. Need also dictates the adoption of the principle of the ‘division of functions’ — as one should call it, rather than ‘division of labor’ in the modern sense. This principle determines not only the structure of the minimal self-subsistent state of farmers and other workers, but also the subsequent separation of three classes in the ‘inflated state’. A more luxurious city needs protection by a professional army as well as the leadership of a class of philosopher-kings and -queens. Beyond the claim that the division of functions is much more economical, Plato gives no justification for this fateful decision that determines the social order in the state as well as the nature of the virtues. Human beings are not born alike, but with different talents that predestine them for different tasks in a well-ordered state. This leads to Plato's rule: ‘one person — one work’ (R. 370a-c; 423d).

Plato's ethics in the Republic is thus not based on high-minded moral principles with a transcendent summum bonum, but on down-to-earth considerations of efficiency. This is an important fact to keep in mind in an evaluation of his ethical system. Since the division of functions surreptitiously paves the way for the definition of justice as ‘doing your own thing’ in book IV (432d-433b), it is necessary to review, at least briefly, the kind of social order Plato has in mind and the means by which it is to be attained. For this explains not only the establishment of a three-class society and the corresponding parts of the soul, it also explains Plato's theory of education, and its metaphysical presuppositions. That economic needs are the basis of the political structure does, of course, not mean that they are the only human needs Plato recognizes. It indicates, however, that the emphasis here is on the unity and self-sufficiency of a well-structured city, not on the well-being of the individual (423c-e; 425c). This focus should be kept in mind in the assessment of the ‘totalitarianism’ and rigorous cultural conservatism of Plato's political philosophy.

Socrates' minimal city is designed to satisfy no more than the basic economical needs. If he calls it a ‘healthy city’ that is because it is a self-contained community without riches that attract outside covetousness or with demands that make foreign conquests necessary. When his partners protest against the citizens' primitive lifestyle because it resembles a ‘city of pigs’ he readily agrees (372e-373a). To supply cultural refinement, the city has to grow in size and wealth and thus conflicts with neighbors become inevitable. In accordance with the principle of division of functions, a professionally trained army is necessary. It is this very feature that leads to the discussion of education, because the preservation of internal peace and external security presuppose the combination of two different character-traits among the ‘guardians’, namely friendliness towards their fellow-citizens and fierceness towards the enemy (‘the philosophical watchdogs’, 375d-376c). This starts a long discussion of the appropriate education that combines the right kind of ‘muses’ (poetry, music, and other fine arts) with the right amount of physical exercise to procure the right temperament and attitude in the soldiers (376d-403d). The muses come in for protracted criticism, both in content and form. All stories that undermine respect towards the gods are to be banned, along with tales that instill fear of death in the guardians. Imitation of bad persons is forbidden, as are impersonations of different characters quite generally. Analogous injunctions apply, mutandis mutatis, to the modes and rhythms in music and to painting. Physical exercise must fit the harmonious soul and therefore must not exceed what is healthy and necessary (403e-412b). Since the educational scheme is geared to secure a harmonious and yet spirited class of soldiers, Plato bans from the city most of the cultural achievements that were the Greeks' pride and joy. There must be nothing to disturb the citizens' willingness to fulfill their tasks. In order to secure such an education, Socrates introduces a third class, the class of the rulers of the city (412b-417b). They are to be selected through tests of character from the soldiers — most of all because they must be unshakable in their conviction that their own well-being is intimately tied to that of the city. To secure this attitude, they must lead a communal life, without private homes, families, or property. His partner's objection, that the leaders are thereby deprived of all happiness is not accepted by Socrates: first, their concern is not the happiness of one particular group, but that of the city as a whole. Second, the rulers will have their own type of happiness, which differs significantly from that of ordinary people. As will emerge later in books VI and VII, the rulers will be recompensed by the rewards of higher learning.

3.2 Virtues of state and soul

The division of functions that leads to the separation of three classes is reflected in the search for justice that concludes the discussion of the social order (427d-434c). This order explains the peculiar character of Socrates' further procedure. He presents, without comment, the catalogue of what in later tradition have been dubbed as ‘the four cardinal Platonic virtues’ — wisdom, courage, moderation, and justice. Piety, as the text indicates, is no longer to be considered as an autonomous human virtue, but religious practices should be left to tradition and the oracle of Apollo at Delphi (427b-c). Socrates then suggests that justice can be discovered by a method of ‘elimination’: If there are four virtues in the city, then justice must be left over after the other three have been identified (427e). He neither proves that there are exactly four virtues in a state nor that they are items that can be lifted up, singly, for inspection, like eggs in a basket. Instead, he simply presents his catalogue of virtues and determines the role they play in the maintenance of the social order. First comes wisdom (sophia), the only purely intellectual virtue and the exclusive possession of the rulers (428b- 429a). Little more is said about it at this point, except that it is ‘good council’ (euboulia) in decisions about the internal and external affairs of the city. Second is courage (andreia), the soldiers' defining excellence (429a-430c). Socrates has some trouble explaining its nature, since it is a mixture of conviction (doxa) and steadfastness of character (sôtêria); he compares this disposition with colorfast wool: through thick and thin the guardians must be dyed-in-the-wool adherents to the laws' decrees about what is to be feared. Third comes moderation (sôphrosunê) (430d-432a). Again it is not an intellectual excellence, but rather a kind of combination of belief with a certain orderly disposition. It is a conviction shared by the three classes about who should rule (doxa, 431e), but this belief is based on a state of ‘order’ (kosmos), ‘consonance’ (sumphônia), a ‘harmony’ (harmonia) that results in the mastery of certain kinds of pleasures and desires so that the better part is in control of the lower part. It is clear from its description as ‘self-mastery’ (egkrateia) that this virtue fits the individual soul better than an entire city (430e-431b), as witnessed by the fact that the function of self-control in the individual soul is used in order to explain its role in the city. Moderation is supposedly not the specialty of any one class of the state, but a unanimity shared by all three (432a). The third class, then, has no specific virtue of its own. That moderation is a virtue common to all three classes makes it hard to pinpoint its difference from justice, the excellence that is left over and that is also shared by all (432d-434c). Socrates claims to realize only now that justice is neither more nor less than the principle they have employed all along in the foundation of their state, namely that everyone is to “do their own thing and not meddle with that of another” (433a). In comparison with moderation's function as “consonance about who should rule and be ruled”, justice as “doing your own thing” may signify a more active state of mind with a wider extension since its task is also to see to it that “no citizen should have what belongs to another or be deprived of what is his own” (433e). But since the dispositions of justice and moderation are not specified any further, there seems to be only a fine line between the functions of justice and moderation in the city. That there are four virtues rather than three, may be due to to the fact that this catalogue of four was a fixture in tradition. Indeed, as will be emerge in connection with the virtues in the individual soul, the distinction between justice and moderation is far less problematic when applied to the individual, because in the individual soul internal self-control and external self-restraint are clearly different attitudes.

