Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Tue Feb 13, 2007

Xunzi (“Master Xun”)[1] was one of the most sophisticated and influential philosophers of China's Warring States period (479–221 B.C.E.). He considered himself a follower of Confucius and was one of the central early figures in the consolidation of what came to be thought of as the Confucian tradition. Xunzi's significance has often been underestimated, with most prominent Confucians since the Song dynasty aligning themselves with his rival Mencius. His writings address topics ranging from economic and military policy, through the justification of traditional authority and institutions, to action theory and the philosophy of language.

1. Life and Writings

There is little to go on in constructing an account of Xunzi's life. The Xunzi itself includes few hints, and it is hard to reconcile later (Han dynasty) sources with one another. There is accordingly a great deal of scholarly disagreement about how to fill in the details of Xunzi's biography. What is relatively certain is that Xunzi was born in the northern state of Zhao towards the end of the 4th century B.C.E., that he flourished in the middle of the 3rd century, and that he died at an old age sometime after 238.

Surviving sources mention two official posts held by Xunzi. For a time he had an advisory position in the eastern state of Qi, and later was given an administrative post by the southern state of Chu, in territory that Chu acquired by conquest in perhaps 254 B.C.E. Xunzi lost the latter post when his sponsor died in 238; this is the latest reasonably secure date in Xunzi's biography, though there is one source that implies (implausibly) that he lived to see the founding of the Chinese empire by the western state of Qin in 221 B.C.E.

The Xunzi reports audiences with the kings both of Zhao, his home state, and of (pre-imperial) Qin. Another passage may report an interview with a prime minister from Qi, though Xunzi's interlocutor in this passage is not identified in all textual traditions.

Xunzi had at least one influential student in Li Si, who is widely considered the intellectual architect of the Qin unification. There is also a tradition that Xunzi taught the philosopher Han Feizi, but this is not as well supported. Other students of Xunzi's seem to have dominated the transmission of several texts that were later canonized, such as the Odes; this helped give Xunzi an extensive influence on Han dynasty thought.

Probably the bulk of the Xunzi was composed during Xunzi's lifetime and under his supervision. It is likely he did much of the writing himself (only a small number of passages depict him in the third person). It is also probable that his followers continued to add to the corpus after his death. Some texts in the Xunzi display signs of later editing, especially interpolation. At some point—or perhaps over an extended period, and perhaps while parts were still being written—the corpus was organized into ‘books’ (more precisely, scrolls), at least partly on thematic grounds, and the books were given titles that reflect their dominant themes. Towards the end of the first century B.C.E., the Han imperial librarian Liu Xiang collated the available materials, producing a collection of 32 books. The Xunzi reached its current form near the beginning of the 9th century C.E., when the commentator Yang Liang put these books in their now-standard order.

The complicated history of the Xunzi, like that of other ancient texts, raises difficult problems of interpretation. Although there are views that are characteristic of the Xunzi as a whole, there is little reason to expect various developments of these views to agree in detail. This means that it is probably a mistake simply to sum up what is said in different passages, and attribute the resulting construction to Xunzi. But in the near total absence of any clues that tie specific texts to specific periods in the careers of Xunzi and his followers, it is difficult to be appropriately sensitive to biographical considerations.[2] It is generally best to defer questions of how the ideas advanced in distinct passages fit together—in a system, a career, or otherwise—until after detailed study of the passages taken individually. This undermines some entrenched interpretive habits, and can make exposition somewhat awkward, but offers other rewards.

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2. The Way of the Sage Kings

At the heart of Xunzi's philosophy was his conception of social and political order, and his faith in a tradition that he thought embodied it. He sometimes referred to this tradition with the phrase li-yi, “rituals and duties,” emphasizing two of its central aspects. People occupied hierarchically-organized roles, and were to act according to the duties of their roles. Traditional rituals and other artificial social forms would help ensure they did this by transforming natural human behavior, so that people would not indulge their desires in ways that lead to disorder, but would instead conform to the Way. The social system as a whole would be overseen by gentlemen (junzi), guided by a class of erudites that Xunzi referred to as ru.[3] These would be men whose education and social position gave them the perspective and virtue to oversee the myriad particular activities that Xunzi considered necessary for an orderly state.

Much of Xunzi's philosophy is based upon a distinction between what is natural or spontaneous and what is a product of human effort. Xunzi conceived of nature—including human nature—as an unchanging context for human action and organization. In his view, human endeavors succeed or fail because of how they respond to this fixed context—not because of any natural advantages or disadvantages, and especially not because nature rewards the virtuous and punishes the wicked. In particular, he believed that the stability of a society largely depends on its ability to respond to the fact that natural human desires outrun naturally available resources. Central to his defense of the Way that he advocated was the claim that it was uniquely capable of doing this, by strengthening and enriching the state, by providing social and political structures to regulate people's attempts to satisfy their desires, and by fundamentally transforming people's characters.

Because Xunzi thought of the natural context of human activity as a constant, he also claimed that his Way was constant. It had been invented by ancient sages, and there was no further need to improve or adjust it. In Book 5, he rejects the argument, which we find in texts such as the Zhuangzi and the Book of Lord Shang, that in different times, because of their different conditions, order must be pursued in different ways; in his view, the Way devised by the sage kings was adequate to all times and conditions. Thus, the Way is not only the product of human effort and invention, it is also a completed product, and now all that is required is that we master it and transmit it to future generations. One could go so far as to argue that this is the primary significance of Xunzi's claims about the origins of the Way—that he attributes the Way to ancient sages primarily because this allows him both to insist that the Way is the product of human innovation and to deny that there is any need for further innovation. Certainly he does not go into the sort of detail one might expect if he were genuinely interested in developing a narrative of the past.

There were many who challenged the socio-political institutions and practices that Xunzi endorsed—not for nothing was this known as the period of a hundred schools. Most vulnerable were his claims on behalf of erudites and rituals, which were universally rejected outside the Confucian tradition.

