Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Juan Luis Vives [Joannes Ludovicus Vives]

First published Mon Jan 12, 2009

Juan Luis Vives (1493–1540) was a Spanish humanist and educational theorist who strongly opposed scholasticism and made his mark as one of the most influential advocates of humanistic learning in the early sixteenth century. His works are not limited to education but deal with a wide range of subjects including philosophy, psychology, politics, social reform and religion. Vives was not a systematic writer, which makes it difficult to classify him as a philosopher. His thought is eclectic and pragmatic, as well as historical, in its orientation. He took what he considered most valid from a variety of sources and combined these elements into a Christianized Aristotelianism.

1. Life and main works

Juan Luis Vives was born in Valencia, Spain on March 6, 1493 (not 1492, as is often found in the literature on him). His parents were Jewish cloth merchants who had converted to Catholicism and who strove to live with the insecurities of their precarious situation. His father, Luis Vives Valeriola (1453–1524), had been prosecuted in 1477 for secretly practicing Judaism. A second trial took place in 1522 and ended two years later when he was burned at the stake. His mother, Blanquina March (1473–1508), became a Christian in 1491, one year before the decree expelling Jews from Spain. She died in 1508 of the plague. Twenty years after her death, she was charged with having visited a clandestine synagogue. Her remains were exhumed and publicly burned.

In his youth, Vives attended the Estudio General of his hometown. In 1509, he moved to Paris and enrolled as a freshman in the faculty of arts. He was never to return to Spain. Vives began his studies at the Collège de Lisieux, where Juan Dolz had just started a triennial course, but soon moved to the Collège de Beauvais, where he attended the lectures of Jan Dullaert (d.1513). From the fall of 1512, Vives started to attend the course of the Aragonese Gaspar Lax (1487–1560) at the Collège de Montaigu. Through Nicolas Bérault (c.1470–c.1545), who was an associate of Guillaume Budé (1467–1540) and taught at various colleges in Paris, Vives also came into contact with the Parisian humanist circle.

In 1514, Vives left Paris without having taken any formal academic degree and moved to the Low Countries. He settled in Bruges, where he would spend most of his life. About this time, he was introduced to Erasmus and appointed as tutor to the Flemish nobleman William of Croy. From 1517 until Croy's premature death in 1521, Vives lived in Louvain and taught at the Collegium Trilingue, a humanist foundation based on Erasmian educational principles. In this period he wrote ‘Fabula de homine’ (‘A Fable about Man,’ 1518), an early version of his views on the nature and purpose of mankind; De initiis, sectis et laudibus philosophiae (On the Origins, Schools and Merits of Philosophy, 1518), a short essay on the history of philosophy; In pseudodialecticos (Against the Pseudo-Dialecticians, 1520), a lively and trenchant attack on scholastic logic; as well as a critical edition, with an extensive commentary, of Augustine's De civitate Dei (City of God, 1522), which was commissioned by Erasmus.

From 1523 to 1528, Vives divided his time between England, which he visited on six occasions, and Bruges, where he married Margarita Valldaura in 1524. In England he attended the court of Henry VIII and Catherine of Aragon, and was tutor to their daughter, Mary. He also held a lectureship at Corpus Christi College, Oxford, and associated with English humanists such as Thomas More and Thomas Linacre. During these years he published De institutione feminae Christianae (The Education of a Christian Woman, 1524), in which he set out pedagogical principles for the instruction of women; the extremely popular Introductio ad sapientiam (Introduction to Wisdom, 1524), a short handbook of ethics, blending Stoicism and Christianity; and De subventione pauperum (On Assistance to the Poor, 1526), a program for the organization of public relief, which he dedicated to the magistrates of Bruges. In 1528 he lost the favor of Henry VIII by siding with his fellow countrywoman Catherine of Aragon in the matter of the divorce. He was placed under house arrest for a time, before being allowed to return to Bruges.

