Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Fri Jul 25, 2003; substantive revision Fri Aug 22, 2008

Xenocrates (of Chalcedon), according to Diogenes Laertius (D.L.) iv 14, became head of the Academy after Speusippus died, in 339/338 (“in the second year of the 110th Olympiad”). D.L. says he held that position for twenty-five years, and died at 82. So his dates work out to 396/395-314/313.

On the death of Plato, when Speusippus became head of the Academy, Xenocrates and Aristotle may have left Athens together at the invitation of Hermeias of Atarneus (see Strabo XIII 57, printed in Gaiser 1988, 380-381, discussed at 384-385), and Xenocrates returned to succeed Speusippus. According to D.L. (iv 3), this was at Speusippus' request, while the Academicorum Index Herculanensis (cols. VI-VII: Mekler 1902, 38-39, Gaiser 1988, 193) tells us that the younger members of the Academy voted on the succession and confirmed Xenocrates by a narrow margin. These two accounts, although not incompatible, do not tell the same story, and it does not appear  possible to get behind them to what really happened.

D.L.'s bibliography (iv 11-14) lists over 70 titles; nothing whatever of these has survived, even in the form of identifiable quotations in other authors. Reconstruction of Xenocrates' views turns, as in the case of Speusippus, on Aristotle, and, again as in the case of Speusippus, this is made the more difficult by Aristotle's frequent failure actually to name Xenocrates when talking about his views. In fact, Aristotle never mentions Xenocrates by name in discussing his metaphysical views.

What is left of Xenocrates' views is here divided up under three headings: Metaphysics, Theory of Knowledge, and Ethics. Sextus Empiricus tells us (Adversus mathematicos vii 16; fr. 1H, 82IP: here and in the sequel ‘H’ refers to the collection of fragments in Heinze 1892 and ‘IP’ to that in Isnardi Parente 1982) that Xenocrates was explicit about the division of philosophical topics implicit in Plato, into ‘physics’, ‘ethics’, and ‘logic’; this became the norm in Stoicism and Hellenistic philosophy in general. We have a great deal more to work with under the first heading than under the other two. As is standard with this terminology, what we are accustomed to refer to as metaphysics and theory of knowledge are included in ‘physics’ and ‘logic’, respectively.

Sextus' report about the standard division of philosophy coming through Xenocrates but ultimately from Plato is typical of much of what we hear about Xenocrates: he appears to have been at least as concerned to carry on the thought of Plato as to promulgate ideas of his own.

1. Metaphysics

Most of what we can reconstruct about Xenocrates pertains to his metaphysics. We do this largely by identifying views of his that appear in Aristotle's criticisms of the metaphysical views of his predecessors and contemporaries, and chaining together with these other texts that can plausibly be taken as dealing with his views. But there are a few sources other than Aristotle.

One of them is Proclus, who says, commenting on the Parmenides (Cousin 1864, 888.11-19, 36-38; fr. 30H, 94IP):

But to the ideas both belonged: both to be intelligible and {to be} unchanging in substance, ‘mounted on a holy pedestal’, that is, on pure mind, being such as to complete the things that are in potentiality and being causes that give them their form; whence {Plato} going up to these principles makes the whole of coming-to-be dependent on them, just as Xenocrates says, positing that the idea is a paradigmatic cause of the {things} that are always constituted according to nature … . Xenocrates, then, wrote down this definition of the idea as in conformity with the founder, positing it as a separate and divine cause; …

‘The founder’ is Plato. The phrase ‘mounted on a holy pedestal’ comes from Plato, Phaedrus 254b7, where the soul has been likened to a charioteer who sees the Forms of the beautiful and temperance so mounted. Some of the phrasing is no doubt neoplatonist rather than Xenocratean, but the formulation, ‘the idea is a paradigmatic cause’, seems to be, as Proclus says, Xenocrates' attempt to capture Plato's intent: see here Plato, Parmenides 132d.