Philosophically, his most important rivals were probably the Mohists.[4] They had argued that social order requires moderation, and they took this to imply a rejection of the lavish rituals that Xunzi advocated; they also attacked the ru erudites ferociously. But they were nonetheless one of Xunzi's most important influences: although he rejected Mohist positions, to a large extent he adopted their argument strategies; he also seems to have learned a great deal from the Mohist conception of fa (models, standards). (On both these points, see below.) By contrast, though Xunzi defended the traditionalism and ritualism of the ru erudites, he did not otherwise owe them a significant philosophical debt. One might go so far as to say that Xunzi used philosophy he had learned from the Mohists to defend doctrines he inherited from the ru.

Other important challenges to which Xunzi responded came from thinkers now often classified as Daoists and Legalists.[5] Daoists typically privileged spontaneity, and rejected morality and ritual as artificial human constructs. Some of them remained committed to authoritarian rule, others advocated dropping out of political society entirely. The Legalists were philosophers and officials who focused on developing practical techniques for rulers to secure and administer territory, and to preserve their control over their subjects, particularly the aristocracy and the emerging bureaucracy. Many such thinkers considered traditional moral values to be of no use, and argued against using them to guide the acquisition and exercise of power.

The brief account of Xunzi given in the Shi Ji incorporates a nice summation of Xunzi's intellectual orientation:

Xun Qing hated the policies of a corrupt age, when lost states and chaotic rulers suited each other, not following the Great Way but engaging in witchcraft and placing their trust in blessings. Base erudites (ru) were petty and inflexible, like Zhuang Zhou and that sort, and also brought turmoil and chaotic customs. At this, [Xunzi] pushed the moral practices of the erudites and the Mohists.

This emphasizes Xunzi's advocacy of virtuous rule and his opposition to superstition (an important corollary of his philosophy of nature). It indicates the importance Xunzi placed on attacking what he took to be unorthodox teachings. The passage relies on a distinction between base erudites and the erudites with whom Xunzi allied himself; this reflects a concern found repeatedly in Xunzi's writings, to separate the true followers of Confucius off from other learned people. Here, the base erudites are represented by Zhuangzi, a Daoist that Xunzi associated especially with an overemphasis of the natural at the expense of the human. (Note however that Zhuangzi would not normally be classified as a ru erudite, Confucian or otherwise.) Interestingly, the passage aligns Xunzi with the Mohists, apparently on the grounds of their shared commitment to a moral Way; the association may also reflect the Mohists' deep influence on Xunzi, mentioned above.

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3. Fa (Models), Teachers, and Gentlemen

Book 8 of the Xunzi portrays Xunzi trying to convince King Zhao of Qin of the worth of ru erudites. He begins by saying, “The ru model themselves after the former kings.” The use here of the word “fa” (“models, standards”) is extremely important. In Xunzi's view, tradition is important largely because it presents us with models of behavior, and the only way to achieve social order is for people to try to emulate those models.

The concept of fa became important in early Chinese philosophy largely because of the Mohists. The Mohists had objected to traditional rituals, arguing that many of their contemporaries confused what is merely customary with what is right. They were also suspicious of the idea that only educated elites have the cultivated judgment necessary for virtue. They instead advocated promulgating models or standards of behavior that (they claimed) all people can easily apply to determine how to act. Among the standards they advocated were the distinction between benefit and harm, the evidence of the senses, and the will of heaven. They compared these standards to devices such as compasses and t-squares, that artisans use to guide their work. Such standards were what they called fa.

Xunzi adopted this idea, but turned it on its head by claiming that the highest fa were the very rituals that the Mohists denounced. These rituals required educated specialists both to conduct them and to transmit instructions for their performance. Thus, Xunzi rejected a key feature of the Mohist conception of fa, according to which ordinary people can apply the fa without extensive training. Instead, he made fa the province of an educated elite devoted to the interpretation and transmission of ritual texts, and this is one of the reasons he placed so much importance on the ru erudites.

Xunzi's conception of fa escapes one objection to which the Mohist conception was vulnerable. The Mohists paid no attention to the question of how people are able to apply the fa correctly in practice; one might say that they tended to treat the fa they advocated as self-interpreting, so that there could never be any room for error in the application of those fa to concrete situations or issues. But there obviously is room for interpretation and error in the application of the particular fa that the Mohists promoted. Indeed, when the Mohists compare their fa to an artisan's tools, this implies that correctly applying them requires skill acquired through training. One might argue that the Mohists' failure to recognize this implication speaks to a significant flaw in their conception of fa.

For Xunzi, fa are not self-interpreting. Only someone who has gone through an appropriate education will be able to apply them correctly, and this education must be guided by a teacher who has already mastered them. The teacher will both provide explanations that are missing from transmitted texts, and evaluate the student's attempts to apply what he has learned to concrete situations. This expert guidance and judgment is essential to the student's success; without it, no matter how intensively the student studies traditional texts or observes the behavior of his contemporaries, he is unlikely to learn the correct lessons from them.

Perhaps paradoxically, Xunzi did not see the goal of elite education to be the acquisition of specialist expertise. Gentlemen—educated men who had been elevated to positions of power on account of their merit—were not for Xunzi specialists, whether in the art of government or anything else. He specifically contrasted them with farmers, merchants, and artisans, people who according to Xunzi master the techniques specific to their areas of expertise but who have no role to play in deciding the ends to which their technical expertise will be put. Gentlemen, by contrast, oversee the business of society as a whole, and regulate the activities of the various specialists, without themselves mastering any specialist techniques. The goal of elite education, then, is to produce a comprehensive and guiding perspective rather than specialist expertise, and the gentleman's understanding of fa should be understood in this light. (Unfortunately Xunzi's extant writings do not address the evident tension between these claims and the value he places on ru ritual specialists.)

The relatively low value Xunzi placed on technical expertise is nowhere more obvious than in his discussion of warfare in Book 15. Rejecting views associated with the Art of War, Xunzi argues that military success does not depend on stratagems or on specifically military techniques. Instead, it depends on gaining the support of the people, and the way to succeed in this is to rule virtuously, not to master military strategy. Thus, according to Xunzi wars are won primarily by the civil elite, and not by military specialists.