The promise to establish the isomorphic structure of city and soul (= the larger and the smaller text) has not been forgotten. After the definition and the assignment of the four virtues to the parts of the city Socrates turns to the investigation of the virtues in the soul. In order to do so, he first has to establish that there are three parts in the soul, just as there are three classes in the city. The lengthy argument for the tri-partition of the soul into a rational (logistikon), a spirited (thumoeides), and an appetitive (épithumêtikon) part (434d-441c), can here be neither reproduced nor subjected to a critical evaluation. That Plato lets Socrates express reservations concerning the fittingness of his own procedure (435c-d), despite his unusually circumspect way of justifying his division of the soul's faculties, indicates that he regards it as an important innovation. No mention of separate parts of the soul is to be found in any of his earlier dialogues; irrational desires are attributed there to the influence of the body. In the Republic, by contrast, the soul itself becomes the source of the appetites and desires. Socrates has little trouble in establishing the difference between a rational and an appetitive part, because the opposition between the decrees of reason and the various kinds of unreasonable desires is familiar to everyone (438d-439e). That there must be a third, a ‘spirited’ or courageous part (thumoeides), separate from reason and desire, is more difficult to prove. The phenomenon of moral indignation is finally used as evidence for a psychic force that is neither reducible to reason, nor to one of the appetites. Instead, it is an ally of reason in a well-ordered soul, a force opposed to unruly appetites (439e-441c). Thus Socrates takes it as established that there are three parts in the soul that correspond to the classes in the city — the rational part to the wisdom of the rulers, the spirited part to the courage of the soldiers, the appetitive part to the rest of the population whose main motivation is material gain.

The division of the soul leads to the final evaluation of justice and injustice: In the city there is justice if the members of the three classes mind their own business; in the individual soul justice likewise consists in each part fulfilling its own function. This presupposes that the two upper parts have obtained the right kind of training and education in order to control the appetitive part (441d-442a). The three other virtues are then assigned to the respective parts of the soul. Courage is the excellence of the spirited part, wisdom belongs to the rational part, and moderation is the consent of all three about who should rule and who should obey. Justice turns out to be the overall unifying quality of the soul (443c-e). The just person does not only refrain from meddling with what is not his externally, but also internally harmonizes the three parts of the soul. While justice is order and harmony, injustice is its opposite: it is a rebellion of one part of the city or soul against the others and an inappropriate rule of the inferior parts. Justice and injustice in the soul are, then, like health and illness in the body. This comparison suffices to bring the investigation to its desired result. If justice is health and harmony of the soul, then injustice must be its disease and disorder. Hence it is clear that justice is a good state of the soul that makes its possessor happy and injustice its opposite. As little as anyone in his right mind would prefer to live with a ruined body, so no-one would prefer to live with a diseased soul. In principle the discussion of justice has reached its promised goal already at the end of book IV. Socrates has met the challenge of Glaucon and Adeimantus to show that justice is a good for the soul of its possessor, in and by itself, and preferable to injustice.

That the discussion does not end here but occupies six more books it due, most of all, to several loose ends that need to be tied up. Apart from the fact that reason and order are to reign supreme, little has been said about the citizens' way of life. This gap will be filled, at least in part, by the description of the communal life without private property and family in book V. More importantly, nothing has been said about the rulers of the city and their particular kind of knowledge. This is a crucial point because, as their definitions show, the quality of the three ‘inferior’ virtues is contingent on the rulers' wisdom. Socrates addresses this problem with the provocative thesis (473c-d): “Until philosophers rule as kings or those who are now called kings and leading men genuinely and adequately philosophize, […] cities will have no rest from evils, nor will the human race.” This thesis starts the discussion of the philosophers' nature, their upbringing and education through books VI and VII. A short summary of the upshot of the educational program must suffice here. The future philosophers, both women and men, are selected from the group of guardians whose general cultural training they share. If they combine moral firmness with quickness of mind they are subject to a rigorous curriculum of higher learning that will prepare them for the ascent from the world of the senses to the world of intelligence and truth, a distinction and ascent that Plato sums up in the similes of the Sun, the Line, and the Cave (508a-518b). To achieve this ascent, the students have to undergo, first, a preparatory schooling of ten years duration in the ‘liberal arts’: arithmetic, geometry, astronomy and theoretical harmonics (518c-531c). Afterwards they are admitted to the training in the master-science of ‘dialectic’, a science of which little more is said beyond the indication that it enables its possessor to deal with the objects of real knowledge, the Forms, and with the Form of the Good in particular, since it is the principle of the goodness of all else (531c-535a). This study is to last for another five years. Successful candidates are then sent back into the Cave of ordinary political life as administrators for about 15 years. At the age of fifty they are allowed to return to the green meadow of philosophy, an activity that is interrupted only by periods of service as overseers over the order of the state. This completes, in a nutshell, the description of the philosopher kings' and — queens' education and activities (539d-541b).

Plato's autocratic rule by an aristocracy of the mind has received a lot of flak. An assessment of his politics must here be limited to the conception of happiness it contains. Regardless of whether or not we accept his overall principle of the Good as the basis of the political order, Plato's model-state has, at least in theory, the advantage that it guarantees external and internal peace. That is no mean feat in a society where external and civil wars were a constant threat and often enough ended in the destruction of the entire state. It also guarantees a high degree of efficiency, if every citizen does what he/she is naturally suited to do. But what about the citizens’ needs, beyond those for security and material goods? Are they to find their life's fulfillment in the pursuit of their jobs? Plato seems to think so; he characterizes each class by its specific kind of desire and the respective good, 581c: the philosophers are lovers of wisdom (philosophoi), the soldiers lovers of honor (philotimoi), and the workers are lovers of material goods (philochrêmatoi). That human beings find, or at least try to find, satisfaction in the kinds of goods they cherish is a point pursued at length in the depiction of the decay of the city and its ruling citizens, from the best, the aristocracy of the mind, down to the worst, the tyranny of lust, in books VIII and IX. Is this a viable theory of political conditions and change that does justice to human nature? It concurs with the assumption that people are happy if they get what they want; ‘preference-satisfaction’ of the citizens is nowadays treated as one of the prime aims of every liberal state. But Plato's restriction of each class to one type of good seems quite ‘illiberal’, most obviously in the case of the citizens of the third class who supposedly covet nothing but wealth. This ‘reductive’ view of human nature militates not only against present-day intuitions, it also militates against Plato's own psychology in that all human souls consist of three parts, a rational, a spirited, and an appetitive part. Why reduce the third class to animals of low appetites, as suggested by the comparison of the people to a strong and big beast that must be placated (493a-c)? This comparison is echoed later in the comparison of the soul with a multiform beast, where human reason just barely controls the hydra-like heads of the appetites with the aid of a lion-like spirit (588c-590d). Is Plato merely giving vent to his anti-democratic sentiments and contempt for the rabble, as has often been claimed? He can be cleared of the suspicion that the workers are mere serfs of the upper classes, because he explicitly grants them the free enjoyment of all customary goods that he denies to the upper classes, 419a: “Others own land, build fine big houses, acquire furnishings to go along with them, make their own private sacrifices to the gods, entertain guests, and also, of course, possess what you were talking about just now, gold and silver and all the things that are thought to belong to people who are blessedly happy.” But apart from such liberties, the members of the third class are utterly neglected in Plato's Callipolis; no education seems provided for them. He nowhere mentions whether they even participate in the guardians' musical and athletic training. Plato seems to sidestep his own insight that all human beings have an immortal soul and have to take care of it as best they can, as he is going to suggest in such a fanciful way in the Myth of Er at the end of Republic book X.

