Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Mon Feb 20, 2006

Trust is both important and dangerous. It is important because it allows us to form relationships with others and to depend on others—for love, for advice, for help with our plumbing, or what have you—especially when we know that no outside force (e.g. the law) compels them to give us such things. Trust always involves the risk that the trusted person (hereafter, the “trustee”) will not pull through for the trusting person (hereafter, the “truster”). If the truster could guarantee that the trustee would pull through, then the truster would have no need to trust that person. The truster therefore cannot assume, while trusting, that the trustee will do what s/he is trusted to do because the trustee has no legitimate choice in the matter. Since people often can choose whether to pull through for us, we often need to trust them.

But since trust necessarily involves risk, it can also be dangerous. What we risk while trusting is the loss of the things that we entrust to others, including our self-respect, perhaps, which can be shattered by the betrayal of our trust. Because trust is risky and can be dangerous, the following question is of particular importance: “Under what conditions is trust warranted?” In this context, “warranted” means justified or well-grounded (where “well-grounded” trust successfully targets a trustworthy person). But I will also use the term “warranted” to mean “plausible,” as indicated below. This entry on trust is framed as a response to the general question of when trust is warranted, where “warranted” is broadly construed to include “justified,” “well-grounded” and “plausible.”

A complete philosophical answer to this question would need to explore the various philosophical dimensions of trust, including the conceptual nature of trust and trustworthiness, the epistemology of trust, the value of trust, and the kind of mental attitude trust is. To illustrate how each of these dimensions is relevant, note first that trust is only warranted (in the sense of being plausible) when the truster is willing to accept the conditions that accompany the act of trusting (e.g., the assumption of a degree of risk). Knowing what these conditions are requires an understanding of trust. Second, trust is warranted (i.e. well-grounded) when the trustee is trustworthy, which makes the nature of trustworthiness important in determining when trust is warranted. Third, trust may be warranted (i.e., justified) even when the trustee is not in fact trustworthy. This point proves the relevance of the epistemology of trust. Fourth, trust can be warranted (i.e. justified), either because some value will emerge from it, or because it is valuable in and of itself. Thus, the value of trust is relevant. Lastly, trust would not be warranted (i.e. plausible) if it was impossible for the agent to develop a trusting attitude, given the agent's circumstances and the sort of attitude trust is. For example, is trust the sort of attitude that one can will oneself to have towards someone, even in the absence of evidence in favor of that person's trustworthiness?

This entry will explore these philosophical dimensions of trust and summarize the current state of the literature on trust. The entry will also deal predominantly with interpersonal trust, which I take to be the dominant paradigm of trust. Although some philosophers write about trust that is not interpersonal, including “institutional trust” (i.e. trust in institutions; see e.g. Potter 2002, Govier 1997), trust in government (Hardin 2002), and “self-trust” (Govier 1993, McLeod 2002), most would agree that these forms of “trust” are coherent only if they share important features of (i.e. can be modeled on) interpersonal trust. This is why I say that the dominant paradigm of trust is interpersonal.

1. The Nature of Trust and Trustworthiness

Trust is an attitude that we have towards people whom we hope will be trustworthy, where trustworthiness is a property, not an attitude. Trust and trustworthiness are therefore distinct although, ideally, those whom we trust will be trustworthy, and those who are trustworthy will be trusted. For trust to be warranted (i.e. plausible) in a relationship, the parties to that relationship must have attitudes toward one another that are conducive to trusting one another. Moreover, for trust to be warranted (i.e. well-grounded), both parties ought to be trustworthy.

One's attitude is conducive to trust if it conveys the following: an acceptance of risk, especially the risk of being betrayed; an inclination to expect the best of the other person (at least in domains in which one trusts him or her); and the belief or optimism that this person is competent in certain respects. All of these conditions for trust are uncontroversial.[1] But a further condition, which is controversial, is that the truster believes or is optimistic that, in general, the trustee has a certain kind of motive for acting. Controversy surrounds this last condition, because it is unclear what, if any, sort of motive we expect from people we trust.

Likewise, it is unclear what, if any, sort of motive a trustworthy person has. Clear conditions for trustworthiness are that the trustworthy person is competent and committed to do what s/he is trusted to do. But this person may also have to be committed in a certain way or for a certain reason (e.g. s/he cares about the truster). This section explains these various conditions for trust and trustworthiness, and focuses in particular on the controversy that surrounds the conditions about motive.

One important condition for trust is that the truster accepts some level of risk or vulnerability (Becker 1996). Minimally, what this person risks, or is vulnerable to, is the failure by the trustee to do what s/he depends on that person to do. The truster might try to reduce this risk by monitoring or imposing certain constraints on the behavior of the trustee; but, after a certain threshold perhaps, the more monitoring and constraining s/he does, the less s/he trusts that person. Trust is relevant “before one can monitor the actions of … others” (Dasgupta 1988, 51) or when out of respect for others one refuses to monitor their actions. Hence, a refusal to be vulnerable tends to undermine trust or prevents it from occurring at all.

Another related condition for trust is the potential for betrayal (and, as noted below, the corresponding condition for trustworthiness is the power to betray). Annette Baier writes that “trusting can be betrayed, or at least let down, and not just disappointed” (1986, 235). In her view, disappointment is the appropriate response when one merely relied on someone to do something, but did not trust him or her to do it. People who monitor and constrain other people's behavior and do not allow them to prove their own trustworthiness may rely on others, but they do not trust them. For, while their reliance could be disappointed, it could not be betrayed. Consider that one can rely on inanimate objects (such as alarm clocks), but when they break, one is not betrayed, although one may feel disappointed. Reliance without the possibility of betrayal is not trust. Thus, people who rely on one another in a way that makes betrayal impossible do not trust one another.