On these points Xunzi was asserting a fundamental disagreement with the thinkers that are now often called Legalists. Legalists were most concerned with developing institutions and policies that would be effective even in the absence of virtuous rulers. For Xunzi, this greatly exaggerates the efficacy of institutions and policies, and to a large extent this can be seen as a disagreement over whether applying fa correctly requires the sort of elite education that Xunzi advocated for gentlemen. Indeed, “Legalist” is meant to translate the Chinese term fajia, or school of fa; and when Xunzi criticized the Legalist Shen Dao he did so saying that Shen was obsessed with fa and neglected the importance of having worthy individuals to interpret and apply the fa.[6]

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4. Education and Punishment

In its traditional arrangement, the Xunzi opens with a book (or chapter) devoted to education. Called “Encouraging Learning,” it insists that virtue can result only from a long pursuit of learning—a pursuit that can never truly end. We find a similar emphasis placed on education throughout the Confucian tradition. Indeed, according to the Confucian Analects, it was primarily Confucius's intense love of learning that set him apart from other people. But education takes on an especially significant role within Xunzi's philosophy.

In this opening book, Xunzi compares education to processes of accumulation: the accumulation of individual paces that forms a long journey, or the accumulation of small currents that forms a river, for example. This choice of metaphor reflects the fact that according to Xunzi the primary aim of education is to master a Way that is the artificial product of human invention. It implies that education is a lengthy endeavor that requires a great deal of effort and dedication from the student; it is not something that comes naturally to us. It also implies that education adds something new to the student; it does not (as the Mencius sometimes implies) simply develop pre-existing tendencies. Elsewhere, Xunzi adopts quite different metaphors. For example, he sometimes compares the process of making a person virtuous to straightening bent wood, a metaphor implying that education fundamentally transforms a person's character. What remains constant is the belief that education provides a necessary addition to people's natural capacities, which alone are not sufficient for virtue.

Xunzi's understanding of education and its importance reflects both his pessimism about human nature and his faith in the perfectibility of human beings. He believed that human nature provides a significant barrier to moral improvement, but a barrier that can be overcome, and that people's characters ultimately depend on the habits and customs they acquire as a result of socialization and education, not on their natures. Even “people in the street” have the capacity to become sages—if they are raised well and they work hard enough to acquire the right sort of education.

The curriculum that Xunzi advocated focused on the guided study of certain canonical texts, including the Odes and the (historical) Documents, as well as texts devoted to rituals and music. These texts, if understood correctly, would provide the student with models for both conduct and policy in the present; as noted above, this required the presence of a teacher. Xunzi seems to have placed little or no emphasis on learning general rules of behavior, apparently assuming that we learn better from particular examples.

One might expect Xunzi's faith in the powers of education, as well as his insistence on rule by virtue, to lead to a rejection of the need for punishment. After all, both the Analects and the Mencius argue that a virtuous ruler has no need for punishment or other forms of coercion, and that recourse to punishment is a sign of misrule. In the Analects, this view is associated especially with the influence a virtuous ruler has over his subjects' characters; in the Mencius, it most likely also reflects that text's optimism about human nature. One might expect Xunzi to draw a similar conclusion on the basis of his belief that all people can be made good through education.

However, Xunzi drew no such conclusion, and instead considered punishment to be an indispensable tool of government. He appears to have thought that education will bring only an elite minority to full virtue, and that the mass of humanity must be kept in line with the threat of severe punishment. In Book 18 he goes so far as to argue explicitly against the view that the ancients practised only “image punishment,” which required the condemned to wear clothes representing what Xunzi calls meat punishment; social order, Xunzi claims, requires the actual use of meat punishment.

Xunzi's belief in the need for punishment, if not his insistence on its most brutal forms, probably reflects not only his pessimistic view of human nature, but also the elitism that is built into his conception of social order. For Xunzi as for other Confucians, social order requires a strict division between the rulers and the ruled. And though he is officially committed to the perfectibility of all human beings through education, and to advancement on the basis of merit rather than birth, in practice he most likely saw education and meritocratic advancement as limited to those whose social background prepared them for entry into elite culture.

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5. Tian (Nature or Heaven)

Xunzi conceived of the Way he advocated as an artificial human invention, significant because of how it brings order to human societies. The Way must be adapted to its natural context, and in particular to features of that context (such as the scarcity of natural resources and the facts about human nature) that place significant constraints on human organization. But it need not correspond in any more direct way to natural patterns, and we read in Book 8 that “the Way is not the way of heaven, and it is not the way of earth; it is the way for guiding people, it is what gentlemen use as their way.”

In Xunzi's Chinese, the pair “tian” and “di” signify the sky and ground, or, as they are usually translated, heaven and earth. Together, heaven and earth constitute the cosmos as a whole, or nature, with humanity often seen as a third term distinct from both. (It is unfortunate that the usual translation of “tian” as “heaven” implies that tian stands outside nature; this was certainly not a feature of early Chinese beliefs about tian.) The word “tian” is often used synecdochally for both heaven and earth, and so used is often contrasted with humanity. In this use it is best translated as “nature,” and the contrast of tian with humanity corresponds closely to the familiar distinction between nature and culture. It is this contrast that motivates most of Xunzi's discussions of tian, particularly in Book 17 of the Xunzi, which is largely devoted to the issue (and which is called “On Tian” in the received text of the Xunzi).

Book 17 begins with the statement that “the courses of nature (tian) have constancy.” The main point of this statement is that nature (or heaven) does not respond to human action by punishing the wicked and rewarding the good; nature simply does not care what people want or do. For Xunzi, nature provides a fixed context within which human societies either secure or fail to secure order. What determines the success of a society in securing order is how well adapted it is to nature's constancies. And nature (or heaven) pays no attention to our attempts to achieve social order; it neither judges our performance nor provides us with guidance.