The life-style designed for the upper classes seems also open to objections. The soldiers' musical and physical training is strictly regimented; they must take satisfaction in the pleasures of preserving the city's inner and outer peace and in deeds of valor in war. Theirs is an austere camp-life. But even the philosophers' lives leave a lot to be desired, and not only because they have to starve their common human appetites and to devote many years to the administration in the ‘Cave’. Their intellectual pursuits are also not entirely enviable, as a closer inspection would show. Not only do the philosophers have two jobs, in violation of the rule ‘one person one function’, by doing both administrative work and philosophical reflection. They are also not to enjoy open-ended research, but a mental training that is explicitly designed to turn their thought away from worldly conditions and to the contemplation of the Forms. This is indicated in the injunctions concerning the study of astronomy (529a-530c). The students are not to crane their necks to watch the “embroidery in the heavens”, but to concern themselves with the ideal motions of ideal moving bodies in a purely geometrical fashion. The universe is not treated as an admirable cosmos in the way Plato is going to treat it in the Timaeus and in the Laws, with the explicit purpose of providing moral and intellectual support to the citizens. Given these limitations of the philosophers' mental exercises in the Republic, the claim that their lives are 729 times more pleasant than the tyrants' (587e) seems like a gross exaggeration, even if they enjoy the pleasures of being filled with pure and unadulterated truths, while everyone else experiences only semblances of pleasures (581e-588a).

To cut short the criticism of Plato's model-city and the lives of its inhabitants: His city resembles a well-oiled machine where everyone has their appointed function and economic niche, but its machine-like character seems repellent, given that no deviations from the prescribed pattern are permitted. If innovations are forbidden, no room seems to be left for creativity and personal development. Plato presupposes, that the fulfillment of a person's function is sufficient to secure her happiness. This at least is suggested by the ‘functional’ argument that leads to Thrasymachus' downfall (352d-354a). It states that every object, animal, and person has a specific function or work (ergon). If it performs its function well, it does well; for a living thing ‘doing well’ means ‘living well’; and living well is tantamount to living happily. Though Socrates' refutation of Thrasymachus is found wanting as a proof of justice's superiority, the ergon-argument is nowhere revoked. On the contrary, it is affirmed by the principle of ‘one person — one work’ that is the basis of Plato's ideal city. It seems rather inhumane to confine everyone's activities to just one kind of work, even if such confinement may be most economical and efficient. These features suffice to make the ideal life in Plato's city unpalatable to us, even apart from other features that have been put aside here, such as the communal life envisaged for the upper classes, and the establishment of lotteries for sexual partners that are rigged for eugenic reasons.

What is perhaps strangest about Plato's depiction of his citizens' life is the fact that he does not even emphasize the one feature that could throw a more favorable light on his social order, namely that each citizen will take pride and joy in the products of their work, especially given that they are to be regarded — each in their own way — as a valuable contribution to the community's well-being. This applies especially to the members of the third class, because they produce the city's material goods, the tailors, carpenters, doctors, architects, sailors, and all those who are summed up rather ungraciously under the epithet of ‘money-lovers’. Has this fact escaped Plato's notice, alongside other deficiencies of his blue-print of an ideal city? Against all these complaints, justified as they must seem, it should be pointed out that Plato clearly is not concerned with all the conditions that would make his city ‘livable’. His aim is rather more limited. He wants to present a model, and to work out its essential conditions. The same explanation applies to his depiction of the city and the citizens' decay in books VIII and IX. Contrary to many critics' assumption, Plato is not there trying to explain the course of history. Rather he wants to explain the generation and decay of each political system and the psychopathology of its leaders, which is based on the respective constitution's characteristic ‘value’: honor, money, freedom, and lust. It is unlikely that Plato presupposes that there are pure representatives of these types, though some historical states may come closer to them than others. Given that his aim is to work out the model of a well-functioning state, he does not concern himself with softening the features of his austere sketch.

If concentration on the depiction of the model explains the ‘inhumanity’ of Plato's political vision, are there nonetheless indications that he was aware of the limitations imposed on his ‘political animals’ when he confines them to their functions in an efficiently run community? Was he aware of the fact that his black-and-white picture disregards the claim of individuals to have their own aims and ends and not to be treated like ‘blue ants’ with no thoughts of their own? Though the Republic contains some indications that would mitigate this bleak picture, it is more fruitful to look at other works of Plato's middle life that concentrate on the conditions of the individual soul rather than on the demands of the community. These works are the Symposium and the Phaedrus.

4. The later dialogues: Ethics and Dialectic

4.1 Happiness and the desire for self-completion

It should come as no surprise that in the two dialogues where Plato focuses on the individual soul he does not require a total submergence in the common weal. Instead there is a picture of self-improvement and self-completion. The Symposium is often treated as a dialogue that predates the Republic, most of all because it does not mention the tri-partition of the soul. But not only is its topic, the praise of Eros by all those present, ill suited to the period of the Gorgias and the Phaedo with their spirit of asceticism, but Plato has good reasons for leaving aside a separation of the soul's faculties and a compartmentalization of their aims and values in order to show that love is an incentive for all human beings. Contrary to the assumption of all other speakers in the Symposium, Socrates denies that Eros is a god since the gods are perfect; love, by contrast, is a kind of desire for the beautiful and the good (199c-201c). Thus, all previous speakers have confused love with the beloved. Socrates claims to have received this message from a “lecture on the nature of love by the wise Diotima” (201d-212b). The upshot is that Eros is but a powerful demon, a being between the mortal and the immortal, an eternally needy hunter for the beautiful. This is also the condition of all human beings — as such they are neither good nor bad, but owing to their needy nature all have a desire for the good and the beautiful, the possession of which would be happiness for them. Because all people want happiness, they all pursue the beautiful to the best of their ability (205a-206b). In each case they desire the particular kinds of objects they take to provide the fulfillment of their needs. Such fulfillment is not a passive possession, it is rather productivity in the strife for self-completion, 207d: “For among animals the principle is the same as with us, and mortal nature seeks so far as possible to live forever and be immortal. And this is possible in one way only: by reproduction, because it leaves behind a new young one in place of the old.” Because all mortal nature is subject to constant change and wasting away, there is a permanent need for self-restoration and self-improvement. In the case of human beings this need to create expresses itself in different ways. There is the search for ‘eternalization’ by the procreation of children of the body or children of the mind, like the works of the arts and crafts, but above all there is the production of the kind of wisdom that orders cities in justice and moderation (209a-e). The Diotiman lecture is finally crowned with a description of the famous ‘scala amoris’, the explanation of the refinement and sublimation that a person experiences by recognizing higher and higher kinds of beauty (210a-212a). Starting with the love of one beautiful body, the individual gradually learns to appreciate not only all physical beauty, but also the beauty of the mind, and in the end it gets a glimpse of the supreme kind of beauty, the Form of the beautiful itself, a beauty that is neither relative nor a matter of degree.

Since the beauty of the highest degree that is discovered by the mind itself is tied to virtue and is attained by the comprehension of what is common in laws and public institutions, it is clear that Plato does not have aesthetic values in mind, but rather the highest principle of all that is good, namely the Form of the Good in the Republic. Where the Republic's and the Symposium's accounts differ is that the scala amoris regards physical beauty as an incentive to the higher and better, an incentive that in principle affects every human being. There is no talk of the need for a painful liberation from the bonds of the senses and a turn-around of the entire soul reserved only for the better educated. The difference of this account cannot be explained away as a kind of aberration, as might be suggested by the fact that it is not Socrates' but Diotima's story that is reported here. Socrates quite emphatically declares his own allegiance to the story's message by calling himself Diotima's disciple in matters of love, and there is indeed an important doctrine he owes to her. Brief as the Symposium's explanation of happiness is, it shows three things: First, all human beings are not only capable of, but also desire their own self-completion. Second, this drive finds its expression in the products of their work, in creativity. Third, the respective activities are instigated by each person's own particular desire for the beautiful. There is no indication that individuals must act as part of a community. Though the communitarian aspect is not excluded, it is also not emphasized, in spite of the fact that the products of statesmen receive particular — but not exclusive — attention (cf. “the children of Lycurgus and Solon's creation of laws”, 209e- 210a). The message of the Symposium is not a singularity in Plato's works. The Lysis shares its basic assumption about human nature, namely that humans are by nature ‘between’ goodness and badness, although in the Lysis it is friendship, not love, that provides occasion for the desired self-completion. Owing to the aporetic character of that dialogue, this consequence remains somewhat obscure, but it is obvious enough that it shares the Symposium's general anthropological presuppositions.