There is disagreement over the rest of the formulation Proclus attributes to Xenocrates: in speaking of ‘the things that are always constituted according to nature’, did Xenocrates intend to rule out forms for individuals, which are transitory, and for artefacts, which are not constituted according to nature? This is the way Proclus goes on to interpret Xenocrates, and it is hard to see how to get around that, although attempts have been made (see Cherniss 1945). But there is indirect confirmation of Proclus' interpretation, at least where artefacts are concerned, from Clement of Alexandria, who tells us (in Stromateis II 5) that Xenocrates claimed that knowledge of the intelligible substance is theoretical as opposed to practical ‘judgement’; at that rate, carpenters are not contemplating forms when they make beds and shuttles, despite what is said by Plato in Republic X 596b and Cratylus 389a-b, and (if it is by Plato) Letter vii 342d. But it should be noted that the rejection of forms for artefacts is in agreement with what Aristotle has to say about Plato and Platonists in Metaphysics I 9. 991b6-7, XII 3. 1070a13-19, and in the fragmentary remains of On Ideas in Alexander (see esp. Hayduck 1891, 79.23-24, 80.6). Likewise the rejection of forms for individuals squares with Aristotle's attack on the ‘argument from thinking’ (Metaphysics I 9. 990b14-15 = XIII 4. 1079a10-11, supplemented by Alexander, Hayduck 1891, 81.25-82.7): if every object of thought is a form, then there are forms also “for the perishables” (990b14 = 1079b10) or “for the particulars and perishables, such as Socrates, Plato” (Alexander, Hayduck 1891, 82.2-3).

The version of the Theory of Forms associated with Xenocrates is that which Aristotle ascribes to the later Plato (see Metaphysics XIII 4. 1078b10-12 for the qualification ‘later’), in which the Forms are ‘generated’ and are, in the first instance, numbers. Xenocrates operated, in parallel with Speusippus and Plato (as Aristotle reports Plato), with a scheme in which two principles--the One and something called any or all of ‘the everflowing’, ‘plurality’ (Aëtius i 3. 23), or ‘the Indefinite Dyad’ (Theophrastus, Metaphysics vi)--generate these form-numbers, and then, in turn, lines, planes, solids, and perceptible things.

The talk of generation Xenocrates reinterpreted as a mere pedagogical device; we hear about this technique from Aristotle, De caelo I 10. 279b32-280a2, and Simplicius' commentary ad loc. (Heiberg 1893, 303.33-34) names Xenocrates in this connection, as does Plutarch (De animae procreatione in Timaeo 3. 1013a-b, Cherniss 1976, 168-171). Here it is a device for interpreting the creation story in the Timaeus; that Xenocrates also applied it to the generation of the formal numbers we learn from Aristotle, Metaphysics XIV 4. 1091a28-29 and the commentary on that passage in pseudo-Alexander (Hayduck 1891, 819.37-820.3).

In trying to understand what Aristotle tells us about formal numbers, it is necessary to bear in mind the fundamental distinction he draws between formal numbers and mathematical numbers: both are, according to Aristotle, composed of units, but formal numbers are composed of very strange units, such that those in one formal number cannot be combined with those in any other. The units of which mathematical numbers are composed can be added and subtracted freely. (See here Metaphysics XIII 6. 1080a15-b4.) And furthermore there is only one formal number for each of the numbers 2, 3, 4, etc., where there are indefinitely many instances of each among the mathematical numbers. (See here Metaphysics I 6. 987b14-18.) The mathematical numbers are the ones mathematicians work with, e.g. in performing arithmetical operations, and that is presumably why they are called ‘mathematical’. There is a corresponding division between types of geometrical figures, but we hear too little about this; most of what follows will be concerned with numbers.

The position that there are both formal numbers and mathematical numbers Aristotle ascribes to Plato. Speusippus rejects the formal numbers (and the entire theory of forms along with them; see the entry on Speusippus). The position Aristotle ascribes to Xenocrates is a bit more elusive.

In Metaphysics VII 2, Aristotle tells us, in 1028b19-21, that Plato accepted three sorts of entities: forms, mathematicals, and perceptibles; in this context that means formal numbers, mathematical numbers, and perceptibles. He then, in b21-24, talks about Speusippus' views (see the entry on Speusippus). In both cases he gives us the names. Then, in b24-27 he says this:

But some say that the forms and the numbers have the same nature, while the others, lines and planes, come next, {and so on} down to the substance of the heavens and to the perceptibles.

Asclepius' commentary on this passage (Hayduck 1888, 379.17-22) tells us that it is dealing with Xenocrates.

The core of Xenocrates' view is that “the forms and the numbers have the same nature:” that is, the formal numbers and the mathematical numbers have the same nature. A series of half a dozen passages in the Metaphysics can, in consequence of this identification, be associated with Xenocrates (see XII 1. 1069a30-b2, XIII 1. 1076a20, 6. 1080b21-30, 8. 1083b1-8, 9. 1086a5-11, XIV 3. 1090b13-1091a5). From these passages it appears that he is saying that the distinction between formal and mathematical numbers (as well as the corresponding distinction among geometrical objects) is unnecessary; he does this by assimilating mathematical numbers to form-numbers and telling us that mathematics can be done entirely with formal numbers. In other words, since he thinks that mathematics can be done with formal numbers, he feels it acceptable to call formal numbers mathematical numbers.