It follows from these claims that it is wrong to interpret events such as eclipses or natural disasters as omens sent by heaven. Eclipses and other odd celestial events are just anomalies with no significance for human beings; we are better off concentrating on nature's regularities, such as the passage of the seasons. Contrary to traditional belief, natural disasters such as floods or droughts are not nature's way to signal displeasure with a ruling family. They are just events that occasionally happen, and which a society must be prepared for; their occurrence has nothing to do with the ruler's virtue. It remains true that floods (for example) lead to calamity only under bad rulers. But this is not because heaven sends floods to punish bad rulers, but because a virtuous ruler would have ensured that floods would not lead to calamity, by maintaining the dikes so that rivers will not overflow, for example, and by setting aside sufficient food stores to make up for any lost harvest.

Xunzi occasionally refers to what he takes to be the ideal relation of humanity to heaven and earth as “forming a triad.” This expression has sometimes been interpreted to imply a mystical union with the cosmos, or a correspondence between human and cosmic patterns. But though these are ideas that would later become important in the Confucian tradition, they are probably not what Xunzi had in mind. According to Xunzi, heaven, earth, and humanity each have their roles. Heaven and earth will fulfill their roles regardless of what humans do, so we should concentrate on our own role, and not try to influence how heaven and earth go about filling theirs. Our role is to achieve order in human societies; if we manage this, then this is what Xunzi refers to as forming a triad.

Thus, heaven and earth have a normative significance for Xunzi only insofar as they provide the context for human societies: they provide constraints that we must take into account, but they do not provide the source or basis for human values and norms. This means in particular that for Xunzi there is no question of wanting to obey heaven's commands or of understanding the adequacy of his Way in terms of a correspondence with cosmic patterns or principles. (He does sometimes use the heaven/earth pair as a metaphor for human hierarchies, with heaven as ruler and earth as subject. But this does not imply that the value or legitimacy of human hierarchies derives from heaven's superiority over earth.)

A corollary of Xunzi's philosophy of nature is a rejection of all belief in non-human agencies. If, for example, spirits exist, then it is as futile to try to win their favor as it is to try to win the favor of heaven. This view gets expressed most clearly in his discussion of the rain sacrifice, which he says has no effect on the weather because it does not influence spirits; its legitimacy depends on the contribution it makes to human culture. More generally, Xunzi seems to have rejected a broad range of contemporary beliefs that we would classify as superstitious, for example in the arguments against physiognomy that constitute the core of Book 5 of the Xunzi.

It is an interesting question to what extent Xunzi held a scientific conception of nature. Certainly an interest in regularity as opposed to anomaly is one of the factors that has distinguished sciences such as astronomy from non-sciences such as astrology, both in China and elsewhere. And in rejecting superstition and denying that nature has any normative significance, Xunzi advanced claims that are often associated with a scientific worldview. But whether or not his conception of nature was in some sense scientific, his attitude towards nature certainly was not. For example, he showed no interest in investigating nature's regularities; one passage from Book 17 is often read as rejecting any such investigation. Further, there is no reason to think that his reasons for rejecting superstition or for denying a normative significance to nature were specifically scientific; in discussing these issues he does not even raise empirical considerations, much less specifically scientific ones.

Another issue much discussed in the secondary literature is the extent to which Xunzi's attitude towards tian (nature or heaven) had a religious dimension. This entry has sided with scholars who take Xunzi's attitude to have been thoroughly secular. Another view is that Xunzi did, contrary to occasional appearances, derive value from tian, for example in his insistence that tian has provided us with the capacities necessary for virtue. Also, some passages, such as the passages according to which humanity should form a triad with heaven and earth, are sometimes taken to imply that we can achieve a sort of mystical union with the cosmos. Note, though, that even if Xunzi held a religious attitude towards tian, this does not imply that he anthropomorphized it. Though this was commonly done by Xunzi's contemporaries (by the Mohists, for example), and though tian appears to have entered Chinese religion as the chief ancestral deity of the Zhou dynasty ruling family, it is clear that Xunzi conceived of heaven in thoroughly impersonal terms even if his attitude towards it was in some sense religious.[7]

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6. Human Nature and Agency

Xunzi's philosophy of human nature is based on a distinction between those characteristics that arise spontaneously in people and cannot be changed, on the one hand, and characteristics that are the result of human effort, on the other. This corresponds directly to his distinction between the fixed natural context of human society and our attempts to respond to that context with artificial institutions and practices. And just as the success and failure of human societies to achieve order depends not on nature but on the Ways they adopt, the success and failure of individuals to achieve virtue depends not on their natural endowment, but on how they exert their capacities for artifice.

Xunzi makes this distinction most explicit when, in Book 23, he distinguishes between what he calls xing and wei. The concept of xing picks out the spontaneous aspects of human nature. Capacities such as the capacity to learn, which we exercise only deliberately and with effort, do not for Xunzi count as xing, but instead fall under the category of wei, or artifice. This distinction is fundamental to his famous claim that people's xing is bad, discussed below; this implies that the tendencies that people acquire spontaneously tend to lead to bad behavior, but does not imply that human nature as a whole as bad. Human nature incorporates, but our xing does not, the capacities that make virtue possible, because though all human beings have these capacities, we do not exercise them spontaneously.[8]

Among the spontaneous features of human nature that attract Xunzi's attention, desire is most significant. Xunzi claims that all human beings experience certain desires—primarily desires for bodily satisfaction and comfort and for social honor and position—and that we cannot reduce or eliminate these desires. The difference between the gentleman and the common person lies not in their desires, but in the actions they take to satisfy their desires. An implication of this claim is that for people to become virtuous it is not necessary for their desires to change. This is borne out by Xunzi's discussion of the effects of ritual in Book 19, where he says that ritual nourishes people's desires and ensures that their behavior will be orderly, but does not say that ritual transforms people's desires.[9]

A consequence of Xunzi's distinction between xing and artifice is that our xing does not distinguish us from animals. Instead, what distinguishes us from animals is our capacity for artifice—our ability to act independently of, or even contrary to, our spontaneous tendencies. Xunzi does not explain this difference in cognitive terms. According to a passage in Book 9, animals, like humans, have knowledge; this is what distinguishes them from plants. What sets humans apart is our capacity for morality and our tendency to form norm-governed societies. (In this he agrees with other Confucian philosophers, notably Mencius.) Perhaps this implies a difference between human and animal knowledge. But even if it does, Xunzi consistently drew the distinction between humans and animals in social and normative rather than cognitive terms.