The idea that eros is a means of sublimation and self-completion is worked out further in the Phaedrus. Though the close relationship between this dialogue's topic and that of the Symposium is generally acknowledged, the Phaedrus is commonly regarded as a much later work. Not only does it develop the Republic's psychological doctrine of a tri-partite soul, it also contains an argument for the immortality of the soul, an element that is conspicuously absent in the Symposium. But this difference is due to a distinction of perspective rather than a change of mind. The discussion in the Symposium is deliberately confined to the conditions of self-immortalization in this life; the Phaedrus takes the discussion beyond the confines of this life. If it shares the Republic's doctrine of a division of the soul into three parts, it does so for a significantly different reason. The three parts of the soul in the Phaedrus do not serve to establish three different classes of people. They explain, rather, the way in which the individual souls manage to travel upwards in their search of beauty and also the reasons for their possible failure. The Phaedrus goes beyond the Symposium in the attempt to show how the story of an enchantment by beauty can be combined with an element of Plato's philosophy that seems quite alien to the notion of self-improvement and sublimation through the love of beauty. That alien element is the method of collection and division that is characteristic of dialectic in Plato's later work. At first sight it seems that the combination of the picture of enchantment by beauty, expressed in a highly poetic and mythical form, in the dialogue's first part and the methodological explanations in the second part do not fit together well. It may seem as if Plato just barely manages to keep them together by making the treatment of ‘eros’ the test-case for good and bad rhetoric. Though the coherence of the Phaedrus cannot be argued for in full here, this diagnosis does not do justice to the dialogue's careful composition and overall aim.

The discussion in the Phaedrus starts with a recital of a speech by the orator Lysias, which pleads that it is better to favor a non-lover than a lover. To show its deficiencies, Socrates delivers his own, rather ironic, counter-plea (237b-242a). He bases it on the following definition of love: Love is a kind of sickness, an irrational craving for the pleasures of the body; its possessor tries to dominate and enslave the beloved one physically, materially and mentally, most importantly, to deprive him of philosophy; once restored to his senses the lover will shun his former beloved and break all his promises. About the non-lover Socrates claims there is no need to say much: the very opposite to all the lover's shortcomings apply to the non-lover, since he is in full command of his reasoning. The display of Socrates' superior rhetorical skill does not end here, however. He claims that his divine warning voice has indicated to him that his first speech was sacrilegious; a recantation is in order: Eros is a god, the son of Aphrodite, and not a diseased state of mind at all, but a kind of ‘divine madness’ (theia mania). Socrates' palinode is very elaborate (242d-257b). He distinguishes between four kinds of ‘divine madness’ or ‘enthusiasm’: besides love, there is the madness of divination, the madness underlying mystic purifications, and the madness of poetic inspiration. In order to explain the nature of love, Socrates first enters into a lengthy disquisition on the soul's nature, which can be summed up only very briefly here. As a ‘self- mover’, the soul must be immortal; in structure it resembles a charioteer with a team of two winged horses, a white one that is good and obedient, a black one that is wicked and unruly. The soul therefore has three parts, just as it does in the Republic, and its condition, likewise, depends on their harmonious cooperation. The crucial difference is that Plato here does not speak of the liberation through education; instead he tells the story of the uplifting effect of — at least at first — physical beauty that makes the soul grow wings and soar up in the pursuit of a corresponding deity, until it attains godlike insights. Since the story is clad in highly metaphorical language, it cannot be fully unraveled here. Suffice it to say that the elevation to a place ‘beyond the heavens’, in the wake of the gods, where the best souls get a glimpse of true being, symbolizes the mind's access to the Forms, including the nature of the virtues (247c-e). Depending on the quality of each human soul, an individual will live either a carnal, earthly life and lose its wings, or it will live a spiritual, philosophical life in pursuit of beauty. In each case, the quality of the beauty pursued will also determine the cycle of reincarnations that is at store for each soul (248c-249c).

4.2 The quest for method

What is remarkable in the Phaedrus' picture of the uplifting effect of beauty is not only the exuberant tone and imagery that goes far beyond the Symposium's simple scala amoris. There is also an intricate interweaving of the mythical and philosophical elements. For in the midst of the fanciful depiction of the fates that are in store for different kinds of souls Plato specifies, in quite technical terms, the ability to, 249b-c: “understand speech in terms of general Forms, proceeding to bring many perceptions together into a reasoned unity” as the condition for the reincarnation in a human form. It is this capacity for abstraction that he then calls “recollection of what the soul saw when it was traveling with god, when it disregarded the things we now call real and lifted up its head to what is truly real instead.” The heavenly adventure seems to be no more than an exercise in the dialectical method that Socrates is going to describe in the dialogue's second part without further mythical camouflage. The ability to establish unity in a given field and to divide it up according to its natural kinds is the art that the ‘scientific rhetorician’ must have mastered (265d-266b). Socrates professes the greatest veneration for such a master, 266b: “If I believe that someone else is capable of discerning a single thing that is also by nature capable of encompassing many, I follow ‘straight behind, in his tracks, as if he were a god’.” So the heavenly voyage has a quite down to earth counterpart in the dialectical method — a method that Plato regards as a “gift of the gods”, as he is going to affirm in the Philebus. Plato's esteem for ‘taxonomy’ explains at the same time the inner unity of the Phaedrus' apparently incongruous two parts as two sides of one coin, and also shows why Plato no longer sees the sensory as a distraction and disturbance of the mind. For the properly conditioned souls sensory impressions are an incentive to the higher and better.

What kind of concept of happiness is contained in this ‘inspired’ view of human life and strife? As was pointed out earlier, the happy life is not here conceived of as a life subordinate to the well-being of the community. But it is not a lonely life spent in the pursuit of truth and one's own good either. The message of the two dialogues is two-pronged. (1) On the one hand, there is no permanent attainment of happiness as a stable state of completeness in this life. In the ups and downs of life (and the afterlife) humans are in constant need of beauty — in the sense of completion and self-completion. Man is neither a god nor wise, he is at best a god-lover and a philosopher, a demonic hunter for truth and goodness. To know is not to have; and to have once is not to have always. Diotima makes it quite clear that humans stand in an eternal need to replenish what they constantly lose because they are mortal and changeable creatures. (2) On the other hand, the eternal pursuit of the good and the beautiful is not a lonely enterprise. As especially the Phaedrus makes clear, love for a beautiful human being is an incentive to search for a higher form of life, as a sacred joint journey of two friends in communion (255a-256e). The need for — but also the possibility of — constant self- completion and repletion is a motive that will also reappear in the ethical thought in Plato's late works, a motive he sometimes formulates as the maxim that humans should strive after a ‘likening to god’, a homoiôsis theô (Theaetetus, 176b; Timaeus 90c).