People also do not, or cannot, trust one another if they are easily suspicious of one another (Govier 1997, 6). If one assumes the worst about someone—“she is late because she has no regard for my feelings,” or “I bet he is talking about me behind my back”—then one distrusts, rather than trusts the person. Trusting involves being optimistic, rather than pessimistic, that the trustee will do something for us (or for others perhaps); and such optimism is, in part, what makes us vulnerable by trusting. It “restricts the inferences we will make about the likely actions of another. Trusting thus opens one up to harm, for it gives rise to selective interpretation, which means that one can be fooled, that the truth might lie, as it were, outside one's gaze” (Jones 1996, 12).

Failing to believe in or be optimistic about people's competence also makes trust impossible. If we did not think that certain people were competent in any way, then we would not trust them. We usually trust people to do certain things—for example, to look after our children, to give us advice, or to be honest with us—but we would not do so if we thought that they lacked the relevant skills (including moral skills of knowing what it means to be honest or caring; McLeod 2002, 19). Rarely, if ever, do we trust people completely (i.e. A simply trusts B). Instead, “trust is generally a three-part relation: A trusts B to do X” (Hardin 2002, 9).[2] To have trust in a relationship, therefore, we do not have to believe that the other person is competent in every way. Optimism about the person's competence in at least one area is essential, however.

When we trust people, we are optimistic not only that they are competent to do what we trust them to do, but also that they are committed to doing it. One can talk about this commitment either in terms of what the truster expects of the trustee or in terms of what the trustee possesses: that is, as a condition for trust or as a condition for trustworthiness (and the same is true, of course, of the competence condition). For simplicity's sake and to focus some of this section on trustworthiness as opposed to trust, I will refer to the commitment mostly as a condition for trustworthiness.

While both the competence and motivational elements of trustworthiness are crucial, the exact nature of the latter is unclear. For some philosophers, it only matters that the trustee is committed. The central problem of trustworthiness in their view concerns the ongoing commitment of the trustee, and in particular, under what circumstances, if any, one could expect such a commitment from another person (see, e.g., Hardin 2002, 28). But for other philosophers, an ongoing commitment from another person is not sufficient for trustworthiness; in their view, the origins of the commitment matter, not just its existence or duration. The central problem of trustworthiness for these philosophers does not simply involve existence or duration, which deals with whether the trustee is or will be motivated to act; it must also concern how that person is or will be motivated. Some motives are simply incompatible with trustworthiness, on this view. To determine which view is correct, we must consider different possible motives that might underlie trustworthy behavior.

Some philosophers believe that trustworthiness can be “compelled by the force of norms” or, more generally, by the force of social constraints (Hardin 2002, 53; see also O'Neill 2002, Dasgupta 1988). In an effort to be trustworthy, people can subject themselves to social constraints, as someone does when she publicly declares her intention to lose weight, putting herself at risk of public censure if she fails. Alternatively, the truster in a relationship can introduce the constraints by requiring that the trustee sign a contract, for example. The constraint imposed could be the primary motivation for being trustworthy. It would compel on ongoing commitment grounded in self-interest. Call this view of trustworthiness “the social contract view.”

Many philosophers would agree that the social contract view is only a partial account of what could motivate trustworthiness. While social constraints can shore up trustworthiness, they cannot account for trustworthiness altogether. For, if they could, then the following sort of person would be trustworthy: a sexist employer who treats female employees well only because he believes that he would face legal sanctions if he did not (Potter 2002, 5). Many would argue that while this person's behavior is predictable or reliable, it is not trustworthy in any genuine sense. They might distinguish mere reliability from trustworthiness on the grounds that people known or considered to be trustworthy have the power to betray us, whereas people known or considered to be merely reliable can only disappoint us. The female employees might know that their employer treats them well only because he fears social sanctioning. In that case, he could not betray them, although he could disappoint them. And if that were true, he would not be trustworthy for them.

An alternative to the social contract view is a view according to which trustworthy people are motivated by their own interest to maintain the relationship they have with the truster, which in turn encourages them to encapsulate the interests of that person in their own interests. Russell Hardin defends this “encapsulated interest” view (2002). But it too is problematic. To see why, consider how it applies to the sexist employer. He is not motivated by an interest to sustain his relationships with female employees: if he could easily fire them, or even avoid hiring them altogether, he would do that. He is therefore not trustworthy. Imagine, however, that he did have an interest in maintaining these relationships and that as a result he treated the women well, but that his interest stemmed from a desire to keep them around so that he could daydream about having sex with them. (Hence, he remains a sexist employer.) To satisfy this interest, he would have to encapsulate enough of their interests in his own to keep the relationships going. And this would make him trustworthy on Hardin's account. But is he trustworthy? The answer is surely “no,” if the women have an interest in being treated well in more than just a surface manner. My point here is that being motivated by a desire to maintain a relationship (the central motivation of a trustworthy person on the encapsulated interests view) may not require one to adopt all of the interests of the truster that would actually make one trustworthy to that person. In the end, like the social contract view, the encapsulated interests view may describe reliability, but not trustworthiness.

The social contract view and the encapsulated interests view are both instances of what Karen Jones calls “risk-assessment views” of trust or trustworthiness (1999, 68). According to such views, people trust other people whenever they assume that the risk of relying on other people to act a certain way is low—because it is in the self-interest of these people to act that way—and so they rely on them. Self-interest determines trustworthiness on these accounts. Risk-assessment theories in general are popular among rational decision theorists and social contract theorists, who presume that people are naturally self-interested.