Xunzi's most pessimistic claims about human nature come in the course of an argument against Mencius that occurs in Book 23 of the Xunzi. Book 6A of the Mencius tells us that Mencius defended the view that people's xing is good. Xunzi takes this to mean that people will spontaneously behave correctly if they are not interfered with, and argues to the contrary that people's xing is bad.[10] His main argument is that if our xing were truly good, then there would be no need for the institutions, such as the rituals and duties, that the sages founded in order to bring order to human societies. That we require these institutions to interfere with people's natural tendencies is supposed to show that these tendencies are originally bad.

The scholarly consensus is that this argument is based on a misunderstanding of Mencian moral psychology. Perhaps the claim that people's xing is good, taken in isolation, implies that people will behave correctly if not interfered with, but in the context of Mencian philosophy more generally it cannot have such an extreme implication. Mencian optimism about human nature is based on claims about our capacities for virtue, and about the naturalness with which we can develop these capacities, not on the implausible claim that we start out with naturally virtuous tendencies.

Xunzi gives a more sensitive interpretation of Mencian moral psychology in another passage from Book 23, where he takes Mencius to be saying that through education people's xing can be made good. So interpreted, Mencius held that our spontaneous tendencies can be extended and shaped, and that the aim of moral education is to do this in the right way; the result is an improved xing. Xunzi rejects this view, arguing that since education requires effort it inevitably separates us off from our xing; when he elsewhere writes that the sage kings transformed xing, he presumably means that they replaced it with something else, namely artifice. By responding to Mencius in this way, Xunzi emphasizes not the inferior moral character of xing, but the need to supplement it with artifice; and he is taking the underlying issue to be the effort required for moral improvement. (Section 4B/26 of the Mencius may agree that this was the fundamental issue in early Chinese disputes about people's xing.)

It is the human heart that enables us to depart from our spontaneous tendencies. The heart does not operate entirely according to xing, for it is also capable of artifice. Because of this, the heart can gain knowledge of the Way (cf. the discussion of the heart in Section 8, Epistemology, below). It can use its knowledge of the Way to guide behavior, for, Xunzi says, the heart is the ruler of the body: once it settles on a course of action, it merely has to issue its orders, and the body is sure to obey.

Xunzi calls the sort of judgment that the heart makes when it settles on a course of action approval. He specifically contrasts approval with desire, arguing that we inevitably do what our hearts approve of doing, even if that goes contrary to our desires. In other words, he argues that we always do what we think we should do, rather than what we want to do. He thus commits himself to the view that there can be no genuine cases of weakness of the will (though unfortunately he does not say how he would account for apparent cases of weakness). This is what allows him to claim that although correct behavior is contrary to people's spontaneous desires, it does not require a reduction or elimination of those desires. There has been some debate in the secondary literature over the extent to which Xunzi thought approval is truly independent of desire. One view is that the heart's approvals are based on judgments about how best to satisfy the agent's desires in the long term. However, it is unlikely that Xunzi saw such judgments as playing an essential role in action. More likely he thought that the heart's approvals reflect the agent's character, which in turn is primarily the product of socialization and education.[11]

Indeed, from a comparative perspective, one of the most striking features of early Chinese conceptions of action is the lack of emphasis that they place on practical reasoning, and the concomitant value they place on spontaneous or unthought behavior. For Xunzi, action is guided by a sort of normative judgment, but he does not say that such judgments always or even often issue from practical reasoning. To the contrary, he takes it for granted that the heart's approvals can and ultimately should be thoroughly habitual. The process of habituation is not itself spontaneous, and requires that the student overcome certain spontaneous tendencies, but its outcome is a state in which, ideally, the agent always acts appropriately but never requires thought or effort to do so. This ideal of learned spontaneity might be explained with reference to the performance of a highly trained athlete or, to bring out its aesthetic dimension, a dancer. It is most fully realized in Xunzi's conception of the sage. For example, in Book 5 of the Xunzi we read that the sage “does not deliberate in advance, does not make early plans, but what he puts forth is fitting.” The sage has mastered the Way to such an extent that it has become his second nature to act according to it.

Many critics have charged that Xunzi cannot account for the possibility of sagehood, given his insistence (uncontroversial in the early Confucian tradition) that the sages share the same nature as the rest of us. When Xunzi tries to explain how we can become virtuous despite our unlovely natures, he takes it for granted that the Way has already been instituted and that we have teachers to help us learn it. Of course this does nothing to explain how the sages were able to institute the Way in the first place. And when Xunzi explicitly takes up this issue (in Book 23), he conflates the ability to initiate a new practice (such as pottery) with the ability to master a pre-existing practice. To some extent, this may reflect the fact that Xunzi rejects any attempt to adjust or replace the Way of the sage kings: as far as he is concerned, the time to initiate new practices is long past, so if he were to give an account of how people are capable of initiating new practices (rather than simply mastering pre-existing ones), then he would be explaining an ability he thought people should no longer exercise.

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7. Normative Arguments

Confucians of the Warring States period were not much given to normative argument. When told that he had a reputation for loving argument, Mencius is supposed to have denied it and insisted that he simply could not avoid engaging in argument. (This exchange occurs in section 3B/9 of the Mencius.) Xunzi's attitude was similar; at one point (in Book 22) he goes so far as to write that the gentleman engages in argument only if he does not have the political authority to prohibit heterodox teachings.

Despite this dogmatism, Xunzi seems to have taken seriously the need to provide his normative claims with some defence. He borrows his basic strategy from the Mohists: they had defended their doctrines primarily by making claims about the benefits of putting them into practice, and Xunzi similarly argues that his Way provides the most effective means for bringing order to human societies. He sometimes does so by imagining a state comparable to Thomas Hobbes's state of nature, in which people's attempts to satisfy their natural desires lead to conflict, disorder, and poverty. He claims that ancient sage kings instituted rituals and duties out of hatred for this disorder, in order to transform people's characters and thereby make social order possible. The implied argument is that the Way of the sage kings is correct because of its consequences, in particular because of its unique ability to produce social order.