Sober philosophers have a tendency to bypass such visionary talk as too elevated and lacking in substance to be worth serious thought. That Plato, appearances notwithstanding, is not indulging in a god-besotted rêverie has been indicated already by his interweaving of the mythical description and the need for careful ‘taxonomical’ procedure. The importance of ‘due process’ is emphasized further in the determination of the use of scientific rhetoric in the second half of the Phaedrus (259e-279c). Artful speaking (and even artful deception) presupposes knowledge of the truth, especially where the identity of the phenomena is difficult to grasp because of deceptive similarities. This applies in particular to concepts like the good and the just, as can be seen by the manifold disagreements about their nature (263a- c). That the development of the ‘sharp eye’ that is needed for the assignment of the object in question to the right class is the aim of the method of dialectic by collection and division that Plato expounds at some length in the Phaedrus is well known. Plato there describes the care that is needed in order to, 265d-e: “see together things that are scattered about everywhere and to collect them into one kind (mia idea)” as well as “to cut the unity up again according to its species along its natural joints, and to try not to splinter any part, as a bad butcher might do.” That this method is supposed to serve an overall ethical purpose is confirmed by the fact that scientific rhetoric must not only know the different types of souls and the types of speech that fit them (271d), but also the truth about just and good things (272d).

That dialectic is geared to this end is somewhat obscured in the subsequent discussion in the Phaedrus. First of all, Plato turns away from this issue in the long exposition of the iniquities of contemporary rhetoricians by comparison with ‘scientific rhetoric’ and in the discussion of speaking and writing that culminates in his famous ‘critique of writing’. Second, the ample use Plato makes of the method of collection and division in later dialogues, such as the Sophist and the Statesman, seems to have little to do with ethical questions. That Plato's ethics employs the tools of dialectic to sort out the different kinds of goods in human life comes to the fore again in the late dialogue Philebus, but the aptness of the dialectical method to discern the nature of the good has been emphasized — albeit not demonstrated — already in the Republic (534b-c). The specifications Plato adds concerning the systematic character he expects from the dialectical procedure provide a clue about the otherwise puzzling fact that he nowhere seems to apply his own recipe where the Good as such is concerned. A collection and methodical division of all that is good would be a superhuman enterprise. It would presuppose nothing less than the knowledge of all kinds of beings — and the insight in what constitutes the goodness of each of them. Already the investigation of a part of the good is an highly ambitious task, as the investigation of the human good in state and soul in the Republic shows. Though it is unclear whether he had already developed the dialectical method in the systematic way indicated in the Phaedrus, the hints contained in the Republic about a ‘longer way’ (435d; 504b) to determine the nature of justice and the other virtues seems to suggest that the systematic method of collection and division was already ‘in the works’ when he composed that dialogue. As a closer look at the Philebus will show, the determination of what is good presupposes more than a careful classification by collection and division. In addition, the internal structure of each kind of entity has to be determined. Knowledge is not only the comprehension of the entities’ being, identity, difference and other kinds of external interrelations that exist in a given field. It also presupposes the knowledge of what constitutes the objects' internal unity and plurality. It would, of course, be rather presumptuous to claim that Plato had not seen the need to do ontological ‘anatomy’ as well as ‘taxonomy’ of the Forms from early on. But as the late dialogues show, it took considerable effort to develop the requisite conceptual ‘tools’ for such analyses.

Before we turn to that question, a final review of the kind of good life Plato envisages in the dialogues under discussion here is in order. In the Symposium the emphasis lies on the individual's creativity: the quality of life attainable for each person differs, depending on the kind of ‘work’ each individual is able to produce in its search for self-perpetuation. This is what the scala amoris is all about. In the Phaedrus the emphasis is more on the ‘joint venture’ of kindred souls. True friends will get to the highest point of self-fulfillment that their souls' conditions permit them to attain. Just as in the Symposium, the philosophical life is deemed the best. But then, this preference is not unique to Plato: all ancient philosophers are prejudiced in favor of their own occupation. If there are differences between them, they concern the kind of study that is deemed appropriate to philosophy. The individualistic view of happiness espoused in the Symposium and the Phaedrus need not be seen as a later stage in Plato's development than the Republic's communitarian conception. They may be complimentary rather than rival points of view, and no fixed chronology need be assumed for their accommodation.

5. The late dialogues: Ethics and Cosmology

5.1 Harmony and cosmic goodness

Nature and natural things are not among the objects that Plato pays much attention to in his philosophical investigations. This seems to be confirmed by the fact that in the Republic he dismisses the study of the visible heaven from the curriculum of higher learning along with audible music. But such generalizations about Plato's intentions may be dangerously misleading. What he denigrates is not the study of the heavenly order as such, nor that of harmonics, it is rather the reliance on our eyes and ears in that area. Students of philosophy are encouraged to work out the true intelligible order underlying the visible heaven and the audible music. Not only that: The ascent out of the Cave includes recognition of objects outside, especially “the things in the sky” (R. 516a-b). If Plato is critical of natural science, it is because of its exclusively empirical approach. This echoes the Phaedo's complaint that one ruins one's eyes by looking directly at things, most of all the sun (Phdo. 99d-e). Nevertheless, Plato already indicates in his critique of Anaxagoras that comprehension of the workings of the order of nature would be highly desirable if it contained an explanation of the rationale of that order, 98a: “I was ready to find out about the sun and the moon and the other heavenly bodies, about their relative speed, their turnings and whatever happens to them, how it is best that each should be acted upon.” Anaxagoras had not fulfilled his promise to explain that mind is the cause of all things by showing, 99c: “that the truly good and ‘binding’ binds and holds everything together”, i.e. through a teleological rather than a mechanical explanation of the cosmic order. Plato himself does not, however, pursue this idea in the rest of the dialogue, but his fanciful ‘geographical’ depiction of the under-, middle-, and upper world in the final myth can be read as a model of such an explanation in mythological garb. The same may be claimed for the description of the heavenly order and the structure of the ‘spindle of necessity’ in the myth of Er at the end of the Republic (R. 616b-617d).

What kind of ‘binding force’ does Plato attribute to ‘the Good’? His reticence about this concept, despite its centrality in his metaphysics and ethics, is largely responsible for the obscurity of his concept of happiness and what it is to lead a happy life — apart from the fact that individuals are best off if they ‘do their own thing’. In what way the philosophers' knowledge provides a solid basis for the good life of the community and the — perhaps uncomprehending — individual remains an open question. What, then, is ‘the Good’ that is responsible for the goodness of all other things? A lot of ink has been spilt over the much quoted passage in Republic book VI, 509b: “not only do the objects of knowledge owe their being known to the Good, but their being (ousia) is also due to it, although the Good is not being, but superior (epekeina) to it in rank and power.” The analogy with the sun's maintenance of all that is alive suggests that the Good is the intelligible inner principle that determines the nature of every object capable of goodness in the sense that it is able to fulfill its function in the appropriate way. How such a principle of goodness works in all things Plato clearly felt unable to say when he wrote the Republic. That he was thinking of an internal ‘binding force’ is indicated, however, in book X when he elucidates the ontological difference between the Forms, as the products of a divine maker, their earthly copies, and the imitation of these copies by an artist (R. 596a ff.). In that connection he explains that in each case it is the use or function that determines its goodness, 601d: “Aren't the virtue or excellence, the beauty and correctness of each manufactured item, living creature, and action related to nothing but the use (chreia) for which each is made or naturally adapted?” Since he does not limit this account to instruments, but explicitly includes living things and human actions in it, it seems that he has a specific ‘fittingness’ in mind that constitutes each thing's excellence. A similar thought is already expressed in Republic I (353a-e) when Socrates in his refutation of Thrasymachus employs the argument that the ability to fulfill one's own task (ergon) well constitutes the excellence of each object. In the case of human beings this means ‘doing well’, and ‘doing well’ means ‘living well’, and ‘living well’ means ‘living happily’. The stringency of these inferences is far from obvious; but they show that Plato saw an intimate connection between the nature, the function, and the well being of all things, including human beings.