The last twelve years of Vives' life were his most productive, and it was in this period that he published several of the works for which he is best known today. These include De concordia et discordia in humano genere (On Concord and Discord in Humankind, 1529), a piece of social criticism emphasizing the value of peace and the absurdity of war; De disciplinis (On the Disciplines, 1531), an encyclopedic treatise providing an extensive critique of the foundations of contemporary education, as well as a program for its renewal; and De anima et vita (On the Soul and Life, 1538), a study of the soul and its interaction with the body, which also contains a penetrating analysis of the emotions. De veritate fidei Christianae (On the Truth of the Christian Faith), the most thorough discussion of his religious views, was published posthumously in 1543. He died in Bruges on May 6, 1540.

2. Dialectic and language

Vives' career as a leading northern European humanist starts with the publication in 1520 of In pseudodialecticos, a satirical diatribe in which he voices his opposition to scholastic logic on several counts. He follows in the footsteps of earlier humanists such as Lorenzo Valla (1406–57) and Rudolph Agricola (1443–85), who set about to replace the scholastic curriculum, based on syllogistic and disputation, with a treatment of logic oriented toward the use of the topics, a technique of verbal association aiming at the invention and organization of material for arguments, and persuasion. Vives' severe censure of scholastic logic derived from his own unhappy experience with the scholastic curriculum at Paris. Therefore, as he himself emphasized, no one could accuse him of “condemning it because he did not understand it” (Opera omnia, 1964, III, 38; all quotations below are from this edition). Erasmus wrote to More that no one was better suited for the battle against the dialecticians, in whose ranks he had served for many years.

The main targets of Vives' criticism are Peter of Spain's Summule logicales, a work dating from the thirteenth century but which still held an important place in the university curriculum, and the theory of the property of terms, a semantic theory dealing with properties of linguistic expressions such as signification, i.e., the meaning of a word regardless of context, and supposition, i.e., the meaning of a word within the context of its use in a proposition. He repudiates the use of technical jargon, accessible only to a narrow group of professionals, and maintains that if scholastic logicians made an effort to speak plainly and according to common usage, many of their conundrums would disappear. Instead, they choose to fritter away their ingenuity on logically ambiguous propositions known as sophismata. Vives provides many examples of such propositions, which in his view make no sense whatever and are certainly of no use. Many of these, such as “Some animal is not man, therefore some man is not animal” (III, 54), were standard scholastic examples. Others, such as “Only any non-donkey c of any man except Socrates and another c belonging to this same man begins contingently to be black” (III, 40), are intended as a mockery of the futile quibbling he associated with scholastic method. Since dialectic, like rhetoric and grammar, deals with language, its rules should be adapted to the rules of ordinary language; but with what language, he asks, have these propositions to do? Moreover, dialectic should not be learned for its own sake, but as a support for the other arts; therefore, no more effort should be spent on it than is absolutely necessary. Vives' criticism is also informed by ethical concerns and the demand for a method that would be of use in everyday life rather than in academic disputations.

A more detailed criticism can be found in De disciplinis of 1531. This encyclopedic treatise is divided into three parts: De causis corruptarum artium (On the Causes of the Corruption of the Arts), seven books devoted to a thoroughgoing critique of the foundations of contemporary education; De tradendis disciplinis (On Handing Down the Disciplines), five books in which Vives outlines his program for educational reform; and five shorter treatises De artibus (On the Arts), dealing mainly with logic and metaphysics. These five treatises include De prima philosophia (On First Philosophy), a compendium of Aristotelian physics and metaphysics from a Christian point of view; De censura veri (On the Assessment of Truth), a discussion of the proposition and the forms of argumentation; De explanatione cuiusque essentiae (On the Explanation of Each Essence); De instrumento probabilitatis (On the Instrument of Probability), which contains a theory of knowledge, as well as a detailed account of dialectical invention; and De disputatione (On Disputation), in which he discusses non-formal proofs. In these treatises, Vives not only continues the trends in humanist dialectic initiated by Valla and Agricola, but also displays a familiarity with philosophical technicalities that was unusual among humanists and that reveals the more traditionally Aristotelian aspects of his thought. His appraisal of the Aristotelian corpus is summarised in Censura de Aristotelis operibus (Assessment of Aristotle's Works, 1538). A posthumously published treatise entitled Dialectices libri quatuor (Four Books of Dialectic, 1550) appears to be a youthful work that Vives evidently did not consider suitable for publication.