Consider for example the discussions of ritual and music that we find in Books 19 and 20 of the Xunzi. In the discussion of ritual, he focuses on people's attempts to satisfy their desires, which he calls seeking. He claims that if people's seeking behavior is not regulated, then it will lead to disorder, and that traditional rituals provide the means to regulate it. Music functions similarly, giving shape to people's inevitable expressions of enjoyment, which would otherwise lead to disorder.[12] In both cases, Xunzi defends the practices he favors by citing their consequences, in particular the contribution they make to social order.

The book that Xunzi devotes to music is especially interesting because its primary foil is the Mohists. The Mohists had argued on consequentialist grounds against the royal practice of organizing elaborate musical performances. They acknowledged that music and its associated practices (such as feasting) bring enjoyment, but argued that they waste valuable resources and therefore should be abolished. Xunzi's response to the Mohists consists in a series of claims about the effects of (good) music; for example, he says that it makes possible the peaceful expression of emotion, it leads to harmonious conduct, and it distinguishes the noble from the base. He thus adopts the Mohists' consequentialist argument strategy in order to argue against their conclusions.[13]

Consequentialist moral theories can be distinguished along a number of dimensions. They might differ with respect to the items that they pick out for consequentialist evaluation, for example. Among contemporary western consequentialists, the main such division is between those who focus on particular actions, and those who focus on general rules of conduct. Xunzi, like the Mohists and other early Chinese philosophers, focused not on actions or rules, but on institutions and practices—on the various ways of organizing human action that sum up to form the Way. We might thus describe Xunzi as way- (or dao-) consequentialist.

Another factor that distinguishes different forms of consequentialism is the standard or standards they use to evaluate consequences—their conception of the good. Classical utilitarians, for example, evaluate consequences according to the amount of happiness or pleasure they include, whereas other forms of consequentialism pick out other goods. In early Chinese philosophy, conseqentialist arguments typically appeal to the material well-being of a state's people, as well as to sociopolitical order (zhi) more generally. This is certainly true of Xunzi, as we see in his complaints that a lack of ritual leads to contention, disorder, and poverty. It remains an important question how much he builds into his conception of order, and of the good more generally.

It is actually quite surprising how little Xunzi builds into his conception of the good, at least in these normative arguments. The Mohist argument against music, sketched above, assumes that the enjoyment produced by music does not count as a good, and we naturally expect Xunzi to reject this assumption. But he does not reject it; indeed, he treats enjoyment as a possible source of disorder, and defends music on the grounds that it helps avert that disorder. Similarly, we might expect Xunzi to appeal to the aesthetic properties of music, which the Mohists simply ignored, as a source of value. But he does no such thing. His arguments imply that music's aesthetic properties have value only insofar as they contribute to its non-aesthetic effects. (The same is true in his defence of ritual: though there are passages that make it clear that Xunzi had a profound aesthetic appreciation for ritual, this plays no role in his normative arguments.) In these arguments, Xunzi rejects the Mohists' arguments, but does not dispute the rather narrow conception of the good that they are based on; he implicitly agrees that music (and ritual) should be judged solely on the basis of its practical consequences.

Indeed, Xunzi's conception of the good may have been narrower than the Mohists'. The Mohists had argued that in the absence of a unifying political authority, families would be torn apart by normative disagreement, and they regularly treat traditional family structures as constitutive of social order and thus of the good. Perhaps surprisingly, there is little evidence that Xunzi followed the Mohists on this point. His normative arguments appeal to the poverty and violence that he claims would prevail in the absence of rituals and duties, but say nothing about families. And the rituals and duties he defends on the grounds of their consequences appear to include the rituals and duties specific to traditional family structures. Thus, though Xunzi may end up recognizing a wider range of values than do the Mohists, his normative arguments probably depend on a narrower conception of the good than had the Mohists' arguments.

Xunzi's normative arguments imply that the rituals and other artificial social forms that Xunzi advocated have value because of their effects, and not because they count intrinsically as goods. This in turn implies that Xunzi's attitude towards these institutions and practices was ultimately pragmatic: he viewed them as means for adapting human society to its fixed natural context, including especially the context provided by the spontaneous products of human nature. Many scholars have been reluctant to accept this apparent consequence of Xunzi's arguments, and indeed there are passages in the Xunzi that seem to express quite a different attitude towards the rituals. This has led some scholars to conclude that there are, as it were, two Xunzis: one a pragmatic thinker ready to defend the rituals on the basis of their alleged consequences, and the other a more religious or dogmatic thinker, for whom the value of the rituals was basic and could not really be called into question.[14] These two Xunzis may be different personas that Xunzi adopted in different contexts or for different audiences, or perhaps they represent distinct stages in his long philosophical career.

Whatever one makes of this issue, there is no question that Xunzi's commitment to his Way was ultimately dogmatic. His consequentialist arguments committed him to the claim that the particular institutions and practices he endorsed, including the particulars of the ritual tradition he favored, were uniquely capable of promoting order in human societies; but the Xunzi offers no reason to think that this claim is true. Moreover, Xunzi was resolutely opposed to any attempt to make changes to the Way, whether to adjust it to changed circumstances or otherwise; in his view, the time for innovation lay in the distant past, with the sage kings. He thus recognized no need to subject his claims on behalf of his Way to empirical test.

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8. Epistemology

Early Chinese philosophers usually thought of knowledge in practical terms. They took it to consist in the mastery not of facts but of ways of acting (dao). Especially important was the knowledge of how to draw distinctions. Drawing distinctions was the closest analog to conceptualization recognized by early Chinese philosophers, and they took it to be the fundamental cognitive operation. Indeed, at one point (in Book 2) Xunzi tells us that drawing distinctions correctly is what is called knowledge.[15]

This takes knowledge to be a kind of ability rather than a sort of representation of facts, and it should come as no surprise that Xunzi did not explain cognitive errors by appealing to mistakes of representation. For Xunzi, we make mistakes not because we picture the facts incorrectly but because we lack some ability; knowledge contrasts not with false belief but with confusion. Xunzi twice (in Books 6 and 21 of the Xunzi) provides lists of his philosophical opponents and diagnoses their errors, and in neither case does he accuse them of misrepresenting the facts, or of confusing appearance with reality. Instead, he charges that they placed too much emphasis on some part of the Way, and thus failed to understand the whole.