What determines the ‘use’ of a human being and in how far can there be a common principle that accounts for all good things? In the Republic this question is answered only indirectly by a depiction of the isomorphism of the just state and soul, as a harmonious internal order. The postulate of such an orderly structure is not here explicitly extended beyond the state and the soul. In the later dialogues the Good clearly operates on a cosmic scale. That such is Plato's intention comes to the fore already in the excursus on the philosopher's nature in the Theaetetus (173c-177c). Contrary to Socrates' denial in the Apology, the philosopher now is to pursue both what lies below the earth and the heights above the heaven, 173e: “tracking down by every path the entire nature of each whole among the things that are.” He also concerns himself with the question: “What is man? What actions and passions properly belong to human nature and distinguish it from all other beings?” In that connection he ties the need to discover the true nature of things with the ‘likening to God’ (homoiôsis theô) and indicates that there is a unitary principle of goodness. The ability to achieve this superhuman state depends on the readiness to engage in strenuous philosophical discourse (177b).

If in the Republic the goodness of the individual soul is explained as that of a ‘smaller copy’ of a harmonious society, in the Timaeus Plato leaves out such a ‘middle-size’ model. The universe now supplies the ‘larger text’ for deciphering the nature of the human soul. The structure of the world-soul that Plato is going to design will be replicated in the nature of the human soul. That there is, nevertheless, a close affinity between the Republic and the project Plato meant to pursue in the Timaeus and its intended sequels is clearly indicated in the preface to the Timaeus. The tale of the origin of the universe and that of human nature is presented as a reply to Socrates' wish to see his own best city ‘in action’ (Ti. 19b-c). From antiquity on this introduction has created the impression that the Timaeus is the direct continuation of the Republic, an impression that is witnessed in its juxtaposition in the Corpus Platonicum. Strong indications speak, however, for a much later date of the Timaeus. If Plato establishes a link between these two works his intent is to contrast as well as to compare. The continuity consists in the fact that Socrates reaffirms that he considers the same social order as best (Ti. 17c-19b); it is this order that his friends promise to put in action in the history of the war between Pre-historic Athens, a city with the ideal order, and Atlantis, a powerful tyrannical superpower (Ti. 20d-26e), a project that Plato eventually set aside: the Critias breaks off after 15 pages in mid-sentence and the third dialogue, Hermocrates, was never written at all.

The difference between the Republic's and the Timaeus' philosophical approach lies in the fact that Plato is now occupied with the structure of the visible heaven as a model for the human soul and also with the material conditions of human physiology. What is confined to the myths in Plato's earlier work is here worked out — with some caveats concerning the mere likeliness of the account — in a cosmological and physical explication. Plato's choice of presenting his explanation of the order of the universe as a story of creation by a ‘divine workman’ is certainly no accident. It is a kind of ‘revocation’ of his depreciation of the divine workman's product in the Republic, because of its inferiority to a purely theoretical model. To be sure, the Timaeus presupposes the Forms as the divine workman's unchanging models (27d-29d; 30c-31b) and he resorts to mathematical principles in the explanation of the cosmic order, but the focus is almost exclusively on the construction of the visible heaven. Plato now seems to follow the insight that in order to explain the nature of a living being it is necessary to show what factors constitute such a live organism.

This intention explains the peculiarities of the Timaeus that make the dialogue hard to penetrate. For the dialogue falls into three rather disparate parts. The first part describes the structure of the world-soul and its replication in the human soul in a way that combines formal principles of mathematics and harmonics with fantastic imagery (29d-47e), the second consists of a rather meticulous account of the elementary physical constituents of nature on the basis of geometrical constructions (47e-69a), the third part combines elements from the first and the second part in a lengthy explanation of the human physiology and psychology (69b-92c). Both the physical and the physiological explanations strain the readers' attention by their very concern with detail. The first part greatly taxes their ability to fit together the notion of a divine creation of a world-soul with the bare hints at an intelligible, mathematical, and harmonic structure that supposedly explains the astronomical system of the heaven.

This is not the place to describe the complex structure of the world-soul. Suffice it to say that this structure combines three features. (1) The ingredients of the soul are the essential tools for dialectic: the soul is composed of being, sameness, and difference, i.e. three of the ‘most important kinds’ discussed in the Sophist as the objects of the philosopher's art of combination and separation (Sph. 253b-254b). Each of the three concepts that constitute the world-soul do so in a mixture of their unchangeable and their changeable types (Ti. 35a-b): it is a combination of unchangeable and changeable being, of unchangeable and changeable sameness, and unchangeable and changeable difference. What is the use of this strange concoction? As Timaeus points out, the combination of the eternal and temporal versions of the formal concepts allows the soul to comprehend both unchangeable and changeable objects in the world (37a-c). In other words, the soul has ‘unchangeable’ tools to identify the Forms, and ‘changeable tools’ to deal with the objects in the physical realm. By ‘mixing together’ the two versions of the formal concepts Plato maintains the unity of the soul. There is not a world-mind dealing only with eternal being, sameness and difference, separate from the world-soul that is concerned with the temporal and changeable, their being, sameness and difference; there is, rather, one mental force that does both — resulting in either knowledge or reliable opinion. Nous and psuchê are united in the Timaeus. (2) The ‘mixed tools’ of dialectic are at the same time depicted as extended ‘bands’ making up the soul in order to receive a mathematical structure by a division in a complex set of proportions (35b-36b). The portions (1 - 2 - 4 - 8 - 3 - 9 - 27) of the mixture, with further subdivisions according to the arithmetical, geometrical and harmonic means, are those that are necessary to demarcate the intervals of harmonic sounds in theoretical harmonics (1 : 2 is the division that forms an octave, 3 : 2 the fifth, 4 : 3 the fourth, 9 : 8 the major second, etc.). As these harmonic divisions suggest, the world-soul is at the same time a kind of musical instrument. No heavenly music is mentioned in the Timaeus, however, though Plato may have at least wanted to imply such a musical capacity. (3) Instead, the mathematical proportions are applied to explain the order and the motions of the heavenly bodies (36b-d). For the soul-bands, divided in different proportions, are then tied together in circles and ordered in a complicated system of combinations that represent a mechanical model of the motions and distances of the stars revolving around the earth.

Why does Plato burden himself and his readers with such a complex machinery — and what does this heavenly instrument have to do with ethics? Since the human soul is formed from the same ingredients (albeit in a less pure form) and displays the same structure as the world soul (41d-e) Plato cannot be just concerned with explaining the order of the universe. He clearly presupposes that the human soul must be in possession of the kinds of concepts that it needs in order to understand the nature of all things, both eternal and temporal. He limits the soul's ingredients to purely formal conditions, however; a theory of recollection of the essence of all things is no longer presupposed. There are (a) the most important concepts to identify and differentiate objects in the way necessary for dialectical procedure; there are (b) the numbers and proportions needed to understand numerical relations and harmonic structures of all sorts; and there is (c) the capacity to perform and comprehend harmoniously coordinated motions. This, it seems, is all the soul gets and all it needs in order to perform its various tasks. The eccentric and fanciful depiction of the soul's composition makes it hard, at first, to penetrate to the rationale of its construction, and it must remain an open question to what extend Plato expected his model to be taken in a literal rather than in an allegorical sense. His message should be clear, however: the soul both is a harmoniously structured entity, that can in principle function forever, and comprehends the corresponding structures in other entities and therefore has access to all that is good and well-ordered. Especially the latter aspect has consequences for his ethical thought that are not developed in the Timaeus itself, but that can be detected in other late dialogues.