A different type of view is what Jones calls a “will-based” account” of trustworthiness and what I call “the goodwill view,” which finds trustworthiness only where the trustee is motivated by goodwill (Jones 1999, 68). This view is dominant in the literature and originates in the work of Annette Baier. According to it, a trustee who is actually trustworthy will act out of goodwill toward the truster, to what or to whom the trustee is entrusted with or both. While proponents of risk-assessment views would likely find the goodwill view too narrow—surely we can trust people without presuming their goodwill!—it does seem immune to criticisms that apply to those views. One could summarize those criticisms as follows: these accounts, unlike the goodwill account, fail to demand that the trustworthy person care about the truster, or care about what he or she cares about. Such caring appears, as we have seen, to be central to a complete account of trustworthiness.

The particular reason why care is central is that it allows us to distinguish between trust and mere reliance. I have said the two differ, putatively, because only the former can be betrayed. But why is that true? Why can trust be betrayed, but not mere reliance? The answer Baier gives is that betrayal is the appropriate response to someone on whom one relied to act out of goodwill, as opposed to ill will, selfishness, or habit bred out of indifference (1986, 234-5). Those who say that trusting could involve relying on people to act on any of these motives cannot distinguish trust from reliance. Examples are risk-assessments theorists, who, again, make trustworthiness a matter of self-interest. While self-interest as a motive is compatible with goodwill toward others, it is also compatible with ill will and selfishness. The question is: how would trustworthiness be different from mere reliability if trust could target any of these motives?

While useful in distinguishing trustworthiness from reliability, or trust from reliance, Baier's will-based account is not perfect, however. Criticisms have been made of it, which suggest that goodwill is neither necessary nor sufficient for trustworthiness. It is not necessary, some say, because we can trust other people without presuming that they have goodwill. In fact, “[w]e are often content to trust without knowing much about the psychology of the one-trusted, supposing merely that they have psychological traits sufficient to get the job done” (Jones 2004, 4; citing Blackburn 1998). This objection implies that trust is compatible with relying on different kinds of motives. But while that is certainly true on risk-assessment accounts, it is clearly not true on Baier's will-based account, which requires that the relevant motive be goodwill. Although problematic, risk-assessment views do have their merits. For example, they seem to make better sense of trusting that strangers will be morally decent toward us, which surely can occur without assuming that strangers have goodwill toward us.

But one could make sense of trust in strangers without adopting a risk-assessment view, or in other words, without assuming that self-interest would be the motive of the trustworthy stranger. One specific sort of motive that could underlie trustworthiness in the absence of goodwill is the motive to stand by one's moral commitments. For example, I could trust a stranger to be decent simply by presuming that he is committed to common decency (Holton 1994, 65). Ultimately, what I am presuming about the stranger is moral integrity, which some say is the relevant motive for all relations of trust (McLeod 2002, 21-27).

As well as being unnecessary, goodwill may not be sufficient for trustworthiness. I say that for three reasons. First, someone trying to manipulate you—a “confidence trickster” (Baier 1986)—could “rely on your goodwill without trusting you” (Holton 1994, 65). Second, basing trustworthiness on goodwill alone cannot explain unwelcome trust. When people do not welcome your trust, they do not object to your optimism about their goodwill (who would object to that?), but only to the fact that you are counting on them. Thus, optimism about goodwill is insufficient and, according to Karen Jones, needs to be coupled with the expectation that the trustee is “favorably moved by the thought that [you are] counting on her” (1996, 9). Third, you can expect people to be reliably benevolent toward you without trusting them (Jones 1996, 10). You can think that their benevolence is not shaped by the sorts of values that, for you, are essential to trustworthiness.[3] It follows that some expectation about shared values or norms may be an important element of trust (McLeod 2002, 27-29).

To recapitulate on the topic of motive, the goodwill view is dominant, but it is still open to serious criticisms. Philosophers who are less concerned with distinguishing trustworthiness from reliability reject the goodwill view on the grounds that it is too narrow. By contrast, those who think this distinction is important follow Baier in identifying the relevant motive as goodwill (e.g. Potter 2002); or combine goodwill with certain expectations (Jones 1996); or jettison the goodwill requirement altogether and replace it with something else, such as moral integrity.[4]

One last view about trustworthiness, which is distinct from the views we have considered so far, is that trustworthiness is a virtue. To illustrate the distinctiveness of this view, consider why it is not captured in the goodwill account. Someone can show goodwill towards another and be trustworthy within the scope of their relationship (think of a convicted felon with his mother) without being someone who we would describe as being trustworthy (Potter 2002, 8). Sometimes, we think of trustworthiness as a character trait that virtuous people possess. Nancy Nyquist Potter refers to the trait as “full trustworthiness,” as opposed to trust that is specific to certain relationships, which she calls “specific trustworthiness” (25). To be fully trustworthy, one must have a disposition to be trustworthy toward everyone. Call this the “virtue” account.