1086a5-9 makes it sound as if some part of Xenocrates' case for his position was based on the consideration that all that can be based on the two ultimate principles, the One and the Indefinite Dyad, is the series of formal numbers. Without some further comment, it is hard to see much of an argument here.

And the resulting position is possibly quite unstable: Aristotle certainly thinks so. For Plato and Speusippus, the addition of 2 and 3 is a matter of putting together a group of units that is a mathematical 2 with a disjoint group of units that is a mathematical 3 (that numbers are such collections of units is a view that can still be found later, perhaps most importantly, given his influence, in Euclid, Elements VII def. 2). Aristotle, too, understood addition in this way, although with a completely different take on the underlying ontology. We do not know how Xenocrates understood addition: perhaps as a sort of map telling you that if you are on the unique formal number 2 and you want to add the unique formal number 3 to it, you cannot, strictly speaking, do that, but taking three steps on in the series will get you to the unique formal number 5, and that is what ‘2 + 3 = 5’ really means. There is, as far as I know, no evidence to support this conjecture, but it has the advantage of explaining Aristotle's complaint, voiced more than once in the passages cited (see 1080b28-30, 1083b4-6, 1086a9-11), that Xenocrates actually makes doing mathematics impossible: he ends up destroying mathematical number, and if the above guess should be correct about Xenocrates' handling of addition, it is readily seen how someone of Aristotle's persuasion might think that Xenocrates is not so much explaining addition as explaining it away.

Aristotle complains in 1080b28-30 that on Xenocrates' view it is not so that every two units make up a pair, and also that on his view not every geometrical magnitude divides into smaller magnitudes. This has to do with Xenocrates' acceptance of the idea that there are indivisible lines; this idea Aristotle ascribes to Plato in Metaphysics I 9. 992a20-22, and Alexander's commentary on that passage adds the name Xenocrates, in a way that suggests that Xenocrates' acceptance of indivisible magnitudes was even better known than Plato's (Hayduck 1891, 120.6-7; see also Simplicius on De caelo, Heiberg 1894, 563.21-22 and many other passages in the commentators in which this ascription occurs: frs. 41-49H, 123-147IP). As Proclus understood Xenocrates' position, it applied to the Form of the line rather than to geometrical or physical magnitudes (see Diehl 1904, 245.30-246.4), but this is very much a minority view: Porphyry is quoted by Simplicius in the latter's commentary on the Physics (Diels 1882, 140.9-13) as saying that, according to Xenocrates, what is:

… is not divisible ad infinitum, but {division} stops at certain indivisibles {atoma}. But these are not indivisible as partless and least {magnitudes}, but while they are cuttable with respect to quantity and matter and have parts, in form they are indivisible and primary; he supposed that there were certain primary indivisible lines and primary planes and solids composed out of them.

This suggests that Xenocrates might have thought he could do with the notion of a line what Aristotle was prepared to do with notions such as man. Aristotle is prepared to say that a man is indivisible, and so a suitable unit for the arithmetician's contemplation, in the sense that if you divide a man what you get is no longer a man (see Metaphysics XIII 3. 1078a23-26). Xenocrates may have thought the notion of a line could be made to work in the same way: beyond a certain point, divisions will no longer yield lines. It is difficult to think how he could have made this plausible; once again, one can see why Aristotle might have regarded Xenocrates' position as unmathematical.

Xenocrates' espousal of indivisible magnitudes has led to the conjecture that the pseudo-Aristotelian treatise On Indivisible Lines is at least in part an attack on him, and that the arguments recounted in its first chapter in favor of the claim that there are indivisible lines, which are rebutted in the sequel, might come from Xenocrates. Unfortunately, those arguments are quite obscure, and the text itself is not in very good shape (an admirably concise summary of the first four of these arguments may be found in Furley 1967, 105). But some of the arguments owe a lot to Zeno of Elea: that Xenocrates was influenced by Zeno is only what one would expect, and is confirmed elsewhere (see esp. the passage from Porphyry cited in part above, apud Simplicius on the Physics, Diels 1882, 140.6-18).

In the passage of Metaphysics VII 2 quoted above, after we get the identification of formal and mathematical numbers, with the formal numbers actually carrying the weight, there is a brief description of the rest of the universe: “while the others, lines and planes, come next, {and so on} down to the substance of the heavens and to the perceptibles.” It appears that Xenocrates pictured the universe as unfolding in the sequence: (1) forms = numbers; (2) lines; (3) planes; (4) solids; (5) solids in motion, i.e. astronomical bodies; …; (n) ordinary perceptible things. Solid shapes aren't mentioned in this sentence, but they were earlier, in 1028b17-18, and they are a standard stage in this sequence.