Vives' criticism of scholastic logic hinges on a profound analysis of the arts of discourse. For him, the supremacy of the sermo communis (ordinary discourse) over the abstract language of metaphysics is indisputable. Philosophy ought not to invent the language and subject of its own specific investigation (VI, 140). In De causis corruptarum artium, he writes: “enraged against nature, about which they know nothing, the dialecticians have constructed another one for themselves—that is to say, the nature of formalities, individual natures (ecceitates), realities, relations, Platonic ideas and other monstrosities which cannot be understood even by those who have invented them” (VI, 190–1). Instead of the formal language of the dialecticians, which he found completely unsuited to interpret reality, he proposes the less rigorous but more concrete universe of everyday communication, which answers all our practical needs and aims to provide a knowledge that is useful.

3. Epistemology and history

Vives was pessimistic about the possibility of attaining knowledge as understood in Aristotelian terms; and his thought anticipates the moderate skepticism of early modern philosophers such as Francisco Sanches (1551–1623) and Pierre Gassendi (1592–1655). Vives belongs, like Francis Bacon (1561–1626), to the so-called ‘maker's knowledge’ tradition, which regards knowledge as a kind of making or as a capacity to make (see A. Pérez-Ramos, Francis Bacon's Idea of Science and the Maker's Knowledge Tradition, Oxford and New York: Clarendon Press and Oxford University Press, 1988). He often insists on the practical nature of knowledge; for instance, in De causis corruptarum artium, he maintains that peasants and artisans know nature far better than many philosophers (VI, 190). In Satellitium animi (The Soul's Escort, 1524), a collection of aphorisms dedicated to Princess Mary, he points out that “man knows as far as he can make” (IV, 63). A central tenet of the maker's knowledge tradition is that man cannot gain access to nature's intimate works, since these, as opera divina (divine works), are only known to God, their maker.

According to Vives, things have two different layers: one external, consisting in the sensible accidents of the thing, and another, internal, and therefore hidden, which is the essence of the thing (III, 197). “The true and genuine essences of all things”, he writes, “are not known by us in themselves. They hide concealed in the innermost part of each thing where our mind, enclosed by the bulk of the body and the darkness of life, cannot penetrate” (III, 406–7). Vives subscribes to the Aristotelian principle that all of our knowledge has its origin in perception. We cannot learn anything, he maintains, except through the senses (III, 193 and 378). But he also maintains that the human mind “must realize that, since it is locked up in a dark prison and surrounded by obscurity, it is prevented from understanding many things and cannot clearly observe or know what it wants: neither the concealed essence of material things, nor the quality and character of immaterial things; nor can it, on account of the gloom of the body, use its acuity and swiftness” (III, 329). In other words, since the senses cannot grasp what is incorporeal or hidden, sense perception does not yield any knowledge of the essence of things but only of their accidents. Vives' view, however, is that sensory knowledge must nonetheless be transcended by means of reasoning. Yet, according to him, the best that human reason can accomplish in this process is to provide a judgment grounded in all the available evidence, thereby increasing the probability of the conclusion. In his view, our knowledge of the essence of a thing is only an approximate guess based on the sensible operations of the thing in question (III, 122).