It may sound odd, however, to insist that trustworthiness is a virtue or, in other words, a moral disposition to be trustworthy (Potter 2002, 25; Hardin 2002, 32). For what disposition exactly is it supposed to be? Is it a disposition normally to honor people's trust? But that would be strange, since trust can be unwanted if the trust is immoral (e.g., being trusted to hide a murder) or if it misinterprets the nature of one's relationship with the trusted person (e.g., being trusted to be friends with a mere acquaintance). Perhaps trustworthiness is instead a disposition to respond to trust in appropriate ways, given “who one is in relation” to the truster and given other virtues that one possesses or ought to possess (e.g., justice, compassion) (Potter 25). This is essentially Potter's view of trustworthiness. She models trustworthiness on an Aristotelian conception of virtue and defines a trustworthy person as “one who can be counted on, as a matter of the sort of person he or she is, to take care of those things that others entrust to one and (following the Doctrine of the Mean) whose ways of caring are neither excessive nor deficient” (her emphasis; 16).[5]

But, one might ask what reasons we have for thinking that trustworthiness is a virtue, beyond the fact that calling a convicted felon “trustworthy” seems out of place. Why not just hang on to the thin conception of trustworthiness, captured by Potter's “specific trustworthiness,” according to which X is trustworthy for me just in case I can trust X? Two things can be said. First, the thick conception of trustworthiness as a virtue is not meant to displace the thin conception. We can and do refer to some people as trustworthy in the specific or thin sense and others as trustworthy in the full or thick sense. Second, one could argue that the thick conception explains better than the thin one why fully trustworthy people are as dependable as they are. It is ingrained in their character. Therefore, they must have an ongoing commitment, and better still, their commitment must come from a source that is compatible with trustworthiness (i.e. virtue as opposed to mere self-interest).

An account of trustworthiness that includes the idea that trustworthiness is a virtue may seem ideal, but only if one thinks that the genesis of the trustworthy person's commitment is important. If one thinks that it matters only whether—not how—the truster will be motivated to act, then one might assume that social constraints and self-interest could do the job as well as a moral disposition. Such controversy explains why philosophical accounts of trustworthiness diverge from one another on the question of what could motivate a trustworthy person (social constraints, interests, goodwill, or a moral disposition?).[6] Not surprisingly, a similar divergence occurs in accounts of trust, especially as those accounts bear on the issue of what sort of motivation we seek from people we trust.

In spite of such controversy, there are certain things we can say for certain about trust and trustworthiness that are relevant to deciding when trust is warranted. The trustee must be competent and committed to do what the truster expects of him or her, and may have to be committed in a particular way. Moreover, the truster must be optimistic that the trustee is competent and committed, and must accept that by trusting, s/he is vulnerable, to betrayal in particular.

2. The Epistemology of Trust

Writings on the epistemology of trust obviously bear on the issue of when trust is warranted (i.e. justified). The central epistemological question about trust is, “Ought I to trust or not?” That is, given the way things seem to me, is it reasonable for me to trust? People tend to ask this sort of question only in situations where they cannot take trustworthiness for granted—that is, where they are conscious of the fact that trusting could get them into trouble. Examples are situations similar to those in which they have been betrayed in the past or unlike any they have ever been in before. Thus, the question, “Ought I to trust?” is particularly pertinent (though not restricted) to a somewhat odd mix of people that includes victims of infidelity, abuse, or the like, as well as foreign immigrants and travelers.

What guidance, if any, could one offer to these people who struggle with when to trust? Philosophical work on this question appears either under the general heading of the epistemology of trust (e.g. Baker 1987, Webb 1992) or under the specific heading of testimony—that is, of putting one's trust in the testimony of others (Coady 1992, Goldman 2001, Fricker 1995, Hardwig 1991, Jones 1999).

In discussing such topics, philosophers sometimes ask, could it ever be rational to trust other people? This question arises for two main reasons. First, it appears that trust and rational reflection (e.g. on whether one should be trusting) are in tension with one another. Since trust inherently involves risk, any attempt to eliminate the risk through rational reflection could eliminate the trust at the same time. Second, the question is relevant because trust tends to give us blinkered vision: it makes us resistant to evidence that may contradict our optimism about the trustee (Baker 1987; Jones 1996). For example, if I trust my brother not to harm anyone, I will resist the truth of any evidence to the contrary.

Even if some of our trust could be rational, however, one might claim that not all of it could be for a number of reasons. First, if we trust people in a myriad of ways every single day, as some claim that we do (e.g. Baier 1986, 234), then we could not possibly subject all of our trust to rational reflection. We certainly could not reflect on every piece of knowledge we have acquired through the testimony of others, such as that the earth is round or that Afghanistan exists (Webb 1993, Fricker 1995, Coady 1992). Second, bioethicists point out that some trust is unavoidable and occurs in the absence of rational reflection (e.g. trust in emergency room nurses and physicians; see Zaner 1991). Lastly, some trust purposefully leaps beyond any evidence of trustworthiness in an effort to engender trustworthiness in the trustee. This is what H.J.N. Horsburgh calls “therapeutic trust” (1960). Parents often engage in it in order to encourage their children to be trustworthy. Trusting a child to buy milk at the store and return with change can be therapeutic if the child has never fulfilled such a task before. But is it rational to trust the child with the money? One might say “no,” given that little evidence exists that the child can be trusted in this way.

Philosophers have responded to such skepticism about the rationality of trust by saying that rationality, when applied to trust, needs to be understood differently than it is in each of the skeptical points above. There, “rationality” means something like this: it is rational to believe in something only if one has verified that it will happen. For example, it is rational for me to believe that my brother has not harmed anyone only if I have verified that to be the case. Leaving aside general problems with this view of rationality, problems exist with applying it to trust specifically (i.e., with assuming that it is rational to trust only if one has verified the other's trustworthiness). Some of these problems will become clearer below. For example, if trust is not a belief, for reasons given in the section, Trust and the Will, then the justification conditions for belief do not apply to it (Jones 1996). The above understanding of rationality is also “internalist,” which is problematic as far as trust is concerned, as I discuss below.