There is here an implicit contrast between Xenocrates and Speusippus, whose universe was to Aristotle discontinuous or disjointed: Xenocrates' universe is at least a more orderly one (see the entry on Speusippus). And something like this rather faint praise is echoed in Theophrastus' Metaphysics. Theophrastus complains that Pythagoreans and Platonists fail to give us a full story about the construction of the universe: they just go so far and stop (6a15-b6). Then he says (6b6-9):

and none of the others {does any different} except Xenocrates: for he places all things somehow around the world-order, alike perceptibles and intelligibles, i.e. mathematicals, and again even the divine {things}.

So we have it from Aristotle that Xenocrates' universe showed continuity, and from Theophrastus that it covered everything. Of course, we do not know how.

Exactly what Theophrastus means by ‘the divine things’ is hard to say. There are two candidates: the objects of astronomical studies, which would connect with Aristotle's account, or those of theological studies, about which Xenocrates also had much to say. These are not exclusive candidates. A passage in Aëtius (Diels 1879, 304b1-14) tells us that Xenocrates took the ‘unit and the dyad’ to be gods, the first male and the second female, and also thought of the heavenly bodies as gods; in addition he supposed there were sublunary daimones. These latter were beings intermediary between gods and men, also mentioned in Plato, Symposium 202d-203a.

We hear more about the gods, daimones, and men from Plutarch, who tells us (De defectu oraculorum 416c-d, Babbitt 1936, 386-387) that Xenocrates associated them with types of triangle: gods with equilateral ones, daimones with isosceles ones, and men with scalene triangles: as isosceles triangles are intermediate between equilateral ones and scalene ones, so daimones are intermediate between gods and men. According to Plutarch (417b, De Iside et Osiride 360d-f: in Babbitt 1936, 390-391 and 58-61, respectively.), Xenocrates' daimones come in good and bad varieties: they may have had something to do with the explanation of the existence of evil.

In addition, there are isolated snatches of other views of Xenocrates that might fall under the heading ‘metaphysics’.

Simplicius, in his commentary on Aristotle's Categories (Kalbfleisch 1907, 63.21-24) tells us that Xenocrates objected to Aristotle's list of ten categories as too long: he thought all that was needed was the distinction, visible in Plato, between things that are ‘by virtue of themselves’ and things that are ‘relative to something’ (see, e.g., Sophist 255c, and Dancy 1999). The standard examples help clarify this: the terms man and horse are of the first sort, whereas large, relative to small, good relative to bad, etc., are of the latter type.

There was, it appears from a text also preserved by Simplicius (in his commentary on the Physics, Diels 1882, 247.30-248.20, from Hermodorus, an early associate of Plato's), an internal connection between these ‘old academic categories’ and the One and the Indefinite Dyad. The One was the heading over the category of things that are ‘by virtue of themselves’: such things are standalone entities, one thing. The Indefinite Dyad was the heading over the category of relatives: such a term refers to an indefinite continuum pointing in two directions. All this is referred to Plato, not Xenocrates, but if Xenocrates accepted Plato's later theory, or at least some of it, he presumably accepted this as well, and saw in Aristotle's proliferation of categories a threat to the basic two principles he shared with Plato.

A text preserved in Arabic (see Pines 1961) has Alexander of Aphrodisias criticizing Xenocrates for saying that the (less general) species is prior to the (more general) genus because the latter, being an element in the definitions of the former, is a part of them (and parts are subsequent to wholes).

A long passage in Themistius' commentary on Aristotle's De anima (Heinze 1899, 11.18-12.33) seems to stem from Xenocrates' On Nature (in 11.37-12.1 Themistius says “It is possible to gather all these {things} from the On Nature of Xenocrates”). This is a discussion of a story about the composition of the soul from the formal numbers 1, 2, 3, and 4 (although 1 was not normally considered a number), mentioned in De anima 408b18-27. The motivation for this account of the soul, in both Aristotle and Themistius, is the explanation of how we can know things about the universe: the universe is derivative from those numbers, and so, if the soul is similarly derivative, the soul can know things under the principle that like things are known by like. This cognitive sort of account is contrasted with another motivic type of account, that takes as the primary thing to be explained the fact that the soul can initiate motion.