The most reliable guide for human inquiry, he argues, is mankind's natural propensity toward what is good and true. This light of our mind, as he also calls it, is always, directly or indirectly, inclined toward what is good and true, and can be regarded as the beginning and origin of prudence and of all sciences and arts. This natural propensity can be perfected if it is subjected to teaching and exercise, just as the seeds of plants grow better if they are cultivated by the industrious hands of a farmer. He found philosophical grounds for this idea in Cicero's report (see, e.g., De natura deorum (On the Nature of the Gods), I.43–5) of the Hellenistic theory of anticipationes (anticipations) and of naturales informationes (natural notions), which we have not learned from teachers or custom, but are instead derived and received from nature (III, 356–7). Nevertheless, human knowledge can be nothing other than a finite participation in creation. Because of the limitations that characterize man's fallen state, investigations into the realm of nature can only lead to conjectures, and not to firm and indubitable knowledge, which we neither deserve nor need. In De prima philosophia, Vives writes: “human inquiry comes to conjectural conclusions, for we do not deserve certain knowledge (scientia), stained by sin as we are and hence burdened with the great weight of the body; nor do we need it, for we see that man is ordained lord and master of everything in the sublunary world” (III, 188). In his opinion, certainty is not a prerequisite for advances in science and philosophy; and as a criterion for scientific progress and for the rational conduct of life, he advocates a method consisting in sound judgment based on experience.

History, seen as the sum of all human experience, is therefore of great importance for all branches of learning. In De tradendis disciplinis, Vives maintains that “history appears to surpass all disciplines, since it either gives birth to or nourishes, develops [and] cultivates all arts” (VI, 291). In this sense, history is not primarily regarded as the memory of great deeds or the source of useful examples, but as a process of development. In principle, every new generation is better equipped than the preceding one, since it can derive advantage from all earlier experience: “It is therefore clear – he maintains – that if only we apply our minds sufficiently, we can formulate better opinions about matters of life and nature than could Aristotle, Plato, or any of the ancients” (VI, 6–7). According to Vives, the saying “we are like dwarfs on the shoulders of giants” is plainly false. We are not dwarfs, nor were they giants. All humans are composed of the same structure (VI, 39). The idea of progress plays an essential role in Vives' conception of intellectual history, and several of the cultural problems he deals with, such as the causes of the corruption of the arts, are approached from an historical perspective.

4. Moral and social philosophy

Vives' moral philosophy stems mainly from his Christian humanism and is aimed at the reform of both individuals and society. He often proclaims the superiority of Christian ethics over pagan wisdom (I, 23; VI, 209–10). In De causis corruptarum artium, he argues at length that Aristotle's ethics, on account of its worldly conception of happiness and virtue, is completely incompatible with the Christianity: “we cannot serve both Christ and Aristotle, whose teaching are diametrically opposed to each other” (VI, 218). He has more sympathy for Platonism and Stoicism, which he believes are broadly in line with Christian morality. In De initiis, sectis et laudibus philosophiae, he even asserts: “I do not think, in fact, that there is any truer Christian than the Stoic sage” (III, 17).

In Introductio ad sapientiam, inspired by the teaching of the Stoics, he recommends self-knowledge as the first step toward virtue, which he regards as the culmination of human perfection. We should not, in his judgment, call anything our own except our soul, in which learning and virtue, or their opposites, are to be found. The body is “a bondslave of the soul” (mancipium animi), while such things as riches, power, nobility, honor, dignity, and their contraries, are completely external to man (I, 2; VI, 401). Vice follows from a wrong judgment about the value of things: “Nothing – he writes – is more destructive in human life than a corrupt judgment which gives no object its proper value” (I, 1). To be wise, however, is not only to have true opinions about things, but also to translate this knowledge into action by desiring honorable things and avoiding evil (I, 2). Wisdom therefore requires the subordination of the passions to the control of the intellect.