Moreover, the above understanding is “truth-directed” or “epistemic,” but the rationality of trust can be “end-directed” or “strategic” (Baker 1987; de Sousa 1987). For example, one could say that it is rational to trust emergency room physicians not because one knows for certain that they are trustworthy, but because by trusting them, one can remain calm in a situation over which one has little control. Similarly, it may be rational for me to trust my brother not because I have verified his trustworthiness but rather because trusting him is essential to our having a loving relationship. Notice that the end to which the trust is directed need not be the trusting person's end alone. Trust may be rational in an end-directed way because it contributes to ends shared by people in relationships or even in whole communities. While some philosophers assume that trust is rational only if it conforms to what a rational egoist would do (i.e. someone who acts on a conception of the good that is purely individual), others say that the trust of socially embedded agents (who act on conceptions of the good that are public as well as individual) can be rational, and indeed can be more rational than the trust of egoists (Hollis 1998).

To recapitulate, trust can be rational depending on how we conceive of rationality and also depending on the nature of trust. For example, if trust is not a belief in someone's trustworthiness, then what makes a belief rationally justified will not be what makes trust rationally justified. Here “rationality” is understood in a truth-directed way. But it could also be understood in an end-directed way, and often is understood in that way when applied to trust.

Philosophers who agree that trust can be rational in either truth- or end-directed ways tend to disagree about the degree to which reasons that confer rationality must be accessible to the truster. Some say that all of these reasons must be available to this person in order for the trust to be rational; in that case, the person is or could be internally justified in trusting as s/he does. Others say that the reasons need not be internal, but can instead be external to the truster and can lie in what caused the trust, or, more specifically, in the epistemic reliability of what caused it. However, the truster need not have access to, or be aware of the reliability of, such reasons. (The latter's epistemology of trust is therefore externalist, while the former's is internalist.)

Some epistemologists of trust write as though trust is only rational if the truster him or herself has rationally estimated the trustworthiness of the trustee. For example, Russell Hardin implies that if my trust in you is rational, then “I make a rough estimate of the truth of [the] claim … that you will be trustworthy under certain conditions … and then I correct my estimate, or ‘update,’ as I obtain new evidence on you” (2002, 112). On this view, I must have reasons for my estimate or for my updates (Hardin 130), which in turn may come from inductive generalizations I have made about my past experience or from my knowledge that social constraints exist that will encourage your trustworthiness. Such an internalist epistemology of trust is valuable because it coheres with the common sense idea that one ought to have good reasons for trusting other people, at least when something important is at stake (Fricker 1995).

But such an epistemology is also open to criticisms. For example, it suggests that rational trust will always be partial rather than complete, because the rational truster is open to evidence that contradicts his or her trust on this theory, while someone who trusts completely in someone else lacks such openness. The theory also implies that the reasons for trusting well (i.e., in a justified way) are accessible to the truster, at some point or another, which may be false. Some suggest that these reasons are often too numerous and varied to be open to the conscious consideration of the truster (e.g., Baier 1986). There can be very subtle reasons to trust or distrust someone—for example, reasons that have to do with body language, with systematic yet veiled forms of oppression, or with a complicated history of trusting others about which one could not easily generalize. Such reasons, or factors, may influence the truster, even though s/he could not state what they are.

The above worries explain why some philosophers defend externalist epistemologies of trust. Some do so explicitly (e.g., McLeod 2002). They argue for reliabilist theories that make trust rationally justified if and only if it is formed and sustained by reliable processes (i.e. “processes that tend to produce accurate representations of the world”; Goldman 1992, 113). Others gesture towards externalism (Webb 1993; Baier 1986), as Baier does with what she calls “a moral test for trust.” The test is that “knowledge of what the other party is relying on for the continuance of the trust relationship would … itself destabilize the relation” (1986, 255). The other party might be relying on concealment of untrustworthiness or on a threat advantage, in which case the trust would probably fail the test. Because Baier's test focuses on the causal basis for trust, or for what maintains the trust relation, it is externalist. Moreover, because the truster often cannot gather the information needed for the test without ceasing to trust the other person (Baier 1986, 260), the test cannot be internalist.

While an externalist theory of trust deals with some of the worries one might have with an internalist theory, it has problems of its own. The most serious problem, perhaps, is the absence of any requirement that trusters themselves have good reasons for trusting, especially when their trust makes them seriously vulnerable. Again, it appears that common sense dictates the opposite: that sometimes we, as trusters, ought to be able to back up our decisions about when to trust.

Presumably to avoid having to defend either internalism or externalism, some philosophers simply provide a list of common “justifiers” for trust (i.e. “facts or states of affairs that determine the justification status of [trust]”; Goldman 1999, 274), which a trusting agent could take into account in deciding when to trust (Govier 1998, Jones 1996). The lists include such factors as the social role of the trustee, the domain in which the trust occurs, an “agent-specific” factor that concerns how good a truster the agent tends to be (Jones 1996, 21), and the social or political climate in which the trust occurs. Philosophers have tended to emphasize that last factor as a justification condition for trust, and so I will describe it in some detail.

While, paradigmatically, trust is a relation that holds between two individuals, forces larger than those individuals inevitably shape their trust in one another. Social or political climate contributes to how trustworthy people tend to be and therefore to whether trust is justified. A climate of virtue, for example, is one in which trustworthiness tends to be pervasive, because the virtues (i.e. those other than trustworthiness) tend to enhance trustworthiness (Baier 2004). Similarly, a democratic society is one in which people can trust one another more often than in other sorts of political societies, such as totalitarian ones (Uslaner 1999). Alternatively, societies that are oppressive make it irrational in general for the people who are oppressed to trust those who oppress them (Baier 1986, 259; Potter 2002, 24).