5.2 Measure for Measure

Plato's concern with ‘right measure’ in a sense that is relevant for ethical thought is, of course, not confined to his late work. It shows up rather early. Already in the Gorgias Socrates blames Callicles for the undisciplined state of his soul and attributes it to his neglect of geometry, 508a: “You've failed to notice that proportionate equality (geometrikê isotês) has great power among both gods and men.” But it is unclear whether this expression is to be taken in a more than figurative sense; it is, at any rate, not repeated anywhere in Plato's earlier work. And though numbers are treated as paradigmatic entities from the middle dialogues on and in the Protagoras Socrates suggests as a definition of virtue that it is an ‘art of measuring’ (metrêtikê technê) pleasure and pain (Prt. 156c-157e), nothing is made of that suggestion; for the dialogue ends in an aporia about the nature of virtue (161c-d). Nor does Plato take up the notion of quantification in his discussion of the nature of the virtues in his middle dialogues. If mathematics looms large, then it is as a model science on account of its exactness, the stability of its objects, and their accessibility to the mind. Such scattered occurrences apart, a systematic exploration of the notion that measure and proportion are the fundamental conditions of goodness is confined to the late dialogues. Apart from the Timaeus' emphasis on a precise cosmic and mental order there is a crucial passage in the Politicus where the Eleatic Stranger distinguishes two kinds of the ‘art of measurement’, Plt. 283d-285c. The first kind is the ordinary measuring of quantities relative to each other (‘the great and small’), the second kind has a normative component; it is concerned with the determination of ‘due measure’ (to metrion). The latter kind is treated with great concern, for the Eleatic Stranger claims that it is the basis of all expertise, including the art they are looking for, namely statesmanship, 284a-b: “It is by preserving measure in this way that they produce all the good and fine things they do produce.” The point he is trying to make is that all good productions or all processes of generation that come to a good end presuppose ‘right measure’, while arbitrary quantities (‘the more and less’) do not constitute such entities. Because of this distinction the Eleatic Stranger suggests the separation of the simple arts of measuring from the arts concerned with ‘due measure’, 284e: “Positing as one part all those sorts of expertise that measure the numbers, lengths, depths, breadths and speeds of things in relation to what is opposed to them, and as the other, all those that measure in relation to what is in due measure (to metrion), what is fitting (to prepon), the right moment (to kairion), what is as it ought to be (to deon) — everything that is removed from the extremes to the middle (meson).” Not much is made of this distinction in the Politicus itself, except that due measure seems to be presupposed in the final definition of the statesman as a ‘kingly weaver’ who possesses the expertise of weaving together the fabric of the state, most of all by combining the aggressive and the moderate temperaments of the population in such a way as to produce a harmonious citizenry (305e- 311c). In the Politicus, no actual use is made of the ‘art of due measurement’ in a literal sense of ‘measure’. No arithmetic is applied in the ‘mixing of the citizens' characters’.

The importance of measure in a literal sense becomes more explicit, however, in the Philebus. In that dialogue number (arithmos), measure (metron), and limit (peras) play a crucial role at various points of the discussion. First of all, the Philebus is the dialogue where Plato requires that numerical precision must be observed in the ‘divine gift’ of dialectical procedure by collection and division (16c-17a). The dialectician must know precisely how many species and subspecies a certain genus contains; otherwise he has no claim to any kind of expertise. Despite this emphasis on precision and on the need to determine the numerical ‘limit’ in every science, Socrates does not provide the envisaged kind of numerically complete division of the two contenders for the rank of highest good in human life, pleasure and knowledge, because he suddenly remembers that neither of the two candidates suffices for the good life, but a mixture of the two is preferable. To explain the mixture Socrates introduces a fourfold division of all beings (23c-27c), which uses the categories of ‘limit’ and ‘measure’ in a different way than in the ‘divine method of dialectic’. As he now states, all beings are in the class of either (a) limit (peras), (b) the unlimited (apeiron), (c) the mixture (meixis) of the unlimited and limit, or (d) the cause (aitia) of such a mixture. As his subsequent explications concerning the four classes show, unlimited are all those things that have no exact grade or measure in themselves, such as the hotter and colder, the faster and slower; though at first only relative terms are used as examples, the class of the unlimited is then extended to things like hot and cold, dry and moist, fast and slow, and even fever and frost. Mixture takes place when such qualities take on a definite quantity (poson) or due measure (metrion) that puts a stop to such vagaries. That only stable entities qualify as mixtures is not only suggested by the examples Socrates refers to: health, strength, beauty, music, and the seasons, but much later in the dialogue he asserts that a mixture without due measure or proportion does not deserve its name, 64d-e: “it will necessarily corrupt its ingredients and most of all itself. For there would be no blending in such cases at all but really an unconnected medley, the ruin of whatever happens to be contained in it.” The upshot of the discussion is that all stable entities (mixtures) consist of a harmonious equilibrium of their otherwise unlimited ingredients. Since indeterminate elements usually turn up in pairs of opposites the right limit in each case is the right proportion necessary for their balance. In the case of health there must be the right balance between the hot and the cold, the dry and the moist. The cause of the proper proportion for each mixture turns out to be reason; it is the only member of the fourth class. As Socrates indicates, divine reason is the ultimate source of all that is good and harmonious in the universe (26e-27c; 28a-30e), of which human reason is just an inferior replica.

This decision on a fourfold ontology allows Socrates to assign the two contenders for the highest good in life to two of the four classes: pleasure turns out to be unlimited since it allows for various degrees. Reason, by contrast, belongs to the fourth class, it is the cause of good mixtures. On the basis of this classification the investigation continues with a critical assessment of the different kinds of pleasures and different kinds of knowledge (31b-59d). It turns out that pleasure is at best a remedial good: pleasure is always the filling of a lack or the restoration of a harmonious state and therefore presupposes some kind of disturbance of the physical or mental equilibrium. Pleasures may be false, harmful and violent if the pursuer is mistaken about the object's identity and quantity, and if there is no real cure for the irritation. Pleasures may be ‘true and pure’ if they are compensations of harmless and unfelt kinds of lack and their possessor is not mistaken about the object's nature (31b-55c). The rival of the pleasures, the different intellectual disciplines, also vary in quality; in their case the difference in quality depends on the amount of mathematical precision they contain (55c-59d). The decision about the right mixture that is to make for a happy life leads to a combination of the true and pure pleasures with all the kinds of knowledge and disciplines that are necessary to fulfill life's needs (59d-64b). In the final ranking of goods, unsurprisingly, measure and due proportion get the first rank, things in proper proportion come in second, reason is ranked third, the different sorts of arts and sciences obtain fourth place, and the true and pure pleasures get fifth and last place on the scale of goods (64c-67b). If Plato in the Philebus is more favorably disposed towards a hedonist stance than in some of his earlier work, he is so only to a quite limited degree: he regards pleasure as a necessary ingredient in human life because both the physical and the psychic equilibria that make up human nature are unstable. There is always some deficiency or lack that needs supplementing. This includes, of course, such processes as learning and the pursuit of the virtues. Hence there are some pleasures that are rightly cherished.

What are we to make of this conception of happiness as a mixture of pleasure and knowledge that is based on ‘due measurement’? There are two points worth noting here. (1) There is the question of the role Plato assigns to measure in his late concept of ethics. (2) There is the question of how serious Plato is about the ‘mathematization’ of his principles, quite generally.