Vives holds that the best means to secure the reform of society is through the moral and practical training of the individual. Man, by his own nature, is a social being (VI, 222–3). In the first book of De subventione pauperum, which consists of a theoretical discussion of the human condition, he stresses not only our need for and dependency on others, but also our natural inclination to love and help one another. He regards the development of society as a distinctly human achievement, based on the ability to profit from experience and turn knowledge to useful ends. Social problems, such as poverty and war, are the result of emotional disorders. Vives deplored the Italian war between France and Spain (1521–6), which, he felt, completely ignored the rights of the suffering population, and accused Francis I and Charles V of irresponsibility and criminal ambition (VI, 480). In these circumstances, he often referred to the notion of natural law, which, as he explains in his preface to Cicero's De legibus (On the Laws), has the same validity everywhere because it was impressed on the heart of every human being before birth (V, 494).

5. Psychology

Vives' philosophical reflections on the human soul are mainly concentrated in De anima et vita, published in 1538, which provides the psychological underpinning for many of his educational ideas and can be characterized as a prolegomenon to moral philosophy. He attempts to reconcile the Aristotelian view of the soul as an organizing and animating principle with the Platonic conception of the soul as an immaterial and immortal substance. He also pays close attention to physiology and, following the Galenic tradition, maintains that our mental capacities depend on the temperament of our body.

The structure of treatise is indebted to the traditional approach of faculty psychology, in which the soul is said to be composed of a number of different faculties or powers, each directed toward a different object and responsible for a distinct operation. The first book covers the functions of the vegetative soul (nutrition, growth and reproduction), of the sensitive soul (the five external senses), and of the cogitative soul (the internal senses, i.e., a variety of cognitive faculties, including imagination, fantasy and the estimative power, which are located in the three ventricles of the brain, and whose acts follows from the acts of the external senses). The second book deals with the functions of the rational soul and its three faculties (mind, will, and memory), as well as with topics stemming from Aristotle's Parva naturalia, such as sleep, dreams, and longevity. The third and final book explores the emotions, which Vives, rejecting the Stoic view, regards as natural responses to the way things appear to us and as essential constituents of human life.

He defines the soul as “the principal agent inhabiting a body adapted to life (agens praecipuum, habitans in corpore apto ad vitam).” The soul is called an agent in the sense that it acts through instruments—e.g., heat, humors and spirits—by means of its own power. That it is the principal agent means that, even though its instruments act on the body, they do not operate by means of their own power but only through the power that they receive from the soul (III, 335–6). The organs governing our rational functions consist of fine and bright spirits exhaled from the pericardial blood. Although the heart is the source and origin of all the rational soul's operations, the head is their workshop. In fact, the mind does not apprehend, nor is it affected, unless the spirits reach the brain (III, 365–6).

The enormous importance Vives attaches to the exploration of the emotions is reflected in the fact that he describes the branch of philosophy that provides a remedy for the severe diseases of the soul not only as “the foundation of all morality, private as well as public” (III, 299–300), but also as “the supreme form of learning and knowledge” (I, 17). Emotions (affectus sive affectiones) are defined as “the acts of those faculties which nature gave to our souls for the pursuit of good and the avoidance of evil, by means of which we are led toward the good and we move away from or against evil”. He stresses that the terms “good” and “evil” in this definition mean, not what is in reality good or evil, but rather what each person judges to be good or evil (III, 422). Therefore, the more pure and elevated the judgment, the more it takes account of what is genuinely good and true, admitting fewer and less intense emotions and becoming disturbed more rarely. Immoderate and confused movements, on the other hand, are the result of ignorance, thoughtlessness, and false judgments, since we judge the good or evil to be greater than it really is (III, 425).

One of the most distinctive features of Vives' study of the human soul is the fundamental role that psychological inquiry came to play in his reform program. His use of psychological principles in his writings often surpasses that of previous authors in both scope and detail. He applies these principles, for instance, not only to individual conduct and education, but also to professional practice, social reform, and practical affairs in general. According to Vives, psychology is relevant to all disciplines. “The study of man's soul”, he writes in De tradendis disciplinis, “exercises a most helpful influence on all kinds of knowledge, because our knowledge is determined by the intelligence and comprehension of our minds, not by the things themselves” (VI, 375).