Social or political climate has a significant influence on the default stance that one ought to take toward people's trustworthiness. One needs such a stance because one cannot always stop to reflect carefully on when trust is appropriate. For example, some say that the correct stance toward the testimony of others is always trust: that people always have a prima facie right to trust what other people say (e.g. Coady 1992). Others disagree that the correct stance could be so universal and claim instead that it is relative to climate, as well as to other factors listed above, such as domain (Jones 1999).

Our trust or distrust may be prima facie justified if we have the correct default stance; however, it could only be fully justified either by reasons that are internal to us or by the causal processes that created the attitude in the first place. Concerning full justification, arguments exist on both sides of the internalism/externalism divide. But whichever epistemology of trust we choose, it ought to be sensitive to the tension that exists between trusting somebody and rationally reflecting on the grounds for that trust. It would be odd, to say the least, if what made an attitude justified destroyed that attitude. However, at the same time, if possible, our epistemology ought to cohere with common sense, insofar as common sense requires that we inspect rather than have pure faith in whatever makes us seriously vulnerable to other people, which trust can most definitely do.

3. The Value of Trust

The one who poses the question, “When is trust warranted?” might be interested in knowing what the point of trusting is. In other words, what value would it have? While the value it would have for a particular person depends on his or her circumstances, the value it could have for any particular person depends on an answer to this question: “Why is trust valuable, generally speaking?” The short answer to this question is that trust can have enormous instrumental value and may also have some intrinsic value. In discussing its instrumental value, I will refer to the “goods of trust.” These goods include opportunities for cooperative activity, knowledge, autonomy, self-respect, and overall moral maturity. And because these goods may benefit the truster, the trustee, or society in general, they are therefore social as well as individual goods, where the most relevant individuals tend to be parties to the trust relationship. A further point I aim to establish about these goods is that they accompany justified trust, rather than any old trust.[7]

But if trusting produced no goods independent of it, then would there be no point in trusting? One might say “no,” on the grounds that trust is a sign of respect for others, which would make it intrinsically worthwhile. This idea is closely linked to the view that trustworthiness is a virtue, which makes it intrinsically worthwhile (see The Nature of Trust and Trustworthiness). For, trust could only be a sign of respect for others if trust were an attitude of optimism about the trustee's character: that is, if it assumed that virtue resided within that person's character. Trust that has intrinsic value of this sort must be justified, presumably. If optimism about the person's character was inappropriate, then the respect would be misplaced and the intrinsic value would be lost. But I am speculating here. Philosophers have said comparatively little about trust being worthwhile in itself as opposed to worthwhile because of what it produces, or because of what accompanies it. So I will say no more about the former and focus on the latter, in particular, on the goods of trust.

Turning first to the instrumental value of trust to the truster, some argue that trusting vastly increases our opportunities for cooperating with others and for benefiting from that cooperation; but, of course, we would only benefit if people we trusted generally cooperated as well (Gambetta 1988; Hardin 2002). Trust enhances cooperation; because it removes the incentive to check up on other people, it makes cooperation with trust less complicated than cooperation without it (Luhmann 1979). This point applies to justified trust only if trust is justified in external rather than internal ways, however (see The Epistemology of Trust). If trust were only justified when the truster could produce legitimate reasons for why the trustee is trustworthy, then cooperation with justified trust would not be a whole lot easier than cooperation without it. That is true, at least, if having proper reasons required frequently checking up on the trustee.

Trusting provides us with goods beyond those that come with cooperation; but again, for these goods to materialize, the trust has to be justified. Sometimes, trust involves little or no cooperation, so that the truster is completely dependent on the trustee, although the reverse is not true. Examples are the trust of young children in their parents and the trust of severely ill or disabled people in their care providers. Trust is particularly important for these people, because they tend to be powerless to exercise their rights or to enforce any kind of contract. Moreover, since the trust that the ill or disabled place in their care providers contributes to them being vulnerable, it is essential that they can trust these people; in other words, it is important that their trust be justified. The goods at stake for them are all the goods involved in having a good or decent life.

Among the specific goods that philosophers associate with trusting are knowledge and autonomy.[8] Philosophers writing on testimony argue that scientific knowledge (Hardwig 1991), moral knowledge (Jones 1999), or almost all knowledge in fact (Webb 1993) depends for its acquisition on trust in the testimony of others. The basic argument for the need to trust what others say is that no one person has the time, intellect, and experience necessary to learn, independently, facts about the world that many of us do know. Examples include the scientific fact that the earth is round, the moral fact that the oppression of people from social groups different from our own can be severe (Jones 1999), and the mundane fact that we were born on such-in-such a day (Webb 1993, 261). Of course, trusting the people who testify to these facts could only generate knowledge if that trust were justified. If we were told our birth date by people who were determined, oddly, to deceive us about when we were born, then we would not know when we were born.

Autonomy is another good that flows from trust, at least insofar as being autonomous is a skill that we acquire and exercise only in social environments where we can trust people to support it. Feminists in particular tend to conceive of autonomy this way—that is, as a relational, or socially-constituted, property (Mackenzie and Stoljar 2000). Many feminists note that sexist or oppressive social environments can inhibit autonomy and that many of the conditions necessary for autonomy (e.g. adequate options, knowledge relevant to one's decisions) can exist only with the help of people or institutions that are trustworthy. Justified trust in others to ensure that these conditions exist is essential for autonomy, if in fact autonomy is relational.