As Section 3 (Fa (Models), Teachers, and Gentlemen) has already made clear, Xunzi thought that much of our knowledge depends on mastery of fa. These fa include both exemplars of various kinds of things and methods for determining a thing's kind, and Xunzi thought that we often depend on these to draw distinctions correctly. For example, to use an example of the Later Mohists', in order to distinguish circles from non-circles, we might use an actual circle, a mental image of a circle, or a compass; all of these would count as fa. To a large extent, then, Xunzi thought that to know X is to know how to use fa to distinguish X from non-X.

However, there are hints that Xunzi thought that we are also able to go beyond this sort of knowledge, and gain a more direct insight into kinds. The passage that implies this most directly comes in Book 9, and deals with judging legal cases; Xunzi says that when there are no fa one must proceed according to the kinds. Here, fa are presumably precedents or explicit legal guidelines, but it is tempting to interpret them more generally as representing the knowledge that one brings to a situation. Read this way, the point of the passage is that we can adapt to new situations in ways that go beyond anything we already knew how to do; doing this is what he calls proceeding according to the kinds. Elsewhere he invokes a state he calls “union with the kinds,” and it is plausible that he is invoking the same adaptiveness. (Cf. the discussion below of emptiness, unity, and stillness.)

Xunzi (like other early Chinese philosophers) took cognitive activities to be distributed throughout the body, not the sole responsibility of one particular organ. This view is most explicit in a passage in Book 22 in which Xunzi explains how the sense organs make it possible for us to distinguish between same and different. They make this possible by drawing distinctions among their objects; for example, the eyes draw distinctions among colors and among shapes. Thus, the role of the sense organs is not to supply sensations to be interpreted by a central organ that specializes in cognition; they do (or at least begin) the work of interpretation themselves. (Early Chinese philosophers also often assumed that desires for sensory gratification are produced directly by the sense organs.)

To the extent that Xunzi and other early Chinese philosophers privileged one organ for its role in cognition, it was the heart. (This leads some scholars to translate “xin” as “mind” rather than as “heart.”) To some extent, the heart works the same way as the (other) sense organs. In the passage from Book 22 mentioned in the last paragraph, Xunzi says that it draws distinctions among reasons, explanations, emotions, and desires; by implication, it does so in much the same way that the eye draws distinctions among colors. But Xunzi privileged the heart in at least three ways. First, the heart controls the activity of the sense organs (using what Xunzi calls sending knowledge) and of the body more generally; it is the decision-making organ (cf. the discussion of the heart in Section 6, Human Nature and Agency, above). Second, the heart can acquire new knowledge, whereas the knowledge of the (other) sense organs of how to draw distinctions among their objects is innate (he attributes it to people's xing). And third, the heart, unlike the other organs, is able to acquire knowledge of the Way.

Xunzi gives his most extensive discussion of the heart's ability to know the Way in Book 21 of the Xunzi. Here Xunzi sets out his most distinctive epistemological doctrine, that the heart can come to know the Way through being empty, unified, and still. He seems to borrow these three terms from texts that came to be classified as Daoist, and some scholars take this whole discussion to imply a Daoist influence on Xunzi. But even as he borrows Daoist terminology, Xunzi rejects the associated doctrines. Within texts in the Zhuangzi that advocate emptiness, for example, emptiness requires emptying the heart of all knowledge. These texts construe knowledge as prejudice: knowledge disposes agents to respond to situations on the basis of past learning, when they would be better off acting according to the demands of the particular situation. The heart should function as a mirror, responding to the current situation without storing anything up, and this is possible only if the heart is emptied of all knowledge. The underlying conviction is that knowledge separates us off from a spontaneous harmony with the non-human world. Now, Xunzi certainly cannot accept these claims. However, he agrees that what one already knows can undermine one's ability to come to grips with something new, and that it is important to prevent this from happening. In advocating what he calls emptiness, he is in effect saying that it is possible to achieve all the benefits of Daoist emptiness without trying to achieve that extreme form of emptiness. In Xunzi's deflationary account, emptiness is a state in which one temporarily sets aside one's prior learning so that one can learn something new. This is what he means when he writes, “Not using what one has already stored up to harm what one is about to receive—call it emptiness.” Similarly, when he advocates unity, he is rejecting the view held by some Daoists that one can be truly concentrated on one matter only if one has given up all knowledge of other matters; and in advocating stillness, he is rejecting the view that one's knowledge can be orderly only if one entirely quiets the movements of the heart. In each case, Xunzi is responding to a worry that motivated some Daoists to embrace extreme claims, but in his response he is implicitly rejecting those Daoist claims.

Now, for the Daoists that Xunzi is responding to in this passage, the whole point is to do away with knowledge; they held that someone in the correct state of mind can respond well to changing situations without the need for stored-up knowledge. By contrast, Xunzi sees these states of mind precisely as the means to acquire and store up knowledge, particularly knowledge of the Way. His primary interest here is thus in the epistemology of learning. This does not mean that he is concerned only with students. The opening line of the Xunzi (in its standard arrangement) tells us that learning never comes to an end, and it may be that Xunzi accepted enough of the Daoist picture that he would have insisted that we need to be empty, unified, and still even in the course of ordinary action, in order to adapt our knowledge to new situations. That he accepted some of this picture is implied by his apparent belief, mentioned above, that we can adapt to new situations in ways that go beyond any prior knowledge. Nonetheless, he could not accept the conclusion some Daoists seem to have drawn from this, that we can make do without knowledge, relying only on adaptiveness; for Xunzi, the ability to adapt to a new situation depends on prior learning even when it takes us beyond the knowledge we acquired as a result of that learning. Admittedly his discussion of emptiness, unity, and stillness does not explain why this is so (and this is a significant objection to that discussion).