However, it is quite clear that, even if the story about the reduction of the soul to numbers stems from Xenocrates' On Nature, the numerical reduction was supposed by Themistius not to be Xenocrates', but (perhaps) Plato's. Aristotle and Themistius both give separate mention to the account of the soul that is traditionally ascribed to Xenocrates: that it is a self-moving number (De anima 408b32-33; Themistius in 12.30-33; the ascription to Xenocrates is supported by a large number of texts gathered as frs. 60H, 165-187IP: e.g., Alexander of Aphrodisias on Aristotle's Topics, Wallies 1891, 162.17). Both Aristotle and Themistius characterize this account as an attempt to combine the cognitive and the motivic ways of thinking about the soul; as Themistius puts it (12.30-33):

And there were others who wove the two together into the explanation of the soul, both moving and knowing, such as the one who asserted the soul {to be} a number that moves itself, pointing by ‘number’ to the capacity for knowing and by ‘moving itself’ to that for moving.

Themistius does not here tell us that this is Xenocrates' account, but he does later on (see esp. 32.19-34, which refers expressly to Xenocrates' On Nature book 5).

2. Theory of Knowledge

As already noted, this heading comes under ‘logic’ in Sextus Empiricus. No one reports anything for Xenocrates about what we would think of as pure logic; Sextus (Adversus mathematicos vii 147-149) gives us a scrap about epistemology. Xenocrates is supposed to have divided the substances or entities into three groups: perceptible, intelligible, and believable (also referred to as ‘composite’ and ‘mixed’). The intelligible ones were objects of knowledge, which Xenocrates apparently spoke of as ‘epistemonic logos’ or ‘knowing account’, and were ‘located’ outside the heavens. The perceptible ones were objects of perception, which was capable of attaining truth about them but nothing that counted as knowledge; they were within the heavens. The composite ones were the heavenly objects themselves, and objects of belief, which is sometimes true and sometimes false.

This scheme descends from that in Plato, Republic V ad fin., where the objects of knowledge were differentiated from those of belief, and from Republic VI ad fin., where that division is portrayed on a divided line. In the latter passage, Plato seems actually to have four divisions of types of cognition and their objects, but this is notoriously difficult (see Burnyeat 1987), and Xenocrates appears to have rethought it. His tripartite division of objects looks like that in Aristotle, Metaphysics XII 1.

The phrase ‘epistemonic logos’ is one Sextus (145) also assigns to Speusippus; it also recalls discussions in Aristotle (e.g. Metaphysics VII 15) and the end of Plato's Theaetetus. An ‘epistemonic logos’ is the sort of account that carries knowledge with it.

The intelligible domain must have included the formal numbers dealt with above, which was also, as mentioned, the domain of mathematics, while the special place for the heavens accords with the fact that one of the items in D.L.'s bibliography is “On Astronomy, 6 books”.

This picture seems to square with Aristotle's exempting Xenocrates from the charge, leveled against Speusippus, of producing a discontinuous universe, and with Theophrastus' comment to the effect that Xenocrates' universe encompassed everything.

Here again we encounter Xenocrates the theologian: Sextus tells us (149) that Xenocrates associated the three fates with his three groups of substances: Atropos with the intelligible ones, Clotho with the perceptible ones, and Lachesis with the believable ones. This sounds a Xenocratean touch: it connects with the interpretation of Plato (see Republic X 620d-e) and takes mythology very seriously.

3. Ethics

Here we are very much in the dark: we have only disconnected snippets to consider.

Aristotle names Xenocrates in the Topics in connection with two ethical views:  II 6. 112a37-38 ascribes to him the view that a happy man is one with a good soul, along with (perhaps) the claim that one's soul is one's daimon, whatever that means; VII 1. 152a7-9 ascribes to him an argument to the effect that the good life and the happy life are the same, employing as premises the claims that the good life and the happy life are both the most choosable (a little later, in 152a26-30, Aristotle objects to this argument).

Plutarch claims (De communibus notitiis adversus Stoicos 1069e-f) that Xenocrates made happiness turn on living in accordance with nature; since this may derive from Antiochus of Ascalon, whose project it was to assimilate the Academy to Stoicism, it is suspect. Clement (Stromateis II 22) ascribes to him the view that happiness is the possession of one's own excellence in the soul. This view bears a family resemblance to Aristotle's (NE I 7. 1098a16-17, 9. 1099b26). The negative emphasis in Xenocrates' evaluation of philosophical activity as “stopping the disturbance of the affairs of life” ([Galen], Historia philosophiae 8, in Diels 1879 605.7-8) sounds like a step in the direction of the Hellenistic goal of undisturbedness.


The available collections of fragments are Heinze 1892 and Isnardi Parente 1982.

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Academy, Plato's | Alexander of Aphrodisias | Aristotle | doxography of ancient philosophy | Plato | Plutarch | Porphyry | Proclus | Sextus Empiricus | Simplicius | Speusippus | Themistius | Theophrastus