The kind of trust that is necessary for both knowledge and autonomy is arguably self-directed as well as other-directed. Keith Lehrer claims that to be able to do the epistemic work that his internalist epistemology requires of us (i.e. evaluating the truth of our beliefs and the worth of our desires), we need to trust ourselves to do that very work (1997). Trudy Govier (1993) and Carolyn McLeod (2002) both assert that to be motivated to choose and act in accordance with our own values—that is, to choose and act autonomously—we need to trust ourselves to do so. While some self-trust might be better than none at all as far as knowledge and autonomy go (for no self-trust would leave us incapacitated and with no opportunity to learn from our mistakes), justified self-trust is best overall. Without being justified in trusting ourselves to be good epistemic or autonomous agents, we cannot be either.

Specific goods of trust that are instrumental to the well-being of the trustee also materialize only if the trust is justified. Trust can improve the self-respect and moral maturity of this person. Particularly if trust involves optimism about a person's moral character, it can engender self-respect in that person. (For on such an account of trust, to trust is to show respect, which can then be internalized.) To be trusted can allow one to be more respectful not only toward oneself, but also toward others. It can therefore enhance one's overall moral maturity. The explicit goal of “therapeutic trust” is precisely to bring about such maturity (see The Epistemology of Trust). Therapeutic trust leaps ahead of the evidence, which means that it is hard to justify epistemically. But perhaps it can be justified in a truth-directed way over time, provided that the trust has its intended effect of making the trustee more trustworthy (Baker 1987, 12). Clearly, for therapeutic trust to benefit trusted people significantly, it would have to be justified in this way (i.e. the therapy would normally have to work).

The social goods of trust are linked with the individual goods that concern moral maturity and cooperation. These social goods include the practice of morality, the very existence of society perhaps, as well as strong social networks. Morality itself is a cooperative activity, which can only get off the ground if people can trust one another to try, at least, to be moral. But to be able to make meaningful attempts in that regard, people have to be somewhat morally mature, which can only come from a moral education grounded in trust. For such reasons, Baier claims that trust is “the very basis of morality” (2004, 180). It might also be the very basis of society in general, for without trust in fellow citizens to honor social contracts, the contracts probably would not exist. Yet even if trust did not make society possible, it certainly makes it better or more livable. Some argue that trust is a form of “social capital,” which roughly means that it enables “people to work together for common purposes in groups and organizations” (Fukuyama 1995, 10; quoted in Hardin 2002, 83). Hence, “high-trust” societies have stronger economies and stronger social networks in general than “low-trust” societies (Fukuyama; Inglehart 1999). Of course, these facts could only be true of these societies if, on the whole, the trust within them was justified (that is, if trustees tended not to “defect” and destroy chances for cooperating in the future).

If without trusting or being trusted in justified ways, we could not have morality or society and could not be morally mature, autonomous, knowledgeable, or invested with opportunities for collaborating with others, then the value of justified trust is hard to over-estimate. The same is not true, however, of trust in general (Baier 1986). People can trust too much or too little; and either way, their trust can be harmful since it can deprive them of the goods that go along with justified trust. Moreover, too much trust in particular leaves people open to betrayal, abuse, terror, and deception. Because of people who tend to elicit too much trust from others, the question, “Why be distrusting?” can be as legitimate as “Why be trusting?”

4. Trust and the Will

Trust may not be warranted (i.e. plausible) because the agent has lost the ability to trust. People lose this ability often as a result of trauma (Herman 1991). The trauma caused by rape, for example, can profoundly reduce one's sense that the world is a safe place, with caring people in it. How can people recover this trusting sensibility? A similar but broader question is “How can trust be restored once it has been lost?” This latter question is relevant to people who lose trust not in everyone or everything, but rather in particular people or particular institutions. For example, in some parts of the world people tend to trust the medical profession much less than they did in the past (O'Neill 2002; Pellegrino 1991b). How could their trust in this profession be restored? While destroying trust is usually quick and almost always dirty, creating trust is often a slow and painful process (Uslaner 1999; Baier 1986). The reasons why have to do with what kind of mental attitude trust is. It is not the sort of attitude that we can simply will ourselves to have, although we can cultivate it.

While the cultivation of any trust depends on what sort of mental attitude trust is, the cultivation of justified trust depends on how trust is justified (see The Epistemology of Trust). Some philosophers, most notably Baier, deny that useful rules exist for when to trust so that one's trust will be justified. The process of trusting well is too complicated for that to be the case. Even so, giving some guidance on how to trust well is possible: for example, philosophers including Baier list factors that will at least improve our chances of trusting well, if we take them into account (see The Epistemology). This section focuses on how to trust at all, rather than on how to trust well. To receive the goods of trust, one has to do both: trust and trust well.

Under the heading “how to trust,” consider why trust cannot be willed but can be cultivated. Baier questions whether people are able “to trust simply because of encouragement to trust” (1986, 244; my emphasis). She writes, “‘Trust me!’ is for most of us an invitation which we cannot accept at will—either we do already trust the one who says it, in which case it serves at best as reassurance, or it is properly responded to with, ‘Why should and how can I, until I have cause to?’” (my emphasis; 1986, 244). Baier is not a voluntarist about trust, just as most people are not voluntarists about belief. In other words, she thinks that we cannot simply decide to trust for purely motivational rather than epistemic reasons (i.e., merely because we want to, rather than because we have reason to think that the other person is actually trustworthy; Mills 1998). That many people feel compelled to say, “I wish I could trust you,” suggests that Baier's view is correct: wishing or wanting is not enough. But Richard Holton interprets her view differently. According to him, Baier's point is that we can never decide to trust, not that we can never decide to trust for motivational purposes (1994). Yet this interpretation ignores the attention that Baier gives to situations in which all we have is encouragement (trusting “simply because of encouragement”). The “cause” she refers to (having “cause to [trust]”) is an epistemic cause. Once we have one of those, we could presumably decide whether to trust on the basis of it. But we could not simply decide to trust only because we want to, according to Baier.