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9. Philosophy of Language

As with knowledge, early Chinese philosophers conceived of language primarily in practical terms. They took its main function to be guiding behavior and not, say, stating facts. Language guides behavior not only when used explicitly to issue commands or suggestions, but also by embodying value-laden distinctions, such as the distinction between right and wrong. This perhaps becomes most clear among those philosophers (now usually classified as Daoist) who argued that the distinctions we draw in language cannot consistently provide good guidance. For Xunzi, the guidance provided by language is essential for social order, and this provides the motivation for his interest in language.

Early Chinese philosophers' practical conception of language is especially obvious in the Confucian doctrine of the rectification of names. This doctrine focused on role-terms, such as “jun” (“ruler”) and “fu” (“father”), and held that bearing one of these ‘names’ commits a person to certain norms; conversely, if a person does not live according to the norms associated with a role-term, then he or she is not appropriately named by that term. One passage in the Confucian Analects implies that it is an important purpose of government to ensure that people act in accordance with the terms used to name their roles. There is also a tradition that Confucius edited the chronicles of the state of Lu so that rulers' titles reflected their true character rather than their official rank. Similarly, section 1B/8 of the Mencius refuses to classify as regicide the killing of the wicked king Zhou, on the grounds that he was not truly a king.

Xunzi structures his main discussion of language (which forms the heart of Book 22 of the Xunzi) as an attack on certain paradoxical sayings that, Xunzi claims, promote confusion and disorder. He begins by insisting on the need for uniformity in linguistic usage, and by complaining that with the disappearance of the sage kings language has fallen into disorder. He then discusses three issues that he sees as fundamental to a correct understanding of language, and relates each of these issues to a class of paradoxical sayings.

The first issue he raises is the purpose of having names. He tells us that we have names in order to illuminate noble and base and distinguish same and different. By separating these two issues, he came closer than does any other early Chinese thinker (at least in extant texts) to articulating a distinction between fact and value. But his aim is not to identify those uses of language that are appropriate for the objective description of fact. The point of distinguishing same and different, just like the point of illuminating noble and base, is to ensure that the ruler's intent can be made plain and that the business of government can succeed.

Xunzi associates a failure to understand the purpose of names with sayings that “are confused about using names and thereby bring disorder to names”; the examples he lists are “being insulted is not disgraceful,” “sages do not care for themselves,” and “killing thieves is not killing people.” (The first is a saying associated with Song Xing; the last is a view defended by the Later Mohists.) Unfortunately, Xunzi does not explain how exactly a confusion about the purpose of names leads to these sayings, or what constitutes the resulting disorder of names. Presumably he is most concerned here with the practical function of language, and the effects of trying to use these sayings to guide behavior; but he does not tell us what those effects would be.

Xunzi turns next to the question of what we follow in order to distinguish same and different. His answer is that we follow the sense organs. The function of the sense organs is to differentiate among their proper objects (and not, say, to produce images). For example, the eye differentiates among shapes, bodies, colors, and patterns. Because we are members of the same species, our sense organs perceive their objects in the same way, and this is what makes agreement in the use of names possible. Xunzi here includes the heart on his list of sense organs.[16] The function of the heart in this context is to differentiate reasons, explanations, emotions, and desires. He also allows that the heart has a further function that distinguishes it from the other sense organs, and which he calls “sending knowledge.” This reflects the heart's supremacy over the other organs of the body; the apparent point is that the heart sends the sense organs to gather knowledge about their objects. (Another interpretation favored by some scholars is that this sending knowledge is a sort of common sense that integrates the knowledge produced separately by the various sense organs.)

A failure to understand the role of the senses in grounding linguistic distinctions leads, says Xunzi, to confusion about objects that brings disorder to the use of names. This confusion is manifest in sayings such as “mountains and gorges are level,” “the natural desires are few,” and “roast meat does not add sweetness, great bells do not add enjoyment.” (The second of these sayings, possibly along with the third, was associated with Song Xing.) The implication is that one can recognize that these sayings are wrong simply by correctly exercising one's senses; Xunzi's concern is again presumably practical, though again he does not give details.

The third and final issue that Xunzi raises is, as he puts it, the essentials in regulating names. Here he addresses several theoretical issues concerning language, claiming that confusion about these issues leads to a third class of paradoxical saying whose effect is to bring disorder to things. Unfortunately, his list of these sayings is impossible to interpret with any confidence, and may be corrupt. The last saying on the list appears to be a variant of “white horses are not horses” (which is associated with Gongsun Long), perhaps drawing on related discussions in the Later Mohist Canons.

Xunzi turns first to compound terms, insisting that single and compound terms can be shared without difficulty. Here he is probably referring to arguments of the sort used in the Gongsun Longzi to defend the claim that white horses are not horses, which appear to entail that nothing can ever be appropriately described both with a compound term (such as “white horse”) and with a single term (such as “horse”). Xunzi says that this is indeed possible when the single and compound terms do not “repel” one another, and appears to explain what this means by distinguishing between terms of different level of generality. The word “thing” (or “wu”) can be used for anything at all; it is the “great shared name.” In order to separate different kinds of things, we use “separating names” such as “bird” and “beast”, stopping only when we cannot further separate different kinds.[17] The point may be that a single and a compound term do not repel one another when the compound term distinguishes a part of the extension of the single term, as is the case with “white horse” and “horse.”

It is harder to relate the rest of Xunzi's discussion of language to the sorts of paradoxical sayings he is primarily objecting to. First, he claims that the appropriateness of names, and especially the appropriateness of using particular names for particular kinds, derives from agreement and custom, and not from any inherent appropriateness. It is hard to know what apparent paradoxes could run afoul of this modest conventionalism. (Book 2 of the Zhuangzi may derive paradoxical conclusions from conventionalism about kinds, but Xunzi does not raise that issue here.) The remainder of his discussion is given over to a surprisingly abstract account of the individuation of objects; Xunzi says that what distinguishes two objects is not their characteristics (which might be the same) but their position in space. It is possible that this was meant to undermine paradoxical sayings dealing with number, such as “a chicken has three feet,” but again it is hard to be sure.

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Confucius | Laozi | Mencius | Mohism | Mohist Canons | School of Names | Taoism | Zhuangzi