6. Influence

Vives' works, which went through hundreds of editions and were translated into several vernacular languages, continued to be widely read and extremely influential during the century after their publication. His critical attitude toward the Aristotelian orthodoxy of his day left a mark on several authors. Mario Nizolio (1488–1567) cites Vives numerous times in De veris principiis et vera ratione philosophandi contra pseudophilosophos (On the True Principles and True Method of Philosophizing against the Pseudo-Philosophers, 1553), an attack on Aristotelian dialectic and metaphysics, which G. W. Leibniz (1646–1716) considered to be worth editing more than a hundred years later. In Quod nihil scitur (That Nothing is Known, 1581), one of the best systematic expositions of philosophical skepticism produced during the sixteenth century, the Portuguese philosopher and medical writer Francisco Sanches displays a familiarity with De disciplinis, and there are indications that he might also have been acquainted with In pseudodialecticos. In Exercitationes paradoxicae adversus Aristoteleos (Paradoxical Exercises against the Aristotelians, 1624), a skeptical attack on Aristotelianism, Pierre Gassendi says that reading Vives gave him courage and helped him to free himself from the dogmatism of Peripatetic philosophy.

Psychology was another area in which Vives enjoyed considerable success. Philip Melanchthon (1497–1560) recommended De anima et vita in the prefatory letter to his Commentarius de anima (Commentary on the Soul, 1540). Vives' influence on the naturalistic pedagogy of the Spaniard Juan Huarte de San Juan (c.1529–1588), in his celebrated El examen de ingenios para las ciencias (The Examination of Men's Wits, 1575), is undeniable. In his discussion of the passions of the soul, the Jesuit Francisco Suárez (1548–1617) counted Vives among his authorities, pointing out that the study of the emotions belongs to natural philosophy and medicine as well as to moral philosophy. Vives' treatise was also an important source of inspiration for Robert Burton (1577–1640), who, in The Anatomy of Melancholy (1621), repeatedly quotes from De anima et vita. The reference to Vives by René Descartes (1596–1650) in Les Passions de l'âme (1649) suggests that he had read the book.

Although Vives is rarely mentioned in the scholarly literature on the Scottish philosophy of “Common Sense,” the impact of his thought on leading exponents of the school was significant. William Hamilton (1788–1856) praised Vives' insights on memory and the laws of association. In his “Contributions Towards a History of the Doctrine of Mental Suggestion or Association”, he quotes extensive portions of Vives' account of memory and maintains that the observations of “the Spanish Aristotelian” comprise “nearly all of principal moment that has been said upon this subject, either before or since”. Moreover, Vives' Dialectices libri quatuor (1550) was one of the primary sources of Thomas Reid (1710–1796) in his “A Brief Account of Aristotle's Logic” (1774).

During the second half of the nineteenth century and the fist decades of the twentieth, Vives was read and studied by philosophers such as Ernest Renan (1823–1892), Friedrich Albert Lange (1828–1875), Wilhelm Dilthey (1833–1911), Pierre Duhem (1861–1916), Ernst Cassirer (1874–1945), and José Ortega y Gasset (1883–1955). Lange regards him as one of the most important reformers of philosophy of his time and a precursor of both Bacon and Descartes. According to Ortega y Gasset, Vives' method, firmly based on experience, and his emphasis on the need to found a new culture grounded, not in barren speculation, but in the usefulness of knowledge, anticipate some elements of the modern Zeitgeist.


Primary Sources

Citations by volume and page only are to the Mayans y Siscár edition of the Opera Omnia.

Secondary Literature

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Aristotelianism: in the Renaissance | Bacon, Francis | emotion: 17th and 18th century theories of | Erasmus, Desiderius | Gassendi, Pierre | humanism: in the Renaissance | More, Thomas | Peter of Spain [= Petrus Hispanus] | sophismata [= sophisms] | terms, properties of: medieval theories of