Trust therefore resembles belief in being non-voluntary in the above sense. So is trust a belief (i.e., a belief in someone's trustworthiness)? While many philosophers presume that it is, others insist that it is not. The latter say it is possible to trust without believing that the trustee is trustworthy. Holton gives the nice example of trusting a friend to be sincere without believing that the friend will be sincere (1994, 75). Arguably, if one already believed that to be the case, one would have no need to trust the friend. It is also possible to believe that someone is trustworthy without trusting that person, which suggests that trust could not merely be a belief in someone's trustworthiness (McLeod 2002, 85). I might think that a particular physician is trustworthy without trusting that physician because I have no cause to do so.

One reason for thinking that trust is not a belief, but is instead an emotion, is that trust resembles an emotion in having characteristics that are unique to emotions, at least according to an influential account of them (de Sousa 1987; Calhoun 1984; Rorty 1980). These characteristics concern how emotions narrow our perception to certain “fields of evidence,” that is, to fields that support the emotion (Jones 1996, 11). Thus, when we are in the grip of an emotion, we tend to see those facts that affirm its existence and are resistant to facts that negate it. To illustrate, if I am angry at my mother, I tend to think about all of the things that justify my anger while ignoring or refusing to see the things that make it unjustified. I can only see those other things once my anger subsides. Similarly with trust: if I truly trust my mother in certain domains, my attention falls on those aspects of her that justify my trust and backs away from any evidence that suggests she is untrustworthy in these domains (Baker 1987).

The characteristics of trust that suggest it is an emotion are ones that we can try to mimic in our attitude toward other people, in an effort to be more trusting. In other words, we could purposefully try to focus our attention on what makes other people trustworthy, and in doing so cultivate trust in them. In doing so, our goal might simply be self-improvement: that is, becoming more trusting, hopefully in a good way, so that we reap the benefits of justified trust. (Alternatively, we might strive for the improvement of others: that is, making them more trustworthy. See the above discussions of “therapeutic trust.”)

Institutions or groups trying to restore public trust could also use the above method of cultivating trust. For example, the medical profession could try to hammer home to the public the message that physicians and other medical professionals actually help people and care about them. Such a campaign could make it impossible for people not to think that these professionals are trustworthy.

But whether such a campaign is morally appropriate would, of course, depend on whether the resulting trust would be justified. In general, cultivating trust is only wise if trusting would be wise in the circumstances. And sorting out whether that is true would involve contemplating whether factors are present that roughly indicate whether trust would be justified. Is, for example, the social or political climate of one's society conducive to one trusting well? It may not be. For a woman who has been raped in a society that effectively condones such acts toward women, cultivating the trust that was lost as a result of the rape may not be prudent, especially if she continues to live in such a sexist place.

5. Conclusion

This entry has centered on an important practical question about trust: “When is trust warranted?” Different answers to this question give rise to different philosophical puzzles. For example, in answering it, one might appeal to the nature of trust and trustworthiness, and consider whether the attitude of the proposed truster could support trust, and whether the qualities of the proposed trustee indicate trustworthiness. But to decide such matters, one must settle on a particular motivation for a trustworthy person, and that is difficult to do. Should one choose goodwill, the fact that the person's interests encapsulate one's own interests or something else entirely?

Alternatively, in deciding whether trust is warranted, one might consider whether the trust would either be rationally justified or valuable. The two can overlap, and do overlap when rational justification is understood in an end-directed way—that is, where trust is rationally justified because it is instrumentally valuable, or because it serves one's ends. But regardless of whether the justification of trust is end-or truth-directed, the exact nature of its justification is puzzling. Should the rationality of trust or distrust be interpreted using an internalist epistemology or an externalist one? Good arguments exist on both sides. And consequently, it is not clear how trust is rationally justified. Neither is it entirely clear what value one could achieve by trusting, given the nature of trust. For example, trust may or may not have moral value depending on whether it can indicate respect for others.

Lastly, one might focus on the fact that trust cannot be warranted when it is impossible, which is the case when the agent does not already trust and cannot simply will him or herself to do so. While it appears that trust is not the sort of attitude that one can will oneself to have, trust can still be cultivated. The manner in which it is cultivated, however, would depend again on what sort of attitude it is.

If one can respond to the question, “When is trust warranted?” by referring to each of the above dimensions of trust, then a complete philosophical answer to this question would be a complex one. But such an answer would also be philosophically interesting and socially important. It would be interesting both because of its complexity and because it would draw on a number of philosophical areas, including epistemology, philosophy of mind, and value theory. Such an answer would be socially important because trust that is warranted forms the foundation of a good society. It allows people to thrive through healthy cooperation with others and to be morally mature human beings.


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Aristotle, General Topics: ethics | autonomy: in moral and political philosophy | criminal law, theories of | feminist (topics): perspectives on the self | friendship | justification, epistemic: internalist vs. externalist conceptions of | rights: of children | scientific knowledge: social dimensions of


Thanks to Julie Ponesse and Ken Chung for their research assistance, to Andrew Botterell for his helpful editing, and to the Lupina Foundation for funding.