(1) Though harmony and order are treated as decisive principles in Plato's metaphysics and ethics from early on, in his late dialogues he seems to envisage right measure in a literal sense. This explains his confidence that even physical entities can attain a relatively stable state as specified both in the Timaeus and in the Philebus: not everything is in a hopeless constant flux, but those things that possess the right measure for their type are stable entities that can be objects of ‘firm and true opinions and convictions’ (Ti. 37b-c). This obviously applies to the nature of the visible universe and also to the human body and mind, as long as they are in good condition. Plato seems to have been encouraged to embrace such theories by the advances in astronomy and harmonics in his own lifetime, so that he at least postulates ‘due proportion’ in an arithmetical sense as the cause of all harmony and stability. This confidence seems to have extended not only to the physical, but also to the moral state of human nature. This assumption is confirmed not only by the emphasis on right mixture in the Philebus, but also by the tenet of the Laws about the way it is the law's task to achieve peace in the state and harmony in the soul of its citizens. It emerges that Plato now regards the emotions no longer as alien to the virtues, but sees it as the lawgiver's obligation to provide an adequate balance of pleasure and pain by habituating citizens in the right way (632a-643a). It is crucial for obtaining the truly free soul through paideia, 636e: “Pleasure and pain flow like two springs released by nature. If a man draws the right amount from the right one at the right time, he lives a happy life.” This is not the place to introduce the project Plato pursues in the Laws as a whole. For our purpose it suffices to notice that the discussion of the right measure of pleasure and pain forms the preface to the entire project. This indicates a considerable shift of emphasis in the Laws in comparison with Plato's treatment of the emotions in the Republic. That education should provide the right habituation (éthos) concerning the measure of pleasure and pain is the topic of the Laws' second book. The emphasis put on the right measure and the right object of pleasure and pain in the éducation sentimentale is a tenet that seems to some extent to anticipate the Aristotelian conception of the moral virtues as the right mean between excess and deficiency, 653b-c: “Virtue is this general concord of reason and emotion. But there is one element you could isolate in any account you give, and this is the correct formation of our feelings of pleasure and pain, which makes us hate what we ought to hate from first to last, and love what we ought to love.” Plato's confidence in the Laws in the power of due measure in all matters finally culminates in the famous maxim that God is the measure of all things, 716c-d: “In our view, it is God who is preeminently the ‘measure of all things’, much more so than any man, as they say. So if you want to recommend yourself to someone of this character, you must do your level best to make your own character reflect his, and on this principle the moderate man is God's friend, being like him, whereas the immoderate and unjust man is not like him and is his enemy; and the same reasoning applies to the other vices too.” Since Plato — just like Aristotle after him — carefully refrains from any kind of specifications on actual right measures we may treat the ‘arithmetic’ of the good life with more than a pinch of salt. That individuals differ in their internal and external conditions is as clear to Plato as it was to Aristotle. This does not shake the faith he expresses in the Laws that right habituation through the right kind of education, most of all in the arts, will provide the right inner equilibrium for the good citizen.

(2) As stated earlier, Plato's confidence in a mathematically structured order of the universe that also includes human nature was greatly enhanced by the progress of the scientists of his day. This seems to be the rationale for his depiction of the world's creation as a construction by a divine craftsman in the Timaeus that makes use of proportion and also takes care to give a geometrical construction to the four elements (a factor left out of consideration here). This conception is echoed in the Philebus' emphasis on measure and proportion as the ultimate criteria of goodness. It should be noted, however, that Plato carefully refrains from going into any specifics about concrete mathematical relations; even in the Timaeus he does not apply his complicated system of proportions when it comes to specify the actual size, distance, and speed of the heavenly bodies. Nor does he indicate in the Philebus how an art of establishing the limits of good mixtures should be obtained. It therefore remains an open question to what extent Plato regarded as viable the project of doing mathematical physics and metaphysics. That he went some way in that direction seems to be indicated by claims in later reports on Plato's theory of Forms, that he either treated the Forms as numbers or associated numbers with them. Since Aristotle is quite vociferous in his criticism of this theory in Metaphysics A 6 and 9 and elaborates the criticism of ideas as numbers or idea-numbers in books M and N, there must be some substance to that claim. This is not the place to enter the controversy about the nature and extent of Plato's ‘unwritten doctrine’ that has been the focus of the so-called ‘Tübingen School’ of interpreting Plato. As the uncertainties in Aristotle's various reports indicate, the doctrine cannot ever have reached a definitive stage, for at one point he complains that Plato's theory relied on too few numbers (Met. 1084a10-27), elsewhere he objects that, 1073a20: “they speak of numbers now as unlimited, now as limited by the number 10.” That Plato never presented this theory in a magisterial form is confirmed by the reports on his ‘lecture on the good’ that scandalized a general audience because Plato, instead of speaking about ordinary goods of fortune, as expected by the uninformed public, spoke about mathematics and “finally, that the Good is one” (cf. Aristoxenos, Harmonica, II, 30). But it was not just the audience who found the message hard to comprehend. As Simplicius reports, Plato's mature students such as Aristotle, Heraclides Ponticus, and Hestiaeus took notes “because it was stated enigmatically” and then reports that Porphyry, his own source, used the Philebus to unravel the enigma (In Aristotelis physica 453,29). Given the disagreements in our sources, it may forever remain a matter of debate how far Plato went in his mathematization of metaphysics. It seems clear, however, that he must at least have entertained the hope that all that is good rests on ‘due measure’ in a more than metaphorical sense.

If Plato's thought remained somewhat speculative in that respect this explains why in his late works his ethical thought strikes us as less rigid and more ready to come to terms with the complexity of human nature and with the conditions for a satisfactory life. Signs of a more conciliatory stance can be seen in the depiction of a mixed life in the Philebus, as well as in the conception of a second-best state as more in accordance with human nature in the Laws. Not only did Plato see that persons of super-human virtue are not easily found and that education and philosophy alone are no warranty of goodness, he no longer expects humans to be immune to the temptations of power. Therefore he recommends a mixed constitution in a nomocracy as more appropriate than a monarchy of the best minds in Laws book V. Humans are to be servants of the laws, not masters of each other. It may seem paradoxical that Plato became more conciliatory towards the conditions of the best human life at the same time as his confidence in scientific rigor increased. But there actually is no paradox. His conciliatory stance seems, rather, to reflect his insight that, the more complex things get, the less precision is to be attained. Therefore no mathematical precision is to be expected in the ordering of as complex mixture as human life. ‘Due measure’ as applied to the human condition must therefore be given some leeway, “if ever we are to find our way home”, as Plato lets Socrates' partner conclude in the Philebus. That ethics cannot be done with the same precision as mathematics is not, then, an insight that occurred only to Aristotle. But Plato must have thought that precision should at least be aimed for if life is to be based on a harmonious order.

Did Plato, then, become more democratic with his concept of happiness in his latest works? If we follow the indications about the best state of the human soul as ‘orderly circles’ in the Timaeus, he seems to be as elitist as he ever was. He no longer puts so much emphasis on the distance between the best and the worst, however. As he states in the Politicus, even the most gifted statesmen don't stick out from the rest of humankind like queen-bees from ordinary bees. All human beings have only ‘second best souls’ when compared to the world soul. If all human beings have to see to the best mixture of life they can obtain, and even the best of them can be no more than servants of the laws, then one may say that Plato has become more democratic in the sense that he sees the ‘human herd’ as a more uniform flock than he used to in his earlier days.




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Anaxagoras | Archytas | Aristotle | dialectic | ethics: virtue | hedonism | metaphysics | Plato | Platonism: in metaphysics | Popper, Karl | Presocratic Philosophy | Pythagoras | Pythagoreanism | self-knowledge | Simplicius | transcendentalism